Constructivism in Metaphysics
Although there is no canonical view of “Constructivism” within analytic metaphysics, here is a good starting definition:
Constructivism: Some existing entities are constructed by us in that they depend substantively on us.
Constructivism is a broad view with many, more specific, iterations. Versions of Constructivism will vary depending on who does the constructing, for example, all humans, an ideal subject, certain groups. It will also vary depending on what is constructed, for example, concrete objects, abstract objects, facts), and what the constructed entity is constructed out of (for example, natural objects, nonmodal stuff, concepts). Most Constructivists take the constructing relation to be constitutive, that is, it is part of the very nature of constituted objects that they depend substantively on humans. Some, however, take the constituting relation to be merely causal. Some versions of Constructivism are relativistic; others are not. Another key difference between versions of Constructivism concerns whether they take the constructing relation to be global in scope (so everything—or, at least every object we have epistemic access to—is a constructed object) or local (so there are unconstructed objects, as well as constructed ones).
Given the many dimensions along which versions of Constructivism differ, one might wonder what unites them—what, that is, do all versions of Constructivism have in common that marks them out as versions of Constructivism? Constructivists are united first in their opposition to certain forms of Realism—namely, those that claim that x exists and is suitably independent of us. Constructivists about x agree that x exists, but they deny that it is suitably independent of us. Constructivism is distinguished from other versions of anti-Realism by the emphasis it places on the constructing relation. Constructivists are united by all being anti-Realists about x and by believing this is due to x’s being, in some way, constructed by us.
Table of Contents
- What Is Constructivism?
- 20th-Century Global Constructivism in Analytic Metaphysics
- 21st-Century Local Constructivism in Analytic Metaphysics
- Criticisms of Constructivism in Analytic Metaphysics
- Evaluating Constructivism within Analytic Metaphysics
- Timeline of Constructivism in Analytic Metaphysics
- References and Further Reading
There is no canonical definition of “Constructivism” within philosophy. The following, however, can serve as a good starting point definition for understanding constructivism:
Constructivism: Some extant entities are constructed by us in that they depend substantively on us. (Exactly what it is for an entity to “depend substantively on us” varies between views.)
Constructivism can be further elucidated by noting that constructing is a three-place relation Cxyz (x constructs y out of z) which involves a constructor x (generally taken to be humans), a constructed entity y, and a more basic entity z which serves as a building block for the constructed entity. (Some would take constructing to be a four-place relation Cxyzt—x constructs y out of z at time t. To simplify, the time variable is left out of the relation. It is straightforward to add it in. Each of the terms that are related are examined below before the examination of the constructing relation itself.
Regarding x, who does the constructing? There is no orthodox view regarding which humans do the constructing; different constructivists give different answers. Constructivists frequently (though not always) emphasize the role language and concepts play in constructing entities. Since language and concepts both arise at the level of the group, rather than the level of the individual, it is generally the group (for example, of language speakers or concept users) rather than the individual which is taken to be the constructor. (Lynne Ruder Baker, for example, is typical of Constructivists when she argues that constructed objects rely on our societal conventions as a whole, rather than on the views of any lone individual: “I would not have brought into existence a new thing, a bojangle; our conventions and practices do not have a place for bojangles. It is not just thinking that brings things into existence” (Baker 2007, 44). See also Thomasson (2003, 2007) and Remhof (2017).) Some Constructivists (for example, Kant) take the constructor to be all human beings; other Constructivists (for example, Goodman, Putnam) take the constructor to be a subset of all human beings (for example, society A, society B). There are some versions of Constructivism which take it to be individuals, rather than groups, which do the constructing. (See Goswick, 2018a, 2018b.) These views are more likely to rely on overt responses (for example, how Sally responds when presented with some atoms arranged rockwise) than on language and concepts.
Regarding y, what is constructed? Versions of Constructivism within analytic philosophy can be distinguished based on which entities they focus on. Constructivism in the philosophy of science, for instance, tends to focus on the construction of scientific knowledge. (Scientific “Constructivists maintain that … scientific knowledge is ‘produced’ primarily by scientists and only to a lesser extent determined by fixed structures in the world” (Downes 1-2). See also Kuhn (1996) and Feyerabend (2010).) Constructivism in aesthetics focuses on the construction of an artwork’s meaning and/or on the construction of aesthetic properties more generally. (Aesthetic Constructivists argue that “rather than uncovering the meaning or representational properties of an artwork, an interpretation instead generates an artwork’s meaning” (Alward 247). See also Werner (2015).) Constructivism in the philosophy of mathematics focuses on mathematics objects. (Mathematical Constructivists argue that, when we claim a mathematical object exists, we mean that we can construct a proof of its existence (Bridges and Palmgren 2018).) Constructivism within ethics concerns the origin and nature of our ethical judgments and of ethical properties. (Ethical Constructivists argue that “the correctness of our judgments about what we ought to do is determined by facts about what we believe, or desire, or choose and not, as Realism would have it, by facts about a prior and independent normative reality” (Jezzi 1). Ethical Constructivism has been defended by Korsgaard, Scanlon, and Rawls. For an explication of their views, see Jezzi (2019) and Street (2008, 2010).) Social Constructivism focuses on the construction of distinctly social categories such as race, gender, and sexuality. (See Hacking (1986, 1992, 1999) and Haslanger (1995, 2003, 2012).) Constructivism in metaphysics focuses on the construction of physical objects. (See, for example, Baker (2004, 2007), Goodman (1978, 1980), Putnam (1982, 1987), Thomasson (2003, 2007).)
Regarding z, what is the more basic entity that serves as a building block for the constructed entity? There is no general answer to this question, as different versions of Constructivism give different answers. Some Constructivists (for example, Goswick) take physical stuff to be the basic building blocks of constructed entities. Goswick argues that modal objects are composite objects which have physical stuff and sort-properties as their parts (Goswick 2018b). Some Constructivists (for example, Goodman) take worlds to be the basic building blocks of constructed entities. Goodman argues that it is constructivism all the way down, so each world we construct is itself built out of other worlds.
Regarding C, what is the relation of constructing? Constructivists vary widely regarding the exact details of the constructing relation. In particular, versions of Constructivism vary with regard to whether the constructing relation is (1) global or local, (2) causal or constitutive, (3) temporally and counterfactually robust or not, and (4) relative or absolute. Each of these dimensions of difference are examined in turn.
Regarding 1, is the constructing relation global or local? Historically, the term “constructivism” has been associated with the global claim that every entity to which we have epistemic access is constructed. (Ant Eagle (personal correspondence) points out that there could be an even more global form of Constructivism which claims that all entities, even those to which we do not have epistemic access, are constructed. This is an intriguing view. However, since it has not yet been defended in analytic metaphysics, it is not discussed here.) Kant held this view; as did the main 20th-century proponents of Constructivism (Goodman and Putnam). In the 21st century, philosophers have explored a more local constructing relation in which only some of the entities we have epistemic access to are constructed. Searle, for instance, argues that social objects (for example, money, bathtubs) are constructed but natural objects (for example, trees, rocks) are not. Einheuser argues that modal objects are constructed but nonmodal stuff is not.
Regarding 2, is the constructing relation causal or constitutive? For example, when an author claims that we construct money does she mean that we bear a causal relation to money (that is, we play a causal role in bringing about the existence of money or in money’s having the nature it has) or does she mean that we bear a constitutive relation to money (that is, part of what it is for money to exist or for money to have the nature it has is for us to bear the constitutor-of relation to it)? We can define the distinction as follows: (See also Haslanger (2003, pp. 317-318) and Mallon (2019, p. 4).)
y is causally constructed by x iff x caused y to exist or to have the nature it has.
For example, we caused that $20 bill to come into existence when we printed it at the National Mint and we caused that $20 bill to have the nature it has when we embedded it in the American currency system.
y is constitutively constructed by x iff what it is for y to exist is for x to F or what it is for y to have the nature it has is for x to F.
For example, what it is for a stop sign to exist is for something with physical features P1–Pn to play role r in a human society and what it is for a y to have stop-sign-nature is, in part, for humans to treat y as a stop sign.
Some Constructivists (for example, Goodman, Putnam) do not discuss whether they intend their constructing to be causal or constitutive. (Presumably because the central aims they intend to accomplish by endorsing Constructivism can be satisfied via either a causal or a constitutive version. We can easily modify their views to be explicitly causal or explicitly constitutive. For a Constructivism that is causal, endorse the standard Goodman/Putnam line and add to it that the constructing is to be taken causally. For a Constructivism that is constitutive, endorse the standard Goodman/Putnam line and add to it that the constructing is to be taken constitutively.) Other Constructivists are explicit about whether the constructing relation they utilize is causal or constitutive. Thomasson, for example, notes that
The sort of dependence relevant to [Constructivism] is logical dependence, i.e. dependence which is knowable a priori by analyzing the relevant concepts, not a mere causal or nomological dependence. The very idea of an object’s being money presupposes collective agreement about what counts as money. The very idea of something being an artifact requires that it have been produced by a subject with certain intentions. (Thomasson 2003, 580)
Remhof argues that an object is constructed “iff the identity conditions of the object essentially depend on (i.e., are partly constituted by) our intentional activities” (Remhof 2014, 2). And Searle notes that “part of being a cocktail party is being thought to be a cocktail party; part of being a war is being thought to be a war. This is a remarkable feature of social facts; it has no analogue among physical facts” (Searle 33-34). (For more on constitutive versions of Constructivism, see Haslanger (2003) and Baker (2007, p. 12). For examples of Constructivisms which are causal, see Hacking (1999) and Goswick (2018b). Regarding Hacking, Haslanger notes: “The basis of Hacking’s social constructivism is the historical [constructivist] who claims that, ‘Contrary to what is usually believed, x is the contingent result of historical events and forces, therefore x need not have existed, is not determined by the nature of things, etc.’ … He says explicitly that construction stories are histories and the point, as he sees it, is to argue for the contingency or alterability of the phenomenon by noting its social or historical origins” (Haslanger 2003, 303).)
Regarding 3, is the constituting relation temporally and counterfactually robust or not? Temporal robustness concerns whether constructed entity e exists and has the nature it has prior to and posterior to our constructing it. If yes, then e is temporally robust; otherwise, e is not temporally robust. Counterfactual robustness concerns whether constructed entity e would exist and have the nature it has if certain things were different than they actually are, for example, if we had never existed or had had different conventions/responses/intentions/systems of classification than we actually have. If it would, then the constructing relation is counterfactually robust; otherwise, it is not. Some Constructivists (for example, Putnam, Goodman) deny that the constructing relation is temporally/counterfactually robust. They believe that before we existed there were no stars and that, if we employed different systems of classification, there would be no stars. Other Constructivists take the constructing relation to be temporally/counterfactually robust. Remhof, for instance, argues that even “if there had been no people there would still have been stars and dinosaurs; there would still have been things that would be constructed by humans were they around” (Remhof 2014, 3). Schwartz adds that:
In the process of fashioning classificatory schemes and theoretical frameworks, we organize our world with a past, as well as a future, and provide for there being objects or states of affairs that predate us. Although these facts may be about distant earlier times, they are themselves retrospective facts, not readymade or built into the eternal order. (Schwartz 1986, 436)
An advantage of taking the constructing relation to be temporally/counterfactually robust is that many find it difficult to believe that, for example, there were no stars before there were people or that there would not have been stars had people employed different systems of classification. A disadvantage of endorsing a temporally/counterfactually robust Constructivism is that it is difficult to give an account which is temporally/counterfactually robust but still respects the genuine role Constructivists take humans to play in constructing. After all, if the stars would have been there even if we never existed, why think we play any substantial role in constructing them? At the very least, any role we do play must be non-essential.
Regarding 4, is the constituting relation relative or absolute? Some philosophers (for example, Kant) take the constructing relation to be absolute. Kant thought that all humans, by virtue of being human, employed the same categories and thus created the same phenomena. Other philosophers (for example, Goodman and Putnam) take the constructing relation to be relative. Both argued that worlds exist only relative to a conceptual scheme. Although relativism is often associated with Constructivism (presumably because the most prominent Constructivists of the 20th century also happened to be relativists), the two views are orthogonal. There are relativist and absolutist versions of Constructivism. Moreover, it is easy to slightly tweak relativist views to make them absolutist, or to slightly tweak absolutist views to make them relativist.
At this point, four ways in which constructing relations can differ from one another have been examined: with regard to whether they are (i) global or local, (ii) causal or constitutive, (iii) temporally/counterfactually robust or not, and (iv) relativistic or absolute. The starting point definition of Constructivism is:
Constructivism: Some extant entities are constructed by us in that they depend substantively on us.
Exactly what it is for an entity to “depend substantively on us” varies between views. This definition holds up well to scrutiny. It captures the commonalities one finds across a wide swath of views across sub-disciplines of philosophy (for example, the philosophy of mathematics, aesthetics, metaphysics) and is general enough to accommodate the many differences between views (for example, some Constructivists take constructing to be constitutive, others take it to be merely causal; some Constructivists take the scope of Constructivism to be global, others take it to be very limited in scope and claim there are very few constructed entities). There is some worry, however, that—being so general—the given definition is too broad: are there any views that do not fall under the Constructivist umbrella?
Constructivism has historically been developed in opposition to Realism; and examining the tension between Constructivism and Realism can help us further understand Constructivism. Although the word “realism” is used widely within philosophy and different philosophers take it to mean different things, several fairly canonical uses have evolved: (i) the linguistic understanding of Realism advocated by Dummett which sees the question of Realism as concerning whether sentences have evidence-transcendent truth conditions or verificationist truth conditions, (ii) an understanding of Realism developed within the philosophy of science which centers on whether the aim of scientific theories is truth understood as correspondence to an external world, and (iii) an understanding of Realism developed within metaphysics which centers on whether x exists and is suitably independent of humans. The understanding of Realism relevant to elucidating Constructivism is this final one:
Ontological Realism (about x): x exists and is suitably independent of us.
Constructivism (about x) stands in opposition to Ontological Realism (about x). The Ontological Realist takes x to be “suitably independent of us,” whereas the Constructivist takes x to “depend substantively on us for either its existence or its nature.” Whatever suitable independence is, it rules out depending substantially on us. Although one does still hear philosophers talk simply of “Realism,” it has become far more common, within analytic metaphysics, to talk of “Realism about x” and to take Realism to be a first-order metaphysical view concerning the existence and/or human independence of specific types of entities (for example, properties, social objects, numbers, ordinary objects) rather than a general stance one has (concerning, for example, the purpose of philosophical investigation). Following this trend in the literature on Realism (that is, the move away from talking about Realism and anti-Realism in general to talking specifically of Realism about x) can help us make more precise the definition of Constructivism.
Constructivism (about x): x exists and depends substantively on us for either its existence or its nature.
This definition of Constructivism is still very general (that is, because it does not spell out what “depends substantively on” entails/requires). However, given that it is standard within the literature on Realism to give a definition which is general enough to encompass many different understandings of “suitably independent of” and that Constructivism has historically been developed in opposition to Realism, it makes sense to mimic this level of generality in defining Constructivism.
One last precisification is in order before we move on to discussing the details of specific versions of Constructivism. A wide array of differences track whether the constructing relation is taken to be global or local. Global and local versions of Constructivism differ with regard to when they were/are endorsed (global: in the 20th century versus local: subsequently), why they are endorsed (global: thinks Realism itself is somehow defective versus local: likes Realism in general but thinks there is at least one sort of object it can’t account for), and what the best objections to the view are (global: general objections to constructing versus local: specific objections regarding whether some x really is constructed). Given this, it is useful to separate our discussion of Constructivism into Global Constructivism and Local Constructivism.
Global Constructivism: For all existing xs to which we have epistemic access, x depends substantively on us for either its existence or its nature.
Local Constructivism: For only some existing xs to which we have epistemic access, x depends substantively on us for either its existence or its nature.
Who are the global constructivists? Who is it, that is, who argues that
[All physical objects we have epistemic access to are] constructed in a way that reflects our contingent needs and interests. [Global Constructivists think that we] can only make sense of there being a fact of the matter about the world after we have agreed to employ some descriptions of it as opposed to others, that prior to the use of those descriptions, there can be no sense to the idea that there is a fact of the matter “out there” constraining which of our descriptions are true and which false. (Boghossian 25, 32)
The number of Global Constructivists within analytic metaphysics is small. (Constructivism has a long and healthy history within Continental philosophy and is still much more widely discussed within contemporary Continental metaphysics than it is within contemporary analytic metaphysics. See Kant (1965), Foucault (1970), and Remhof (2017).) Scouring the literature will yield only a handful. The best-known proponents are Goodman and Putnam. Schwartz supported Goodman’s view in the 1980s and most recently wrote an article supporting the view in 2000. Kant (late 1700s) and James (early 1900s) were early proponents of the view. Rorty and Dummett each endorse the view in passing. These seven authors exhaust the list of analytic Global Constructivists. (Al Wilson (personal communication) suggests this list might be expanded to include Rudolf Carnap, Simon Blackburn, and Huw Price.) Their motivation for endorsing Global Constructivism is worries they have about the cogency of Realism. They think that, if Realism were true, we would have no way to denote objects or to know about them. Since we can denote objects and do have knowledge of them, Realism must not be the correct account of them. The correct account is, rather, Constructivism. Although their number is small, their influence—especially that of Goodman and Putnam—has reverberated within analytic metaphysics. The remainder of this section examines the views of each of the central defenders of Global Constructivism.
Goodman defended Global Constructivism is a series of articles and books clustering around the 1980s: Ways of Worldmaking (1978), “On Starmaking” (1980), “Notes on the Well-Made World” (1983), “On Some Worldly Worries” (1993). Goodman, himself, described his view as “a radical relativism under rigorous restraints, that eventuates in something akin to irrealism” (1978 x). He believed that there were many right worlds, that these worlds exist only relative to a set of concepts, and that the building blocks of constructed objects are other constructed objects: “Worldmaking as we know it always starts from worlds already on hand; the making is a remaking” (1978 6-7). Goodman thought that there is “no sharp line to be drawn between the character of the experience and the description given by the subject” (Putnam 1979, 604). Goodman is perhaps the most earnest and sincere defender of the global scope of Constructivism. Whereas others tend to find the idea that we construct, for example, stars nearly incoherent; Goodman finds the idea that we did not construct the stars nearly incoherent:
Scheffler contends that we cannot have made the stars. I ask him which features of the stars we did not make, and challenge him to state how these differ from features clearly dependent on discourse. … We make a star as we make a constellation, by putting its parts together and marking off its boundaries. … The worldmaking mainly in question here is making not with hands but with minds, or rather with languages or other symbol systems. Yet when I say that worlds are made, I mean it literally. … That we can make the stars dance, as Galileo and Bruno made the earth move and the sun stop, not by physical force but by verbal invention, is plain enough. (Goodman 1980 213 and 1983 103)
Goodman takes the constructors of reality to be societies (rather than lone individuals). He takes constructing to be relative, so, for example, society A constructs books and plants, whereas, faced with the same circumstances, society B constructs food and fuel (Goodman 1983, 103). He does not comment on whether the constructing relation is causal or constitutive. Like all relativistic versions of Constructivism, his view is not temporally/counterfactually robust. Goodman’s motivation for endorsing Global Constructivism is that he thinks it is clear that we can denote and know about, for example, stars and he thinks we would not be able to do this were Realism true.
Schwartz defends Goodmanian Global Constructivism in two articles: “I’m Going to Make You a Star” (1986) and “Starting from Scratch: Making Worlds” (2000). Since Goodman’s writings on constructivism can often be difficult to understand, examining Schwartz’s writings can serve to give us further insight into Goodman’s view. Schwartz writes that:
In shaping the concepts and classification schemes we employ in describing our world, we do take part in constituting what that reality is. Whether there are stars, and what they are like, … are facts that are carved out in the very process of devising perspicuous theories to aid in understanding our world. … Until we fashion star concepts and related categories, and integrate them into ongoing theories and speculations, there is no interesting sense in which the facts about stars are really one way rather than another. (Schwartz 1986, 429)
Schwartz emphasizes the role we play in making it the case that certain properties are instantiated and, thus, in drawing out ordinary objects from the mass of undifferentiated stuff which exists independently of people:
In natura rerum there are no inherent facts about the properties [x] has. It is no more a star, than it is a Big Dipper star and belongs to a constellation. … From the worldmaker’s perspective, the unmade world is a world without determinate qualities and shape. Pure substance, thisness, or Being may abound, but there is nothing to give IT specific character. (Schwartz 2000, 156)
Schwartz notes that, “no argument is needed to show that we do have some power to create by conceptualization and symbolic activity. Poems, promises, and predictions are a few obvious examples” (Schwartz 1986, 428). For example, it is uncontroversial that part of what it is to be a Scrabble joker (one of those blank pieces of wood that you can use as any letter when playing the game of Scrabble) is to be embedded in a certain human context: “These bits of wooden reality could no more be Scrabble jokers without the cognitive carving out of the features and dimensions of the concept, than they could be Scrabble jokers had they never been carved from the tree” (Schwartz 1986, 430-431). Schwartz, and Global Constructivists in general, differ from non-constructivists in that they think all ordinary objects (and, in fact, all the objects we have epistemic access to) are like Scrabble jokers. Of course, there is something that exists independently of us. But this something is amorphous, undefined, and plays no role in our epistemic lives. What we are aware of is the objects we create out of this mass by the (often unconscious) imposition of our concepts.
The other key defender of Global Constructivism is Putnam. Like Goodman, Putnam defended Global Constructivism is a series of articles and books which cluster around the 1980s, see, for example, “Reflections on Goodman’s Ways of Worldmaking” (1979), Reason, Truth, and History (1981), “Why There Isn’t a Ready-Made World” (1982), and The Many Faces of Realism (1987). Putnam thinks philosophy should look to science, and he shares the Positivists’ skepticism about traditional metaphysics:
There is … nothing in the history of science to suggest that it either aims at or should aim at one single absolute version of “the world”. On the contrary, such an aim, which would require science itself to decide which of the empirically equivalent successful theories in any given context was “really true”, is contrary to the whole spirit of an enterprise whose strategy from the first has been to confine itself to claims with clear empirical significance. … Metaphysics, or the enterprise of describing the “furniture of the world”, the “things in themselves” apart from our conceptual imposition, has been rejected by many analytic philosophers. … apart from relics, it is virtually only materialists [i.e. physicalists] who continue the traditional enterprise. (Putnam 1982 144 and 164)
Contrary to Putnam’s hopes, in the twenty-first century the materialists have won, and most metaphysicians recognize the sharp subject/object divide that Putnam rejected. Putnam argues that objects “do not exist independently of conceptual schemes. We cut up the world into objects when we introduce one scheme or another” (Cortens 41). Putnam takes the constructors of reality to be societies, the constructing to be relative, and does not comment on whether the constructing relation is causal or constitutive. Like all relativistic versions of Constructivism, his view is not temporally/counterfactually robust. Putnam’s motivation for endorsing Global Constructivism is that he rejects the sharp division between object and subject which Realism presupposes. He thinks analytic philosophy erred when it responded to 17th-century science by introducing a distinction between primary and secondary qualities (Putnam 1987). He argues that we should instead have taken everything that exists to be a muddled combination of the objective and subjective; there is no way to neatly separate out the two. By recognizing the role we play in constructing objects, Global Constructivism pays homage to this lack of separation; Realism does not. Thus, Putnam prefers Global Constructivism to Realism. (See Hale and Wright (2017) for further discussion of Putnam’s rejection of Realism.)
Other adherents of Global Constructivism include Kant, James, Rorty, and Dummett. (See Kant (1965), James (1907), Rorty (1972), and Dummett (1993).) In “The World Well Lost” (1972), Rorty argues that “the realist true believer’s notion of the world is an obsession rather than an intuition” (Rorty 661). He endorses an account of alternative conceptual frameworks which draws heavily on continental philosophers (Hegel, Kant, Heidegger), as well as on Dewey. Ultimately, he concludes that we should stop focusing on trying to find an independent world that is not there and should recognize the role we play in constructing the world. In Frege: Philosopher of Language (1993), Dummett argues that the “picture of reality as an amorphous lump, not yet articulated into discrete objects, thus proves to be a correct one. [The world does not present] itself to us as already dissected into discrete objects” (Dummett 577). Rather, in the process of developing language, we develop the criterion of identity associated with each term and then, with this in place, the world is individuated into distinct objects.
The heyday of analytic Global Constructivism was the 1980s. No one in analytic metaphysics defends the view Schwartz’s defense in 2000. The view has now more or less been abandoned. Remhof discussed the view in 2014, but he did not endorse it. However, Global Constructivism continues to be influential in discussions, where it serves primarily as a rallying point for the Realists who argue against it—see, for example, Devitt (1997) and Boghossian (2006). Although there are no contemporary Global Constructivists, Local Constructivism—which is an heir to Global Constructivism—is alive and well. The next section examines the many versions of Local Constructivism which proliferate in the twenty-first century.
You will not find the term “constructivism” bandied about within contemporary analytic metaphysics with anything approaching the frequency with which the term is used in other sub-disciplines of analytic philosophy or within Continental philosophy. (Why is not the term “constructivism” used more frequently in contemporary analytic metaphysics? The reluctance to use the term “constructivism” probably stems from the current sociology of analytic metaphysics. Realism has a strong grip on analytic metaphysics. Moreover, many anti-Realist metaphysics writings are strikingly bad, and most philosophers currently working within analytic philosophy can easily recall the criticism that was directed toward Global Constructivism: “Barring a kind of anti-realism that none of us should tolerate” (Hawthorne 2006, 109). “[Constructivism] is such a bizarre view that it is hard to believe that anyone actually endorses it” (Boghossian 25). “We should not close our eyes to the fact that Constructivism is prima facie absurd, a truly bizarre doctrine” (Devitt 2010, 105). These factors conspire to make contemporary analytic metaphysics a particularly unappealing place to launch any theory which might smell of anti-Realism, and to be a Constructivist about x is to be an anti-Realist about x.) However, if one looks at the content of views within analytic metaphysics rather than at what the views are labeled, it quickly becomes apparent that many of them meet the definition of Local Constructivism.
Local Constructivism: For only some existing xs to which we have epistemic access, x depends substantively on us for either its existence or its nature.
Although they may be Realists about many kinds of entities (and may self-identify as “Realists”), many metaphysicians of the twenty-first century are Constructivists about at least some kinds of entities. (See, for example, Baker (2004 and 2007), Einheuser (2011), Evnine (2016), Goswick (2018a), Kriegel (2008), Searle (1995), Sidelle (1989), Thomasson (2003 and 2007), Varzi (2011).) Let’s consider the views of several of these metaphysicians. In particular, let’s look at Local Constructivism with regard to vague objects (Heller), modal objects (Sidelle, Einheuser, Goswick), composite objects (Kriegel), artifacts (Searle, Thomasson, Baker, Devitt), and objects with conventional boundaries (Varzi).
Although not himself a Constructivist, in The Ontology of Physical Objects (1990) Heller presents a view which is a close ancestor of contemporary Local Constructivism. Since a minor tweak turns his view into Local Constructivism, since he was one of the first in the general field of Local Constructivism, and since his work has been so influential on contemporary Local Constructivists, it is worth taking a quick look at exactly what Heller says and why Local Constructivists have found inspiration in his book. Heller distinguishes between what he calls “real objects” and what he calls “conventional objects.” Real objects are four-dimensional hunks of matter which have precise spatiotemporal boundaries; we generally do not talk or think about real objects (since we tend not to individuate so finely as to denote objects with precise spatiotemporal boundaries). “Conventional object” is the name Heller gives to objects which we think exist, but do not really (due to the fact that, if they did exist they would have vague spatiotemporal boundaries and nothing that exists has vague spatiotemporal boundaries) (Heller 47). For example, Heller thinks there is no statue and no lump of clay:
The [purported] difference [between the statue and the clay] is a matter of convention. … This difference cannot reflect a real difference in the objects. There is only one object in the spatiotemporal region claimed to be occupied by both the statue and the lump of clay. There . are no coincident entities; there are just . different conventions applicable to a single physical object. (Heller 32)
What really exists (in the rough vicinity we intuitively think contains the statue) are many precise hunks of matter. None of these hunks is a statue or a lump of clay (because “statue” and “lump of clay” are both ordinary language terms which are not precise enough to distinguish between, for example, two hunks of matter which differ only with regard to the fact that one includes, and the other excludes, atom a), but we mistakenly think there is a statue (where really there are just these various hunks of matter). Heller is an Eliminativist about conventional objects: there are none. However, it is a short step from Heller’s Eliminativism about vague objects to Constructivism about vague objects. The framework is in place; Heller has already provided a thorough account of the difference between nonconventional objects (hunks of matter) and conventional objects (objects—such as rocks, dogs, mountains, and necklaces—which have vague spatiotemporal boundaries) and of how our causal interaction with nonconventional objects gives rise to our belief that there are conventional objects. To be a Constructivist rather than an Eliminativist about Heller’s conventional objects, one need only argue, contra Heller, that our conventions in fact bring new objects—objects which are constructed out of hunks of matter and our conventions—into existence. (Just to re-iterate, Heller is opposed to this: “There are other alternatives that can be quickly discounted. For instance, the claim that we somehow create a new physical object by passing legislation involves the absurd idea that without manipulating or creating any matter we can create a physical object” (Heller 36). However, by so thoroughly examining nonconventional objects, conventional objects, and the relationship between them, he laid the groundwork for the Local Constructivists that would come after him.)
Local Constructivists about modal objects share Heller’s skepticism about the ability of Realism to account for ordinary objects. However, whereas Heller worries that ordinary objects have vague spatiotemporal boundaries but that all objects that really exist have precise spatiotemporal boundaries and resolves this worry by being an Eliminativist about ordinary objects, Local Constructivists about modal objects worry that ordinary objects have “deep” modal properties but that all objects that Realism is true of have at most “shallow” modal properties. (Where a “deep” modal property is any de re necessity or de re possibility which is non-trivial and a “shallow” modal property is any modal property which is not “deep.” See Goswick (2018b) for a more detailed discussion.) Rather than being Eliminativists about ordinary objects, they resolve this worry by endorsing Local Constructivism about objects which have at least one “deep” modal property (henceforth, such objects will be referred to as “modal objects”).
Sidelle and Einheuser both defend Local Constructivism about modal objects. Sidelle’s goal in his (1989) is to defend a conventionalist account of modality. He argues that conventionalism about modality requires Constructivism about modal objects (1989 77). He relies on (nonmodal) stuff as the basic building block out of which modal objects are constructed: “[The] conventionalist should … say that what is primitively ostended is ‘stuff’, stuff looking, of course, just as the world looks, but devoid of modal properties, identity conditions, and all that imports. For a slogan, one might say that stuff is preobjectual” (1989 54-55). Modal objects come to exist when humans provide individuating conditions. It is because we respond to stuff s as if it is a chair and apply the label “chair” to it that there is a chair with persistence conditions c rather than just some stuff. Einheuser’s goal in her (2011) is to ground modality. She argues that the best way to do this is to endorse a conceptualist account of modality and that so doing requires endorsing Constructivism about modal objects. Like Sidelle, she endorsees preobjectual stuff: “the content of the spatio-temporal region of the world occupied by an object [is] the stuff of the object” (Einheuser 303). She argues that this stuff “does not contain … built-in persistence criteria. … It is ‘objectually inarticulate’” (Einheuser 303). Modal objects are created out of such mere stuff by the imposition of our concepts:
Concepts like statue and piece of alloy impose persistence criteria on portions of material stuff and thereby “configure” objects. That is, they induce objects governed by these persistence criteria. Our concept statue is associated with one set of persistence criteria. Applied to a suitable portion of stuff, the concept statue configures an object governed by these criteria. (Einheuser 302)
Einheuser emphasizes the fact that what we are doing is creating a new object (a piece of alloy) rather than adding modal properties to pre-existing stuff. (Einheuser on why we must be Local Constructivists about modal objects rather than Local Constructivists about only modal properties: “There is the view that our concepts project modal properties onto otherwise modally unvested objects. This view appears to imply that objects have their modal properties merely contingently. [The piece of alloy may be necessarily physical] but that is just a contingent fact about [it] for our concepts might have projected a different modal property [on to it]. That seems tantamount to giving up on the idea of de re necessity. … The conceptualist considered here maintains conceptualism not merely about modal properties but about objects: Concepts don’t project modal properties onto objects. Objects themselves are, in a sense to be clarified, projections of concepts” (302).)
Kriegel endorses Local Constructivism about composite objects. He takes Realism to be true of non-composite objects and uses them as the basic building blocks of his composite objects. He worries that, given Realism, there is simply no fact of the matter regarding whether the xs compose an o (Kriegel 2008). He argues that we should be conventionalists about composition: “the xs compose an o iff the xs are such as to produce the response that the xs compose an o in normal intuiters under normal forced-choice conditions” (Kriegel 10). A side effect of this conventionalism about composition is Local Constructivism about composite objects, namely, Kriegel is a Realist about some physical entities r (the non-composite objects) to which we have epistemic access, and he thinks that by acting in some specified way (having the composition intuition) with regard to these physical entities we thereby bring new physical objects (the composite ones) into existence.
Local Constructivism about artifacts is the most wide-spread form of Local Constructivism. It is endorsed by Seale, Thomasson, Baker, and Devitt, among others. (See also Evnine (2016).) Searle is a Realist about natural objects such as Mt. Everest, bits of metal, land, stones, water, and trees (Searle 153, 191, 4). He is a Constructivist about artifactual objects such as money, cars, bathtubs, restaurants, and schools (Searle xi, 4). He takes the natural objects to be the basic building blocks of the artifactual ones:
[The] ontological subjectivity of the socially constructed reality requires an ontological objective reality out of which it is constructed, because there has to be something for the construction to be constructed out of. To construct money, property, and language, for example, there have to be the raw materials of bits of metal, paper, land, sounds, and marks. And the raw materials cannot in turn be socially constructed without presupposing some even rawer materials out of which they are constructed, until eventually we reach a bedrock of brute physical phenomena independent of all representations. (Searle 191)
Thomasson’s Local Constructivism about artifacts arises from her easy ontology. She claims that terms have application and co-application conditions and that, when these conditions are satisfied, the term denotes an object of kind k (Thomasson 2007). Although humans set the application and co-application conditions for natural kind terms such as “rock,” humans play no role in making it the case that these conditions are satisfied. Thus, Realism about natural objects is true. However, with regard to artifactual kind terms such as “money,” humans both set the application and co-application conditions for the term and play a role in making it the case that these conditions are satisfied: “The very idea of something being an artifact requires that it have been produced by a subject with certain intentions” (Thomasson 2003, 580). Intentions, alone, however are not enough:
Although artifacts depend on human beliefs and intentions regarding their nature and their existence, the way they are also partially depends on real acts, e.g. of manipulating things in the environment. Many of the properties of artifacts are determined by physical aspects of the artifacts without regard for our beliefs about them. (Thomasson 2003, 581)
Every concrete artifact includes unconstructed properties which serve as the basis for the object’s constructed properties.
Baker distinguishes between what she calls “ID objects” and non-ID objects. ID objects are objects—such as stop signs, tables, houses, driver’s licenses, and hammocks—that could not exist in a world lacking beings with beliefs, desires, and intentions (Baker 2007, 12). Non-ID objects are objects which could exist in a world which lacked such beliefs, desires, and intentions, for example, dinosaurs, planets, rocks, trees, dogs. Artifacts are ID objects. They are constructed out of our doing certain things to and having certain attitudes toward non-ID objects.
When a thing of one primary kind is in certain circumstances, a thing of another primary kind—a new thing, with new causal powers—comes to exist. [Sometimes this new thing is an ID object.] For example, when an octagonal piece of metal is in circumstances of being painted red with white marks of the shape S-T-O-P, and is in an environment that has certain conventions and laws, a new thing—a traffic sign—comes into existence. (Baker 2007, 13)
Baker advocates a constitution theory according to which coinciding objects stand in a hierarchical relation of constitution. Aggregates are fundamental, non-ID objects, and serve as the ground-level building blocks out of which all ID objects, including artifacts, are built: “Although … thought and talk make an essential contribution to the existence of certain objects [e.g., artifacts], … thought and talk alone [do not] bring into existence any physical objects: conventions, practices, and pre-existing materials [i.e., non-ID aggregates] are also required” (Baker 2007, 46). (Unlike nearly all the other advocates of Local Constructivism about artifacts, Baker does not take constructed objects to be inferior to non-constructed ones: “An artifact has as great a claim as a natural object to be a genuine substance. This is so because artifactual kinds are primary kinds. Their functions are their essences” (Baker 2004, 104).)
Devitt is another defender of Local Constructivism about artifacts. He distinguishes between artifactual objects whose “natures are functions that involve the purposes of agents” (Devitt 1997, 247) and natural objects whose nature is not such a function: “A hammer is a hammer in virtue of its function for hammerers. A tree is not a tree in virtue of its function” (Devitt 1997, 247). Devitt argues that every constructed artifact can also be described as a natural object which is not constructed: “Everything that is [an artifact] is also a [natural object]; thus, a fence may also be a row of trees” (Devitt 1997, 248). He is at pains to distance his Local Constructivism from Global Constructivism and emphasizes the role unconstructed objects play in bringing about the existence of constructed objects:
No amount of thinking about something as, say, a hammer is enough to make it a hammer. … Neither designing something to hammer nor using it to hammer is sufficient to make it a hammer. [Only] things of certain physical types could be [hammers]. In this way [artifacts] are directly dependent on the [unconstructed] world. (Devitt 1997, 248-249)
The final version of Local Constructivism to be examined is Varzi’s Local Constructivism about objects with conventional boundaries. Varzi distinguishes between objects with natural boundaries and those with conventional boundaries. He argues that, “If a certain entity enjoys natural boundaries, it is reasonable to suppose that its identity and survival conditions do not depend on us; it is a bona fide entity of its own” (Varzi 137). On the other hand, if an entity’s “boundaries are artificial—if they reflect the articulation of reality that is effected through human cognition and social practices—then the entity itself is to some degree a fiat entity, a product of our world-making” (Varzi 137). Varzi is quick to point to the role objects with natural boundaries play in our construction of objects with conventional boundaries: “the parts of the dough [the objects with natural boundaries] provide the appropriate real basis for our fiat acts. [They] are whatever they are [independently of us] and the relevant mereology is a genuine piece of metaphysics” (Varzi 145). Varzi also emphasizes the compatibility of Local Constructivism with a generally Realist picture:
It is worth emphasizing that even a radical [constructivist] stance need not yield the nihilist apocalypse heralded by postmodern propaganda. [Constructed objects] lack autonomous metaphysical thickness. But other individuals may present themselves. For instance, on a Quinean metaphysics, there is an individual corresponding to “the material content, however heterogeneous, of some portion of space-time, however disconnected and gerrymandered”. … Such individuals are perfectly nonconventional, yet the overall [Quinean] picture is one that a [constructivist] is free to endorse. (Varzi 147-148)
Having examined five versions of Local Constructivism—constructivism about vague objects, modal objects, composite objects, artifacts, and objects with conventional boundaries—I turn now to describing what all these view have in common that marks them out as constructivist views. Taking note of what each view takes to be unconstructed and what each view takes to be constructed can provide insight into what all the views have in common:
|Author||Unconstructed Entities||Constructed Entities|
|neo-Hellerian||4D hunks of matter||vague objects|
|Sidelle/Einheuser/Goswick||nonmodal stuff||modal objects|
|Kriegel||simple objects||composite objects|
|Searle/Thomasson/Baker/Devitt||natural objects||artifactual objects|
|Varzi||natural boundaries||conventional boundaries|
The definitive thing that each version of Local Constructivism has in common that makes it a Local Constructivist view is that (i) each takes there to be something unconstructed to which we have epistemic access, and (ii) each thinks that by acting in some specified way with regard to these unconstructed entities we thereby bring new physical objects (the constructed ones) into existence. The views differ with regard to what they think the unconstructed entities are and with regard to what they think we have to do in order to utilize these unconstructed entities to construct new entities, but they are all alike in endorsing (i) and (ii). This is what marks them out as local and constructivist. They are local—rather than global—in scope because they all think only some of the entities that we have epistemic access to are constructed. They are Constructivist—rather than Realist—about vague objects or modal objects or … objects because they take these entities to depend substantially (either causally or constitutively) on us for either their existence or nature.
Broadly speaking, all Local Constructivists share the same motivation for endorsing Constructivism—namely, they think that although Realism is generally a good theory there are little bits of the world that it cannot account for. Although Local Constructivists tend to be fond of Realism, they are even fonder of certain entities which they take Realism to be unable to accommodate. They resolve this tension (that is, between the desire to be Realists and the desire to have entities e in their ontology) by endorsing Local Constructivism about entities e. The appeal of Local Constructivism springs from an inherent tension between naturalism and Realism. Most analytic metaphysicians of the twenty-first century are naturalists: they think that metaphysics should be compatible with our best science, that philosophy has much to learn from studying the methods used in science, and that, at root, the basic entities philosophy puts in its ontology had better be ones that are scientifically respectable (quarks, leptons, and forces are in; God, dormative powers, and Berkeleyan ideas are out). It is not obvious, however, that there is a place within our best science for the ordinary objects we know and love. (“We have already seen that ordinary material objects tend to dissolve as soon as we acknowledge their microscopic structure: this apple is just a smudgy bunch of hadrons and leptons whose exact shape and properties are no more settled than those of a school of fish” (Varzi 140).) Metaphysicians’ naturalism inclines them to be Realists only about those entities our best science countenances. (Searle, for example, wonders how there can “be an objective world of money, property, marriage, governments, elections, football games, cocktail parties, and law courts in a world that consists entirely of physical particles in fields of force” (Searle xi).) They worry that there is no room within this naturalistic picture of the world for, for example, modal objects, composite objects, or artifacts. This places them in a bind: they do not want to abandon naturalism or Realism, but they also do not want to exclude entities e (whose existence/nature is not countenanced by naturalistic Realism) from their ontology. This underlying situation makes it the case that analytic metaphysicians will often end up endorsing Local Constructivism for some entities, that is, because doing so allows them to include such objects in their ontology whilst recognizing that they are defective in a way many other objects included in their ontology are not (that is, because they are existence or nature depends on us in some way the existence/nature of other objects does not). (This discussion of Local Constructivism has focused on concrete objects. There is also a literature concerning the construction of abstract objects. See, for example, Levinson (1980), Thomasson (1999), Irmak (2019), Korman (2019).)
The previous two sections examined two central versions of Constructivism within analytic metaphysics and provided overviews of the works of their most prominent adherents. The article concludes by asking what—all things considered—we should make of Constructivism in analytic metaphysics. Before the question can be answered, there must be an examination of the central criticisms of Constructivism. These criticisms can be divided into two main sorts: (1) coherence criticisms—which argue that Constructivism is in some way internally flawed to the extent that we cannot form coherent, evaluable versions of the view, and (2) substantive criticisms—which take Constructivism to be coherent and evaluable, but argue that we have good reason to think it is false.
Consider these four coherence criticisms: (i) Constructivism is not a distinct view, (ii) The term “constructivism” is too over-used to be valuable, (iii) Constructivism is too metaphorical, and (iv) Constructivism is incoherent.
Consider, first, whether Constructivism is a distinct view within the anti-Realist family of metaphysical views. Meta-ethicists, for instance, sometimes worry about whether Ethical Constructivism is sufficiently distinct from other views (for example, emotivism or response-dependence) within ethics. (See, for example, Jezzi (2019) and Street (2008 and 2010).) Does a similar worry arise with regard to Constructivism in analytic metaphysics? It does not. Constructivism is a broad view within anti-Realism; there are many more specific versions of it, but Constructivism is sufficiently distinct from other anti-Realist views. It is not, for example, Berkeleyan Idealism (that is, because Berkeleyan Idealism requires that God play a central role in determining what exists and Constructivism has no such reliance on God) or Eliminativism (that is, because Eliminativists about x deny that x exists, whereas Constructivists about x claim that x exists).
Consider, next, whether the term “constructivism” is too over-used to be valuable. Haslanger notes that, “The term ‘social construction’ has become commonplace in the humanities. [The] variety of different uses of the term has made it increasingly difficult to determine what claim authors are using it to assert or deny” (Haslanger 2003, 301-302). The term “constructivism” certainly is not over-used with analytic metaphysics. If anything, it is underused; authors only very rarely use the term “constructivism” to refer to their own views. We need not fear that the variety of uses which plagues the humanities in general will be an issue in analytic metaphysics. The term is uncommon within analytic metaphysics; and there is value in introducing the label within analytic metaphysics—as such labels serve to emphasize the similarity both in content and in underlying motivation between views whose authors use quite disparate terms to identify their own views.
Consider, third, whether “constructivism,” as used in analytic metaphysics, is too metaphorical. This criticism has been directed primarily at Global Constructivism. Understandably when, for instance, Goodman writes, “The worldmaking mainly in question here is making not with hands but with minds, or rather with languages or other symbol systems. Yet when I say that worlds are made, I mean it literally” (Goodman 1980 213), we want to know exactly what it is to literally make a world with words—it is difficult to parse this phrase if we do not take either the making or the world to be metaphorical. Global Constructivists, themselves, often stress—as Goodman does in the above passage—that they mean their views to be taken non-metaphorically: we really do construct the stars, the planets, and the rocks. Critics of Global Constructivism, however, often find it almost irresistible to take the writings of Global Constructivists to be metaphorical, namely “The anti-realist [Constructivist] is of course speaking in metaphor. It we took him to be speaking literally, what he says would be wildly false—so much so that we would question his sanity” (Devitt 2010, 237—quoting Wolterstorff). There is something to the worry that what Global Constructivists say is just so radical (and frequently, so convoluted) that the only way we can make any sense of it at all is to take it metaphorically (regardless of whether its proponents intend us to take it this way).
A final coherence criticism is that Constructivism is simply incoherent: we cannot make enough sense of what the view is to be in a position to evaluate it. This criticism takes various forms, including that Constructivism (a) is incompatible with what we know about our terms; (b) relies on a notion of a conceptual scheme which is, itself, incoherent; (c) requires unconstructed entities of a sort Global Constructivism cannot accept; (d) relies on a notion of unconstructed objects which is itself contradictory; and (e) allows for the construction of incompatible objects.
Consider, first, the claim that Constructivism is incompatible with what we know about our terms. Boghossian, for example, writes:
Isn’t it part of the very concept of an electron, or of a mountain, that these things were not constructed by us? Take electrons, for example. Is it not part of the very purpose of having such a concept that it is to designate things that are independent of us? If we insist on saying that they were constructed by our descriptions of them, don’t we run the risk of saying something not merely false but conceptually incoherent, as if we hadn’t quite grasped what an electron was supposed to be? (Boghossian 39)
The idea behind Boghossian’s worry is that linguistic and conceptual competence reveal to us that the term “electron” and the concept electron denote something which is independent of us. If so, then any theory that proposes that electrons depend on us is simply confused about the meaning of the term “electron” or, more seriously, about the nature of electrons. There are a variety of ways one can address this concern. One could argue that externalism is true and, thus, that competent users can be radically mistaken about what their terms refer to and still successfully refer. Historically, we have often been mistaken both about what exists and about what the nature of existing objects is. We were able to successfully refer to water even when we thought it was a basic substance (rather than a composite of H2O) and we can refer successfully to electrons even if we are deeply mistaken about their nature, that is, we think they are independent entities when they are really dependent entities. The more serious version of Boghossian’s worry casts it as a worry about changing the subject matter rather than as a worry about reference. It may be that electrons-which-depend-on-us are so radically different from what we originally thought electrons were that Constructivists (who claim electrons so depend) are (i) proposing Eliminativism about electrons-which-are-independent-of-us, and (ii) introducing an entirely new ontology, namely electrons-which-depend-on-us. (See Evnine (2016) for arguments that taking electrons to depend on humans changes the subject matter so radically that Eliminativism is preferable.) The critic could press this point, but it is not very convincing. To see this, hold a rock in your hand. On the most reasonable way of casting the debate, the Realist to your right and the Constructivist to your left can both point to the rock and utter, “we have different accounts of the existence and nature of that rock.” It is uncharitable to interpret them as talking about different objects, rather than as having different views about the same object. Boghossian overestimates the extent of our knowledge of, for example, the term “electron,” the concept electron, and the objects electrons. We are not so infallible with regard to such terms, concepts, and objects that views which dissent from the mainstream Realist position are simply incoherent.
Consider, next, the criticism that Constructivism relies on a notion of a conceptual scheme which is, itself, incoherent. Goodman and Putnam both endorsed relativistic versions of Global Constructivism which rely on different cultures having different conceptual schemes and on the idea that truth can be relative to a conceptual scheme. Davidson (1974) attacks the intelligibility of truth relative to a conceptual scheme. Cortens (2002) argues that, “Many relativists run into serious trouble on this score; rarely do they provide a satisfactory explanation of just what sort of thing a conceptual scheme is” (Cortens 46). Although there are responses to this criticism, they are not presented here. (See the entries for Goodman, Putnam, and Schwartz in the bibliography.) Goodman/Putnam’s Global Constructivism is a dated view, and contemporary versions of Constructivism do not utilize the old-fashioned notion of a conceptual scheme or of truth relative to a conceptual scheme.
Another criticism which attacks the coherence of Constructivism is the claim that Constructivism requires unconstructed entities of a sort Global Constructivism cannot accept. Boghossian (2006) and Scheffler (2009) argue that Constructivism presupposes the existence of at least some unconstructed objects which we have epistemic access to. If this is correct, then Global Constructivism is contradictory, that is, since it would require unconstructed objects we have epistemic access to (to serve as the basis of our constructing) whilst also claiming that all objects we have epistemic access to are constructed:
If our concepts are cutting lines into some basic worldly dough and thus imbuing it with a structure it would not otherwise possess, doesn’t there have to be some worldly dough for them to work on, and mustn’t the basic properties of that dough be determined independently of all this [constructivist] activity. (Boghossian 2006, 35)
There are various answers Constructivists can give to this worry. Goodman, for instance, insists that everything is constructed:
The many stuffs—matter, energy, waves, phenomena—that worlds are made of are made along with the worlds. But made from what? Not from nothing, after all, but from other worlds. Worldmaking as we know it always starts from worlds already on hand; the making is a remaking (Goodman 1978, 6-7)
Goodman’s view may be hard to swallow, but it is not internally inconsistent. Another approach is to argue that although all objects are constructed, there are other types of entities (for example, Sidelle’s nonmodal stuff, Kant’s noumena) which are not constructed. (See also Remhof (2014).)
A fourth incoherence criticism is that Constructivism relies on a notion of unconstructed objects which is itself (at worst) contradictory or (at best) under explained. How cutting a worry this is depends on what a particular version of Constructivism takes to be unconstructed. Kriegel’s Local Constructivism about composite objects, for instance, allows that all mereologically simple objects are unconstructed—such simples provide a rich building base for his constructivism. Similarly, Local Constructivists about artifacts claim that natural objects are unconstructed. They are, that is, Realists about all the objects Realists typically give as paradigms. This, too, provides a rich and uncontroversially non-contradictory building base for their constructed objects. Other views—such as Global Constructivism and Local Constructivism about modal objects—do face a difficulty regarding how to allow unconstructed entities to have enough structure that we can grasp what they are, without claiming they have so much structure that they become constructed entities. Wieland and Elder give voice to this common Realist complaint against Constructivism:
When it comes to [the question of what unconstructed entities are], those who are sympathetic to [Constructivism] are remarkably vague. … The problem [is that constructivists] want to reconcile our freedom of carving with serious, natural constraints. … [The] issue is about the elusive nature of non-perspectival facts in a world full of facts which do depend on our perspective. (Wieland 22)
[Constructivists] are generally quite willing to characterize the world as it exists independently of our exercise of our conceptual scheme. It is simply much stuff, proponents say, across which a play of properties occurs. … But just which properties is it that get instantiated in the world as it mind-independently exists? (Elder 14)
Global Constructivists are quite perplexing when they try to explain how they can construct in the absence of any unconstructed entities to which we have epistemic access. This is a central problem with Global Constructivism and one reason it lacks contemporary adherents. The situation is different with Local Constructivism. Local Constructivists are vocal about the fact that they endorse the existence of unconstructed entities to which we have epistemic access and that such entities play a crucial role in our constructing. (Baker, for example, notes that, “I do not hold that thought and talk alone bring into existence any physical objects … pre-existing materials are also required” (2007 46). Devitt argues that, “Neither designing something to hammer nor using it to hammer is sufficient to make it a hammer … only things of certain physical types could be [hammers]” (1991 248). Einheuser emphasizes that the application of our concepts to stuff is only object creating when our concepts are directed at independently existing stuff which has the right nonmodal properties (Einheuser 2011).) Local Constructivists—even those such as Sidelle who think unconstructed entities have no “deep” modal properties—can provide an account of unconstructed entities which is coherent. There are a variety of ways to do this. (See, for example, Sidelle (1989), Goswick (2015, 2018a, 2018b), Remhof (2014).) Rather than presenting any one of them, there will be a few general points which should enable the reader to understand for herself that Local Constructivists about modal objects can provide a coherent view of unconstructed entities. The easiest way to see this is to note two things: (1) The Local Constructivist about modal objects does not think that every entity which has a modal property is constructed; they only think that objects which have “deep” modal properties are constructed. So, for example, arguments such as the following will not work: Let F denote some property purportedly unconstructed entity e has. Every entity that is actually F is possibly F. So, e is possibly F. Thus, e has a modal property—which contradicts the Local Constructivists’ claim that unconstructed entities do not have modal properties. But, of course, Local Constructivists are happy for unconstructed objects to have a plethora of modal properties, so long as they are “shallow” modal properties. (A “deep” modal property, remember, is any constant de re necessity or de re possibility which is non-trivial. A “shallow” modal property is any modal property which is not “deep.”) (2) Most of us have no trouble understanding Quine when he defines objects as “the material content of a region of spacetime, however heterogeneous or gerrymandered” (Quine 171). But, of course, Quine rejected “deep” modality. The Local Constructivist about modal objects can simply point to Quine’s view and use Quine’s objects as their unconstructed entities. (See Blackson (1992) and Goswick (2018c).)
A final coherence criticism of Constructivism is the claim that Constructivism licenses the construction of incompatible objects, for example, society A constructs object o (which entails the non-existence of object o*), whilst society B constructs object o* (which entails the non-existence of object o). (Suppose, for example, that there are no coinciding objects, so at most one object occupies region r. Then, society A’s constructing a statue (at region r) rules out the existence of a mere-lump (at region r) and society B’s constructing a mere-lump (at region r) rules out the existence of a statue (at region r).) What, then, are we to say with regard to the existence of o and o*? Do both exist, neither, one but not the other? Boghossian puts the worry this way:
[How could] it be the case both that the world is flat (the fact constructed by pre-Aristotelian Greeks) and that it is round (the fact constructed by us)? [Constructivism faces] a problem about how we are to accommodate the possible simultaneous construction of logically incompatible facts. (Boghossian 39-40)
Different versions of Constructivism will have different responses to this worry, but every version is able to give a response that dissolves the worry. Relativists will say that o exits only relative to society A, whereas o* exists only relative to society B. Constructivists who are not relativists will pick some subject to privilege, for example, society A gets to do the constructing, so what they say goes—o exists and o* does not.
Now that Constructivism has been shown to satisfactorily respond to the coherence criticisms, let’s turn to presenting and evaluating the eight main substantive criticisms of Constructivism: (i) If Constructivism were true, then multiple systems of classification would be equally good, but they are not, (ii) Constructivism is under-motivated, (iii) Constructivism is incompatible with naturalism, (iv) Constructivism should be rejected outright because Realism is so obviously true, (v) Constructivism requires constitutive dependence, but really, insofar as objects do depend on us, they depend on us only causally, (vi) Constructivism is not appropriately constrained, (vii) Constructivism is crazy, and (viii) Constructivism conflicts with obvious empirical facts.
Consider, first, the criticism that if Constructivism were true, then multiple systems of classification would be equally good; but they are not, so Constructivism is not true. The main proponent of this criticism is Elder. He expresses the concern in the following way:
If there were something particularly … unobjective about sameness in natural kind, one might expect that we could prosper just as well as we do even if we wielded quite different sortals for nature’s kinds. (Elder 10)
The basic idea is that, as a matter of fact, dividing up the world into rocks and non-rocks works better for us than does dividing up the world into dry-rocks, wet-rocks, and non-rocks: the sortal rock is better than the alternative sortals dry-rock and wet-rock. Why is this? Elder’s explanation is that rock is a natural kind sortal which traces the existence of real objects. Dry-rock and wet-rock do not work as well as rock because there are rocks and there are not dry-rocks and wet-rocks. Since we cannot empirically distinguish between a rock that is (accidentally) dry and an (essentially dry) dry-rock or between a rock that is (accidentally) wet and an (essentially wet) wet-rock, Elder provides no empirical basis for his claim. The Constructivist will point out that she is not arguing that any set of constructed objects is as good as any other. It may very well be the case that rock works better for us than do dry-rock and wet-rock. The Constructivist attributes this to contingent facts about us (for example, our biology and social history) rather than to its being the case that Realism is true of rocks and false of dry-rocks and wet-rocks. Nothing Elder says blocks this way of describing the facts. Pending some argument showing that the only way (or, at least, the best way) we can explain the fact that rock works better for us than do dry-rock and wet-rock is if Realism is true of rocks, Elder has no argument against the Constructivist.
Another argument one sometimes hears is that Constructivism is undermotivated. Global Constructivism is seen as an overly radical metaphysical response to minor semantic and epistemic problems with Realism. (See, for example, Devitt (1997) and Wieland (2012).) How good a criticism this is depends on how minor the semantic and epistemic problems with Realism are and how available a non-metaphysic solution to them is. This issue is not explored further here because this sort of criticism cannot be evaluated in general but must be looked at with regard to each individual view, for example, is Goodman’s Global Constructivism undermotivated, is Sidelle’s Local Constructivism about modal objects undermotivated, is Thomasson’s Local Constructivism about artifacts undermotivated? Whether the criticism is convincing will depend on how well each view does at showing there’s a real problem with Realism and that their own preferred way of resolving the problem is compelling. If Sidelle is really correct that the naturalist/empiricist stance most analytic philosophers embrace in the twenty-first century is incompatible with the existence of ordinary objects with “deep” modal properties, then we should be strongly motivated to seek a non-Realist account of ordinary objects. If Thomasson’s really right that existence is easy and that some terms really are such that anything that satisfies them depends constitutively on humans, then we should be strongly motivated to seek a non-Realist account of the referents of such terms.
Another argument one sometimes hears is that Constructivism is incompatible with the naturalized metaphysics which is in vogue. Most contemporary metaphysicians are heavily influenced by Lewisian naturalized metaphysics: they believe that there is an objective reality, that science has been fairly successful in examining this reality, that the target of metaphysical inquiry is this objective reality, and that our metaphysical theorizing should be in line with what our best science tells us about reality. If Constructivism really is incompatible with naturalized metaphysics it will ipso facto be unattractive to most contemporary metaphysicians. However, although one frequently hears this criticism, upon closer examination it is seen to lack teeth. The crucial issue—with regard to compatibility with naturalistic metaphysics—is whether one’s view is adequately constrained by an independent, objective, open to scientific investigation reality. All versions of Realism are so constrained, so Realism wears its compatibility with naturalistic metaphysics on its sleeve. Not all versions of Constructivism are so constrained, for example, Goodman and Putnam’s Global Constructivisms are not. But it would be overly hasty to throw out all of Constructivism simply because some versions of Constructivism are incompatible with naturalistic metaphysics. Some versions of Constructivism are more compatible with naturalized metaphysics than is Realism. Suppose Ladyman and Ross are correct when they say our best science shows there are no ordinary objects (2007). Suppose Einheuser is correct when she says our best science shows there are no objects with modal properties (2011). Suppose, however, that in daily human life we presuppose (as we seem to) the existence of ordinary objects with modal properties. Then, Local Constructivism about ordinary objects is motivated from within the perspective of naturalistic metaphysics. One’s naturalism prevents one from being a Realist about ordinary objects, that is, because all the subject-independent world contains is ontic structure (if Ladyman and Ross are correct) or nonmodal stuff (if Einheuser is correct). One’s desire to account for human behavior prevents one from being an Eliminativist about ordinary objects. A constructivism which builds ordinary objects out of human responses to ontic structure/nonmodal stuff is the natural position to take. Although some versions of Constructivism (for example, Global Constructivism) may be incompatible with naturalistic metaphysics, there is no argument from naturalized metaphysics against Constructivism per se.
A fourth substantive criticism levied against Constructivism is that it should be rejected outright because Realism is so obviously true:
A certain knee-jerk realism is an unargued presupposition of this book. (Sider 2011, 18)
Realism is much more firmly based than these speculations that are thought to undermine it. We have started the argument in the wrong place: rather than using the speculations as evidence against Realism, we should use Realism as evidence against the speculations. We should “put metaphysics first.” (Devitt 2010, 109)
[Which] organisms and other natural objects there are is entirely independent of our beliefs about the world. If indeed there are trees, this is not because we believe in trees or because we have experiences as of trees. (Korman 92)
For example, facts about mountains, dinosaurs or electrons seem not to be description-dependent. Why should we think otherwise? What mistake in our ordinary, naive realism about the world has the [Constructivist] uncovered? What positive reason is there to take such a prima facie counterintuitive view seriously. (Boghossian 28)
All that the Constructivist can say in response to this criticism—which is not an argument against Constructivism but rather a sharing of the various authors’ inclinations—is that she does not think Realism is so obviously true. She can, perhaps, motivate others to see it as less obviously true by not casting the debate as a global one between choosing whether the stance one wants to adopt toward the world is Global Constructivist or Global Realist, but rather as a more local debate concerning the ontological status of, for example, tables, rocks, money, and dogs. We are no longer playing a global game; one can be an anti-Realist about, for example, money without thereby embracing global anti-Realism.
Another criticism of Constructivism is that Constructivism is only true if objects constitutively depend on us, but really, insofar as objects do depend on us, they depend on us only causally. As this article has defined “Constructivism,” it has room for both causal versions and constitutive versions. (Hacking (1999) and Goswick (2018b) present causal versions of Constructivism. Baker (2007) and Thomasson (2007) present constitutive versions of Constructivism.) One could, instead, define “Constructivism” more narrowly so that it only included constitutive accounts. This would be a mistake. Consider a (purported) causal version of Local Constructivism about modal objects: Jane is a Realist about nonmodal stuff and claims we have epistemic access to it. She thinks that when we respond to rock-appropriate nonmodal stuff s with the rock-response we bring a new object into existence: a rock. Jane does not think that rocks depend constitutively on us—it is not part of what it is to be a rock that we have to F in order for rocks to exist. But we do play a causal role in bringing about the existence of rocks. If there were some modal magic, then rocks could have existed without us (nothing about the nature of rocks bars this from being the case); but there is no modal magic, so all the rocks that exist do causally depend on us. Now consider a (purported) constitutive version of Local Constructivism about modal objects: James is a Realist about nonmodal stuff and claims we have epistemic access to it. He thinks that when we respond to rock-appropriate nonmodal stuff s with the rock-response we bring a new object into existence: a rock. James thinks that rocks depend constitutively on us—it is part of what it is to be a rock that we have to F in order for rocks to exist. Even if there were modal magic, rocks could not have existed without us. Do Jane and James’ views differ to the extent that one of them deserves the label “Constructivist” and the other does not? Their views are very similar—after all they both take rocks to be composite objects which come to exist when we F in circumstances c, that is, they tell the same origin story for rocks. What they differ over is the nature of rocks: is their dependence on us constitutive of what it is to be a rock (as James says) or is it just a feature that all rocks in fact have ( as Jane says). Jane and James’ views are so similar (and the objections that will be levied against them are so similar) that taking both to be versions of the same general view (that is, Constructivism) is more perspicuous than not so doing. More generally, causal constructivism is similar enough to constitutive constructivism that defining “constructivism” in such a way that in excludes the former would be a mistake.
A sixth substantive criticism of Constructivism is that it is not appropriately constrained.
Putnam does talk, in a Kantian way, of the noumenal world and of things-in-themselves [but] he seems ultimately to regard this talk as “nonsense” … This avoids the facile relativism of anything goes by fiat: we simply are constrained, and that’s that. … [But to] say that our construction is constrained by something beyond reach of knowledge or reference is whistling in the dark. (Devitt 1997, 230)
The worry here is that it is not enough just to say “our constructing is constrained”; what does the constraining and how it does so must be explained. Global Constructivists have fared very poorly with regard to this criticism. They (for example, Goodman, Putnam, Schwartz) certainly intend their views to be so constrained. What is less clear, however, is whether they are able to accomplish this aim. They provide no satisfactory account of how, given that we have no epistemic access to them, the unconstructed entities they endorse are able to constrain our constructing. This is a serious mark against Global Constructivism. Local Constructivists fare better in this regard. They place a high premium on our constructing being constrained by the (subject-independent) world and each Local Constructivist is able to explain what constrains constructing on her view and how it does so. Baker, for example, argues that all constructed objects stand in a constitution chain which eventuates in an unconstructed aggregate. These aggregates constrain which artifacts can be in their constitution chains, namely (i) an artifact with function f can only be constituted by an aggregate which contains enough items of suitable structure to enable the proper function of the artifact to be performed, and (ii) an artifact with function f can only be constituted by an aggregate which is such that the items in the aggregate are available for assembly in a way suitable for enabling the proper function of the artifact to be performed (Baker 2007, 53). For another example, consider Einheuser’s explanation of what constrains her Local Constructivism about modal objects: Every (constructed) modal object coincides with some (unconstructed) nonmodal stuff. A modal object of sort s (for example, a rock) can only exist at region r if the nonmodal stuff that occupies region r has the right nonmodal properties (Einheuser 2011). This ensures that, for example, we cannot construct a rock at a region that contains only air molecules.
A seventh substantive criticism of Constructivism is the claim that Constructivism is crazy. Consider,
We should not close our eyes to the fact that Constructivism is prima facie absurd, a truly bizarre doctrine. … How could dinosaurs and stars be dependent on the activities of our minds? It would be crazy to claim that there were no dinosaurs or stars before there were people to think about them. [The claim that] there would not have been dinosaurs or stars if there had not been people (or similar thinkers) seems essential to Constructivism: unless it were so, dinosaurs and stars could not be dependent on us and our minds. [So Constructivism is crazy.] (Devitt 2010, 105 and Devitt 1997, 238)
The idea that we in any way determine whether there are stars and what they are like seems so preposterous, if not incomprehensible, that any thesis that leads to this conclusion must be suspect. … And a forceful, “But people don’t make stars” is often thought to be the simplest way to bring proponents of such metaphysical foolishness back to their senses. For isn’t it obvious that … there were stars long before sentient beings crawled about and longer still before the concept star was thought of or explicitly formulated? (Schwartz 1986, 429 and 427)
The “but Constructivism is crazy” elocution is not a specific argument but is rather an expression of the utterer’s belief that Constructivism has gone wrong in some serious way. Arguments lie behind the “Constructivism is crazy” utterance and the arguments, unlike the emotive outburst, can be diffused. Behind Devitt’s “it’s crazy” utterance is the worry that Constructivism simply gets the existence conditions for natural objects wrong. It is just obvious that dinosaurs and stars existed before any people did and it follows from this that they must be unconstructed objects. There are two ways to respond to this objection: (1) argue that even if humans construct dinosaurs and stars it can still be the case that dinosaurs and stars existed prior to the existence of humans. (For this approach, see Remhof, “If there had been no people there would still have been stars and dinosaurs; there would still have been things that would be constructed by humans were they around” (Remhof 2014, 3); Searle, “From the fact that a description can only be made relative to a set of linguistic categories, it does not follow that the objects described can only exist relative to a set of categories. … Once we have fixed the meaning of terms in our vocabulary by arbitrary definitions, it is no longer a matter of any kind of relativism or arbitrariness whether representation-independent features of the world that satisfy or fail to satisfy the definitions exist independently of those or any other definitions” (Searle 166); and Schwartz, “In the process of fashioning classificatory schemes and theoretical frameworks, we organize our world with a past, as well as a future, and provide for there being objects or states of affairs that predate us. Although these facts may be about distant earlier times, they are themselves retrospective facts, not readymade or build into the eternal order” (Schwartz 1986, 436).) (2) bite the bullet. Agree that—if Constructivism is true —dinosaurs and stars did not exist before there were any people. Diffuse the counter-intuitiveness of this claim by, for example, arguing that, although dinosaurs per se did not exist, entities that were very dinosaur-like did exist. (For this approach, see Goswick (2018b):
The [Constructivist] attempts to mitigate this cost by pointing out that which ordinary object claims are false is systematic and explicable. In particular, we’ll get the existence and persistence conditions of ordinary objects wrong when we confuse the existence/persistence of an s-apt n-entity for the existence/persistence of an ordinary object of sort s. We think dinosaurs existed because we mistake the existence of dinosaur-apt n-entities for the existence of dinosaurs (Goswick 2018b, 58).
Behind Schwartz’s “Constructivism is crazy” utterance is the same worry Devitt has: namely—that Constructivism simply gets the existence conditions for natural objects wrong. It can be diffused in the same way Devitt’s utterance was.
The final substantive criticism of Constructivism to be considered is the claim that Constructivism conflicts with obvious empirical facts.
It is sometimes said, for example, that were it not for the fact that we associated the word “star” with certain criteria of identity, there would be no stars. It seems to me that people who say such things are guilty of [violating well-established empirical facts]. Are we to swallow the claim that there were no stars around before humans arrived on the scene? Even the dimmest student of astronomy will tell you that this is non-sense. (Cortens 45)
This worry has largely been responded to in responding to the previous criticism. However, Cortens makes one point beyond that which Devitt and Schwartz make. Namely, that it is not just our intuitions that tell us stars existed before humans, but also our best science. Any naturalist who endorses Constructivism about stars will be skeptical—that our best science really tells us this. Even the brightest student of astronomy is unlikely to make the distinctions metaphysicians make, for example, between a star and the atoms that compose it. Does the astronomy student really study whether there are stars or only atoms-arranged-starwise? If not, how can she be in a place to tell us whether there where stars before there were humans or whether there were only atoms-arranged-starwise? The distinction between stars and atoms-arranged-starwise is not an empirical one. In general, the issues Constructivists and Realists differ over are not ones that can be resolved empirically. Given this, it is implausible that Constructivism conflicts with obvious empirical facts. It would conflict with an obvious empirical fact (or, at least, with what our best science takes to be the history of our solar system) if, for example, Constructivists denied that there was anything star-like before there were humans. But Constructivists do not do this; rather, they replace the Realists’ pre-human stars with entities which are empirically indistinguishable from stars but which lack some of the metaphysical features (for example, being essentially F) they think an entity must have to be a star.
Having explicated what Constructivism within analytic metaphysics is and what the central criticisms of it are, let’s examine what, all things considered, should be made of Constructivism within analytic metaphysics.
Global Constructivism is no longer a live option within analytic metaphysics. Our understanding of Realism, and our ability to clearly state various versions of it, has expanded dramatically since the 1980s. Realists have found answers to the epistemic and semantic concerns which originally motivated Global Constructivism, so the view is no longer well motivated. (See, for example, Devitt (1997) and Devitt (2010).) Moreover, there are compelling objections to Global Constructivism regarding, in particular, how we can construct entities if we have no epistemic access to any unconstructed entities to construct them from, and what can constrain our constructing, namely, given that we have epistemic access only to the constructed, it appears nothing unconstructed can constrain our constructing.
Local Constructivism fares better for reasons both sociological and philosophical. Sociologically, Local Constructivism has not been around for long and, rather than being one view, it is a whole series of loosely connected views, so it has not yet drawn the sort of detailed criticism that squashed Global Constructivism. Additionally, being a Local Constructivist about x is compatible with being a Realist about y, z, a, b, … (all non-x entities). As such, it is not a global competitor to Realism and has not drawn the Realists’ ire in the way Global Constructivism did. Philosophically, Local Constructivism is also on firmer ground than was Global Constructivism. By endorsing unconstructed entities which we have epistemic access to and which constrain our constructing, Local Constructivists are able to side-step many of the central criticisms which plague Global Constructivism. Local Constructivism looks well poised to provide an intuitive middle ground between a naturalistic Realism (which often unacceptably alters either the existence or the nature of the ordinary objects we take ourselves to know and love) and an overly subjective anti-Realism (which fails to recognize the role the objective world plays in determining our experiences and the insights we can gain from science).
|1781||Kant’s A Critique of Pure Reason distinguishes between noumena and phenomena, thereby laying the groundwork for future work on constructivism|
|1907||James’ Pragmatism: A New Name for Some Old Ways of Thinking defends Global Constructivism|
|1978-1993||Goodman and Putnam publish a series of books and papers defending Global Constructivism|
|1986 and 2000||Schwartz defends Global Constructivism|
|1990||Heller defends an eliminativist view of vague objects, along the way to doing so, he shows how to be a constructivist about vague objects|
|1990s-2000s||Baker, Thomasson, Searle, and Devitt endorse Local Constructivism about artifacts|
|Post 1988||Sidelle, Einheuser, and Goswick argue that objects having “deep” modal properties are constructed|
|2008||Kriegel argues that composite objects are constructed|
|2011||Varzi argues that objects with conventional boundaries are constructed|
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