Copyediting Guidelines

Each new IEP article will be copyedited by a copy editor. However, it is not the responsibility of a copy editor to turn a poorly written article into a well written article, but only to ensure clarity, revise obvious errors and enforce the Encyclopedia’s style guidelines. Begin copyediting your article by opening it in Microsoft Word, and turning on Review | Track Changes. That way your changes will be clearly visible to the general editors. If the author used right justification, turn this off so you can more easily detect spacing errors.

The most important items covered in these guidelines are included in a task checkoff list at the end of this document.

Table of Contents

  1. New Submissions
  2. Existing Articles
  3. Depth or Extent of Copyediting
  4. Avoid Awkward Phrases
  5. Style Preferences
    1. Author Guidelines
    2. Opening Summary
    3. Table of Contents
    4. Article Title
    5. Headings and Sub-Headings
    6. Author Information
    7. American vs. British English
    8. References
    9. Hyperlinks (Links, Web Address, URLs)
    10. Footnotes and Endnotes
    11. Acknowledgments and Thank Yous
    12. Latin Abbreviations
    13. Self Reference
    14. Pejorative Terms
    15. Italics
    16. Dates
    17. Initials
    18. Using “Now” and “Recent”
    19. Quotations
    20. Punctuation
      1. Quotation Marks
      2. Dashes and Hyphens
      3. Colons and Semicolons
      4. Contractions
      5. Future Tense
      6. Non-English Words
    21. Lists
  6. Last Step: Checkoff List

1. New Submissions

Here is an overview of the copyediting process from the volunteer’s viewpoint. The General Editor (probably Brad Dowden) will send you an original article that has been approved by the professional referees. Normally this will be a Microsoft Word file. Your goal is to produce a copyedited version which you will send back to the General Editor.

When you are ready to begin copyediting, open your article in Microsoft Word and click on Review | Track Changes | All Markup. Then revise (that is, mark up) the document to improve it. Do not defend your changes with a comment; just make the changes.

Your goal is to improve the English without affecting the philosophical content. But be a minimalist. Poor writers should live with most of the consequences of their writing ability, although you, the copy editor, will make some minimal improvements to correct clear errors or violations of the Encyclopedia’s style requirements. If you have any doubts about whether something needs to be changed, then use the Insert | Comment feature of Word to describe the problem; or contact the person who sent you the article.

Do not bother to defend all your changes by using Comments. Just make the changes. However, if you are making a potentially controversial change, then add a comment defending your change. If you notice a change is needed but are not sure how to make the change, then add a comment to alert the General Editor that a change may be needed.

Run the free version of the program on your article. It is uses A.I. to improve your article’s grammar. You will find it to be surprisingly smart, but still makes errors. Change its default settings to Formal Writing, Neutral Tone, Purpose to Inform. Using it is helpful, but optional.

When you are done copyediting, save a copy of the file while adding the word copyedited at the end of the original file name, and send the General Editor the marked-up copy, so it is clear what changes you have made.

But before sending your marked-up article, do one last review of your changes by choosing Review | Tracking | Final | No Markup (without accepting the changes) so you can see for yourself how the article will look if all your changes were to be accepted. That last step often helps to reveal imperfections that you will need to fix. Do not accept your own changes.

After your marked-up article is received by the General Editor, it will then be read and approved, perhaps with a revision or two, and sent on to a formatter to produce a formatted version that is posted within the Encyclopedia. The General Editor will acknowledge receipt of your work, but if you do not get a response within a week, send a query.  You will receive a notification when the article is posted. This notification will normally be a cc of an email sent to the area editor indicating that he or she can pass along the good news to the author.

Your identity is never revealed to the author.

When you are available to copyedit another article, let the General Editor know.

Most of the items covered in the guidelines below are included in a task checkoff list.

2. Existing Articles

For articles that already have been published, but for some reason were not properly copyedited, the General Editor will advise you on the proper procedure for copyediting. Normally this involves using an HTML editor rather than a word processor such as Word.

3. Depth or Extent of Copyediting

How much copyediting is appropriate? Don’t be too picky. Be a minimalist and change only what is clearly confusing or sloppy.  The bottom line is that authors who are weak writers must live with what they create. Unfortunately, academic referees confine their remarks to accuracy of claims and not to clarity or elegance.

Here is the list of rules that all good copy editors must follow:
1. Be more or less specific.
2. Use not bad grammars.
3. Proofread carefully to see if you any words out.
4. Don’t use no double negatives.
5. Avoid tumbling off the cliff of triteness into the dark abyss of overused metaphors.
6. Take care that your verb and your subject is in agreement.
7. No sentence fragments.
8. Placing a comma between subject and predicate, is not correct.
9. Who needs rhetorical questions?
10. Use the apostrophe in it’s proper place.
11. Avoid colloquial stuff, like totally.
12. Avoid those run-on sentences you know the ones they stop and then start again they must be separated with semicolons.
13. The passive voice should be used infrequently.
14. And don’t start sentences with a conjunction.
15. Excessive use of exclamation points can be disastrous!!!!
16. Exaggeration is a million times worse than understatement.
17. Stamp out and eliminate redundancy because, if you reread your work, you will find on rereading that a great deal of repetition can be avoided by rereading and editing, so reread your work and improve it by editing out the repetition you noticed during the rereading.
18. Tis incumbent upon one to employ the vernacular and eschew archaisms.
19. It’s not O.K. to use ampersands & abbreviations.
20. Parenthetical remarks (however relevant) are usually (but not always) an obstacle for readers (and make it harder on readers even if you’re being careful) who have the task of understanding your work (article, passage, document, and so forth) as they read.

The list is not original with the IEP.

4. Avoid Awkward Phrases

Confusing, ambiguous, and awkward phrases must be rewritten for clarity. If you notice that rewriting is needed but are unsure how to rewrite it yourself, then indicate this issue in a comment in your Word document.


Noting these after-affects, one has to wonder how human experience can be anything but an ineffectual, spectatorial undergoing.

The last two words are confusing. They need to be rewritten like this:

…spectator process.

Maybe you also noticed that the term after-affects is misspelled; it should be after-effects. will catch all this.

5. Style Preferences

a. Author Guidelines

Become familiar with the author guidelines so that you have a good sense of what we expect from our authors. You are the enforcer of those guidelines. The IEP prefers the Chicago Manual of Style for its documentation style, but if your author has already written it in APA style or some other coherent style, then you can leave it as is. And if the author has written the article in New Zealand English or some other non-American English, then do not convert it to American English.

b. Opening Summary

All articles must begin with a 200-500-word summary. If it is absent, or not within this range, then add a comment. The summary must not be mentioned in the table of contents nor contain its own heading.

It is OK for the summary to be broken into paragraphs.

Quotations used in the summary should not be given detailed citations; just say who said it. In this sense, we are more like encyclopedias or Scientific American Magazine than like philosophy journal articles. If the author violates this style recommendation, indicate this with a side comment.

The IEP style is to refer to one of its own articles not as an entry but as an article.

If the author uses the future tense, change it to the present tense; the summary must state that the article covers topic X rather than will cover topic X.

c. Table of Contents

The opening summary must be followed by a table of contents that indicates the section headings and sub-headings of the article. If this isn’t the case in the article you are copyediting, indicate this issue in a comment in your Word document.

Make sure the headings in the table of contents match the headings within the article. One of the most common errors made by authors is to begin their article with a table of contents after their opening summary, then to change the heading of some section during composition of the article and then to forget to go back and also revise the table of contents.

The table of contents can either be flat (for example in the IEP article Solipsism and the Problem of Other Minds) or hierarchical (indented), with main sections and then sub-sections within them (for example in Aztec Philosophy). In either case, the table of contents must use the following structure and labeling convention:

1. Heading
a. Subheading
b. Subheading
i. Subsubheading
ii. Subsubheading
iii. Subsubheading
c. Subheading
2. Heading
a. Subheading
b. Subheading
3. References and Further Reading

d. Article Title

Capitalize an IEP article title as if the title were the name of a book. Here is a helpful, free program that capitalizes for you:, although sometimes it does make a mistake. The program capitalizes all the important words (adjectives, adverbs, nouns, verbs) but not prepositions (to, below) and articles (a, the) and conjunctions (or, and). Capitalize the first word, and capitalize words that immediately follows a hyphen. Examples: To Him and Then to Home. What Is Not (Yet) Covered in This Article? Non-Locative Theories of Persistence.

For articles on an individual philosopher, the article title must contain the philosopher’s first and last name, birth date, and death date. If the philosopher has died, include the death date. If the philosopher is still alive, leave the death date blank. If both the birth date and the death date are guesses, then use two circas as in: Anaxarchus (c.380—c.320 B.C.E.), or use question marks as in: Anaxarchus (380?—320? B.C.E.). Check that an em dash (—), not a hyphen (-),  nor an en dash (–) is used between the two dates. Blank spaces around the em dash must be removed. Within the body of the article rather then a title, use a hyphen rather than an em dash, that is, use Anaxarchus (c.380-c.320 B.C.E.).

In both the article title and the body of the article, check that periods are used in B.C.E. and C.E. without blank spaces. C.E. is only allowed if the year’s number is less than 500. Circa, the Latin word for about, must be abbreviated as c. rather than ca. or CA. There should be no blank space between c. and the date in either a title or in the body of the article. For example, in a title say Anaxagoras (c.500—428 B.C.E.) rather than Anaxagoras (c. 500—428 B.C.E.).  

The word century should be abbreviated as cn.  and not c. and be separated from the date number with a blank space, for example Alexander Polyhistor (1st cn. B.C.E.). Outside of article titles, the full word century is fine to use also.

If a philosopher is known under two names, then insert the second spelling in parentheses as follows: Zhuangzi (Chuang-Tzu, 369—298 B.C.E.). Do not allow Zhuangzi (Chuang-Tzu) 369—298 B.C.E.

e. Headings and Sub-Headings

Make sure section headings and sub-headings in the article match those in the table of contents. Use your own judgment to fix a disagreement.

Capitalize headings and sub-headings as if they are titles of books. See Article Title for more on this. All article titles, headings and sub-headings must be in caps and smalls. Many authors will use full caps; this mistake must be fixed by the copy editor.

f. Author Information

Remove all titles from the author’s name such as Dr. or Professor. Delete the department name and the university’s street address and city. Do not abbreviate country names except for U. S. A. Note the blank spaces within the abbreviation.

For example, change:

Sir Michael Dummett, professor
Dept. of Philosophy
College of Arts & Sciences
Université de Genève
2010 La Mer Avenue
Geneva, Switzerland


Michael Dummett
University of Geneva

Use the English translation of university names.

g. American vs. British English

The IEP prefers American English, but other dialects such as British, South African, Australian, and Indian are acceptable. Just be consistent throughout the article.

British spelling examples: Aristotelean, favourite, defence, sceptic, behaviour, realisation, travelling.

American spelling examples: Aristotelian, favorite, defense, skeptic, behavior, realization, traveling.

h. References

Citations within the body of the article can use either of these two styles, with or without pages numbers, so long as the author is consistent throughout the article:

…as Alston argued (Alston 2009).

…as Alston argued (2009).

The last main section of every IEP article (and thus, every table of contents) must be titled “References and Further Reading.” Articles often will use these titles instead: Sources, Bibliography, References, Readings, or Notes. Change these to References and Further Reading.

Alphabetize the references by author’s last name. Do not number it.

The IEP recommends that authors use the MLA style of references and in-line citations; however, the IEP does not enforce this recommendation and allows almost any style that is coherent in the References and Further Reading section.

References and Further Reading sections in IEP articles can have sub-headings such as Original Sources, More Advanced Studies, and so forth.

When there are more than two entries for the same author, repeat the author’s name in subsequent entries. The MLA and many authors use a long dash in place of the author’s name when it occurs a second time; replace all these dashes with the author’s name.

If a citation contains an item with a list of multiple authors, change any occurrence of “&” in the list to “and.”

Do not permit authors to cite a forthcoming article; highlight this with a comment in your Word version of the article, and the General Editor will decide what to do about them.

i. Hyperlinks (Links, Web Address, URLs)

Hyperlinks, links, web addresses, and URLs are the same thing. Hyperlinks to other articles within the Encyclopedia are always encouraged. Some authors are overly eager to include hyperlinks and will ask for a hyperlink for every occurrence of the term, but you must check to see that there is normally only one link per term, usually upon the term’s first occurrence in the body of the article. An exception would be when two links go to the same place but for different reasons, as when a link occurs to explain what the technical word field means, and then later there is a link to the same place to tell the reader that this is where to look for a discussion of the controversy about the relationship between spacetime and its fields, with some metaphysicians saying spacetime contains fields, other metaphysicians saying spacetime is its fields, and still other metaphysicians advocating an even different answer.

We have a strict policy about linking to articles outside of the IEP. We use hyperlinks only for stable resources. The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy and a professional society’s collection of Wittgenstein’s original correspondence are two examples of sites with stable URLs, but a link to an article on someone’s personal Webpage would not be stable because it would be too likely to become broken over the next fifty years.

All these unstable URLs must be removed. If you are unsure whether the author used an unstable URL, indicate this issue in a comment in your Word document.

For URLs mentioned in the section References and Further Reading, it is optional whether to add a date accessed.

j. Footnotes and Endnotes

Articles must not contain footnotes or endnotes. If you notice that an IEP article contains them, and you haven’t been told explicitly to include them, indicate this issue in a comment in your Word document.

k. Acknowledgments and Thank Yous

The copy editor must remove all the acknowledgments and thank yous. If one is found, include a comment in your Word document so the General Editor can notify the author and the area editor that it was removed.

l. Latin Abbreviations

Replace Latin abbreviations. Here are the replacements:

cf.  |  compare
e.g.  |  for example
et. al.  |  and others
etc.  |  and so forth
i.e.  |  that is
infra | see below
fl. | flourished
NB  |  note
pace | with all due respect to
per se | intrinsically (or as such)
viz.  |  namely

Exceptions: It is OK to use a priori, ibid., op. cit., vice versa, and vs.

m. Self Reference

Revise these sorts of unnecessary self-referential terms:

This concludes what I take to be the major influences on Mitchell’s thought. [This concludes the major influences on Mitchell’s thought.]

My book about him says… [Jones (2005) says…]

I believe Passmore’s description is right. [Passmore’s description is generally accepted.]

We will show in the next section… [The next section shows…]

n. Pejorative Terms

Do not permit your authors to use pejorative phrases.

Examples: which certain irrational philosophers still believethe idealist curse.

Personal attacks and snide remarks must be removed.

o. Italics

Use italics or quotation marks for emphasis, never boldface or underlining.

Use italics to name something, unless using quotation marks would be clearer. Here is an example using italics: Philosophers have named them entities, things, and objects. Here is an example where quotation marks are clearer. Replace:

For any sentence S, if S is true, then S.


For any sentence S, if “S” is true, then S.

p. Dates

For a date range, such as 62-113 C.E., use an em dash (—) within an article title, but a hyphen within the body of the article and its table of contents.

The IEP is multicultural, so we do not want to place all events on a Christian timeline that uses AD and BC. Therefore, change B.C., BC, and BCE to B.C.E. (which means Before the Common Era). Do not use blank spaces within B.C.E., but do insert a blank space between the year and the B.C.E. Change Pliny (A.D. 62-113) to Pliny (62-113 C.E.). Note: the IEP does not normally use C.E. for any date after 500 C.E.

If you encounter c. or circa in birth/death dates, change these to ca. and use no space between it and the number.

Regarding the word century in birth/death dates, authors may use fourth century, fourth cn, 4th century, and 4th cn provided the article’s style is consistent.

Regarding approximate dates, our style is to use either, for example, Ramanuja (ca.1017-ca.1137) or Ramanuja (1017?-1137?). Within article titles the hyphen should be replaced by an em dash.

For disputed dates within a definite range, do not use circa, ca, or question marks, but instead use this style: Ramanuja (1017/21-1137). If only a death date is known, then use Ramanuja (d. 1137) with a blank space after the period.

q. Initials

You can use either J.M.E. McTaggart or J. M. E. McTaggart, but the key is to be consistent throughout the article. If referring to a person by using only their initials, then use no spaces and no periods, as in FDR.

r. Using “Now” and “Recent”

Do not allow these temporal terms: now, currently, at present, recent, recently, presently, a few years ago, now, to date, does not yet exist. For example, if your author writes, “Recently this topic has become attractive to philosophers of mathematics …,” change this to, “In the first two decades of the twenty-first century, this topic became attractive to philosophers of mathematics.” There can be exceptions to this policy, but the point is that the sentence shouldn’t risk changing from true to false if it were being read eighty years after its publication.

Always allow the word now within direct quotations or in passages in which it means as a consequence rather than at present.  Here is an example of an acceptable use of now:

This implies that x = 23. Because y = 2, now we know x+y = 25.

s. Quotations

IEP articles use two types of quotation formatting. Indent for long ones; use quotation marks for short ones.

Quotation formatting type 1: Quotations longer than three lines must be put in a new paragraph that is indented and introduced with a colon. Longer quotations can use multiple paragraphs Do not enclose these long quotations with quotation marks.

Quotation formatting type 2: quotations of three or fewer lines must be used inline. In these cases, the quotations must be enclosed within quotation marks.

Unlike in journal articles, full citations for quotations are not required in IEP articles. Only the author’s name is required.

The indention of non-quotations is fine; it is a tool for emphasizing something.

t. Punctuation

i. Quotation Marks

The American style uses double quotation marks. The British style uses single quotation marks.

ii. Dashes and Hyphens

Replace a double hyphen (- -) and an en dash (–) with an em dash (—), and remove any blank spaces around them.

iii. Colons and Semicolons

For quotations, place the colon and semicolon outside the quotation:

Correct: Kant wrote, “There is no fact of the matter here”; Kripke disagreed with him.

Incorrect: Kant wrote, “There is no fact of the matter here;” Kripke disagreed with him.

Listed items may be made inline or, instead, indented as new paragraphs. List short items with commas, and list long items with semicolons either inline or indented. Both cases must be introduced with a colon. Here are two examples:

Traditionally the arguments for God’s existence have fallen into several families: arguments, miracles, and prudential justifications.

A person is justified in believing that X does not exist if:

(a) all the available evidence used to support the view that X exists is shown to be inadequate;

(b) X is the sort of entity that, if X exists, then there is a presumption that would be evidence adequate to support the view that X exists;

(c) this presumption has not been defeated although serious efforts have been made to do so.

iv. Contractions

Contractions not within quotations must be unpacked. For example, change don’t to do not.

v. Future Tense

Sentences referring to what is included in the article must use the present tense rather than the future tense.

Correct: Both act and rule utilitarianism are discussed in the next section.

Incorrect: Both act and rule utilitarianism will be discussed in the next section.

vi. Non-English Words

Italicize non-English words.

These movements are designed to channel the flow of qi (energy).

In subsequent uses of the term, drop the associated English meaning.

u. Lists

Authors are allowed to choose their own way of producing lists. They might use numbers, letters, caps or smalls, and not be consistent in which they use. However, do add a left parenthesis if they use only a right one. That is, change:




Indent lists a standard tab; don’t make them be flush left unless the items listed are very large, say over thirty lines.

6. Last Step: Checkoff List

Most (but not all) of the recommendations described above have been converted into the following task list.

    1. Save changes. Turn on Review | Track Changes | All Markup. Save your work early and often.
    2. Grammar check. Run the free version of the program on your article. It uses A.I. to improve your article’s grammar. You will find it to be surprisingly helpful, although occasionally its recommendations are incorrect. Change its default settings to Formal Writing, Neutral Tone, Purpose to Inform.
    3. Opening Summary. Check that the article has an opening summary; that its length is in the range of 200-500 words; and that it is not mentioned in the table of contents. Make a Word comment if there is an error here.
    4. Table of contents. Ensure that the text in the table of contents matches the corresponding heading text in the body of the article. If there is a mismatch, and it is not obvious how to fix it, then describe the problem in a Word comment.
    5. Hyperlinks. Check that all hyperlinks point to the correct location and that the hyperlink is not repeated later in the article.
    6. Contractions. Search for and unpack contractions that are not part of an externally sourced quotation. Rather than searching for apostrophes, it is usually easier to perform individual searches for: ‘t, ‘d, ’s, ‘re, ‘ve, ‘ll.
    7. Quotation marks. Ensure that the style of quotation marks is consistent throughout the article.
    8. Emphasis. Use italics and not quotation marks or boldface for emphasis.
    9. Final heading. Ensure that the article ends with a References and Further Reading. It is more important that this section’s style be internally consistent than that it conform to one of the famous styles.
    10. Periods. Check for missing periods and double periods at the ends of sentences.
    11. Dates. With any date range such as “101 B.C.E.-88 B.C.E”, check that an em dash (—) is used in the article’s title, but a hyphen is used within the body of the article.

Additional grammar guidelines are available at: