Conspiracy Theories

The term “conspiracy theory” refers to a theory or explanation that features a conspiracy among a group of agents as a central ingredient. Popular examples are the theory that the first moon landing was a hoax staged by NASA, or the theory that the 9/11 attacks on the World Trade Center were not (exclusively) conducted by al-Qaeda, but that the US government conspired to let these attacks succeed. Conspiracy theories have long been an element of popular culture; and cultural theorists, sociologists and psychologists have had things to say about conspiracy theories and the people who believe in them. This article focuses on the philosophy of conspiracy theories, that is, on what philosophers have had to say about conspiracy theories. Conspiracy theories meet philosophy when it comes to questions concerning epistemology, science, society and ethics.

After giving a brief history of philosophical thinking about conspiracy theories in section 1, this article considers in more detail the definition of the term “conspiracy theory” in section 2. As it turns out, the definition of the term has received a lot of attention in philosophy, mainly because the common usage of the term has negative connotations (as in, “It’s just a conspiracy theory!”), raising the question whether our definition should reflect these. As there is a great variety of conspiracy theories on offer, section 3 considers ways of classifying conspiracy theories into distinct types. Such a classification may be useful when it comes to identifying possible problems with a conspiracy theory.

The main part of this article, section 4, is devoted to the question when one should believe in a conspiracy theory. In general, the philosophical literature has been more positive about conspiracy theories than other fields, being careful not to dismiss such theories too easily. Hence, it becomes important to come up with criteria that one may use to evaluate a given conspiracy theory. Section 4 provides such a list of criteria, distilled from the philosophical literature.

Turning from questions about belief to questions about society, ethics and politics, section 5 addresses the societal effects of conspiracy theories that philosophers have identified, also asking to what extent these are positive or negative. Given these effects, the last question this article addresses, in section 6, is what, if anything, we should do about conspiracy theories. Answering this question does not, of course, depend on philosophical thinking alone. For this reason, section 7 briefly mentions some relevant work outside of philosophy.

Table of Contents

  1. History of Philosophizing about Conspiracy Theories
  2. Problems of Definition
  3. Types of Conspiracy Theories
  4. Criteria for Believing in a Conspiracy Theory
    1. Criteria concerning Scientific Methodology
      1. Internal Faults (C1)
      2. Progress: Is the Conspiracy Theory Part of a Progressive Research Program? (C2)
      3. Inference to the Best Explanation: Evidence, Prior, Relative and Posterior Probability (C3)
      4. Errant Data (C4)
    2. Criteria Concerning Motives
      1. Cui Bono: Who Benefits from the Conspiracy? (C5)
      2. Individual Trust (C6)
      3. Institutional Trust (C7)
    3. Other Realist Criteria
      1. Fundamental Attribution Error (C8)
      2. Ontology: Existence Claims the Conspiracy Theory Makes (C9)
      3. Übermensch: Does the Conspiracy Theory Ascribe Superhuman Qualities to Conspirators? (C10)
      4. Scale: The Size and Duration of the Conspiracy (C11)
    4. Non-Realist Criteria
      1. Instrumentalism: Conspiracy Theories as “as if” Theories (C12)
      2. Pragmatism (C13)
  5. Social and Political Effects of Conspiracy Theories
  6. What to Do about Conspiracy Theories?
  7. Related Disciplines
  8. References and Further Reading

1. History of Philosophizing about Conspiracy Theories

Philosophical thinking about conspiracies can be traced back at least as far as Niccolo Machiavelli. Machiavelli discussed conspiracies in his most well-known work, The Prince (for example in chapter 19), but more extensively in his Discourses on the First Ten Books of Titus Livius, where he devotes the whole sixth chapter of the third book to a discussion of conspiracies. Machiavelli’s aim in his discussion of conspiracies is to help the ruler guard against conspiracies directed against him. At the same time, he warns subjects not to engage in conspiracies, partly because he believes these rarely achieve what they desire.

Where Machiavelli discussed conspiracies as a political reality, Karl Raimund Popper is the philosopher who put conspiracy theories on the philosophical agenda. The philosophical discussion of conspiracy theories begins with Popper’s dismissal of what he calls “the conspiracy theory of society” (Popper, 1966 and 1972). Popper sees the conspiracy theory of society as a mistaken approach to the explanation of social phenomena: It attempts to explain a social phenomenon by discovering people who have planned and conspired to bring the phenomenon about. While Popper thinks that conspiracies do occur, he thinks that few conspiracies are ultimately successful, since few things turn out exactly as intended. It is precisely the unforeseen consequences of intentional human action that social science should explain, according to Popper.

Popper’s comments on the conspiracy theory of society comprised only a few pages, and they did not trigger critical discussion until many years later. It was only in 1995 that Charles Pigden critically examined Popper’s views (Pigden, 1995). Besides Pigden’s critique of Popper, it was Brian Keeley (1999) and his attempt at defining what he called “unwarranted conspiracy theories” that started the philosophical literature on conspiracy theories. The question raised by Keeley’s paper is essentially the demarcation problem for conspiracy theories: Just as Popper’s demarcation problem was to separate science from pseudoscience, within the realm of conspiracy theories, the problem Keeley raised was to separate warranted from unwarranted conspiracy theories. However, Keeley concluded that the problem is a difficult one, admitting that the five criteria he proposed were not adequate for specifying when we are (un)warranted to believe in a conspiracy theory. This article returns to this problem in section 4.

After Popper’s work in the late 1960s and early 1970s, and Pigden’s and Keeley’s in the 1990s, philosophical work on conspiracy theories took off in the first decade of the 21st century. Particularly important in this development is the collection of essays by Coady (2006a), which made visible that there is a philosophical debate about conspiracy theories to a wider audience, as well as within philosophy. Since this collection of essays, philosophical thinking has been continuously evolving, as evidenced by special issues of Episteme (volume 4, issue 2, 2007), Critical Review (volume 28, issue 1, 2016), and Argumenta (volume 3, no.2, 2018).

Looking at the history of philosophizing about conspiracy theories, a useful distinction that has been applied to philosophers writing about conspiracy theories is the distinction between generalists and particularists (Buenting and Taylor, 2010). Following in the footsteps of Popper, generalists believe that conspiracy theories in general have an epistemic problem. For them, there is something about a theory being a conspiracy theory that should lower its credibility. It is this kind of generalism which underlies the popular dismissal, “It’s just a conspiracy theory.” Particularists like Pigden, on the other hand, argue that there is nothing problematic about conspiracy theories per se, but that each conspiracy theory needs to be evaluated on its own (de)merits.

2. Problems of Definition

The definition of the term “conspiracy theory” given at the beginning of this article is neutral in the sense that it does not imply that a conspiracy theory is wrong or unlikely to be true. In popular discourse, however, an epistemic deficit is often implied. Tracking this popular use, the Wikipedia entry on the topic (consulted 26 July 2019) defined a conspiracy theory as “an explanation of an event or situation that invokes a conspiracy by sinister and powerful actors, often political in motivation, when other explanations are more probable.”

We can order possible definitions of the term “conspiracy theory” in terms of logical strength. The definition given at the beginning of this article is minimal in this sense; it says that a conspiracy theory is a theory that involves a conspiracy. Slightly more elaborate, but still in line with this weak notion of conspiracy theory, Keeley (1999, p.116) sees a conspiracy theory as an explanation of an event by the causal agency of a small group of people acting in secret. What Keeley has added to the minimal definition is that the group of conspirators is small. Other additions that have been considered are that the group is powerful and/or that it has nefarious intentions. While these additions create a stronger notion of conspiracy theory, they all remain epistemically neutral; that is, they do not state that the explanation is unlikely or otherwise problematic. On the other end of the logical spectrum, definitions like the Wikipedia definition cited above are not only logically stronger than the minimal definition—the conspirators are powerful and sinister—but are also epistemically laden: A conspiracy theory is unlikely.

Within this spectrum of possibilities, philosophers have generally opted for a rather minimal definition that is epistemically neutral. As explicated by Dentith (2016, p.577), the central ingredients of a conspiracy are (a) a group of conspirators, (b) secrecy and (c) a shared goal. Similarly separating out the different ingredients of a conspiracy theory, Mandik (2007, p.206) states that conspiracy theories postulate “(1) explanations of (2) historical events in terms of (3) intentional states of multiple agents (the conspirators) who, among other things, (4) intended the historical events in question to occur and (5) keep their intentions and actions secret.” He sees these five conditions as necessary conditions for being a conspiracy theory, but he remains agnostic as to whether they are jointly sufficient.

A second approach to defining conspiracy theories has been proposed by Coady (2006b, p.2). He sees conspiracy theories as explanations that are opposed to the official explanation of an event at a given time. Coady points out that usually explanations that are conspiracy theories in this sense are also conspiracy theories in the sense discussed earlier, but not vice versa, as also official theories can refer to conspiracies, for example the official account of 9/11. Often, according to Coady, an explanation will be a conspiracy theory in both senses.

Which definition to adopt—strong or weak, epistemically neutral or not—is ultimately a question of what purpose the definition is to serve. No matter what definition one chooses, such a choice will have consequences. As an example, Watergate will not count as a conspiracy theory under the Wikipedia definition, but it will under the minimal definition given at the beginning of this article. Furthermore, this minimal definition of conspiracy theories will have as a consequence that an explanation of a surprise party will be considered a conspiracy theory. Hence, to be put to use, the minimal definition may need to be supplemented by an extra condition like nefariousness.

Finally, besides using the term “conspiracy theory,” some authors also use the term “conspiracism.” This latter term has been used in different ways in the literature. Pipes (1997) has used the term to indicate a particular paranoid style of thinking. Muirhead and Rosenblum (2019) have used it to describe an evolving phenomenon of political culture, distinguishing classic conspiracism from new conspiracism. While classic conspiracism involves the development of conspiracy theories as alternative explanations of phenomena, new conspiracism has shed the interest in explanation and theory building. Instead, it is satisfied with bare assertion or insinuation of a conspiracy and aims at political delegitimation and destabilization.

3. Types of Conspiracy Theories

Conspiracy theories come in great variety, and typologies can help to order this variety and to further guide research to a particular type of conspiracy theory that is particularly interesting or problematic. Räikkä (2009a, p.186 and 2009b, p.458-9) distinguishes political from non-political conspiracy theories. Räikkä mentions conspiracy theories about the death of Jim Morrison or Elvis Presley as examples of non-political conspiracy theories. He furthermore divides political conspiracy theories into local, global and total conspiracy theories depending on the scale of the event to be explained.

Huneman and Vorms (2018, p.251) provide further useful categories for distinguishing different types of conspiracy theories. They distinguish scientific from non-scientific conspiracy theories—that is, whether or not the theories deal with the domain of science, like the AIDS conspiracy theory—ideological from neutral conspiracy theories—whether there is a strong ideology driving the conspiracy theory, like anti-Semitism—official from anti-institutional conspiracy theories—as exemplified by official versus unofficial conspiracy theories about 9/11—and alternative explanations from denials—providing a different explanation for an event versus denying that the event took place.

A further way to distinguish conspiracy theories is by looking at what kind of theoretical object we are dealing with. In general, a conspiracy theory is an explanation of some event or phenomenon, but one can examine what kind of explanation it is. Some conspiracy theories may be full-blown theories, whereas others may not be theories in the scientific or philosophical sense. Clarke (2002 and 2007) thinks that some conspiracy theories are actually only proto-theories, not worked out sufficiently to count as theories, while others may be degenerating research programs in the sense defined by Imre Lakatos. There is more on the relationship between conspiracy theories and Lakatosian research programs in section 4, but here it is important to realize that while all conspiracy theories are explanations of some sort, certain conspiracy theories may be theories, others may be proto-theories or research programs.

4. Criteria for Believing in a Conspiracy Theory

A number of criteria have been offered, sometimes implicitly, in the philosophical literature to evaluate whether we should believe in a particular conspiracy theory, and these are surveyed below. Partly, such criteria will be familiar from scientific theory choice, but given that we are dealing with a specific type of theory, more can be said and more has been said. Due to the number of criteria, it is useful to group them into categories. There are different ways of grouping these criteria. The one adopted here tries to stay close to the labels and classifications common in the philosophy of science.

Although not explicitly stated, the dominant view in the philosophical literature from which the criteria below are taken is a realist view: Our (conspiracy) theories and beliefs should aim at the truth. Alternatively, one may propose an instrumentalist criterion which advocates a (conspiracy) theory or belief for its usefulness, for example in making predictions. Finally, while instrumentalism still has epistemic aims, we can also identify a more radical pragmatist view which focuses more generally on the consequences, for example political and social consequences, of holding a particular (conspiracy) theory or belief.

As mentioned, most of the criteria from the philosophical literature fit into the realist view. Within this view, we can distinguish three groups of criteria. First, we have criteria coming from the philosophy of science. These criteria have to do with the scientific methodology of theory choice, and here the question is how these play out when applied to conspiracy theories. Second, we have criteria dealing with motives. These can be the motives of the agents proposing a conspiracy theory, the motives of institutions relevant to the propagation of a conspiracy theory, or, finally, the motives of the agents the conspiracy theory is about. Third, there are a number of other criteria neither dealing with motives nor with scientific methodology. The picture arising from this way of organizing the criteria is presented in figure 1. The figure is not intended as a decision tree. Rather, it is more like an organized toolbox from which multiple tools may be chosen, depending, for example, on one’s philosophical commitments and one’s existing beliefs.

Figure 1 

a. Criteria concerning Scientific Methodology

i. Internal Faults (C1)

Basham (2001, p.275) advocates skepticism of a conspiracy theory if it suffers from what he calls “internal faults,” among which he lists “problems with self-consistency, explanatory gaps, appeals to unlikely or obviously weak motives and other unrealistic psychological states, poor technological claims, and the theory’s own incongruencies with observed facts it grants (including failed predictions).” Räikkä (2009a, p.196f) also refers to a similar list of criteria. Basham thinks that this criterion, while seemingly straightforward, will already exclude many conspiracy theories. An historical example he mentions is the theory that sees the antichrist of the biblical Book of Revelations to be Adolf Hitler. According to Basham, the fact that Hitler is dead and the kingdom of God nowhere near shows that this theory has internal faults, presumably a big explanatory gap or failed prediction.

Note that the list of things mentioned by Basham as internal faults is rather diverse, and one can debate whether all of these faults should really be considered internal to the theory. More narrowly, one could restrict internal faults to problems with self-consistency. Most of the other elements mentioned by Basham return below as separate criteria. For instance, an appeal to “unlikely or obviously weak motives” is discussed as C5.

ii. Progress: Is the Conspiracy Theory Part of a Progressive Research Program? (C2)

Clarke (2002; 2007) sees conspiracy theories as degenerating research programs in the sense developed by Lakatos (1970). In Clarke’s description of a degenerating research program, “successful novel predictions and retrodictions are not made. Instead, auxiliary hypotheses and initial conditions are successively modified in light of new evidence, to protect the original theory from apparent disconfirmation” (Clarke 2002, p.136). By contrast, a progressive research program would make successful novel predictions and retrodictions. Clarke cites the Watergate conspiracy theory as an example of a progressive research program: It led the journalists to make successful predictions and retrodictions about the behavior of those involved in the conspiracy. By contrast, Clarke uses the conspiracy theory about Elvis Presley’s fake funeral as an example of a degenerating research program (p.136-7), since it did not come up with novel predictions that were confirmed, for example, concerning the unusual behavior of Elvis’s relatives. Going further, Clarke (2007) also views other conspiracy theories—the controlled demolition theory of 9/11, for instance—as only proto-theories, something that is not sufficiently worked out to count as a theoretical core of a degenerating or progressive research program. Proto-theories are similar to what Muirhead and Rosenblum (2019) call new conspiracism.

Pigden (2006, footnote 17 and p.29) criticizes Clarke for not providing any evidence that conspiracy theories are in fact degenerating research programs and points to the many conspiracy theories accepted by historians as counterevidence. In any case, we might consider evaluating a given conspiracy theory by trying to see to what extent it is, or is part of, a progressive or a degenerating research program. Furthermore, as Lakatos’s notion of a research program comes with a hard core—the central characteristic claims not up for modification—and a protective belt—auxiliary hypotheses which can be changed—applying this notion also gives us tools to analyze a conspiracy theory in more detail. Such an analysis might yield, for example, that the problematic aspects of a conspiracy theory all concern its protective belt rather than its hard core.

iii. Inference to the Best Explanation: Evidence, Prior, Relative and Posterior Probability (C3)

Dentith (2016) views conspiracy theories as inferences to the best explanation. To judge such inferences using a Bayesian framework, we need to look at the prior probability of the conspiracy theory, the prior probability of the evidence and its likelihood given the conspiracy theory, thereby allowing us to calculate the posterior probability of the conspiracy theory. Furthermore, we need to look at the relative probability of the conspiracy theory when comparing it to competing hypotheses explaining the same event. Crucial in this calculation is our estimation of the prior probability of the conspiracy theory, which Dentith thinks we usually set too low (p.584) because we tend to underestimate how often conspiracies occur in history.

There is some disagreement between authors about whether conspiracy theories may be selective in their choice of evidence. Hepfer (2015, p.78) warns against the selective acceptance of evidence which he calls selective coherentism (p.92), which for Hepfer explains, for example, the wealth of different conspiracy theories surrounding the assassination of John F. Kennedy. Dentith (2019, section 2), on the other hand, argues that scientific theories are also selective in their use of evidence, and that conspiracy theories are not different from other theories, such as scientific ones, in the way they use evidence. Dentith compares conspiracy theories about 9/11 to the work that historians usually do. In both cases, says Dentith, we see a selection of only part of the total evidence as salient.

Finally, Keeley (2003, p.106) considers whether lack of evidence for a conspiracy should count against a theory positing such a conspiracy. On the one hand, he points out that it is in general true that we should not confuse absence of evidence for a conspiracy with evidence of absence of a conspiracy. After all, since we are dealing with a conspiracy, we should expect that evidence will be hard to come by. This is also why falsifiability is in general not advocated as a criterion for evaluating conspiracy theories (see, e.g., Keeley 1999, p.121 and Basham 2003, p.93): In the case of conspiracy theories, something approaching unfalsifiability is a consequence of the theory. Nonetheless, Keeley (2003, p.106) thinks that if diligent efforts to find evidence for a conspiracy fail where similar efforts in other similar cases have succeeded, we are justified in lowering the credibility of the conspiracy theory.

iv. Errant Data (C4)

While the previous criterion already discussed how conspiracy theories relate to data, there is a particular kind of data that receives special attention both by conspiracy theorists and in the philosophical literature about conspiracy theories. Many conspiracy theories claim that they can explain “errant data” (Keeley, 1999, p.117), data which either contradicts the official theory or which the official theory leaves unexplained. According to Keeley (1999), conspiracy theories place great emphasis on errant data, an emphasis that also exists in periods of scientific innovation. However, Keeley thinks that conspiracy theories wrongly claim that errant data by itself is a problem for a theory, which Keeley thinks it is not, since not all the available data will in fact be true. Clarke (2002 p.139f) and Dentith (2019, section 3) are skeptical of Keeley’s argument: Clarke points out that the data labelled as “errant” will depend on the theory one adheres to, and Dentith thinks that conspiracy theories are no different from other theories in relation to such data.

Dentith (2014, 129ff), following Coady (2006c), points out that any theory, official or unofficial, will have errant data. While advocates of a conspiracy theory will point to data problematic for the official theory which the conspiracy theory can explain, there will usually also be data problematic to the conspiracy theory which the official theory can explain. As an example of data errant with regard to the official theory, Dentith mentions that the official theory about the assassination of John F. Kennedy does not explain why some witnesses heard more gunshots than the three gunshots Oswald is supposed to have fired. As an example of data errant with regard to a conspiracy theory, Dentith points out that some of the conspiracy theories about 9/11 cannot explain why there is a video of Osama Bin Laden claiming responsibility for the attacks. When it comes to evaluating a specific conspiracy theory, the conclusion is that we should be looking at the errant data of both the conspiracy theory and alternative theories.

b. Criteria Concerning Motives

i. Cui Bono: Who Benefits from the Conspiracy? (C5)

Hepfer (2015, p.98ff) uses the assassination of John F. Kennedy in 1963 to illustrate how motives enter into our evaluation of conspiracy theories. While there seems to be widespread agreement that the assassin was in fact Lee Harvey Oswald, conspiracy theories doubt the official theory that he was acting on his own. There are a number of possible conspirators with plausible motives that may have been behind Oswald: The military-industrial complex, the American mafia, the Russian secret service, the United States Secret Service and Fidel Castro. Which of these conspiracy theories we should accept also depends on how plausible we find the ascribed motives given our other beliefs about the world.

According to Hepfer (2015, p.98 and section 2.3), a conspiracy theory should be (a) clear about the motives or goals of the conspirators and (b) rational in the means-ends sense of rationality; that is, if successful, the conspiracy should further the goals the conspirators are claimed to have. If the goals of the conspirators are not explicitly part of the theory, we should be able to infer these goals, and they should be reasonable. Problematic conspiracy theories are those where the motives or goals of the conspirators are unclear, the goals ascribed to the conspirators conflict with our other knowledge about the goals of these agents, or a successful conspiracy would not further the goals the theory itself ascribes to the conspirators.

ii. Individual Trust (C6)

Trust plays a role in two different ways when it comes to conspiracy theories. First, Räikkä (2009b, section 4) raises the question of whether we can trust the motives of the author(s) or proponents of a conspiracy theory. Some conspiracy theorists may not themselves believe the theory they propose, and instead may have other motives for proposing the theory; for example, to manipulate the political debate or make money. Other conspiracy theorists may genuinely believe the conspiracy theory they propose, but the fact that the alleged conspirators are the political enemy of the theory’s proponent may cast doubt on the likelihood of the theory. The general question here is whether the author or proponent of a conspiracy theory has a motive to lie or mislead. Here, Räikkä uses as an example the conspiracy theory about global warming (p.462). If a person working for the fossil-fuel industry claims that there is a global conspiracy propagating the idea of global warming, the financial motive is clear. Conversely, people who reject a particular theory as “just” a conspiracy theory may also have a motive to mislead. As an example, Pidgen disscusses the case of Tony Blair,who labeled the idea that the Iraq war was fought for oil a mere conspiracy theory.

A second way in which trust enters into the analysis of conspiracy theories is in terms of epistemic authority. Many conspiracy theories refer to various authorities for the justification of certain claims. For instance, a 9/11 conspiracy theory may refer to a structural engineer who made a certain claim regarding the collapse of the World Trade Center. The question arises as to what extent we should trust claims of alleged epistemic authorities, that is, people who have relevant expertise in a particular domain. Levy (2007) takes a radically socialized view of knowledge: Since knowledge can only be produced by a complex network of inquiry in which the relevant epistemic authorities are embedded, a conspiracy theory conflicting with the official story coming out of this network is “prima facie unwarranted” (p.182, italics in the original). According to Levy, the best epistemic strategy is simply to “adjust one’s degree of belief in an explanation of an event or process to the degree to which the epistemic authorities accept that explanation” (p.190). Dentith (2018) criticizes Levy’s trust in epistemic authority. First, Dentith argues that since conspiracy theories cross disciplinary boundaries, there is no obvious group of experts when it comes to evaluating a conspiracy theory, since a conspiracy theory will usually involve claims connecting various disciplines. Furthermore, Dentith points out that the fact that a theory has authority in the sense of being official does not necessarily mean that it has epistemic authority, a point Levy also makes. Related to our first point about trust, Dentith also points out that epistemic authorities might have a motive to mislead, for example, when the funding sources might have influenced research. Finally, our trust in epistemic authority will also depend on the trust we place in the institutions accrediting expertise, and hence questions of individual trustworthiness relate to questions of institutional trustworthiness.

iii. Institutional Trust (C7)

As mentioned when discussing individual trust, when we want to assess the credibility of experts, part of that credibility judgment will depend on the extent to which we trust the institution accrediting the expertise, assuming there is such an institution to which the expert is linked. The question of institutional trust is relevant more generally when it comes to conspiracy theories, and this issue has been discussed at length in the philosophical literature on conspiracy theories.

The starting point of the discussion of institutional trust is Keeley (1999, p.121ff) who argues that the problem with conspiracy theories is that these theories cast doubt on precisely those institutions which are the guarantors of reliable data. If a conspiracy theory contradicts an official theory based on scientific expertise, this produces skepticism not only with regard to the institution of science, but may also produce skepticism with regard to other public institutions, for example the press, which accepts the official story instead of uncovering the conspiracy, the parliament and the government, which produce or propagate the conspiracy theory in the first place. Thus, the claim is that believing in a conspiracy theory implies a quite widespread distrust of our public institutions. If this implication is true, it can be used in two ways: Either to discredit the conspiracy theory, which is the route Keeley advocates, or to discredit our public institutions. In any case, our trust in our public institutions will influence the extent to which we hold a particular conspiracy theory to be likely. For this reason, both Keeley (1999, p.121ff) and Coady (2006a, p.10) think that conspiracy theories are more trustworthy in non-democratic societies.

Basham (2001, p.270ff) argues that it would be a mistake to simply assume our public institutions to be trustworthy and dismiss conspiracy theories. His position is one he calls “studied agnosticism” (p.275): In general, we are not in a position to decide for or against a conspiracy theory, except—and this is where the “studied” comes in—where a conspiracy theory can be dismissed due to internal faults (see C1). In fact, we are caught in a vicious circle: “We cannot help but assume an answer to the essential issue of how conspirational our society is in order to derive a well justified position on it” (p.274). Put differently, while an open society provides fewer grounds for believing in conspiracy theories, we cannot really know how open our society actually is (Basham 2003, p.99). In any case, an individual who tries to assess a particular conspiracy theory should thus also consider to what extent they trust or distrust our public institutions.

Clarke (2002,p.139ff) questions Keeley’s link between belief in conspiracy theories and general distrust in our public institutions. He claims that conspiracy theories actually do not require general institutional skepticism. Instead, in order to believe in a conspiracy theory, it will usually suffice to confine one’s skepticism to particular people and issues. Räikkä (2009a) also criticizes Keeley’s supposed link between conspiracy theories and institutional distrust, claiming that most conspiracy theories do not entail such pervasive institutional distrust, but that if such pervasive distrust were entailed by a conspiracy theory, it would lower the conspiracy theory’s credibility. A global conspiracy theory like the Flat Earth theory tends to involve more pervasive institutional distrust, since it involves multiple institutions from various societal domains, than a local conspiracy theory like the Watergate conspiracy. According to Clarke, even the latter does not have to engender institutional distrust with regard to the United States government as an institution, since distrust could remain limited to specific agents within the government.

c. Other Realist Criteria

i. Fundamental Attribution Error (C8)

Starting with Clarke (2002; see also his response to criticism in 2006), philosophers have discussed whether conspiracy theories commit the fundamental attribution error (FAE). In psychology, the fundamental attribution error refers to the human tendency to overestimate dispositional factors and underestimate situational factors in explaining the behavior of others. Clarke (p.143ff) claims that conspiracy theories commit this error: They tend to be dispositional explanations whereas official theories often are more situational explanations. As an example, Clarke considers the funeral of Elvis Presley. The official account is situational since it explains the funeral in terms of his death due to heart problems. On the other hand, the conspiracy theory which claims Elvis is still alive and staged his funeral is dispositional since it sees Elvis and his possible co-conspirators as having the intention to deceive the public.

Dentith (2016, p.580) questions whether conspiracy theories are generally more dispositional than other theories. Also, like in the case of 9/11, the official theory may also be dispositional. Pigden (2006, footnotes 27 and 30, and p.29) is critical of the psychological literature about the FAE, claiming that “if we often act differently because of different dispositions, then the fundamental attribution error is not an error” (footnote 30). Pigden is also critical of Clarke’s application of the FAE to conspiracy theories: Given that conspiracies are common, what Pigden calls “situationism” is either false or it does not imply that conspiracies are unlikely. Hence, Pigden concludes, the FAE has no relevant implications for our thinking about conspiracy theories. Coady (2003) is also critical of the existence of the FAE. Furthermore, he claims that belief in the FAE is paradoxical in that it commits the FAE: Believing that people think dispositionally rather than situationally is itself dispositional thinking.

ii. Ontology: Existence Claims the Conspiracy Theory Makes (C9)

Some conspiracy theories claim the existence or non-existence of certain entities. Among the examples Hepfer (2015, p.45) cites is a theory by Heribert Illig that claims that the years between 614 and 911 never actually happened. Another example would be a theory claiming the existence of a perpetual motion machine that is kept secret. Both existence claims go against the scientific consensus of what exists and what does not. Hepfer (2015, p.42) claims that the more unusual a conspiracy theory’s existence claims are, the more we should doubt its truth. This is because of the ontological baggage (p.49) that comes with such existence claims: Accepting these claims will force us to revise a major part of our hitherto accepted knowledge, and the more substantial the revision needed, the more we should be suspicious of such a theory.

iii. Übermensch: Does the Conspiracy Theory Ascribe Superhuman Qualities to Conspirators? (C10)

Hepfer (2015, p.104) and Räikkä (2009a, p.197) note that some conspiracy theories ascribe superhuman qualities to the conspirators that border on divine attributes like omnipotence and omniscience. Examples here might be the idea that Freemasons, Jews or George Soros control the world economy or the world’s governments. Sometimes the superhuman qualities ascribed to conspirators are moral and negative, that is, conspirators are demonized (Hepfer, 2015, p.131f). The antichrist has not only been seen in Adolf Hitler but also in the pope. In general, the more extraordinary the qualities ascribed to the conspirators, the more they should lower the credibility of the conspiracy theory.

iv. Scale: The Size and Duration of the Conspiracy

The general claim here is that the more agents that are supposed to be involved in a conspiracy—its size—and the longer the conspiracy is supposed to be in existence—its duration—the less likely the conspiracy theory. Hepfer (2015, p.97) makes this point, and similarly Keeley (1999, p.122) says that the more institutions are supposed to be involved in a conspiracy, the less believable the theory should become. To some extent, this point is simply a matter of logic: The claim that A and B are involved in a conspiracy cannot be more likely than that A is involved in a conspiracy. Similarly, the claim that a conspiracy theory has been going on for at least 20 years cannot be more likely than the claim that it has been going on for at least 10 years. In this sense, conspiracy theories involving many agents over a long period of time will tend to be less likely than conspiracy theories involving fewer agents over a shorter period of time. Furthermore, Grimes (2016) has conducted simulations showing that large conspiracies with 1000 agents or more are unlikely to succeed due to problems with maintaining secrecy.

Basham (2001, p.272; 2003, p.93) takes an opposing view by referring to social hierarchies and mechanisms of control, saying that “the more fully developed and high placed a conspiracy is, the more experienced and able are its practitioners at controlling information and either co-opting, discrediting, or eliminating those who go astray or otherwise encounter the truth” (Basham 2001, p.272). Dentith (2019, section 7) also counters the scale argument by pointing out that any time an institution is involved in a conspiracy, only very few people of that institution actually are involved in the conspiracy. This reduces the number of total conspirators and questions the relevance of the results by Grimes of which Dentith is very critical.

d. Non-Realist Criteria

i. Instrumentalism: Conspiracy Theories as “as if” Theories (C12)

Grewal (2016) has shown how the philosophical opposition between scientific realism and various kinds of anti-realism also shows up in how we evaluate conspiracy theories. While most authors implicitly seem to interpret the claims of conspiracy theories along the lines of realism, Grewal has suggested that adherents of conspiracy theories may interpret or at least use these theories instrumentally. Viewed this way, conspiracy theories are “as-if”-theories which allow their adherents to make sense of a world that is causally opaque in a way that may often yield quite adequate predictions. “An assumption that the government operated as if it were controlled by a parallel and secret government may fit the historical data…while also providing better predictions than would, say, an exercise motivated by an analysis of constitutional authority or the statutory limitations to executive power” (p.36). As a more concrete example, Grewal mentions that “the most parsimonious way to understand financial decision making in the Eurozone might be to treat it as if it were run by and for the benefit of the Continent’s richest private banks” (p.37). Hence, our evaluation of a given conspiracy theory will also depend on basic philosophical commitments like what we expect our theories to do for us.

ii. Pragmatism (C13)

The previous arguments have mostly been epistemic or epistemological arguments, arguments that bear on the likelihood of a conspiracy theory to be true or at least epistemically useful. However, similar to Blaise Pascal’s pragmatic argument for belief in God (Pascal, 1995), some arguments concerning conspiracy theories that have nothing to do with their epistemic value can be reinterpreted pragmatically as arguments about belief: Pragmatically, our belief or disbelief should depend on the consequences the (dis)belief has for us personally or for society more generally.

Basham (2001) claims that epistemic rejection of conspiracy theories will often not work, and we have to be agnostic about their truth. Still, we should reject them for pragmatic reasons because “[t]here is nothing you can do,” given the impossibility of finding out the truth, and “[t]he futile pursuit of malevolent conspiracy theory sours and distracts us from what is good and valuable in life” (p.277). Similarly, Räikkä (2009a) says that “a person who strives for happiness in her personal life should not ponder on vicious conspiracies too much” (p.199). Then again, contrary to Basham’s claim, what you can do with regard to conspiracy theories will depend on your role. As a journalist, you may decide to investigate certain claims, and Räikkä (2009a, p.199f) thinks that “it is important that in every country there are some people who are interested in investigative journalism and political conspiracy theorizing.”

Like journalists, politicians play a special role when it comes to conspiracy theories. Muirhead and Rosenblum (2016) argue that politicians should oppose conspiracy theories if they (1) are fueled by hatred, or (2) when they present political opposition as treason and illegitimate, or (3) when they undermine epistemic or expert authority generally. Similarly, Räikkä (2018, p.213) argues that we must interfere with conspiracy theories when they include libels or hate speech. The presumed negative consequences of such conspiracy theories would be pragmatic reasons for disbelief.

Räikkä (2009b) lists both positive and negative effects of conspiracy theorizing, and we may apply these to concrete conspiracy theories to see which ones to believe in. The two positive effects he mentions are (a) that “the information gathering activities of conspiracy theorists and investigative journalists force governments and government agencies to watch out for their decisions and practices” (p.460) and (b) that conspiracy theories help to maintain openness in society. As negative effects, he mentions that a conspiracy theory “tends to undermine trust in democratic political institutions and its implications may be morally questionable, as it has close connections to populist discourse, as well as anti-Semitism and racism” (p.461). When a conspiracy theory blames certain people, Räikkä points out that there are moral costs for the people blamed. Furthermore, he thinks that the moral costs will depend on whether the people blamed are private individuals or public figures (p.463f).

5. Social and Political Effects of Conspiracy Theories

Räikkä (2009b, section 3) and Moore (2016, p.5) survey some of the social and political effects of conspiracy theories and conspiracy theorizing. One may look at the positive and negative effects of conspiracy theorizing in general, but it is also useful to consider the effects of a specific conspiracy theory, by looking at which effects mentioned below are likely to obtain for the conspiracy theory in question. Such an evaluation is related to the pragmatist evaluation criterion C13 just discussed, so some of the points mentioned there are revisited in what follows. Also, the effects of a conspiracy theory may be related to the type of conspiracy theory we are dealing with; see section 3 of this article.

On the positive side, conspiracy theories may be tools to uncover actual conspiracies, with the Watergate scandal as the standard example. When these conspiracies take place in our public institutions, conspiracy theories can thereby also help us to keep these institutions in check and to uncover institutional problems. Conspiracy theories can help us to remain critical of those holding power in politics, science and the media. One of the ways they can achieve this is by forcing these institutions to be more transparent. Since conspiracy theories claim the secret activity of certain agents, transparent decision making, open lines of communication and the public availability of documents are possible responses to conspiracy theories which can improve a democratic society, independent of whether they suffice to convince those believing conspiracy theories. We may call this the paradoxical effect of conspiracy theories: Conspiracy theories can help create or maintain the open society whose existence they deny.

Turning from positive to possible negative effects of conspiracy theories, a central point that already came up when discussing criterion C7 is institutional trust. Conspiracy theories can contribute to eroding trust in the institutions of politics, science and the media. The anti-vaccination conspiracy theory which claims that politicians and the pharmaceutical industry are hiding the ineffectiveness or even harmfulness of vaccines is an example of a conspiracy theory which can undermine public trust in science. Huneman and Vorms (2018) discuss how at times it can be difficult to draw the line between rational criticism of science and unwarranted skepticism. One fear is that eroding trust in institutions leads us via unwarranted skepticism to an all-out relativism or nihilism, a post-truth world where it suffices that a claim is repeated by a lot of people to make it acceptable (Muirhead and Rosenblum, 2019). Conspiracy theories have also been linked to increasing polarization, populism and racism (see Moore, 2016). Finally, as alluded to in section 1, Popper’s dislike of conspiracy theories was also because they create wrong ideas about the root causes of social events. By seeing social events as being caused by powerful people acting in secret, rather than as effects of structural social conditions, conspiracy theories arguably undermine effective political action and social change.

Bjerg and Presskorn-Thygesen (2017) have claimed that conspiracy theories cause a state of exception in the way introduced by Giorgio Agamben. Just like terrorism undermines democracy in such a way that it licenses a state of political exception justifying undemocratic measures, a conspiracy theory undermines rational discourse in such a way that it licenses a state of epistemic exception justifying irrational measures. Those measures consist in placing conspiracy theories outside of official public discourse, labeling them as irrational, as “just” conspiracy theories, and as not worthy of serious critical consideration and scrutiny. Seen in this way, conspiracy theories appear as a form of epistemic terrorism, through their erosion of trust in our knowledge-producing institutions.

6. What to Do about Conspiracy Theories?

Besides deciding to believe or not to believe in a conspiracy theory (section 4), there are other actions one may consider with regard to conspiracy theories. Philosophical discussion has mainly focused on what actions governments and politicians can or should take.

The seminal article concerning the question of government action is by Sunstein and Vermeule (2009). Besides describing different psychological and social mechanisms underlying belief in conspiracy theories, they consider a number of policy and legal responses a government might take when it comes to false and harmful conspiracy theories: banning conspiracy theories, taxing the dissemination of conspiracy theories, counterspeech and cognitive infiltration of groups producing conspiracy theories. While dismissing the first two options, Sunstein and Vermeule consider counterspeech and cognitive infiltration in more detail. First, the government may itself speak out against a conspiracy theory by providing its own account. However, Sunstein and Vermeule think that such official counterspeech will have only limited success, in particular when it comes to conspiracy theories involving the government. Alternatively, the government may try to involve private parties to infiltrate online fora and discussion groups associated with conspiracy theories in order to introduce cognitive diversity, breaking up one-sided discussion and introducing non-conspirational views.

The proposals by Sunstein and Vermeule have led to strong opposition, most explicitly by Coady (2018). He points out that Sunstein and Vermeule too easily assume good intentions on the part of the government. Furthermore, these policy proposals, coming from academics who have also been involved in governmental policy making, will only confirm the fears of the conspiracy theorists that the government is involved in conspirational activities. If the cognitive infiltration proposed by Sunstein and Vermeule were discovered, conspiracy theorists would be led to believe in conspiracy theories even more. Put differently, we are running the risk of a pragmatic inconsistency: The government would try to deceive, via covert cognitive infiltration, a certain part of the population to make it believe that it does not deceive, that it is not involved in conspiracies.

As mentioned when discussing evaluation criterion C13 in section 4, Muirhead and Rosenblum (2016) consider three kinds of conspiracy theories that should give politicians cause for official opposition. These are conspiracy theories that fuel hatred, equate political opposition with treason, or that express a general distrust of expertise. In these cases, politicians are called to speak truth to conspiracy, even though this might create a divide between them and their electorate. Muirhead and Rosenblum (2019) also consider what to do against new conspiracism (see the end of section 2). They note that such conspiracism is rampant in our society despite ever more transparency. As a counter measure, they not only advocate speaking truth to conspiracy, but also what they call “democratic enactment,” by which they mean “a strenuous adherence to the regular processes and forms of public decision-making” (p.175).

Both Sunstein and Vermeule, as well as Muirhead and Rosenblum, agree that what we should do about conspiracy theories will depend on the theory we are dealing with. They do not advocate action against all theories about groups acting in secret to achieve some aim. However, when a theory is of a particularly problematic kind—false and harmful, fueling hatred, and so forth—political action may be needed.

7. Related Disciplines

Philosophy is not the only discipline dealing with conspiracy theories, and in particular when it comes to discussing what to do about conspiracy theories, research from other fields is important. We have already seen some ways in which philosophical thinking about conspiracy theories touches on other disciplines, in particular in the previous section’s discussion of political science and law. As for other related fields, psychologists have done a lot of research about conspirational thinking and the psychological characteristics of people who believe in conspiracy theories. Historians have presented histories of conspiracy theories in the United States, the Arab world and elsewhere. Sociologists have studied how conspiracy theories can target racial minorities, as well as the structure and group dynamics of specific conspirational milieus. Uscinski (2018) covers many of the relevant disciplines which this article does not cover and also includes an interdisciplinary history of conspiracy theory research.

8. References and Further Reading

To get an overview of the philosophical thinking about conspiracy theories, the best works to start with are Dentith (2014), Coady (2006a) and Uscinski (2018).

  • Basham, L. (2001). “Living with the Conspiracy”, The Philosophical Forum, vol. 32, no. 3, p.265-280.
  • Basham, L. (2003). “Malevolent Global Conspiracy”, Journal of Social Philosophy, vol. 34, no. 1, p.91-103.
  • Bjerg, O. and T. Presskorn-Thygesen (2017). “Conspiracy Theory: Truth Claim or Language Game?”, Theory, Culture and Society, vol. 34, no. 1, p.137-159.
  • Buenting, J. and J. Taylor (2010). “Conspiracy Theories and Fortuitous Data”, Philosophy of the Social Sciences, vol. 40, no. 4, p. 567-578.
  • Clarke, St. (2002). “Conspiracy Theories and Conspiracy Theorizing”, Philosophy of the Social Sciences, vol. 32, no. 2, p.131-150.
  • Clarke, St. (2006). “Appealing to the Fundamental Attribution Error: Was it All a Big Mistake?”, in Conspiracy Theories: The Philosophical Debate. Edited by David Coady. Ashgate, p.129-132.
  • Clarke, St. (2007). “Conspiracy Theories and the Internet: Controlled Demolition and Arrested Development”, Episteme, vol. 4, no. 2, p.167-180.
  • Coady, D. (2003). “Conspiracy Theories and Official Stories”, International Journal of Applied Philosophy, vol. 17, no. 2, p.197-209.
  • Coady, D., ed. (2006a). Conspiracy Theories: The Philosophical Debate. Ashgate.
  • Coady, D. (2006b). “An Introduction to the Philosophical Debate about Conspiracy Theories”, in Conspiracy Theories: The Philosophical Debate. Edited by David Coady. Ashgate, p.1-11.
  • Coady, D. (2006c). “Conspiracy Theories and Official Stories”, in Conspiracy Theories: The Philosophical Debate. Edited by David Coady. Ashgate, p.115-128.
  • Coady, D. (2018). “Cass Sunstein and Adrian Vermeule on Conspiracy Theories”, Argumenta, vol. 3, no.2, p.291-302.
  • Dentith, M. (2014). The Philosophy of Conspiracy Theories. Palgrace MacMillan.
  • Dentith, M. (2016). “When Inferring to a Conspiracy might be the Best Explanation”, Social Epistemology, vol. 30, nos. 5-6, p.572-591.
  • Dentith, M. (2018). “Expertise and Conspiracy Theories”, Social Epistemology, vol. 32, no. 3, p.196-208.
  • Dentith, M. (2019). “Conspiracy theories on the basis of the evidence”, Synthese, vol. 196, no. 6, p.2243-2261.
  • Grewal, D. (2016). “Conspiracy Theories in a Networked World”, Critical Review, vol. 28, no. 1, p.24-43.
  • Grimes, D. (2016). “On the Viability of Conspirational Beliefs”, PLoS ONE, vol. 11, no. 1.
  • Hepfer, K. (2015). Verschwörungstheorien: Eine philosophische Kritik der Unvernunft. Transcript Verlag.
  • Huneman, Ph. and M. Vorms (2018). “Is a Unified Account of Conspiracy Theories Possible?”, Argumenta, vol. 3, no. 2, p.247-270.
  • Keeley, B. (1999). “Of Conspiracy Theories”, The Journal of Philosophy, vol. 96, no. 3, p.109-126.
  • Keeley, B. (2003). “Nobody Expects the Spanish Inquisition! More Thoughts on Conspiracy Theory”, Journal of Social Philosophy, vol. 34, no. 1, p.104-110
  • Lakatos, I. (1970). “Falsification and the Methodology of Scientific Research Programmes”, in I. Lakatos and A. Musgrave, editors, Criticism and the Growth of Knowledge. Cambridge University Press, p.91-196.
  • Levy, N. (2007). “Radically Socialized Knowledge and Conspiracy Theories”, Episteme, vol. 4 no. 2, p.181-192.
  • Mandik, P. (2007). “Shit Happens”, Episteme, vol. 4 no. 2, p.205-218.
  • Moore, A. (2016). “Conspiracy and Conspiracy Theories in Democratic Politics”, Critical Review, vol. 28, no. 1, p.1-23.
  • Muirhead, R. and N. Rosenblum (2016). “Speaking Truth to Conspiracy: Partisanship and Trust”, Critical Review, vol. 28, no. 1, p.63-88.
  • Muirhead, R. and N. Rosenblum (2019). A Lot of People are Saying: The New Conspiracism and the Assault on Democracy. Princeton University Press.
  • Pascal, B. (1995). Pensées and Other Writings, H. Levi (trans.). Oxford University Press.
  • Pigden, Ch. (1995). “Popper Revisited, or What Is Wrong With Conspiracy Theories?” Philosophy of the Social Sciences, vol. 25, no. 1, p.3-34.
  • Pigden, Ch. (2006). “Complots of Mischief”, in David Coady (ed.), Conspiracy Theories: The Philosophical Debate. Ashgate, p.139-166.
  • Pipes, D. (1997). Conspiracy: How the Paranoid Style Flourishes and Where It Comes From. Free Press.
  • Popper, K.R. (1966). The Open Society and Its Enemies, vol. 2: The High Tide of Prophecy, 5th edition, Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Popper, K.R. (1972). Conjectures and Refutations. 4th edition, Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Räikkä, J. (2009a). “On Political Conspiracy Theories”, Journal of Political Philosophy, vol. 17, no. 2, p.185-201.
  • Räikkä, J. (2009b). “The Ethics of Conspiracy Theorizing”, Journal of Value Inquiry, vol. 43, p.457-468.
  • Räikkä, J. (2018). “Conspiracies and Conspiracy Theories: An Introduction”, Argumenta, vol. 3, no. 2, p.205-216.
  • Sunstein, C. and A. Vermeule (2009). “Conspiracy Theories: Causes and Cures”, Journal of Political Philosophy, vol. 17, no. 2, p.202-227.
  • Uscinski, J.E., editor (2018). Conspiracy Theories and the People Who Believe Them. Oxford University Press.

Author Information

Marc Pauly
University of Groningen
The Netherlands