Diels-Kranz Numbering System

Of the writings of the Presocratics, only quotations embedded in the works of later authors have survived. These quotations, along with reports about the Presocratics and imitations of their works, were first compiled into a standard edition (Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker) in the nineteenth century by Hermann Diels (1848-1922) with revisions by Walther Kranz and subsequent editors, in a complete edition of all the works of Presocratic authors which has become standard in the field of ancient philosophy. The works of Presocratics, therefore, are normally referred to by DK numbers. In Diels-Kranz, each author is assigned a number, and within that author’s number, entries are divided into three groups labeled alphabetically:

  1. testimonia: ancient accounts of the authors’ life and doctrines
  2. ipsissima verba (literally, exact words, sometimes also termed “fragments”): the exact words of the author
  3. imitations: works which take the author as a model

Within each of these three groups, individual fragments or testimonia are assigned sequential numbers. So, for example, since Protagoras is the eightieth author in Diels-Kranz, the third testimony concerning him, a generally unreliable short biography by Hesychius, would be referred to as DK80a3.

Diels, Hermann and Walther Kranz. Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. Zurich: Weidmann, 1985.

Freeman, Kathleen. Ancilla to the Pre-Socratic Philosophers. Cambridge: Harvard Univ Pr., 1983 (reprint edition).

This book is a complete English translation of the ‘b’ passages–the so-called ‘fragments’–from Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker.

Author Information

Carol Poster
Email: cposter@english.fsu.edu
Florida State University