Conceptual Role Semantics

In the philosophy of language, conceptual role semantics (hereafter CRS) is a theory of what constitutes the meanings possessed by expressions of natural languages, or the propositions expressed by their utterance. In the philosophy of mind, it is a theory of what constitutes the contents of psychological attitudes, such as beliefs or desires.

CRS comes in a variety of forms, not always clearly distinguished by commentators. Such versions are known variously as functional/causal/computational role semantics, and more broadly as use-theories of meaning. Nevertheless, all are united in seeking the meaning or content of an item, not in what it is made of, nor in what accompanies or is associated with it, but in what is done with it, the use it is put to. Roughly, according to CRS, the meaning or propositional content of an expression or attitude is determined by the role it plays in a person’s language or in her cognition.

Currently, many view CRS as the main rival to theories that take notions such as truth or reference as central (for example, Davidson 2001), although the relationship between the two is not straightforward. The following outlines the main varieties of CRS, provides a cursory survey of its history, introduces the central arguments offered in its favor, and provisionally assesses how the variants fair against a number of prominent criticisms.

Table of Contents

  1. Preparing the Ground
    1. A Theory of Linguistic Meaning
    2. A Theory of Content
    3. Normativism and Naturalism
    4. Perception and Action
    5. Language and Mind
    6. Provisional Summary
  2. A Very Brief History
  3. Arguments for CRS
    1. Attributions of Meaning and Understanding
    2. The No Intrinsic Meaning Thesis
    3. The Insufficiency of Causation
    4. The Frege-problem
    5. Methodological Solipsism
  4. Problems for CRS
    1. Holism, Compositionality and Analyticity
    2. Proper Names
    3. Externalism
    4. Truth, Reference and Intentionality
    5. Indeterminacy
    6. Defective Expressions and Conservatism
    7. Circularity
  5. Prospects and Applications
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Preparing the Ground

a. A Theory of Linguistic Meaning

CRS may be first introduced as a theory of meaning. The theory of meaning must be distinguished from a meaning-theory. The former is a philosophical project that seeks to explain what meaning is, or what the meaning possessed by expressions in a natural language consists in. The latter, in contrast, is an empirical project. More specifically, it is a specification of the meaning of each expression in a language. Since a natural language such as English contains a potential infinity of expressions, these specifications must be derived from a finite body of axioms concerning sentence constituents and their modes of combination. CRS is a theory of meaning rather than a meaning-theory, although as such it can and should inform the construction of meaning-theories.

One must also distinguish the meaning of an expression from what is said (the proposition expressed) by its utterance. For example, what is said by the use of ‘I am tired now’ varies according to who employs the expression and when, whereas the meaning remains constant. Arguably, this overt context-dependency in the case of sentences containing indexicals is quite general (see Travis 2000). Hence, the invariant meaning possessed by a sentence is distinct from the truth-evaluable propositional content expressed by its use on a particular occasion, although the former (in combination with contextual factors) determines the latter.

CRS can be profitably viewed as a refinement of the claim that the meaning of an expression is its use (Wittgenstein 1967: §43; cf. Alston 2000; see Wittgenstein, Ludwig). While many philosophers might accept as platitudinous that, in some sense, an expression means what it does because of how it is employed, what is here distinctive is the claim that its having a meaning is its having a use. So stated, however, the view suffers from a number of objections. Many things have a ‘use’ (for example, hammers) but no meaning. More seriously, there are linguistic expressions with a use but no meaning, such as ‘um’ or ‘abracadabra’. Likewise, there can be differences in use without differences in meaning. For example, where and by whom a word is used can vary while meaning remains constant (see Glock 1996; Lycan 2000: 94ff; Rundle 2001: 100-1; Whiting 2007b).

One response to such criticisms is to identify more narrowly the specific kind of use that is supposed to be constitutive of meaning. According to CRS, it is use in inference. Roughly, it claims that to understand an expression is to be prepared to make certain inferential transitions. Accordingly, the meaning of the expression is its inferential role. If one were to enumerate all the transitions an expression is involved in, one would thereby give its meaning. So, to take a simplified example, to grasp the meaning of ‘brother’ is to be prepared to make linguistic moves of the following kind:

x is a male sibling” → “x is a brother”

x is a brother” → “x has parents”

Note that it is somewhat misleading to call the above ‘inferential’ transitions, since properly-speaking inferential relations hold between propositions not sentences. Nevertheless, the basic idea remains the same once qualified. One might say that the invariant meaning an expression possesses is its inferential potential, that is, its usability by speakers to make certain inferential transitions.

Note also that it is sentences that in the first instance can properly be said to have inferential significance, since ordinarily it is only by uttering a sentence that one make a claim from which other claims might be said to follow. Hence, for CRS, it is sentences that are the primary bearers of meaning. Nonetheless, a proponent of CRS can still speak of the meaning of a word as its stable contribution to the inferential potential of sentences or, more abstractly, as the set of inferential roles of sentences in which it occurs.

b. A Theory of Content

CRS extends straightforwardly to a theory of the propositional content expressed by the use of an expression. According to it, to know what is said by an utterance is to know, given the context, what the grounds for making the utterance are, and which further utterances are thereby in order. For an utterance to express such content just is for speakers to perform, and respond to performances, in a characteristic way. The proposition expressed is determined by the inferential network the utterance is caught up in, the linguistic moves that lead to and from it.

CRS simultaneously provides a theory of what constitutes mental content. So-called psychological attitudes, such as beliefs, desires and fears, appear to have two components: an attitude—believing, desiring, fearing and so on—and a content—that which is believed, desired, feared and so on. One can hold the same attitude toward different contents, and different attitudes toward the same content. According to CRS, for an attitude to have as its content a particular proposition just is for it to play a particular role in cognition, and to grasp that conceptual content is to be prepared to make certain inferential transitions. So, to take another simplified example, to possess the concept vixen, or to have thoughts involving it, is to be prepared to make moves conforming to the following pattern:

x is a female fox → x is a vixen

x is a vixen → x is a mammal

c. Normativism and Naturalism

So far, this survey has talked neutrally of subjects being ‘prepared’ to make inferences. But how exactly should this be understood? On this issue, there is a broad division among theorists between what one might label naturalists (for example, Block 1986; Field 1977; Harman 1999; Horwich 1998; 2005; Loar 1981; Peacocke 1992) and normativists (for example, Brandom 1994; von Savigny 1988; Skorupski 1997; Travis 2000). Exploring this distinction will simultaneously address another matter. One might have qualms about CRS as outlined above, since the notion of inference is itself semantic. Surely, one might complain, philosophy requires that a theory of meaning provide a more illuminating explanation of what constitutes meaning or content. Through outlining the naturalist and normativist positions, one can see in each case how their proponents seek to capture the notion of an inferential role in more fundamental terms.

According to normativists, content or meaning is constituted by those transitions one ought to or may (not) make, and to grasp that content or meaning is to grasp the propriety of those moves. While many philosophers recognise that what an expression means, for example, has normative implications, what is distinctive of the normativist view is that such norms do not merely follow from but are rather determinative of its meaning. Hence, such a theory typically takes as basic a primitive normative notion, with which to explain semantic notions. That said, one need not take the existence of such norms to be inexplicable; one might instead view them as instituted in some way, perhaps behaviorally or socially.

An issue on which normativists are divided is whether the existence of such proprieties requires the existence of rules. If the issue is not to be purely terminological, it presumably turns on whether the relevant standards of usage stem from generalisations or from particular considerations, and on whether to qualify as such, rules must always be explicitly formulated. (For a defence of the appeal to rules, see Glock 2005. For resistance, see Boghossian 1989; Brandom 1994: ch. 1; Dancy 2004: ch. 13.)

Naturalists in turn divide into two camps (although, it is fair to say, they are typically not distinguished). According to regularists, meaning or content is determined by those behavioral or psychological transitions a person regularly or generally makes. According to dispositionalists, in contrast, meaning or content is determined by those transitions a person is disposed in certain actual and counterfactual circumstances to make. On such accounts, the notion of inferential role gives way to that of causal or computational role.

d. Perception and Action

In addition, one can distinguish the more liberal CRS from the more restricted inferential role semantics (IRS) (sometimes referred to as ‘long-’ and ‘short-armed’ respectively). According to the latter, meaning or content is determined by intra-linguistic transitions only. According to the former, meaning or content is partially constituted by the tokenings of a concept or expression that result from perceptual experience, and the action such tokenings elicit. That is to say, extra-linguistic transitions—which Sellars (2007: 36) dubs ‘language-entry’ and ‘language-departure’ moves—contribute to the determination of meaning or content (cf. Harman 1999; McCulloch 1995).

e. Language and Mind

A final preliminary matter concerns the relative priority of (public) language and mind. Some philosophers hold that CRS provides, in the first instance, a theory of mental content, viewed as independent of its public expression, and only derivatively extended to linguistic content and meaning. On this view, the semantics of language is parasitic upon the semantics of mental states (for example, Loar 1981; Peacocke 1992). Typically, the connection between the two is thought to be effected by various Gricean mechanisms (1989). Crudely, on this picture, speakers intend to communicate their thoughts to one another, and over time such thoughts are conventionally correlated with particular linguistic expressions.

Alternatively, one might take mastery of a public language to be prior to possession of psychological attitudes and view mental content as derivative (for example, Sellars 1997), or hold that the two develop in unison (for example, Brandom 1994; Harman 1999; Horwich 2005). One reason for rejecting the priority of mind over language is that there is arguably no substance in attributing beliefs to a creature incapable in principle of manifesting them, and only linguistic behavior is sufficiently fine-grained for this task.

f. Provisional Summary

By now it should be clear that, when investigating or propounding CRS, one must keep in view a number of issues:

1. Is it a theory of meaning or propositional content?

2. Is it normativist or naturalist?

i. If normativist, are the norms in the forms of rules?

ii. If naturalist, is it regularist or a dispositionalist?

3. Does it incorporate language-entry and language-exit moves?

4. Is the mind prior to language or vice versa?

In many cases, which objections to CRS are relevant or effective will depend on how these questions are answered.

2. A Very Brief History

Although this is not an exegetical essay, it is worth noting that CRS has a distinguished history. Arguably, it goes back at least as far as Kant, if not further (Brandom 2002). Uncontroversially, however, it can be traced to Wittgenstein’s dictum that

the meaning of a word is its use in the language. (1967: §43)


The use of the word in practice is its meaning. (1969: 69)

This putative insight was endorsed by, and in turn influenced the methods of, Oxford philosophers such as Ryle (1968) and Strawson (2004: 7).

Perhaps unsurprisingly, given the influence of Wittgenstein, there are clear affinities between CRS and verificationism, according to which for an expression to have a meaning is for it to possess evidential conditions that warrant its application (Ayer 1959; Dummett 1991; 1996; Waismann 1968: 36). The shared idea is that the meaning of an expression, or the content it expresses, is given in part by what justifies and what are the implications of its employment.

One can also note similarities between CRS and the structuralist and phenomenological traditions. Saussure, for example, held that the meaning of a sign is determined by its role within a system of signs, its structural relations to other signs (1983). And according to Heidegger, for an expression to have a certain significance is for it to occupy a role within a network of linguistic and non-linguistic practices and, more specifically, for it to be subject to proprieties of usage (1962: 203ff).

Arguably, however, it was Sellars (2007: pt. 1) who first explicitly placed the notion of inference at the centre of the theory of meaning, and advocated the first systematic and unmistakable version of CRS.

Having precedent, no matter how distinguished, is of course no guarantee of correctness. So as to place us in a position to evaluate CRS, the next section outlines a number of prominent arguments in its favor, and the following introduces a number of prominent objections.

3. Arguments for CRS

a. Attributions of Meaning and Understanding

Reflection on our ordinary practices of attributing both meaning and understanding lend support to CRS (Horwich 1998: 48-9; Wittgenstein 1969: 102-3). One would typically say of a word in a foreign language that it has the same meaning as one in English if it has the same role. And if a word has no discernible use, one would be reluctant to attribute it meaning. Correlatively, if a person is able to use a word correctly, and respond to its employment appropriately, one would usually claim that she understands it. All of these observations suggest that the meaning of an expression is its role within a language.

Similar results are obtained by reflecting on everyday explanations of the meaning of an expression. This can take a number of forms, including exhibiting a familiar expression that plays a similar role, indicating the circumstances or grounds for introducing the expression, or noting what follows from its introduction. This likewise indicates that the expression’s meaning is given by its linguistic role.

b. The No Intrinsic Meaning Thesis

A different route to CRS is via the ‘no intrinsic meaning’ thesis (Skorupski 1997). It begins with the observation that a sign, considered in itself, is a mere noise or ink-mark, and as such, surely lacks any intrinsic meaning. That same noise or mark could have had a different meaning altogether, or none at all. One might be tempted to think that what ‘animates’ it is some entity to which it is (somehow) related, perhaps an image in the mind or abstract object.

However, this appears only to push the explanation back a stage, since one now needs to know in virtue of what these entities have the significance that they do. What an expression means has consequences for how it is to be employed on an indefinite number of occasions. Hence, one requires an account of how the mental or abstract entity could have such consequences when the mere noise or mark could not. As Wittgenstein remarks,

whatever accompanied [the sign] would for us just be another sign. (1969: 5)

Once one feels the force of the no intrinsic meaning thesis, one might be tempted by CRS. This view has the advantage of not positing any further entity that accompanies or is associated with an expression to act as an unexplained explainer, but instead looks to how the word is employed to account for its significance, specifically its role in inference.

c. The Insufficiency of Causation

Another motivation for endorsing CRS is through contrasting it with a competitor, one which also accepts the no intrinsic meaning thesis. According to it, the meaning or content of an item is determined by that which typically causes its tokenings (Dretske 1981; Fodor 1990). (This is no doubt crude but sufficient for present purposes.) Even if such a differential response to environing stimuli were necessary to grasp certain meanings or possess certain concepts, it cannot be sufficient (Brandom 1994; Harman 1999: 211; Sellars 1997). To put it vividly, it would not distinguish one who genuinely possesses understanding from a thermostat! Surely, in order properly to grasp the concept red, say, one must not only be able to respond differentially to red things, but in addition know that if something is red then it is not blue, or that if it is red it is colored, and so on. Hence, these entailments and incompatibilities, that is, these inferential connections, seem to be determinative of the relevant concept. And to accept that is to accept CRS.

d. The Frege-problem

Diagnosis of what is often labelled the ‘Frege-problem’ likewise speaks in favor of CRS (Frege 1997; see Frege and Language and Frege, Gottlob). A prominent and intuitive view is that for an expression to have a meaning is for it to refer to something. However, two expressions can refer to the same thing, for example, ‘table salt’ and ‘sodium chloride’, and yet one acquainted with both expressions could rationally adopt conflicting attitudes towards sentences containing them. One might accept:

(1) Table salt dissolves.

but not:

(2) Sodium chloride dissolves.

It seems, therefore, that a term’s ‘cognitive significance’ cannot reside solely in its having a reference.

CRS is consonant with this observation. According to it, what distinguishes co-referring (or co-extensive) terms is precisely their cognitive role, or the inferential networks they are involved in.

e. Methodological Solipsism

A final, and more controversial, reason to endorse IRS (rather than CRS) is to respect ‘methodological solipsism’ (see Lepore 1994). Methodological solipsism requires that mental content properly so-called supervene upon a person’s internal physical and functional make-up considered in isolation from her physical and social environment, by ‘what is in her head’. This is in part intended to respect the conviction that mental states are causes of behavior, and that such causes must be proximal rather than distal, and is presumed indispensable for the ability to make generalisations about subjects’ behavior.

If, as IRS holds, the content of a mental state is determined by its cognitive role, where this cognitive role is specified without reference to the person’s physical or social environment, then the requirements imposed by methodological solipsism are satisfied.

4. Problems for CRS

Despite the number of factors that seem to point to CRS, it faces a number of potential problems. The remainder outlines those difficulties and suggests various possible responses one might offer on its behalf. These issues not only pose a challenge for CRS, but also serve to bring into view the respective strengths and weaknesses of the various forms it might take.

a. Holism, Compositionality and Analyticity

CRS is evidently a holistic view of meaning or content. Since an expression’s meaning is possessed in virtue of the inferential relations it stands in to other expressions, it follows that an expression cannot have meaning on its own. This might seem innocuous, but it leads swiftly to seemingly grave problems.

What one takes the inferential significance of an expression to be depends on what beliefs one has. Therefore, since no two speakers share the same beliefs, they will inevitably be disposed to make, or treat as correct, different inferential transitions involving an expression. Hence, according to CRS, the same word in different mouths will possess a different meaning and be understood in different ways. It seems to follow that communication is impossible. Relatedly, since a particular speaker’s beliefs are constantly changing, at different times she will inevitably be disposed to make, or treat as correct, different inferential transitions involving an expression. Hence, according to CRS, the same word in the same mouth will possess a different meaning and be understood differently at different times. It seems to follow that constancy of meaning is impossible.

One possible response to this is to reject the need for CRS to incorporate shareable, constant meaning, and hold instead that what is required is only sufficiently similar understanding of an expression (Block 1995; Harman 1993). But this is hard to stomach. It seems a mere platitude, and is arguably definitive of the relevant notions, that two speakers can understand one another or say the same thing, that terms in different vocabularies might be synonymous, and so on. One requires a better reason for rejecting such trivialities than the fact that they are hard to accommodate in one’s preferred theory of meaning.

In any event, rather than offering an alternative, the above suggestion simply takes for granted the possibility of shared concepts or mutual understanding of the corresponding expressions (see Fodor and Lepore 1992: 17-22; for further discussion, see Pagin 2006). Consider how one might ascertain similar understandings. Presumably one would need to enumerate the various inferences that any two subjects are prepared to make. Their understanding is alike in so far as they are prepared to make a sufficient number of the same inferences. But what is to count as the same inference? Surely those that contain identical concepts.

Related to the communication and constancy problems are difficulties concerning the phenomena of productivity—the fact that competent speakers of a language are able to produce and understand a potential infinity of novel sentences—and systematicity—the fact that if a speaker understands an expression that expresses a proposition of the form aRb, then typically she will also understand one that expresses a proposition of the form bRa. The best explanation of both is that meanings are compositional. The meanings of the potentially infinite complex expression in a language are a function of the meanings of their parts, which constitute a finite vocabulary.

Therein lies the apparent difficulty for CRS, since inferential roles are not usually compositional (Fodor and Lepore 1992; Lepore 1994). The inferential role of ‘Cars pollute’, for example, is not determined by the meanings of ‘cars’ and ‘pollute’ alone, but in part by auxiliary information.

Proponents and critics alike typically accept that for CRS to avoid all of the above problems it requires some kind of analytic/synthetic distinction (Boghossian 1994; 1997; Fodor and Lepore 1992; Horwich 1998; Lepore 1994; Loewer 1997: 120-1). That is, a distinction in kind between those transitions that are determinative of meaning or content and those that are not. This would provide something constant—an invariant significance—that could be grasped despite differences in belief. And, moreover, it respects compositionality, since the meaning of a complex expression is fixed only by its role in analytic inferences, and that is determined by the meanings of its parts.

Where proponents and critics differ is over whether any such distinction can and should be drawn. Some suggest that it would be circular to appeal to the notion of analyticity in an analysis of meaning, since ‘analytic’ just means true/valid in virtue of meaning (Fodor and Lepore 1992; Lepore 1994; cf. Quine 1980: ch. 2). But clearly the advocate of CRS need not specify the analytic inferences using that very description, but might rather seek to do so in more basic terms (Boghossian 1994; Horwich 1998; 2005; cf. Block 1993: 64). Alternatively, one might challenge the requirement of reductionism. CRS might serve to illuminate the nature and role of semantic notions without appealing only to independently intelligible notions.

Nonetheless, since Quine’s ‘Two Dogmas of Empiricism’ (1980: ch. 2), many consider the notion of analyticity to be spurious (see The Classical Theory of Concepts). Therefore, if CRS requires an analytic/synthetic distinction, however specified, so much the worse for it.

Crucially, however, Quine’s target is a conception of analyticity according to which analytic statements possess no experiential implications or factual content whatsoever. In virtue of this, they owe their truth-value to meaning alone, and thereby provide a priori knowledge. With this target in view, Quine argues that no statement is immune from revision in the light of empirical data, and so no statement is such that it possesses no factual content whatsoever, is true in virtue of meaning alone, or knowable a priori. Therefore, there is no such thing as analyticity.

Note, however, that to grant Quine undermines one conception of the analytic/synthetic distinction is not to concede that he shows it to be bogus as such. A notion of analyticity might be available that respects the obviously fluctuating status of those statements considered determinative of meaning, and does not involve such notions as truth/validity in virtue of meaning, or a priori knowledge, or, if it does, admits only watered-down versions. There is something of a resurgence of work in this area and scepticism at this stage would be precipitate (see Boghossian 1997; 2003; Glock 2003: ch. 3; Horwich 2005: 38-9; Lance and Hawthorne 1997).

Additionally, a quick argument is available to show that any account of meaning must recognise some version of the analytic/synthetic distinction (Boghossian 1997; cf. Glock 2003: 93-5; Grice and Strawson 1989). Certain putatively analytic statements—that is, statements that might license analytically valid inferences—are such that they can be turned into logical truths by replacing synonyms with synonyms. For example:

(3) All bachelors are unmarried men.

is equivalent to:

(3’) All unmarried men are unmarried men.

So, to say that there are no facts as to whether such statements are analytic is just to say that there are no facts about synonymy. From this it surely follows that there are no facts about meaning, which is a conclusion few would accept whether they wish to defend CRS or an alternative. Thus, the mere fact that CRS requires certain inferential transitions to be privileged as analytic cannot be thought a devastating problem peculiar only to it. All (realist) theories of meaning are in the same boat.

b. Proper Names

Certain specific kinds of expression pose a potential problem for CRS. One in particular is proper names, such as ‘Kelly’ or ‘O Brother! Where Art Thou?’ According to one very influential view, proper names have no meaning. Nevertheless, they certainly have a use and play a role in cognition and language. Therefore, CRS must be rejected (Lycan 2000: 94; Rundle 2001: 101).

One response is to insist that proper names do indeed have meaning (Baker and Hacker 2004; Horwich 1998: 88-9, 124ff). But this seems strange. One does not find them in the dictionary, and the question ‘What does “David” mean?’ sounds confused. A more promising strategy is to offer an explanation—consonant with CRS—as to why proper names do not possess meaning, despite having a usage. That is, to show that although they have a role it is not of the right kind. To do so, I shall examine Kripke’s arguments for the view that proper names ‘directly refer’.

Kripke (1980) convincingly shows that there are no descriptions that warrant (a priori) the introduction of a proper name, and the latter’s use alone does not license the transition to any such description. Consider, for example, ‘Aristotle’ and the following:

the greatest pupil of Plato

the author of De Anima

the most famous teacher of Alexander the Great

As a matter of fact, one is warranted in replacing any of the above descriptions with ‘Aristotle’. Thus, the transition from ‘This was written by the greatest pupil of Plato’ to ‘This was written by Aristotle’ is correct. But in principle one could be unprepared to make such a transition without failing to understand ‘Aristotle’. One could revise which transitions one takes to be correct, and the term would still designate the same individual. Hence, there is no essential relation between ‘Aristotle’ and the above descriptions. This is supposed to generalise to cover any possible set of descriptions and associated proper names.

These observations point toward a distinguishing feature of proper names. They simply lack the kind of intra-linguistic role that bestows meaning on other expressions; they really just function as labels or proxies for their bearers. There are no transitions involving a proper name that one who masters it must be prepared to make. So, rather than count against CRS, one can precisely explain why proper names lack meaning by pointing out that they lack the relevant established usage, or inferential role, that is distinctive of meaningful expressions.

c. Externalism

This section temporarily focuses on IRS and the difficulty externalism seems to pose for it. According to externalism, meaning and content are determined by environmental, that is, extra-linguistic, factors. This is in manifest tension with IRS, according to which meaning and content are determined by intra-linguistic relations alone.

Different versions of externalism emphasise different environmental factors. According to ‘social’ externalism (Burge 1979), the content of a person’s claim or thought is determined in part by the linguistic community to which she belongs (so long as she is suitably deferent to the ‘experts’). What a person says, for example, in uttering ‘I have arthritis’ (and so whether what she says is true or false) is fixed by how her medical community employ ‘arthritis’. While this form of externalism is evidently in tension with methodological solipsism, it is not in tension with IRS per se. On this account, the meaning of a term is still its inferential significance, but that significance is fixed communally not individually.

It is ‘physical’ externalism that is typically thought to pose problems for IRS (Lepore 1994: 197-8; Lycan 2000: 93; McGinn 1982; Putnam 1991: 46ff). Imagine that Sally on Earth has a twin on Twin Earth. The term ‘water’ plays just the same role in the language of Sally and Twin Sally. Both, for example, would make the transition from ‘That is the colorless, odorless liquid in lakes and rivers’ to ‘That is water’, and vice versa. Nevertheless, the colorless odorless liquid on Earth consists of H2O, whereas on Twin Earth it consists of XYZ. Hence, the referent of ‘water’ is different on each planet, and insofar as meaning determines reference, the meaning likewise differs (Putnam 1975). Therefore, linguistic role alone does not determine meaning. This point is supposed to generalise to hold for propositional content too. Since intuitions about thought-experiments of this kind appear strongly to support externalism, it would seem IRS must be false.

One response to such cases regarding mental content is to postulate ‘narrow content’, to be explained by IRS. Narrow content has a cognitive role but it does not have truth-conditions and its constituents do not refer (Block 1986; Fodor 1990; McGinn 1982). ‘Wide content’ involving truth-conditions and reference-relations is then viewed as a mere device for attributing (narrow) thoughts to subjects, or some additional (perhaps causal) theory is wheeled in to explain how it attaches to the relevant item or state. Crucially, on such ‘two-factor’ accounts, only narrow content is genuinely, cognitively ‘real’ (since only it respects methodological solipsism).

Alternatively, one might reject Putnam’s assumption that meaning determines reference. On this account, ‘water’ would be treated as equivalent to ‘the colorless, odorless liquid in our lakes and rivers’. Since this involves an indexical, it combines the externalist intuition that the reference varies across worlds, with the view compatible with IRS that its meaning is not determined by the physical environment. The expression’s role is constant across on Earth and Twin Earth (Horwich 2005: ch. 1; Putnam 1975: 229ff).

While this might work for linguistic meaning, it is less clear that the same account can be given for mental content. The worry with this strategy is that it looks like what it offers is content in name only (McCulloch 1995). Surely thoughts (unlike meanings) are essentially truth-evaluable, and typically concern extra-mental reality. Such features play a crucial part in their role in psychological explanation. To divorce in this way the contents of beliefs, desires and thoughts from their objects is deeply unpalatable. This objection applies equally to the two-factor strategy mentioned above of postulating narrow content.

A different tact is to adopt CRS rather than IRS (Harman 1999; McCulloch 1995). On this view, since perception of distal objects and action on those objects contributes to individuating cognitive roles, one can indeed distinguish the roles of ‘water’ on Earth and Twin Earth (even if subjectively things appear just the same to Sally and her twin).

A concern with this suggestion is that it threatens to divorce the notions of meaning and content from those of understanding and grasp of content. According to it, the meaning of ‘water’, for example, is partially determined by the micro-physical constitution of water, even if a subject is utterly unaware of it. Hence, it apparently follows that she is ignorant of what she says and thinks in employing that expression or the corresponding concept. Insofar as this leaves a subject unable to distinguish the contents of her thoughts, one would expect this to have devastating consequences for her ability to reason.

That externalism in general makes problematic knowledge of one’s own mind is widely-recognised (see Brown 2004), but it seems especially acute in the case of CRS. There will inevitably be a disparity between a concept’s role as individuated by the physical environment and its role in a subject’s cognition, and insofar as they cannot be reconciled, it is hard to imagine how a particular role (hence content) could be assigned to the concept. Perhaps this problem facing CRS can be resolved, but prima facie an alternative response to externalism is preferable.

The above are conciliatory strategies, which accept the externalist’s claim and seek a theory of meaning to accommodate it. An altogether different approach is to reject the externalist intuitions and insist that Sally and Twin Sally mean the same thing by ‘water’, say colorless, odorless liquid, and so both think thoughts that are true of colorless, odorless liquid (whether H2O or XYZ). This is supported by the observation that both subjects would behave, explain their terms and react to their use in identical ways. Perhaps if deferential relations are taken into consideration, one might be able to point to relevant differences that would indicate semantic differences, but this only pushes us toward social rather than physical externalism, and the former has already been shown to be compatible with IRS.

Different strategies for responding to externalism have been considered, and the issue remains unresolved. Nevertheless, there is reason to be confident that intuitions about Twin-Earth style cases do not present insuperable problems for CRS, and especially IRS.

d. Truth, Reference and Intentionality

This discussion points towards a further potential difficulty for CRS (Loewer 1997; Putnam 1978), one which is sometimes treated simultaneously. Thoughts and statements are ‘about’ the world; they possess intentionality. And what they are about is determined by their content. However, according to CRS, content consists primarily in word-word relations (exclusively in some instances), whereas intentionality is on the face of it a word-world relation.

This issue can be reformulated in terms of truth and reference. Statements and thoughts are true or false, depending on how matters stand in the world, and those statements refer to objects and events in that world. How, one might ask, can CRS explain the evident conceptual links between meaning, truth and reference? What is required, surely, is a theory according to which for something to have meaning is for it to stand in some relation to extra-linguistic reality, from which one derives its truth-conditions and reference. (For the remainder, I shall focus on truth. The relevant points can easily be extended to reference, or being true of.)

This assumption, however, takes for granted a conception of truth according to which it consists in some substantial, non-semantic relation between an item and the world. According to deflationism, in contrast, the notion of truth does not pick out any such relation (see Horwich 1990; 1998). Rather, its content is exhausted by the schema:

(T) The proposition that p is true if and only if p

To grasp the notion of truth is to be disposed to accept, or grasp the propriety of, statements of that form. No deeper account of truth is needed or available. On this view, the reason for having an expression such as ‘is true’ in a language is solely to enable us to make generalisations such as ‘Everything the Pope says is true’.

If the deflationary theory is correct then, since truth does not consist in a non-semantic word-world relation, there is no reason to expect or demand a theory that shows possessing meaning or content to consist in such a relation either. A statement of the truth-conditions of a sentence can be derived trivially from a statement of the content it expresses.

More generally, if correct, the outcome of deflationism is that the notion of truth cannot play a fundamental explanatory role in the theory of meaning, as is commonly assumed, since it is to be explained via an antecedently intelligible notion of proposition (or meaning). Crucially, CRS need not deny the platitude that to grasp the content of an attitude or utterance is to grasp its truth-conditions, but instead can be seen as giving a theoretical account of what it is to possess such truth-conditions (Field 1994; Harman 1999: 195).

There is obviously much more to be said for and against deflationism (see Truth). But what should be clear is that it complements CRS and (if successful) shows it to be compatible with the obvious conceptual links between the notions of meaning and content on the one hand and truth and reference on the other.

e. Indeterminacy

This section explores again the views of Kripke, who, on supposed behalf of Wittgenstein, presents several notorious arguments against regularist and dispositionalist theories of meaning (1982). If his arguments succeed, those versions of CRS must be abandoned. (Quine reaches similar conclusions (see 1993).)

The problem with regularism, according to Kripke’s Wittgenstein (1982: 7), is that the actual use of an expression is consistent with an indefinite number of semantic interpretations. A stretch of behavior is only finite, whereas what a word means has consequences for its use on an indefinite number of occasions. For example, that a person to date has uttered ‘blue’ in response to all and only blue things does not determine that by ‘blue’ she means blue, since that behavior is consistent with its meaning ‘blue until 2146AD and green thereafter.’ Thus, regularities of employment leave meaning indeterminate.

Such observations might lead one to dispositionalism. The apparent advantage here is that it includes facts about what speakers would say in an indefinite number of counterfactual circumstances, and thereby promises to rule out gerrymandered interpretations. For example, if a person would assent to an utterance of ‘blue’ in the presence of blue after 2146AD, then by ‘blue’ she means what we mean and not ‘blue until 2146AD and green thereafter.’

Nevertheless, Kripke’s Wittgenstein points out, focus on dispositions fails to exclude deviant interpretations. The fact that a person utters ‘blue’ in the presence of blue after 2146AD does not determine that the expression means blue, since she might be making a mistake and using the expression incorrectly, that is, in a way that conflicts with its meaning. This in turn points to Kripke’s fundamental claim—dispositionalism fails because it does not accommodate the intrinsically normative nature of meaning. What an expression means is a matter of how it ought to or may (not) be used. If one understands an expression, one knows not simply how it is as a matter of fact employed but how it should be. Hence, for an expression to have a meaning cannot be merely for a subject to be disposed to employ it in certain circumstances, since a speaker’s disposition only fixes for what she would do, not what she should.

Several philosophers take this to show that the relevant use constitutive of meaning must be specified using wholly semantic, intentional or normative concepts (Boghossian 1989; Brandom 1994: ch. 1; McDowell 1998: chs. 11-2; Stroud 2002), that is, to favor normativism. If the relevant behavior is described in the first instance in normative terms, that is, as according or failing to accord with a certain standard, then it would seem that the gap between it and the relevant pattern picked out by the semantic interpretation is closed. Alternatively, a dispositionalist or regularist might challenge the claim that dispositions and regularities of use leave meaning indeterminate, perhaps by rejecting the suggestion that meaning is an essentially normative dimension (for discussion, see Hattiangadi 2007; Horwich 1998; 2005; Miller 2007: ch. 5). It is fair to say that the issue of how exactly to respond to Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s challenge is very much a live one.

f. Defective Expressions and Conservatism

Prior (1960) objects to CRS on the following grounds. Given IRS, one could presumably provide a meaning for a connective ‘tonk’ by stipulating that it is to be employed according to the following rules:

Tonk-introduction: p

p tonk q

Tonk-elimination: p tonk q


Evidently, by following these rules for the use of ‘tonk’, one could infer any claim from any other claim. Prior took this to be a reductio ad absurdum of IRS. One cannot give an expression a genuine meaning simply be stipulating that it is to be employed in inference in a certain way. As Belnap diagnoses the complaint, a ‘possible moral to draw from this’ is that one ‘must first […] have a notion of what [an expression] means, independently of the role it plays as premise or conclusion’ (1962: 130). That is, the example seems to show that it is in virtue of having an antecedent grasp of an expression’s meaning that one can make judgments as to its inferential significance. Hence, the latter cannot be constitutive of the former.

The traditional response on behalf of CRS is to maintain that the relevant expression does not have a genuine meaning, since the introduction of ‘tonk’ does not constitute a conservative extension of the language (Belnap 1962; see also Dummett 1973: 397; 1991). An extension of the language is conservative if and only if one cannot use the new vocabulary to derive any statements in the original vocabulary that could not already be derived using the original vocabulary. More informally, the problem is that non-conservative rules for the use of an expression clash with the meanings of existing expressions or, rather, the rules governing their employment. The novel rules ‘clash’ in the sense that, when added to the established rules, they lead to contradiction. As a result, the extended language is inconsistent.

This is evident in the case of ‘tonk’. Were one to employ the connective according to the above rules, one could derive any statement in our tonk-free vocabulary from any other statement in that vocabulary. Suppose, for example, that one accepts ‘Grass is green’. According to tonk-introduction, from that sentence, ‘Grass is green tonk it is not the case that grass is green’ follows. From this, in turn, according to tonk-elimination, ‘Grass is not green’ follows, which manifestly contradicts the original sentence from which it was derived. In such a way, assuming the meanings or rules for the use of the other expressions remain constant, the tonk-rules lead immediately and without auxiliary premises to contradiction; their introduction to the language renders it inconsistent.

The constraints imposed by conservatism proscribe the fraudulent connective ‘tonk’ by ruling out the introduction of non-conservative rules of the kind that would generate inconsistency in the manner outlined above. In doing so, they guarantee that there is no defective meaning possessed by ‘tonk’ and so no counter-example to CRS.

According to Prior, CRS allows one to introduce into a language obviously defective expressions. According to a recent twist on this objection, our language obviously contains certain defective expressions and CRS is unable to explain how (see Williamson 2003; cf. Hornsby 2001; cp. Whiting 2007a; 2008). Pejorative terms like ‘Boche’ provide vivid examples. A proponent of CRS might, following Dummett (1973), hold that to grasp the meaning possessed by ‘Boche’ is to infer according to rules such as:

Boche-introduction: x is German

x is Boche

Boche-elimination: x is Boche

x is cruel

As Williamson says (although he does not accept this evaluation), one might regard the above account as providing CRS ‘with a positive success by elegantly explaining in inferentialist terms what is wrong with pejorative expressions’. Unfortunately, however, it instead leads immediately to the following problem.

Since most speakers (including you and I) are simply not disposed to infer according to rules such as Boche-introduction and Boche-elimination and do not consider it proper to do so, it appears to follow (given CRS) that those speakers do not understand the term ‘Boche’ or grasp its meaning. This is, of course, implausible. As Williamson glibly says, ‘We find racist and xenophobic abuse offensive because we understand it, not because we fail to do so’ (2003: 257). Pejorative terms, then, appear to provide a counter-example to CRS. An expression can possess a certain meaning without speakers being prepared to make the relevant inferences involving it; its inferential role is therefore not constitutive of its meaning. It is in virtue of having an antecedent grasp of meaning that one can make judgments as to the inferential significance of an expression.

A possible solution to this problem runs parallel to Belnap’s reply to Prior. One might reject the Boche-introduction and Boche-elimination rules on the grounds that they are non-conservative. They allow one to make without the aid of collateral information the transition from, for example, ‘Merkel is German’ to ‘Merkel is cruel’, when one could not do so in the ‘Boche’-free language. More informally, Boche-introduction and Boche-elimination clash with the rules governing the employment of existing terms, in the sense that supplementing them with the Boche-rules leads to contradiction, rendering the extended language inconsistent. Suppose, for example, that Merkel was born in Germany and does not cause suffering with disregard. On this basis—given what one may assume to be among the established inferential rules for the employment of ‘German’ and ‘cruel’—one infers ‘Merkel is German and is not cruel’. However, by following Boche-introduction one may make the transition to ‘Merkel is Boche and is not cruel’, and in turn Boche-elimination allows one to infer ‘Merkel is cruel and is not cruel’. Hence, in such a way, the introduction of the Boche-rules to a ‘Boche’-free language leads to contradiction.

Since it is non-conservative, the above account of the meaning of ‘Boche’ is bogus and so does not constitute a counter-example to IRS. This point does not depend on the exact details of Dummett’s proposal; the same will be true of any model of pejoratives according to which we accept the grounds for introducing them but not the consequences of doing so.

This proposal might generate the following worry:

It is hard to believe that racists who employ boche-like concepts fail to express complete thoughts. (Boghossian 2003: 243)

Accepting the above, however, does not lead to the conclusion that bigots are not saying anything whatsoever, or express no thoughts, when they use the term ‘Boche’; it is to deny one account of its meaning, not to deny that it has meaning. Indeed, a proponent of CRS might view the term ‘Boche’ as having the same meaning as ‘German’. Thus, the meaning of ‘Boche’ is given by whatever (conservative) rules govern ‘German’. One can in turn explain the pejorative nature of ‘Boche’ by appeal not to its literal, semantic content, but to its offensive associations, its conventional implications (see Grice 1989 ch. 2). According to this account, CRS deals with that aspect of a word that is shared by its neutral counterpart (for example, ‘German’) and an additional apparatus is wheeled in to explain the respect in which it causes offence. (The former is the remit of semantics, the latter of pragmatics.)

Williamson claims that such an account is not available to one who recommends CRS (2003: 267-8). Even if the ‘Boche’ is governed by the same rules as ‘German’, it is still the case that most speakers are not prepared—given its offensive implications—to employ ‘Boche’ in accordance with those rules. According to CRS, then, they do not understand the term ‘Boche’ or grasp the concept it expresses, which is implausible.

Note, however, that this criticism is effective against regularism and dispositionalism, but not normativism. The normativist can insist that the propriety of employment that is constitutive of the concept is distinctively semantic, as opposed to (say) moral. Once this is recognised, one can appreciate that speakers can indeed acknowledge that inferring from ‘x originates in Germany’ to ‘x is Boche’ is correct as far as the language is concerned, or according to the semantic norms determinative of the relevant expressions’ meanings, and still refuse actually to use the term ‘Boche’, since the propriety of doing so is trumped by other considerations (in this instance, moral). So, if CRS distinguishes the relevant normative notion according to which inferences are correct or incorrect, it has the resources to meet Williamson’s objection.

g. Circularity

The above discussion leads almost directly to a concern about CRS that Davidson voices in the following passage:

It is empty to say that meaning is use unless we specify what use we have in mind, and when we do specify, in a way that helps with meaning, we find ourselves going in a circle. (2005: 13)

This is perhaps especially relevant to normativism. According to it, for an expression to possess meaning, or express content, is for it be correctly used in a certain way. But intuitively the ‘correct’ use is just that which accords with meaning, or mastery of which is required for understanding. Further, it was suggested above that norms of meaning must be distinguished from other kinds of norm and hence viewed as distinctively semantic. Clearly, for a theory of meaning to appeal to such notions would be circular.

Two alternatives present themselves. One strategy would be to show how the relevant norms can be picked out in independently intelligible or more basic terms, say epistemological (Brandom 2000: ch. 6; Skorupski 1997; cf. Dummett 1991; 1996). Alternatively, one might reject the requirement of reductionism (Alston 2000; Stroud 2002; Whiting 2006). The assumption that an account of semantic notions must be given in independently intelligible or more basic terms is one that should not go unchallenged.

Note that dispositionalism arguably suffers from its own, distinctive problem of circularity (see Boghossian 1989; Kripke 1982: 28). According to it, to grasp the meaning of an expression is to be disposed to use it in a certain way. So, for example, to grasp the meaning of ‘bachelor’ is to be disposed to make the transition from ‘He is an unmarried man’ to ‘He is a bachelor’. But, of course, a person might fully understand the expression and yet not be disposed to make that transition. Perhaps she desires to confuse her interlocutor, or does not have long to live and wishes not to waste words, or believes that within the elapsed time the person has married, and so on. Evidently, the dispositionalist must say that to grasp the meaning one must be disposed to perform in a certain way in optimal circumstances. However, it appears unlikely that those circumstances could possibly be specified without employing semantic notions of the same kind as that of meaning or content.

5. Prospects and Applications

This entry has surveyed some of the arguments in favor of CRS and sketched briefly a number of the prominent problems it faces. Its critics’ claims notwithstanding, there is no reason to think that CRS faces proportionally more difficulties than its competitors. And in each case there are lines of response that, if not immediately decisive, are worthy of investigation.

For those sympathetic to CRS, examining such matters provide a means of adjudicating between the different versions. Specifically, it seems that the threats of indeterminacy and defective concepts point strongly toward normativism. Of course, once one accepts that semantic concepts are intrinsically normative, one must further distinguish such norms from other kinds of propriety, and it is doubtful that this can be done without making use of semantic concepts on a par with meaning or content. Nevertheless, the assumption that the only satisfactory philosophical explanations are those that provide analyses in independently intelligible and more basic terms is arguably unfounded and certainly not to be assumed.

In closing, it is worth noting that some consider CRS to provide insights into the possibility of a priori knowledge (see A Priori and A Posteriori), and as explaining our entitlement to follow certain fundamental epistemic and ethical principles (Boghossian 1997; 2000; 2003; Hale and Wright 2000; Peacocke 1992; Wedgwood 2006; cp. Horwich 2005 ch. 6; Williamson 2003). This is a burgeoning field of research and deserves investigation. In order to evaluate such claims, however, the details of CRS need first to be spelled out. It is on that task that this entry has focussed.

6. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

Daniel Whiting
University of Southampton
United Kingdom