Donald Davidson: Philosophy of Language

Donald Davidson (1917-2003) was one of the most influential analytic philosophers of language during the second half of the twentieth century and the first decade of the twenty-first century. An attraction of Davidson’s philosophy of language is the set of conceptual connections he draws between traditional questions about language and issues that arise in other fields of philosophy, including especially the philosophy of mind, action theory, epistemology, and metaphysics. This article addresses only his work on the philosophy of language, but one should bear in mind that this work is properly understood as part of a larger philosophical endeavor.

It is useful to think of Davidson’s project in the philosophy of language as cleaving into two parts. The first, which commences with his earliest publications in the field (Davidson 1965 and 1967), explores and defends his claim that a Tarski-style theory of truth for a language L, modified and supplemented in important ways, suffices to explain how the meanings of the sentences of a language L  depend upon the meanings of words of L, and thus models a significant part of the knowledge someone possesses when she understands L. In other words, Davidson claims that we can adapt a Tarski-style theory of truth to do duty for a theory of meaning. This claim, which is stronger and more complex than it appears at first reading, is examined in section 1.

The second part of Davidson’s work on language (in articles beginning with Davidson 1973 and 1974) addresses issues associated with constructing the sort of meaning theory he proposes in the first part of his project. A Davidsonian theory of meaning is an empirical theory that one constructs to interpret─that is, to describe, systematize, and explain─the linguistic behavior of speakers one encounters in the field or, simply, in line at the supermarket. Again, this problem turns out to be more complex and more interesting than it first appears. This set of issues is examined in section 2.

Table of Contents

  1. Davidson’s Theory of Meaning
    1. Constraints on a Theory of Meaning
      1. Compositionality
      2. No Meaning Entities
    2. Theories of Truth as Theories of Meaning
    3. Meaning and Truth
    4. Formal and Natural Languages
      1. Indexicals
      2. Indirect Discourse
  2. Davidson’s Theory of Interpretation
    1. Radical Translation
    2. Radical Interpretation
      1. Principles of Charity: Coherence
      2. Principles of Charity: Correspondence
    3. Language without Conventions
    4. Indeterminacy of Interpretation
    5. Meaning and Interpretation
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Anthologies of Davidson’s Writings
    2. Individual Articles by Davidson
    3. Primary Works by other Authors
    4. Secondary Sources
      1. Anthologies
      2. Critical Discussions of Davidson’s Philosophy

1. Davidson’s Theory of Meaning

Davidson takes the notion of a theory of meaning as central, so it is important to be clear at the outset what he means by the term. Starting with what he does not mean, it is no part of his project to define the concept of meaning in the sense in which Socrates asks Euthyphro to define piety. Davidson writes that it is folly to try to define the concept of truth (Davidson, 1996), and the same holds for the closely related concept of meaning: both belong to a cluster of concepts so elementary that we should not expect there to be simpler or more basic concepts in terms of which they could be definitionally reduced. Nor does Davidson ask about meaning in such a way that we would expect his answer to take the form,

the meanings of a speaker’s words are such-and-suches.

Locke, who says that meanings of a speaker’s words are ideas in her mind, has a theory of meaning in this sense, as do contemporary philosophers of language who identify meanings with the contents of certain beliefs or intentions of the speaker.

Davidson, therefore, pursues neither a theory of what meaning is nor a theory of what meanings are. Rather, for Davidson a theory of meaning is a descriptive semantics that shows how to pair a speaker’s statements with their meanings, and it does this by displaying how semantical properties or values are distributed systematically over the expressions of her language; in short, it shows how to construct the meanings of a speaker’s sentences out of the meanings of their parts and how those parts are assembled. As a first approximation, one can think of a Davidsonian theory of meaning for the language L as a set of axioms that assign meanings to the lexical elements of the language and which, together with rules for constructing complex expressions of L, imply theorems of the form,

(M)  S means m,

for each sentence S of the language and m its meaning. If an observer of A’s linguistic behavior has such an “M-theorem” for each of his sentences, then she can explain and even make predictions about S‘s behavior; conversely, we can think of the M-theorems as expressing a body of linguistic knowledge that A possesses and which underwrites his linguistic competence.

a. Constraints on a Theory of Meaning

Much of the interest and originality of Davidson’s work on theories of meaning comes from his choice of Tarski-style theories of truth to serve as the model for theories of meaning. This choice is not obvious, though as early as 1935 Quine remarks that “in point of meaning… a word may be said to be determined to whatever extent the truth or falsehood of its contexts is determined” (Quine 1935, p. 89); it is not obvious since meaning is a richer concept than truth, for example, “snow is white” and “grass is green” agree in both being true, but they differ in meaning. As Davidson sees the matter, though, only theories of truth satisfy certain reasonable constraints on an adequate theory of meaning.

i. Compositionality

The first of these constraints is that a theory of meaning should be compositional. The motivation here is the observation that speakers are finitely endowed creatures, yet they can understand indefinitely many sentences; for example, you never before heard or read the first sentence of this article, but, presumably, you had no difficulty understanding it. To explain this phenomenon, Davidson reasons that language must possess some sort of recursive structure. (A structure is recursive if it is built up by repeatedly applying one of a set of procedures to a result of having applied one of those procedures, starting from one or more base elements.) For unless we can treat the meaning of every sentence of a language L  as the result of a speaker’s or interpreter’s performing a finite number of operations on a finite (though extendable) semantical base, L  will be unlearnable and uninterpretable: no matter how many sentences I master, there will always be others I do not understand. Conversely, if the meaning of each sentence is a product of the meanings of its parts together with the ways those parts are combined, then we can see “how an infinite aptitude can be encompassed by finite accomplishments” (Davidson 1965, p. 8). If every simple sentence of English results from applying a rule to a collection of lexical elements, for example, Combine a noun phrase and an intransitive verb (“Socrates” + “sits” ⇒ “Socrates sits”); and if every complex sentence results from applying a rule to sentences of English, such as Combine two sentences with a conjunction (“Socrates sits” + “Plato stands” ⇒ “Socrates sits and Plato stands”), then although human beings have finite cognitive capacities they can understand indefinitely many sentences. (“Socrates sits,” “Socrates sits and Plato stands,” “Socrates sits and Plato stands and Aristotle swims,” and so forth.)

This, then, gives us the requirement that a theory of meaning be compositional in the sense that it shows how the meanings of complex expressions are systematically “composed” from the meanings of simpler expressions together with a list of their modes of significant combination.

ii. No Meaning Entities

Davidson’s second adequacy constraint on a theory of meaning is that it avoid assigning objects (for example, ideas, universals, or intensions) to linguistic expressions as their meanings. In making this demand, Davidson does not stray into a theory of what meanings are; his point, rather, is that “the one thing meanings do not seem to do is oil the wheels of a theory of meaning… My objections to meanings in the theory of meaning is that… they have no demonstrated use” (Davidson 1967, p. 20).

To see this, consider that traditional logicians and grammarians divided a sentence into a subject term and a predicate term, for example, “Socrates sits” into the subject term “Socrates” and the predicate term “sits,” and assigned to the former as its meaning a certain object, the man Socrates, and to the latter a different sort of object, the universal Sitting, as its meaning. This leaves obscure, however, how the terms “Socrates” and “sits,” or the things Socrates and Sitting, combine to form a proposition, as opposed to, say, the terms “Socrates” and “Plato” (or the objects Socrates and Plato) which cannot combine to form a proposition. It also leaves obscure what role the copula “is” plays in sentences such as “Socrates is wise.” Does “is” refer to a third object that somehow “binds” Socrates to Wisdom? But how does this work? Or does “is” represent some relation? But what relation?

One might solve these difficulties faced by traditional accounts by assigning to different types of expressions different types of entities as their meanings, where these types differ in ways that make the entities amenable to combining in patterns that mirror the ways their corresponding expressions combine. If we read Frege as a Platonist, then his mature semantics is such a theory, since it divides expressions and their meanings, or Bedeutungen, into two types: “saturated” or “complete” expressions and meanings, and “unsaturated” or “incomplete” expressions and their meanings (see, for example, Frege, 1891). The proper noun “Annette” is an expression of the first type, and it means a particular object of the first type, the woman Annette; while the function expression “the father of ( )” belongs to the second type and means a certain nonspatiotemporal entity of the second type, namely, the function that maps objects to their fathers. (The open parentheses marks the argument place of the function expression, which is to be filled with a saturated expression such as “Annette,” and it lines up with a corresponding empty position in the function itself.) There is also the semantical rule that filling the parentheses of the expression, “the father of ( ),” yields a complete expression that means the father of whomever is meant by the saturated expression that fills the parentheses: Annette’s father if “Annette” fills the parentheses, Annette’s father’s father if “the father of Annette” fills the parentheses, and so forth. But now one has to ask, what is the point of our having said that the expression, “the father of ( )” means a certain entity? All the work is being done by the rule we have formulated, and none by the ontology.

There are other methodological considerations that lie behind Davidson’s hostility toward doing semantics by assigning objects and other sorts of entities to words as their meanings. People acquire a language by observing the situated behavior of other people, that is, by observing other people speaking about objects and occurrences in their shared environment; in turn, when they speak, what they mean by their words generally reflects the causes that prompt them to utter those words. These causes are usually mundane sorts of natural things and events, such as other people, grass, people mowing the grass, and the like. This picture of meaning is vague, but it suggests that the psychological achievement of understanding or being able to produce a sentence like “grass is green” rests on the same (or very nearly the same) natural abilities as knowing that grass is green; and it suggests to Davidson that theories of meaning should eschew the esoteric objects and relations that many contemporary philosophies of language presuppose, such as intensions, possible worlds, transworld identity relations, and so forth. By avoiding such things, Davidson positions theories of meaning more closely to the epistemology of linguistic understanding, in the sense of an account of the way that a speaker’s actions and other events are evidence for an interpreter’s attributing meaning to the speaker’s words.

b. Theories of Truth as Theories of Meaning

To begin to see what a Davidsonian theory of meaning looks like, recall schema M,

(M)  S means m,

where sentence S belongs to language L and m is its meaning. Recasting this in a more instructive version,

(M′)  S means that p,

we replace “m” in schema M by the schematic variable “p” in schema M′. In the latter, the schema is filled out by replacing “p” with a sentence in the interpreter’s background or metalanguage that translates the target or object language sentence S. For example, a theory of meaning for German constructed by an English-speaking interpreter might include as an instance of schema M′ the theorem,

“Schnee ist weiss” means that snow is white,

where “Schnee ist weiss” replaces “S” and “snow is white” replaces “p.

Now, schema M′ is more instructive than its predecessor because while the “m” in schema M names an object that S means – in violation of Davidson’s second constraint – the expression “p” holds the place for a sentence (for example, “snow is white”) that the interpreter uses to “track” the meaning of S (“Schnee ist weiss”) without reifying that meaning, that is, without treating that meaning as an object. The sentence that replaces “p” tracks the meaning of S in the sense that schema M′ correlates S (again, “Schnee ist weiss”) with the extra-linguistic condition that p (that snow is white) which the interpreter describes using her own sentence (“snow is white.”)

Schema M′ points the way forward, but we are not there yet. Davidson is not really interested in constructing theories of meaning in the sense of filling out schema M′ for every sentence of German or Urdu; rather, he theorizes about constructing theories of meaning to gain insight into the concept of meaning. And in this regard, schema M′ comes up short: it relies on the relation “means that” which is essentially synonymy across languages, which is as much in need of explication as meaning itself. What Davidson is really interested in is giving an explication, in Carnap’s sense (Carnap 1947, pp. 7-8), of an obscure explanandum, meaning, using a clear and exact explanans, and he finds his explanans in Tarski’s semantic theory of truth.

The semantic theory of truth is not a metaphysical theory of truth in the way that the correspondence theory of truth is. That is, the semantic theory of truth does not tell us what truth is, rather, it defines a predicate that applies to all and only the true sentences of a specified language (technically, true-in-L) by showing how the truth-conditions of a sentence of the language depend on the sentence’s internal structure and certain properties of its parts. This should sound familiar: roughly, the semantic theory of truth does for truth what Davidson wishes to do for meaning. Therefore, Davidson replaces schema M′ with Tarski’s schema T:

(T)  S is true if and only if p.

Schema T sits at the center of Tarski’s project. A formally adequate (that is, internally consistent) definition of truth for a language L is, in addition, materially adequate if it applies to all and only the true sentences of L; Tarski shows that an axiomatic theory θ meets this condition if it satisfies what he calls Convention T, which requires that θ entail for each sentence S of L  an instance of schema T. The idea is that the axioms of θ supply both interpretations for the parts of S, for example,

(A.i) “Schnee” means snow,


(A.ii)  an object a satisfies the German expression “x ist weiss” if and only if a is white,

and rules for forming complex German expressions from simpler ones, such as that

(A.iii)  “Schnee” + “x ist weiss” ⇒ “Schnee ist weiss,”

Together these axioms imply instances of schema T, for example,

“Schnee ist weiss” is true if and only if snow is white.

More precisely, an internally consistent theory of truth θ for a language L meets Convention T if it implies for each S of L an instance of schema T in which “p” is replaced by a sentence from the metalanguage that translates S. Clearly, such a theory will “get it right” in the sense that the T-sentences (that is, the instances of schema T) that θ implies do state truth conditions for the sentences of the object language.

Now, Davidson’s claim is not that a Tarski-style theory of truth in itself is a theory of meaning; in particular, he remarks that a T-sentence cannot be equated with a statement of a sentence’s meaning. At best, a Tarski-style theory of truth is a part of a theory of meaning, with additional resources being brought into play.

c. Meaning and Truth

Notice that Tarski’s Convention T employs the notion of translation, or synonymy across languages, and so a Tarski-style theory of truth cannot, as it stands, supply the explanans Davidson seeks. The underlying point, which Davidson acknowledges “only gradually dawned on me” (1984, p. xiv), is that Tarski analyzes the concept of truth in terms of the concept of meaning (or synonymy), while Davidson’s project depends on making the opposite move: he explains the notion of meaning in terms of truth.

Davidson, therefore, dispenses with translation and rewrites Convention T to require that

an acceptable theory of truth must entail, for every sentence s of the object language, a sentence of the form: s is true if and only if p, where “p” is replaced by any sentence that is true if and only if s is. Given this formulation, the theory is tested by the evidence that T-sentences are simply true; we have given up the idea that we must also tell whether what replaces ‘p’ translates s. (Davidson 1973, p. 134)

Thus, where Tarski requires that “p” translate S, Davidson substitutes the much weaker criterion that the T-sentences “are simply true.”

But Davidson’s weakened Convention T is open to the following objection. Suppose there is a theory of truth for German, θ1, that entails the T-sentence,

(T1)  “Schnee ist weiss” is true if and only if snow is white.

Suppose, further, that there is a second theory of truth for German, θ2, that is just like θ1 except that in place of (T1) it entails the T-sentence,

(T2)  “Schnee ist weiss” is true if and only if grass is green.

A theory of truth that entails (T2) is clearly false, but θ1 satisfies Davidson’s revised Convention T if and only if θ2 also satisfies it.

Here is why. The sentences “snow is white” and “grass is green” both happen to be true, and hence the two sentences are materially equivalent, that is,

Snow is white if and only if grass is green.

(Sentences are materially equivalent if they contingently have the same truth-value; sentences are logically equivalent if they necessarily have the same truth-value.) But since they are materially equivalent, it turns out that:

(T1) is true if and only if (T2 ) is true.

Therefore, all the T-sentences of θ1 are true if and only if all the T-sentences of θ2 are true, and thus θ1 satisfies Davidson’s revised Convention T if and only if θ2 does. The root of this problem is that when it comes to distinguishing between sentences, truth is too coarse a filter to distinguish between materially equivalent sentences with different meanings.

Davidson has a number of responses to this objection (in Davidson 1975). He points out that someone who knows that θ is a materially adequate theory of truth for a language L  knows more than that its T-sentences are true. She knows the axioms of θ, which assign meaning to the lexical elements of L, the words and simple expressions out of which complex expressions and whole sentences are composed; and she knows that these axioms imply the T-sentence correlations between object language sentences (“Schnee ist weiss”) and their interpreting conditions (that snow is white). Thus, someone who knows that θ is a materially adequate theory of truth for a language L   knows a systematic procedure for assigning to the sentences of L   their truth-conditions, making one’s grasp of a theory of truth-cum-meaning a holistic affair: knowing the T-sentence for any one object language sentence is tied to knowing the T-sentences for many object language sentences. (For example, knowing that “‘Schnee ist die Farbe der Wolken” is true if and only if snow is the color of clouds, and that “Schnee ist weiss” is true if and only if snow is white, is tied to knowing that “Wolken sind weiss” is true if and only if clouds are white.) In this way, although Davidson’s version of Convention T — stated in terms of truth rather than translation — does not prima facie filter out theories like θ2, such theories will raise red flags as deviant assignments (such as grass to “Schnee”) ramify through the language and interpreters consider the evidence of speakers pointing to snow and uttering, “Das ist Schnee!”

It matters, too, that the T-sentences of a Davidsonian theory of truth-cum-meaning are laws of an empirical theory and not mere accidental generalizations. The important difference here is that as empirical laws and not simple statements of chance correlations, T-sentences support counterfactual inferences: just as it is true that a certain rock would have fallen at 32 ft/sec2 if it had been dropped, even if it was not, it is also true that a German speaker’s utterance of “Schnee ist weiss” would be true if and only if snow is white, even in a world where snow is not white. (But in a world where grass is green, and snow is not white, it is not the case that a German speaker’s utterance of “Schnee ist weiss” would be true if and only if grass is green.)

This means that there is a logically “tighter” connection between the left- and right-hand sides of the T-sentences of materially adequate theories. This logically “tighter” connection underwrites the role that T-sentences have in constructing explanations of speakers’ behavior and, in turn, is a product of the nature of the evidence interpreters employ in constructing Davidsonian theories of truth-cum-meaning. An interpreter witnesses German speakers uttering “Schnee ist weiss!” while indicating freshly fallen snow; the interpreter singles out snow’s being white as the salient feature of the speaker’s environment; and she infers that snow’s being white causes him to hold the sentence, ‘Schnee ist weiss!,” true. Thus, the connection between snow’s being white and the T-sentence is more than a chance correlation, and this gets expressed by there being something stronger than an extensional relation between a statement of the evidence and the theory.

This has often been taken to be a fatal concession, inasmuch as Davidson is understood to be committed to giving an extensional account of the knowledge someone possesses when she understands a language. However, Davidson denies that he is committed to giving an extensional account of an interpreter’s knowledge; all he is after is formulating the theory of truth-cum-meaning itself in extensional terms, and he allows that ancillary knowledge about that theory may involve concepts or relations that cannot be expressed in extensionalist terms. Thus, it is not an objection to his project that an interpreter’s background logic, for example, in her understanding of her own theory, should involve appeal to intensional notions.

d. Formal and Natural Languages

Tarski restricts his attention to investigating the semantical properties of formal languages, whereas Davidson’s interest lies in the investigation of natural languages. Formal languages are well-behaved mathematical objects whose structures can be exactly and exhaustively described in purely syntactical terms, while natural languages are anything but well-behaved. They are plastic and subject to ambiguity, and they contain myriad linguistic forms that resist, to one degree or another, incorporation into a theory of truth via the methods available to the logical semanticist. Davidson has written on the problems posed by several of these linguistic forms (in Davidson 1967a, 1968, 1978, and 1979) including indexicals, adverbial modifiers, indirect discourse, metaphor, mood, and the propositional attitudes.

i. Indexicals

It is instructive to see how Davidson handles indexicals. The key insight here is that truth is properly a property of the situated production of a sentence token by a speaker at a certain time, that is, it is a property of an utterance, not a sentence. We define, therefore, an utterance to be an ordered triple consisting of a sentence token, a time, and a speaker. Truth is thus a property of such a triple, and in constructing a Tarski-style theory of truth for a language L the goal is to have it entail T-theorems such as:

“Das ist weiss” is true when spoken by x at t if and only if the object indicated by x at t is white.

This T-theorem captures two distinct indexical elements. First, the German pronoun “das” refers to the object the speaker indicates when she makes her utterance; we model its contribution to the utterance’s truth-condition by explicitly referring on the right side of the T-theorem to that object. Second, the German verb “ist” is conjugated in the present indicative tense and refers to the time the speaker performs her utterance. We represent this indexical feature by repeating the time variable “t” on both sides of the T-theorem. Not all sentences contain indexicals (“that,” “she,” “he,” “it”, “I,” “here,” “now,” “today,” and so forth, but unless it is formulated in the so-called “eternal present” (for example, “5 plus 7 is twelve”), every sentence contains an indexical element in the tense of the sentence’s main verb.

ii. Indirect Discourse

The philosophy of language is thick with proposals for treating the anomalous behavior of linguistic contexts involving intensional idioms, including especially indirect discourse and propositional attitude constructions. In such contexts, familiar substitution patterns fail; for example, it is true that

(1)  The Earth moves,

and that

(2)  The Earth = the planet on which D.D. was born in 1917.

By the Principle of Extensionality,

Co-referring terms can be exchanged without affecting the truth-value of contexts in which those terms occur,

we can infer that

The planet on which D.D. was born in 1917 moves.

However, if we report that Galileo said that (1), that is,

(3)  Galileo said that the Earth moves,

we are blocked from making the substitution,

(4)  Galileo said that the planet on which D.D. was born in 1917 moves,

for surely Galileo did not say that, since he died nearly three hundred years before D.D. was born. (2) and (3) are true, while (4) is false; hence (2) and (3) do not entail (4), and the Principle of Extensionality fails for “says that” contexts.

Davidson’s solution to this problem is as ingenious as it is controversial, for it comes at the price of some grammatical novelty. He argues that the word “that” that occurs in (3) is a demonstrative pronoun and not, as grammar books tell us, a relative pronoun; the direct object of “said” is this demonstrative, and not the subordinate noun clause “that the Earth moves.” In fact, under analysis this noun clause disappears and becomes two separate expressions: the demonstrative “that,” which completes the open sentence “Galileo said x,” and the grammatically independent sentence “The Earth moves.” This new sentence is the demonstrative’s referent; or, rather, its referent is the speaker’s utterance of the sentence, “The Earth moves,” which follows her utterance of the sentence “Galileo said that.” Thus Davidson proposes that from a logical point of view, (3) is composed of two separate utterances:

(5)  Galileo said that. The Earth moves.

In other words, the grammatical connection between “The Earth moves” and “Galileo said that” is severed and replaced by the same relationship that connects snow and my pointing to snow and saying “That is white.”

More properly, (5) should be:

(6)  Galileo said something that meant the same as my next utterance. The Earth moves.

This qualification is needed, since the utterance to which “that” refers in (5) is my utterance of a sentence in my language, which I use to report an utterance Galileo made in his language. As Davidson sometimes puts it, Galileo and I are samesayers: what he and I mean, when he performs his utterance and I perform mine, is the same. Finally, a careful semantical analysis of (6) should look something like this:

(7)  There exists some utterance x performed by Galileo, and x means the same in Galileo’s idiolect as my next utterance means in mine. The Earth moves.

Now in my utterance, “the Earth” can be exchanged for “the planet on which D.D. was born in 1917” because as I use them both expressions refer to the same object, namely, the Earth. Thus, the Principle of Extensionality is preserved.

Davidson proposes that this account can be extended to treat other opaque constructions in the object language, such as the propositional attitudes (Davidson 1975) and entailment relations (Davidson 1976). Looking at the former, the idea is that by analogy with (3), (5), and (6),

(8)  Galileo believed that the Earth moves,

should be glossed as

(9)  Galileo believed that. The Earth moves,

or, better,

(10)  Galileo believed something that had the same content meant as my next utterance. The Earth moves.

A question, then, is what is this something that Galileo believed? In the analysis of indirect discourse, my sentence (“The Earth moves”) tracks an actual utterance of Galileo’s (“Si muove”), but Galileo had many beliefs he never expressed verbally; so it cannot be an utterance of Galileo’s. Alternatively, one might treat thoughts as inner mental representations and belief as a relation between thinkers and thoughts so conceived; then what has the same content as my utterance of my sentence, “The Earth moves,” is Galileo’s mental representation in his language of thought. However, Davidson argues elsewhere (Davidson 1989) that believing is not a relation between thinker and mental objects; this point is important to the position he stakes out in the internalism/externalism debate in the philosophy of mind.

Instead, Davidson proposes (in Davidson 1975) that (3) is to (6) as (8) is to:

(11)  Galileo would be honestly speaking his mind were he to say something that had the same content as my next utterance. The Earth moves.

Galileo never actually said something that means the same as my sentence, “The Earth moves,” but had he spoken his mind about the matter, he would have. (Historically, of course, Galileo did say such a thing, but let us suppose that he did not.) This analysis, however, imports a counterfactual condition into the T-sentences of an interpreter’s theory for Galileo’s words and thoughts, which Davidson wants to avoid. Finally, in the same article Davidson seems to suggest that we treat Galileo’s thought more directly as a “belief state,” which might be glossed as:

(12)  Galileo was in some belief state that had the same content meant as my next utterance. The Earth moves.

Intuitively, this seems right: what I track with my utterance is precisely the content of Galileo’s belief. This leaves open, however, what “belief states” are such that they can be quantified over (as in (10)) and have contents that can be tracked by utterances. This, though, is a problem for the philosophy of mind rather than the philosophy of language, and there is no reason to suppose that it affects Davidson’s proposal more than other accounts of the semantics of the propositional attitudes.

2. Davidson’s Theory of Interpretation

Consideration of the exigencies of interpreting a person’s speech behavior yields additional constraints on theories of truth-cum-meaning, and it also provides deep insights into the nature of language and meaning. Davidson examines interpretation and the construction of theories of meaning by drawing extensively on the work of his mentor, W. V. Quine.

a. Radical Translation

In Quine’s famous thought experiment of radical translation, we imagine a “field linguist” who observes the verbal behavior of speakers of a foreign language, and we reflect on her task of constructing a translation manual that maps the speakers’ language onto her own. The translation task is radical in the sense that Quine assumes she has no prior knowledge whatsoever of the speakers’ language or its relation to her home language. Hence her only evidence for constructing and testing her translation manual are her observations of the speakers’ behavior and their relation to their environment.

The linguist’s entering wedge into a foreign language are those of the speakers’ utterances that seem to bear directly on conspicuous features of the situation she shares with her subject. Taking Quine’s well-known example, suppose a rabbit scurries within the field of view of both the linguist and an alien speaker, who then utters, “Gavagai!” With this as her initial evidence, the linguist sifts through the features of the complex situation that embeds his speech behavior; she reasons that were she in the subject’s position of seeing a rabbit, she would be disposed to assert, “Lo, a rabbit!” Supposing, then, that the alien speaker’s verbal dispositions relate to his environment as her verbal disposition are related to her own, she tentatively translates “Gavagai!” with her own sentence, “Lo, a rabbit!”

b. Radical Interpretation

Taking his inspiration from Quine, Davidson holds that a radical interpreter thus begins with observations such as:

(13)  A belongs to a community of speakers of a common language, call it K, and he holds “Gavagai!” true on Saturday at noon, and there is a rabbit visible to A on Saturday at noon,

and eliciting additional evidence from observing K-speakers’ situated verbal behavior, she infers that

(14)  If x is a K-speaker, then x holds “Gavagai!” true at t if and only if there is a rabbit visible to x at t.

This inference is subject to the vagaries that attend empirical research, but having gathered an adequate sample of instances of K-speakers holding “Gavagai” true when and only when rabbits cross their paths, she takes (14) to be confirmed. In turn, then, she takes (14) as support that (partly) confirms the following T-sentence of a Tarski-style truth theory for K:

(15)  “Gavagai!” is true when spoken by x at t if and only there is a rabbit visible to x at t.

Note that in reconstructing the language K, Davidson’s linguist does not mention sentences of her home language. Of course, she uses her own sentences in making these assignments, but her sentences are directed upon extra-linguistic reality. Thus, unlike a Quinean radical translator, who does mention sentences of his home language, a Davidsonian radical interpreter adopts a semantical stance: she relates speakers’ sentences to the world by assigning them objective truth conditions describing extra-linguistic situations and objects. It is in this sense that a Davidsonian linguist is an interpreter, and Davidson calls the project undertaken by his linguist the construction of a theory of interpretation.

i. Principles of Charity: Coherence

Like any empirical scientist, a Davidsonian radical interpreter relies on methodological assumptions she makes to move from her observations (13) to her intermediate conclusions (14) and to the final form of her theory (15). Davidson identifies as the radical interpreter’s two most important methodological assumptions the Principle of (Logical) Coherence and the Principle of Correspondence. Taken together these canons of interpretation are known, somewhat misleadingly, as the Principle(s) of Charity.

Since a Davidsonian theory of interpretation is modeled on a Tarski-style theory of truth, one of the first steps an interpreter takes is to look for a coherent structure in the sentences of alien speakers. She does this by assuming that a speaker’s behavior satisfies strong, normative constraints, namely, that he reasons in accordance with logical laws. Making this assumption, she can diagram the logical patterns in speakers’ verbal behavior and leverage evidence she gleans from her observations into a detailed picture of the internal structure of his language.

Assuming that a speaker reasons in accordance with logical laws is neither an empirical hypothesis about a subject’s intellectual capacities nor an expression of the interpreter’s goodwill toward her subject. Satisfying the norms of rationality is a condition on speaking a language and having thoughts, and hence failing to locate sufficient consistency in someone’s behavior means there is nothing to interpret. The assumption that someone is rational is a foundation on which the project of interpreting his utterances rests.

ii. Principles of Charity: Correspondence

The problem the radical interpreter faces is that by hypothesis she does not know what a speaker’s sentences mean, and neither does she have direct access to the contents of his propositional attitudes, such as his beliefs or desires. Both of these factors bear on making sense of his verbal behavior, however, for which sentences a speaker puts forward as true depends simultaneously on the meanings of those sentences and on his beliefs. For example, a K-speaker utters “Gavagai!” only if (α) the sentence is true if and only if a rabbit presents itself to him, and (β) he believes that a rabbit presents itself to him.

A speaker’s holding a sentence true is thus (as Davidson put it) a “vector of two forces” (Davidson 1974a, p. 196), what meanings his words have and what he believes about the world. The interpreter thus faces the problem of too many unknowns, which she solves by performing her own thought experiment: she projects herself into her subject’s shoes and assumes that he does or would believe what she, were she in his position, would believe. This solves the problem of her not knowing what the speaker believes since she knows what she would believe were she in his situation, and hence she knows what her subject does believe if he believes what she thinks he ought to believe. The Principle of Correspondence is the methodological injunction that an interpreter affirm the if-clause.

The Principle of Correspondence applies especially to speakers’ observation sentences, for example, there goes a rabbit! These are the points of immediate causal contact between the world shared by speakers and interpreters, on the one hand, and the utterances and attitudes of speakers, on the other. Where there is greater distance between cause (features of the speaker’s situation) and effect (which sentences the speaker puts forward as true), there are extra degrees of freedom in explaining how the speaker might reasonably hold true something that the interpreter believes is false.

Davidson sometimes formulates the Principle of Correspondence in terms of the interpreter’s maximizing agreement between her and the speakers she interprets, but this is misleading. An interpreter needs to fill out the contents of the speaker’s attitudes if her project is to move forward; and she does this by attributing to him those beliefs that allow her to tell the most coherent story about what he believes. Thus, she routes attributions of beliefs to the speaker through what she knows about his beliefs and values. An interpreter will still export to her subject a great deal of her own world view, but if there are grounds for attributing to him certain beliefs that she takes to be false, then she does so if what she knows about him makes it more reasonable than not. She thus makes use of whatever she knows about the speaker’s personal history and psychology.

c. Language without Conventions

Davidson typically presents radical interpretation as targeting a community’s language, but in his more careful statements he argues that the focus of interpretation is the speech behavior of a single individual over a given stretch of time (Davidson 1986). One reason for this is that Davidson denies that conventions shared by members of a linguistic community play any philosophically interesting role in an account of meaning. Shared conventions facilitate communication, but they are in principle dispensible. For so long as an audience discerns the intention behind a speaker’s utterance, for example, he intends that his utterance of “Schnee ist weiss” mean that snow is white, then his utterance means that snow is white, regardless of whether he and they share the practice that speakers use “Schnee ist weiss” to mean that snow is white. This point is implicit in the project of radical interpretation.

This implies, according to Davidson, that what we ordinarily think of as a single natural language, such as German or Urdu, is like a smooth curve drawn through the idiolects of different speakers. It also underwrites Davidson’s claim that “interpretation is domestic as well as foreign” (Davidson 1973, p. 125), that is, there is no essential difference between understanding the words spoken by radically alien speakers and our familiars; there is only the practical difference that one has more and better information about the linguistic behavior and propositional attitudes of those with whom one has more contact.

d. Indeterminacy of Interpretation

Davidson, following Quine, argues that although the methodology of radical interpretation (or translation, for Quine) winnows the field of admissible candidates, it does not identify a unique theory that best satisfies its criteria. At the end of the day there will be competing theories that are mutually inconsistent but which do equally well in making sense of a speaker’s utterance, and in this sense interpretation (and translation) is indeterminate.

Quine draws from this the skeptical conclusion that there is “no fact of the matter” when it comes to saying what speakers or their words mean. Davidson stops short of Quine’s skepticism, and he draws a different moral from the indeterminacy arguments. (In this section we emphasize Davidson’s agreements with Quine, in the following his disagreement.)

Here is how indeterminacy infects the task of the radical translator. She begins with a speaker’s situated observation sentences, and she finds her first success in correlating a sentence SH of her home language with a sentence SO of her subject’s language. She hypothesizes that SH and SO are synonymous, and this is her wedge into the speaker’s language. Next, the translator makes hypotheses about how to segment the speaker’s observation sentences into words (or morphemes) and about how to line these up with words of her own language. For example, she may identify the initial vocable of “Gavagai!,” “ga,” with the demonstrative “there” in her home language, and “gai” with the common noun “rabbit.” This permits her to puzzle out the translation of nonobservation sentences that share some of their parts with observation sentences. (In the Davidsonian version, these correlations take the form of interpretations rather than translations, but the point is the same.)

These additional hypotheses are essential to her project, but they are not backed by any direct behavioral evidence. They are confirmed just so long as the translations or interpretations they warrant are consistent with the linguist’s evidence for her evolving theory; however, that evidence has the form of information about the translation or interpretation of complete sentences. Indeterminacy arrives on the scene, then, because different sets of hypotheses and the translations or interpretations they imply do equally well in making sense of a speaker’s sentences, even though they assign different translations or interpretations to the parts of those sentences.

Indeterminacy, however, also infects the translation and interpretation of complete sentences. This is because the evidence for a translation manual or theory of interpretation does not, in fact, come at the level of sentences. The radical translator or interpreter does not test her translations or T-sentences one-by-one; rather, what goes before the tribunal of evidence is a complete translation manual or theory of interpretation for the entire language (Quine 1953). This means that in the case of sentences, too, there is slack between evidence and a translation or interpretation as the linguist may vary the translation or interpretation of a given sentence by making complementary changes elsewhere in her translation manual or theory of interpretation. Thus the interpretation of sentences as well as terms is indeterminate.

e. Meaning and Interpretation

Davidson’s response to the indeterminacy arguments is at the same time more modest and more ambitious than Quine’s. It is more modest because Davidson does not endorse the skeptical conclusion that Quine draws from the arguments that since there are no determinate meanings, there are no meanings. This reasoning is congenial to Quine’s parsimony and his behaviorism: all there is, according to Quine, are speaker’s behavior and dispositions to behave and whatever can be constructed from or explained in terms of that behavior and those dispositions.

It is more ambitious than Quine’s response insofar as Davidson offers in place of Quine’s skepticism what Hume would call a skeptical solution to the indeterminacy problem. That is, while acknowledging the validity of Quine’s argument that there are no meanings, he undertakes to reconceive the concept of meaning that figures as a premise in that reasoning (as Hume reconceives the concept of causation that figures in his skeptical arguments). There are no determinate meanings, therefore, meaning is not determinate. In place of the traditional picture of meanings as semantical quanta that speakers associate with their verbal expressions, Davidson argues that meaning is the invariant structure that is common to the competing interpretations of speakers’ behavior (Davidson 1999, p. 81). That there is such a structure is implied by holism: in assigning a certain meaning to a single utterance, an interpreter has already chosen one of a number of competing theories to interpret a speaker’s over-all language. Choosing that theory, in turn, presupposes that she has identified in the speaker’s utterances a pattern or structure she takes that theory to describe at least as well as any other. Herein lies the Indeterminacy of Interpretation, for that theory does only at least as well as any other. There is, therefore, no more an objective basis for choosing one theory of meaning over another than there is for preferring the Fahrenheit to the Celsius scale for temperature ascriptions.

This conclusion, however, has no skeptical implications, for by assumption each theory does equally well at describing the same structure. Whether there is a “fact of the matter” when it comes to saying what speakers or their sentences mean, therefore, becomes the question whether there are objective grounds for saying that that structure exists. That structure is a property of a system of events, and hence the grounds for saying that it exists are the criteria for attributing those properties to those events; the skeptical conclusion would follow, therefore, only if there were no such criteria. The argument for the Indeterminacy of Interpretation does not prove that, however. On the contrary, the methodology of radical interpretation provides a framework for attributing patterns of properties to speakers and their utterances.

As Davidson reconceives it, therefore, understanding a person’s sentences involves discerning patterns in his situated actions, but no discrete “meanings.” An interpreter makes sense of her interlocutor by treating him as a rational agent and reflecting on the contents of her own propositional attitudes, and she tracks what his sentences mean with her own sentences. This project may fail in practice, especially where the interpretation is genuinely radical and there is moral as well as linguistic distance separating an interpreter and a speaker; but in principle there is no linguistic behavior that cannot be interpreted, that is, understood, by another. If an interpreter can discern a pattern in a creature’s situated linguistic behavior, then she can make sense of his words; alternatively, if she cannot interpret his utterances, then she has no grounds for attributing meaning to the sounds he produces nor evidence to support the hypothesis that he is a rational agent. These observations are not a statement of linguistic imperialism; rather, they are implications of the methodology of interpretation and the role that Tarski-style theories of truth-cum-meaning play in the enterprise. Meaning is essentially intersubjective.

Further, meaning is objective in the sense that most of what speakers say about the world is true of the world. Some critics object that this statement rests on an optimistic assessment of human capacities for judgment; however, Davidson’s point is not an empirical claim that could turn out to be mistaken. Rather, it is a statement of the methodology of radical interpretation, an assumption an interpreter makes to gain access to her subject’s language. Her only path into his language is by way of the world they share since she makes sense of his sentences by discerning patterns in the relations between those sentences and the objects and events in the world that cause him to hold those sentences true. If too many of his utterances are false, then the link between what he says and thinks, on the one hand, and the world, on the other, is severed; and the enterprise of interpretation halts. Finding too much unexplainable error in his statements about the world, therefore, is not an option, if she is going to interpret him.

3. References and Further Reading

a. Anthologies of Davidson’s Writings

  • Davidson, Donald. 1984. Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation. New York: Oxford University Press. [Cited as ITI]
  • Davidson, Donald. 2001. Essays on Actions and Events. Oxford University Press. [Cited as EAE]
  • Davidson, Donald. 2001. Subjective, Intersubjective, Objective. New York: Oxford University Press. [Cited as SIO]
  • Davidson, Donald. 2005. Truth, Language, and History. New York: Oxford University Press. [Cited as TLH]
  • Davidson, Donald. 2005A. Truth and Predication. Boston: Harvard University Press.
    • Contains the texts of Davidson’s 1989 Dewey Lectures (given at Columbia University) on the concept of truth together with his 2001 Hermes Lectures (given at the University of Perugia). The first half is useful in understanding the role truth plays in his systematic philosophy, and the second half contains Davidson’s interesting criticisms of his predecessors, ranging from Plato to Quine.

b. Individual Articles by Davidson

  • Davidson, Donald. 1965. “Theories of Meaning and Learnable Languages,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1967. “Truth and Meaning,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1967a. “The Logical Form of Action Sentences,” reprinted in EAE.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1968. “On Saying That,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1973. “Radical Interpretation,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1974. “Belief and the Basis of Meaning,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1974a. “On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1975. “Thought and Talk,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1976. “Reply to Foster,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1978. “What Metaphors Mean,” reprinted in ITI.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1986. “A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs,” reprinted in TLH.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1989. “What is Present to the Mind?”, reprinted in SIO.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1996. “The Folly of Trying to Define Truth,” reprinted in TLH.
  • Davidson, Donald. 1999. “Reply to W.V. Quine,” printed in Hahn 1999.

c. Primary Works by other Authors

  • Carnap, Rudolf. 1947., Meaning and Necessity, 2nd ed. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Frege, Gottlob. 1891. “Funktion und Begriff,” translated as “Function and Concept” and reprinted in Brian McGuinness et al. (eds.), Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic, and Philosophy, 1984. New York: Basil Blackwell.
  • Quine, W.V. 1935. “Truth by Convention,” reprinted in The Ways of Paradox, 1976. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

d. Secondary Sources

i. Anthologies

  • De Caro, Marion. 1999. Interpretations and Causes: New Perspectives on Donald Davidson’s Philosophy. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
    • Articles by an internationally diverse range of authors focusing on the interplay between the notions of interpretation and causation in Davidson’s philosophy.
  • Dasenbrock, Reed Way. 1993. Literary Theory After Davidson. University Park: Penn State Press.
    • Articles addressing the significance of Davidson’s philosophy of language for literary theory.
  • Hahn, Edwin Lewis. 1999. The Philosophy of Donald Davidson. The Library of Living Philosophers, volume XXVII. Peru, IL: Open Court Publishing Company.
    • A useful collection of articles, including Davidson’s intellectual autobiography and his replies to authors.
  • Kotatko, Petr, Pagin, Peter and Segal, Gabriel. 2001. Interpreting Davidson. Stanford, CA: Center for the Study of Language and Information Publications.
  • Lepore, Ernest. 1986. Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
    • An excellent collection of articles addressing a range of topics in Davidson’s philosophy of language.
  • Stoecker, Ralf. 1993. Reflecting Davidson: Donald Davidson Responding to an International Forum of Philosophers. Berlin: de Gruyter.

ii. Critical Discussions of Davidson’s Philosophy

  • Evnine, Simon. 1991. Donald Davidson. Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Joseph, Marc. 2004. Donald Davidson. Montreal: McGill-Queens University Press.
  • Lepore, Ernest, and Ludwig, Kirk. 2005. Davidson: Meaning, Truth, Language, and Reality. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Lepore, Ernest, and Ludwig, Kirk. 2009. Donald Davidson’s Truth-Theoretic Semantics. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • A detailed and technical examination of Davidson’s use of Tarski-style theories of truth in his semantical project.
  • Ramberg, Bjørn. 1989. Donald Davidson’s Philosophy of Language. Oxford: Basil Blackwell.

Author Information

Marc A. Joseph
Mills College
U. S. A.