Doxastic Conservatism

We are creatures with clear cognitive limitations. Our memories are finite and there is a limit to the kinds of things we can store and retrieve. We cannot, for example, remember the justification or evidence for many of our beliefs. Moreover, in response to our limited cognitive resources, we generally tend to maintain our beliefs and are reluctant to change them. A clear case of this psychological tendency to preserve beliefs obtains when people are informed of the inadequacy of the original grounds of their beliefs. Their reluctance to change their beliefs shows that they are sensitive to the fact that changing them incurs cognitive costs, thus straining their limited resources.

Certain views in epistemology have sought to put a rational gloss on this phenomenon of belief perseverance by suggesting the thesis of doxastic conservatism, according to which the fact that one believes a proposition provides some measure of justification for that belief. This initial picture has, however, become more complicated by further claims made on behalf of the thesis to the effect that it also has the potential to resolve certain outstanding problems in epistemology, (such as how perception is a source of reason), skeptical worries about induction, and the problem of easy knowledge. Examination of these claims reveals that they involve more than one thesis of conservatism. Moreover, it appears that the epistemic role that is attributed to the conservative thesis is often played by superficially similar claims which derive their epistemic significance not from what the thesis regards as the source of justification but from other substantial properties that are attributed to beliefs. This article presents and examines some of the main accounts of the thesis of doxastic conservatism as well as the arguments that are suggested in their support.

Table of Contents

  1. Doxastic Conservatism: The Debate
  2. Varieties of Doxastic Conservatism
  3. Differential Conservatism
  4. Perseverance Conservatism
  5. Generation Conservatism
    1. Arguing for and Against GC
      1. The Transcendental Argument
      2. The Argument from Charity
    2. Modifying GC
      1. Conservatism as the Principle of Credulity
      2. Conservatism as Believing in the Absence of Defeaters
      3. Conservatism as a Dynamic Strategy
  6. Conclusion
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Doxastic Conservatism: The Debate

Doxastic conservatism refers to a variety of theses which, in different ways, emphasize the stability of one’s belief system by requiring the subject to refrain from revising his or her beliefs when there are no good reasons for a revision. We are all too familiar with the fact that our undeniable cognitive limitations restrict the set of things we can store or retrieve. Often, we lose track of the justification relations among our beliefs and the reasons behind them, which is why, as well documented experiments have shown, we tend to retain many of our beliefs despite being informed of the inadequacy of their original grounds. Against this background of limited cognitive resources and the costs that the changing of one’s mind incurs, doxastic conservatism (DC) presents itself as a viable blueprint for regulating our belief-forming processes by recommending the adoption of those hypotheses that minimize the revision of our belief system, thereby ensuring its stability. The advocates of DC, however, do not limit its virtues to the minimization of such cognitive costs; they sometimes make ambitious claims on its behalf, highlighting its ability to serve a number of epistemological projects such as the justification of memory beliefs and the resolution of various skeptical problems (McGrath 2007, McCain 2008, and Poston 2012).

However, before proceeding to delineate the contours of the conservatism thesis as well as its purported virtues, an important terminological remark is in order. The conservative thesis that is the subject of this article is generally known in the literature under the rubric of epistemic conservatism. However, since there are several different theses in epistemology all using the same or a similar label, it is best to call it doxastic rather than epistemic conservatism to distinguish it from such theses as phenomenal conservatism and epistemic conservatism, the latter of which is found in the context of the liberalism (dogmatism)/conservatism debate. According to phenomenal conservatism (Huemer 2001), if it seems to you that p, then, in the absence of defeaters, you thereby have at least some degree of justification for believing p. When phenomenal conservatism is restricted to perceptual experience, the thesis is known as dogmatism (Pryor 2000). According to dogmatism (liberalism), perceptual experience (e) gives one justification to believe its content if it appears to one that p and one has no reason to suspect that any skeptical alternative to p is true. So, in this liberal theory, experience on its own can confer justification on the belief in its content. Against this liberal view stands the conservative view, notably defended by Crispin Wright (2004), according to which to be warranted or justified in holding a perceptual belief, we must have some antecedent justification or entitlement to believe certain fundamental presuppositions such as the existence of the world, the reliability of our perceptual system, and so on. With this word of caution out of the way, discussion of conservatism can proceed without the risk of confusing it with similarly labeled doctrines.

Doxastic conservatism has informed philosophical views as diverse as Quine’s and Chisholm’s. According to Quine (1951), belief revision must be subject to a number of conditions, most notably the overall simplicity of the resulting belief system and the need to preserve as many earlier beliefs as possible. For Chisholm (1980), however, conservative principles play an important role in his defense of epistemological foundationalism. Despite the popularity of the conservatism thesis, however, it is difficult to identify a single thesis as representing its content. Sometimes DC is presented as the claim that the holding of a belief confers some positive epistemic status on its content, sometimes it is said to regulate our decision to continue to hold a belief, and sometimes it is said to help us to decide between a number of evidentially equivalent alternative hypotheses. Although it is easy to see a common motivation behind all these different versions of DC, one should not lose sight of their differences, because the considerations that are usually offered in their defense often involve different concerns. This article begins by distinguishing between three main varieties of doxastic conservatism, namely, differential, perseverance, and generation conservatism. It then examines the plausibility of the arguments given in their support. This investigation pays special attention to the alleged payoffs of DC. In particular, it will inquire whether it is DC, on its own, that has such epistemic potentials or whether the latter are the result of other claims that superficially resemble DC.

2. Varieties of Doxastic Conservatism

As noted above, the thesis of doxastic conservatism actually covers a family of views that are all presented as conservative theses. These non-equivalent versions of conservatism differ from each other not only because their advocates often reject one version while upholding another, but also because the arguments that are put forward in their favor are actually tailored to defend one particular version to the exclusion of another. For example, Lawrence Sklar (1975) defends what he calls methodological conservatism, which guides a cognizer who comes to know of a hypothesis that is evidentially equivalent to the one that she has already adopted. However, Sklar rejects another version of conservatism, according to which holding a belief confers some measure of justification on that belief, for being too strong. It is, however, this latter version of conservatism, defended by Chisholm (1980), that is upheld as the standard version of doxastic conservatism.

Another exponent of conservatism, Gilbert Harman (1986), is more concerned with uncovering the principles that regulate our continuing to believe a proposition in the absence of contrary reasons. Although Harman sometimes appeals to the standard version of conservatism, on his official account conservatism is the view according to which “one is justified in continuing fully to accept something in the absence of a special reason not to” (1986, p. 46). Accordingly, to evaluate the thesis of epistemic conservatism, it would be more appropriate to begin by distinguishing the following types of the conservative theses (Vahid 2004):

Differential Conservatism (DiC) One is justified in holding to a hypothesis (belief) despite coming to know of evidentially equivalent alternatives.
Perseverance Conservatism (PC) One is justified to continue to hold a belief as long as there is no special reason to give it up.
Generation Conservatism (GC) Holding a belief confers some measure of justification on the belief.

When evaluating these theses for their epistemic worth, it should be borne in mind that some of the virtues mentioned in connection with their plausibility are pragmatic in nature. We are told that, due to our cognitive limitations, changing our mind for no good reason is a waste of our time, energy, and resources, and that, therefore, following the conservative principles would minimize such costs and save us from dwindling our resources. Whatever the practical merits of conservatism, such virtues, on their own, due to their pragmatic nature, fail to ensure that epistemically warranted beliefs would result from adherence to the conservative principles as canons of theory choice. Thus, we need to see what it is exactly that makes conservatism an epistemic, rather than a pragmatic, thesis, and this is best achieved by examining the merits of each conservative principle on its own.

3. Differential Conservatism

According to Sklar, “[a]ll [differential conservatism] commits us to is the decision not to reject a hypothesis once believed simply because we become aware of alternative, incompatible hypotheses which are just as good as, but no better than, that believed” (1975, 378). Sklar’s defense of DiC is a sort of transcendental argument involving what he calls an anti-foundationalist “local theory of justification.” Unlike the foundationalist theory of justification, in which basic beliefs depend on no other beliefs for their justification, the local theory takes epistemic justification to be relative to a body of assumed, unchallenged background beliefs. These background beliefs are supposed to play the role of evidence. They can play such a role, says Sklar, because their own status is not at the time under scrutiny. Such an account, however, is consistent with the existence of incompatible total belief structures all being locally justified. The only way to rule out this possibility is to invoke differential conservatism and hold on to what we already believe despite becoming aware of competing belief structures.

This argument, however, leaves one with a lacuna about the status of the background beliefs in the relevant belief structures. In order to confer justification on the target belief, these background beliefs must themselves be justified. However, with Sklar’s rejection of foundationalism, such beliefs can only acquire their epistemic worth either by cohering with the rest of one’s belief system or by relying on GC, according to which the mere holding of a belief confers a positive epistemic status on it. The latter option is not available to Sklar because he rejects GC for being too strong. The only alternative seems to be to adopt a coherence theory of justification and claim that the unchallenged background beliefs acquire their justified status by belonging to a coherent belief system. Collapsing the local theory into a holistic coherence theory of justification, though, renders DiC redundant. It is indeed no accident that, in defending the local theory, Sklar is forced to respond to the alternative coherent systems objection that usually arises for the coherentist accounts of justification. Either way, the transcendental argument is unsuccessful.

Considering the following scenario highlights another problem with DiC. Suppose two subjects, S1 and S2, faced with the task of explaining some body of data (e), come up with two incompatible hypotheses, H1 and H2 respectively, that can equally account for e. Both can be said to be justified in believing their respective hypothesis. Suppose, however, that S2 also learns or independently discovers that H1 equally accounts for e, and for some non-evidential, perhaps aesthetic, reason gives up his previous belief and instead comes to believe that H1. By DiC, S2 should have stuck with H2 and his belief that H1 is therefore not justified. If so, we have a case here where two tokens of the same belief (H1) are based on the same grounds, but while one is justified, the other is not, and this undermines the thesis of epistemic supervenience according to which the justification of a belief supervenes on certain non-epistemic properties of that belief, such as being reliably produced, being adequately grounded, or being part of a coherent belief system. It is worth noting that this problem only affects DiC on non-permissivist views according to which, for any body of evidence e and any proposition p, there is at most one kind of doxastic attitude towards p that is permitted by e.

One might object that since e equally justifies both H1 and H2, and the two hypotheses cohere equally well with S2’s beliefs, S2 is neither justified in believing H1 nor justified in believing H2 (McCain 2008). Of course, with these further stipulations about the justificatory role of coherence and the strength of evidence, S2 will not be justified. This would be a different conservative thesis (see below for discussion), however, and not the thesis that Sklar defends, which clearly states that one can retain one’s justification for believing a hypothesis despite coming to know of incompatible but evidentially equivalent hypotheses.

Finally, DiC may lack intuitive plausibility. Suppose a subject S comes to believe that H1 on the ground that it explains some data e. It is plausible to think that S’s awareness of a competing but equally explanatory hypothesis H2 should require some doxastic attitude adjustment vis-à-vis her belief that H1. The thought is that by finding out that H2 equally accounts for e and that H1 and H2 cannot be both correct, S, being a rational agent, should conclude that she may have assessed e inappropriately. Of course, this does not mean that S’s belief that H1 is false. However, given her fallibility, awareness of the second-order evidence regarding the possibility of her inappropriate assessment of e should prompt S to be more circumspect in her attitude towards H1. It follows that the rational credibility of this belief is thereby eroded to some extent. If S continues to come across further competing explanations of e such as H3, H4, and so forth, the evidential impact of such collective evidence would become quite impressive to the extent of significantly undermining the epistemic status of S’s original belief that H1. This conclusion is clearly at odds with DiC’s recommendation that S ought to stick with H1 regardless of the competing hypotheses that she may come across.

Marc Moffett (2007) has argued, however, that awareness of competing but equally explanatory hypotheses—underdetermination—does not constitute a defeater for holding on to our beliefs if we help ourselves with something like GC. In other words, if we accept that merely having a belief constitutes a prima facie justification for that belief, then it follows that if one believes that p at t, one should not abandon this belief at t unless one has adequate reason to do so. Accordingly, Moffett denies that knowledge that one’s belief is rationally underdetermined by evidence undermines our entitlement to that belief, for, given that underdetermination is a widespread phenomenon, we would be forced to adopt a theoretically neutral psychological standpoint in a great portion of our cognitive endeavors, which is implausible. Apart from the problem that this maneuver is at odds with Sklar’s rejection of GC, it is unclear whether such considerations constitute epistemic, rather than prudential or moral, reasons for holding on to beliefs.

4. Perseverance Conservatism

The driving force behind this version of conservatism, defended most notably by Harman (1986), has been the phenomenon of “lost justification” or “lost evidence.” As noted before, failure to keep track of our evidence, itself the result of our cognitive limitations, is usually taken to explain the so-called phenomenon of “belief perseverance in the face of evidential discrediting.” Experimental results have shown that people exhibit a psychological tendency towards the perseverance of their beliefs when apprised of the unreliability of the original source of those beliefs because they fail to recall that it was the discredited evidence that was initially responsible for their beliefs.

Harman discerns two competing theories of the rationality of belief perseverance, the foundations theory and the coherence theory. The former requires that one have a special reason to continue to hold a particular belief if one is to be justified in that belief, while the latter, by contrast, only requires the absence of any special reason to revise the belief in question for one to be justified to continue to hold it. Since the foundations theory requires that one keep track of one’s original reasons, Harman concludes that, in the face of the phenomenon of lost evidence, it is the coherence theory that is normatively correct, and the conservative thesis is simply the expression of its normative import. Although Harman sometimes understands conservatism as the thesis that “a proposition can acquire justification simply by being believed” (1986, p.30), it is obvious that it is not GC that he has in mind. For if having a bare belief is to be sufficient for its justification, the phenomenon of lost evidence or justification would be rendered impossible since the belief itself would ground its justification.

Harman’s official account of conservatism, along the lines of PC, maintains that one is justified in continuing to hold a belief as long as there are no good reasons against it. Although PC can account for the rationality of belief perseverance, alternative explanations of such rationality can undermine its credibility. Before addressing this issue, it is worth considering an objection made to Harman’s argument from lost justification by David Christensen (1994), as it would further clarify what PC really involves. Christensen thinks that one can explain the phenomenon of belief perseverance without appealing to any conservative principle. Suppose, for example, that I currently hold the belief that the population of India exceeds that of the United States, though I have forgotten what the source of my belief was. To show that conservatism need not play any role in explaining the rationality of this belief, Christensen offers what he takes to be a similar case, where it is completely implausible to invoke any conservative principle. Suppose I flip a coin which lands out of my sight, and I decide to believe that it has landed tails up without checking to see whether it has. It is obviously implausible to take that belief as justified, but it seems this is what conservatism invites us to do.

Despite their structural similarity, the two cases, says Christensen, differ in the following respect: “In both cases, I have a belief for which I am unable to cite any grounds…Yet in one case, maintaining the belief seems quite reasonable; while in the other… unreasonable” (1994, 74). Christensen claims that one cannot explain this difference in terms of the applicability of conservatism in one case and its inapplicability in another. Rather, it is to be explained by the role that background beliefs play in the two cases. In the India example, I have some background beliefs—for example, that I have acquired the belief from a reliable source, that despite India and the United States being favorite topics in my family, I have never been contradicted, and so forth—that convince me that my belief is correct. Moreover, it is precisely such beliefs that maintain the rationality of my continuing to hold the belief about India’s population. However, no similar beliefs are present in the coin example, which is why I am not justified in holding the belief that I do.

Vahid has, however, criticized this argument on several grounds (2004). It could be, for instance, that the coin example and the India example are only superficially similar. It is true that, in both cases, I have a belief for which I can no longer recall any evidence, but this is true for different reasons in the two cases. In the India case, I have forgotten the original source of my belief, but in the coin case there is simply no reason to report. So the coin case is not really an instance of the phenomenon of forgotten evidence. More damaging, even the India example does not seem to be a case of forgotten evidence. For what seems to be forgotten in that example is merely the name or identity of the source of my belief, and that is irrelevant to the question of the rationality of continuing to hold to that belief. After all, Christensen himself maintains that among the things I know in this case is that “I was once told [about India’s population] by… some… reliable source, and I (quite rationally) accepted the source’s word for it” (1994, p.73). To put it differently, the evidence that I have forgotten in this example concerns the identity of the source of my belief that India is more populous than the United States. However, as far the belief itself is concerned, I have enough information to render it justified.

As noted above, PC’s credibility in accounting for the rationality of belief perseverance can be undermined if there are alternative explanations of the phenomenon of lost justification. Here is one alternative explanation (Vahid 2004). Suppose we take the property of justification to be an objective property that beliefs possess when they are adequately grounded. It is also customary in the epistemology literature to distinguish between “being justified” or “having justification” and the “activity of justification” (Alston 1989). The idea is that just as one can be good, say, without being able to show that one possesses that virtue, one’s belief can have (and retain) the property of justification if it was initially based on adequate grounds, and there are currently no defeaters, without one being able to show that it is justified. With these distinctions in force, one could say that what the phenomenon of lost justification threatens is not the justification of one’s belief, but one’s ability to show that one is justified in holding that belief. The plausibility of this explanation depends, however, on the fate of some of the contentious issues in the internalism-externalism debate in epistemology.

5. Generation Conservatism

This section presents what is generally regarded as the standard version of conservatism, namely, GC. Given its mainstream status, GC has been more extensively discussed than the other versions of conservatism. Unlike the other two versions of conservatism, where what is at issue is the epistemic status of belief when one has lost track of its grounds or when one has been apprised of the evidentially equivalent competing hypotheses to that belief, generation conservatism (GC) is concerned with whether the very formation of a belief bears on its epistemic status. As Chisholm characterizes GC, the principle says that “anything we find ourselves believing may be said to have some presumption in its favor—provided it is not explicitly contradicted by the set of other things that we believe” (1980, pp. 551-552). Despite being the mainstream version of conservatism, GC also turns out to be its most controversial version.

There is no doubt that GC, if true, is a powerful epistemic tool for resolving a number of standing problems in epistemology, such as the problem of skepticism, the puzzle over the epistemic status of memory beliefs, and others. It has also been put to use to address a number of other challenges, like the problems facing internalism. For example, Smithies (2019) has argued for what he calls “phenomenal mentalism” according to which epistemic justification is determined only by our phenomenally individuated mental states, which include not only our conscious experiences but also our consciously accessible beliefs. More specifically, he defends a synchronic version of phenomenal mentalism, which takes epistemic justification to be determined by the phenomenal states you have now. This particular version of internalism is, however, vulnerable to the problem of forgotten evidence, as when a subject no longer remembers the ground of her justified belief (Goldman 1999). Along with other authors (McGrath 2007), Smithies thinks that GC provides a neat solution to this problem.

GC has also been the subject of many criticisms including, among other things, the “boost” and “conversion” objections as well as arbitrariness worries (for the latter, see below). The conversion problem says that when one has adequate evidence for two contrary hypotheses H1 and H2, one should withhold judgment. However, according to GC, by believing either of the hypotheses, the subject can convert her evidential situation from unjustified to justified, which is unacceptable. According to the boost problem, GC allows a subject to boost her justification for believing a proposition (p) by simply forming the belief. Suppose that S has evidence that supports p to some degree n. If GC is true, S can boost this support relation by simply believing that p. Following Feldman (2014), McCain (2020) has responded to this objection by rejecting the “additivity of evidence” principle, which says that if an agent S acquires new evidence that supports p while retaining any old evidence, then, in the absence of defeaters for p, S becomes better justified in believing p. The argument against this principle appeals to the possibility of redundant evidence; that is, evidence that makes no difference in levels of justification. Accordingly, there can be cases where S acquires new evidence for p without becoming better justified in believing p (Feldman 2014).

Another objection is that GC seems to conflict with the causal accounts of the basing relation (Frise 2017). The obtaining of the basing relation is what marks the transition from propositional to doxastic justification, and it is widely believed that causation must play a role in any viable account of the basing relation. The problem is that since a belief cannot cause itself at a time, the beliefs that GC claims are justified fail to satisfy the causal requirements for the basing relation (see McCain 2020 for a response). Finally, there is also the argument that GC lacks in intuitive plausibility. The idea is that it seems difficult to see how the bare fact of believing a proposition could confer justification on that belief. To get a sense of this unease, consider Christensen’s coin example again. I flip a coin which lands out of my sight and I form the belief that it has landed tails up without bothering to see if this is the case. GC seems to rule that this belief is justified, which is implausible. A response is that belief makes an epistemic contribution only when the subject lacks evidence for or against it (Poston 2012). If this is correct, though, it follows that a subject who believes that p in the absence of evidence for or against p would be placed in a position by GC to assert the following Moore-paradoxical sentence: <p but I have no evidence for p>. The awkwardness of allowing mere belief to be a source of justification does not disappear so easily (see Poston 2014, ch.2 for a response).

An important note, however, is that although constructing counterexamples to GC appears to be easy, it may be easier to beg the question against the proponent of GC. Consider, for example, an argument involving a possible scenario on the basis of which Foley (1982) rejects GC as being too strong. Consider subject S, who comes to believe a proposition H, which is not explicitly contradicted by anything else she believes, while, given her circumstances, it is more reasonable for S to believe not-H. By GC, S is justified in believing H. However, this scenario is under-described. For it is either the case that S has no evidence for H or not-H, in which case GC can be plausibly applied to S’s belief that H to ground her justification in believing that H, or it may be that, as Foley stipulates, S has better reasons for not-H than she has for H, in which case GC is no longer applicable because it takes the bare fact of believing a proposition to endow it with justification only in cases where there are no reasons against it. In such circumstances, it is not clear how, on pain of begging the question against the proponent of GC, one is to take believing not-H as being more reasonable than believing H.

In response to the above problems, the proponents of conservatism usually try to introduce certain modifications in their theses to make them more appealing. Although their official view is still the claim that it is the mere belief that confers justification on its content, closer observation reveals that these modified accounts often rely on such external factors as “seemings,” coherence, and evidence about our “general reliability” in order to enable their conservative theses to discharge their epistemic role. Before turning to such versions, though, it is important to consider some of the arguments that have been suggested for and against GC.

a. Arguing for and Against GC

i. The Transcendental Argument

A rather common transcendental argument for GC starts with the methodological question of how we are supposed to conduct our inquiries. One policy is to follow the Cartesian advice of dispensing with all our beliefs except those that are certain. This would seem to ensure that our beliefs satisfy the epistemic goal of believing truth and avoiding falsehood. Abandoning all our beliefs and trying to rebuild them from scratch, though, is close to cognitive suicide. The only way forward, then, is to work with what we have got and rely on our perspective in order to achieve the epistemic goal. Our perspective, however, consists not only of our mundane beliefs but also of our beliefs about which methods or belief-forming processes are reliable for regulating the formation of those mundane beliefs. There is no Archimedean point from which we can determine which of our belief-forming processes are reliable. Accordingly, there is no way to regulate our belief-forming activities except by relying on our antecedent convictions that constitute our perspective on the world. For those convictions to discharge this epistemic role, however, they must possess some epistemic worth to start with. Otherwise, our beliefs would fail to be justified. This means that mere belief, as GC claims, can confer some measure of justification on its content.

This argument can be resisted. Even if one may now appeal, a la GC, to the justified status of one’s background beliefs about the reliability of belief-forming processes in order to rationally and actively reaffirm a particular belief resulting from such processes, it is not clear that the belief in question was actually based on such background beliefs upon its inception (Podgorski 2016). So the justification now associated with the reaffirmation of the belief may not be the justification that was lost in the process. Another worry is that the motivations behind this argument might result in absurd consequences if the argument is repeatedly applied. Suppose, having formed a justified belief p by relying on my background beliefs, I take myself to have fulfilled the epistemic goal of truth and so consider the belief as justified. The type of conservatism that results from this argument would then seem to require that I hold on to the belief in the absence of a challenge from within my perspective. As Roger White argues, the same conservative motivations would also require me to avoid such challenges:

If I allow myself to critically rethink my commitment to p, there is a chance that I might   conclude that I was mistaken. But from my perspective now, to change my mind as to          whether p would be to be led into error. Of course I do not want that. So it is better for me to avoid all possible challenges and cling dogmatically to my current convictions. No one, I    take it, wants to endorse this sort of attitude. (2007, pp. 125-26)

Finally, there is the problem of arbitrariness that seems to arise from applying GC to our day-to-day cognitive dealings (White 2007 and Podgorski 2016). The idea is that it is possible for two or more subjects to have radically different perspectives, including different habits of thought that enjoy the same degree of coherence. According to GC, all such subjects are justified in their beliefs. Any insistence on the privileged status of one particular belief system over others invites the charge that the norms of epistemic impartiality are being violated. Moreover, if all belief systems are equally rational, it is not clear why one should not feel free to adopt the perspective of others.

ii. The Argument from Charity

Another argument (Vahid 2004) in defense of GC takes its inspirations from the consideration involving Davidson’s claim that belief ascription is constrained by the principle of charity. Very roughly, Davidson takes the evidence for the semantic theory to consist in the conditions under which speakers hold sentences true. The holding of a sentence true by a speaker is, however, a function of both what she means by that sentence as well as what she believes. This means that belief cannot be inferred without prior knowledge of the meaning, and meaning cannot be deduced without the belief. This is where Davidson appeals to the principle of charity. The idea is that we can solve the problem of the interdependence of belief and meaning “by holding the belief constant as far as possible while solving for meaning. This is accomplished by assigning truth conditions to alien sentences that make native speakers right when plausibly possible, according, of course, to our own view of what is right” (Davidson 1984, p.137). Thus understood, we may view the application of the principle of charity as involving the maximization of truth by the interpreter’s own lights.

Now, if belief ascription is to be constrained by charity and the latter is characterized by the aim of maximizing truth and minimizing falsity in the speaker’s belief system, then this would seem to endow the ascribed belief with some presumption of rationality, since justification (rationality) is also generally understood in terms of promoting the truth goal. A belief is justified in so far as it promotes the epistemic goal of believing what is true and not believing what is false. It should be noted, however, that since charity begins at home, the ascriber’s (interpreter’s) beliefs are as much subject to the constraint of charity as are the beliefs of the subject (interpretee) to whom beliefs are ascribed. One problem with this approach is that since charity requires the assignment of truth conditions to the interpretee’s sentences according to the interpreter’s view of what is right, the kind of rationality that emerges from this belief ascription process is one that is perspective-dependent and thus very weak. Although this seems to comport well with Chisholm’s own estimate of GC as constituting the “lowest” degree of epistemic justification (1980, 547), it will not be of much interest to those philosophers who think that conservatism is a substantial epistemic thesis.

The possible failure of the above arguments to fully substantiate the epistemic credentials of GC has not, however, deterred its proponents from coming up with modified versions of the thesis that no longer suffer from the problems that have afflicted the original version. Before considering these modified versions of GC, it pays to consider an argument against GC that denies that ordinary people are even capable of holding bare beliefs, and so concludes that, since the evaluation of GC requires the possibility of such beliefs, it is practically impossible to evaluate such a thesis.

Daniel Coren (2018) has claimed that the nature of bare belief makes it impossible to evaluate GC. He takes it that a bare belief is supposed to be a belief that is stripped of all personal memory and epistemic context. Although Coren regards such beliefs as logically conceivable, he thinks that for us, human agents, they are practically inconceivable. Even in the case of forgotten evidence, says Coren, it is not the case that one’s beliefs stand entirely on their own without any support from what the agent can recall. There are always some epistemic contexts within which our beliefs can be located. Coren realizes that there are some seemingly plausible examples where beliefs seem to lack such contexts as when, as a result of hypnosis or a bang on my head, I come to believe that, say, the number of stars in the universe is a prime number.

In response, he denies that such cases of belief-formation (involving hypnosis or brain injury) are practically possible. He says that he can imagine guessing or wanting the number of stars to be a prime number. However, being an ordinary agent, he cannot imagine being in such an extraordinary, non-human state of believing that the number of stars is prime while having no supporting reasons. To conclude, Coren’s main objection to conservatism is that since we are not “able to imagine having a belief in total isolation from other beliefs…[we cannot] evaluate the question of whether having a bare belief would have any positive epistemic status” (2018, p.10).

While Coren’s skeptical observations about the possibility of bare beliefs is a useful antidote to the often loose and fast way that conservatives play with such beliefs, it may not be advisable to base a critique of conservatism completely on empirical claims such as the practical impossibility of beliefs resulting from hypnosis or the formation of beliefs that are not sensitive to epistemic reasons. After all, there are views that countenance forming beliefs on the basis of pragmatic reasons (Leary 2017 and Rinard 2018). Moreover, not all processes resulting in belief need to be of a cognitive variety. Beliefs can come and go as a direct result of brain injury. Only beliefs that are the result of a cognitive process carry the distinction of being responsive to reasons.

More importantly, there are at least two ways of understanding Coren’s analysis of a bare belief in terms of a “belief in total isolation from other beliefs” depending on whether “isolation” is understood as conceptual or epistemic isolation. It is surely true that beliefs cannot be held in conceptual isolation. For, being conceptually structured, beliefs are said to be inferentially integrated with other beliefs such that their combination can yield further beliefs as consequences (Stich 1978). This is what lies behind Jerry Fodor’s (1983) denial that cognitive systems, unlike perceptual systems, are modular and informationally encapsulated. A conservative, though, need not challenge the preceding observations. What she claims is rather that beliefs can acquire their epistemic status in epistemic isolation from other beliefs. Although beliefs always appear in holistic networks with other beliefs, it is possible for some of them, says the conservative, to acquire their justification in epistemic isolation. At the risk of begging the question against such conservatives, the impossibility of having beliefs in total epistemic isolation from other beliefs cannot serve as a premise in an argument against conservatism.

b. Modifying GC

It was pointed out that the problems arising from the attempts to substantiate the standard formulation of GC have prompted some conservatives to suggest alternative formulations of the conservative principle that are no longer vulnerable to those difficulties. These versions of GC either involve appending further conditions to GC or seek to radically revise some of its assumptions.

i. Conservatism as the Principle of Credulity

An early attempt to modify GC by adding further restrictions to it is due to William Lycan (1988). Lycan presents his version of GC as the “principle of credulity” according to which the “seeming” plausibility (truth) of beliefs is sufficient for their acceptance. He takes this principle to underlie the justification of what he calls “spontaneous beliefs,” namely, beliefs that are directly produced by such sources as perception, memory, and so forth. Lycan’s’s choice of the beliefs that are rendered justified by his principal of credulity, namely perceptual and memory beliefs, raises, however, the suspicion that what we are dealing with here is in fact an instance of the thesis of phenomenal conservatism (discussed earlier), according to which if it seems to you that p, then, in the absence of defeaters, you are justified in believing that p. For the phenomenal conservative such seemings (perceptual, memorial, intuitive, and so forth) constitute the general source of justification for the beliefs to which they give rise, whereas for the upholders of GC it is the mere fact of believing of a proposition that endows that proposition with some epistemic worth.

Leaving this point to one side, Lycan’s recognition of the over-permissiveness of his principle in justifying what he regards as “wild” spontaneous beliefs, such as religious and superstitious beliefs, prompts him to add a number of restrictions on it, such as consistency with previously justified explanatory beliefs as well as the availability of an explanation by the agent’s belief system of how his or her spontaneous beliefs are produced. He requires that:

[Our] total body of beliefs and theories yield an idea of how… spontaneous belief[s] [were] produced in us. Finally suppose that according to this idea or explanation, the mechanism that produced the belief was (as we may say) a reliable one, in good working order. Then, I submit, our spontaneous beliefs are fully justified. (1988, p.168)

Although such constraints might exclude Lycan’s “wild” beliefs, they seem to be so stringent that it is unlikely that they can even be satisfied in the case of spontaneous perceptual and memory beliefs. With Lycan’s principal of credulity, we have, once more, an example of a seemingly conservative principal whose epistemic engine is driven not by the mere holding of a belief itself but by factors external to that belief.

ii. Conservatism as Believing in the Absence of Defeaters

Lycan’s principle of credulity is not the only way of evading the problems that are associated with GC. Kevin McCain (2008) suggests another way of getting around such problems that involves appending GC with two defeating conditions along the following lines:

PEC If S believes that p and p is not incoherent, then S is justified in retaining the belief that p and S remains justified in believing that p so long as p is not defeated for S.
Defeating Condition (C1) If S has better reasons for believing that not-p than S’s reason for believing that p, then S is no longer justified in believing that p.
Defeating Condition (C2) If S’s reasons for believing p and not-p are equally good and the belief that not-p coheres equally as well or better than the belief that p does with S’s other beliefs, then S is no longer justified in believing that p.

McCain’s account of conservatism involves references to both the fact of believing something as well as the absence of defeaters. He is quite explicit, though, that while S’s belief that p provides S with justification, the belief itself “is not counted among S’s reasons” (2008, p.187). He claims that the role that that the belief plays in its justification is akin to the role that the absence of defeaters plays in the justification of a belief. Perhaps what McCain has in mind here is that believing that p is merely an enabler for the reason that is supposed to justify the belief. It is not, however, clear what, once the belief itself is excluded from the realm of reasons, is supposed to play that role when one appeals to the conservative thesis. Closer examination of McCain’s account reveals, however, that this role is played by such notions as evidence and coherence in the account’s defeating conditions. (C1) requires that evidence for not-p not be stronger than evidence for p, and (C2) requires an asymmetry in the coherence of p and not-p with the rest of the agent’s beliefs. Thus, far from relying on mere belief to confer justification on its content, it is the strength of evidence for the belief as well as the coherence of the target belief p with the rest of the subject’s belief repertoire that are doing the main epistemic work. This conclusion can receive further support when we turn to McCain’s claims, on behalf of his account, that it can resolve skeptical and other standing problems of epistemology.

To illustrate, consider some of the ambitious claims that McCain makes on behalf of PEC. He thinks, for example, that his version of conservatism is able to neutralize the challenge presented by Cartesian-style skeptical arguments that seek to undermine our beliefs in the external world by proposing alternative hypotheses, such as dreaming, being a brain in a vat, and so forth, that can also explain our evidence (perceptual experience). According to McCain, his conservative thesis explains why the skeptical argument fails, for none of the skeptical hypotheses provide a defeater that satisfy C1. Evidence in favor of these hypotheses is no better than evidence in favor of the belief about the external world. Neither is C2 satisfied because our belief in the external world coheres better with our overall set of beliefs, including our commonsense beliefs such as, “It is raining now,” “I slept last night,” and so forth.

The crucial premise in McCain’s argument is that “[a]lthough these commonsense beliefs are closely related to the belief that there is an external world, they are not directly dependent upon the belief that that there is an external world. We do not form the belief that there is an external world and then infer from them the belief that ‘the sun is shining today,’ etc.” (2008, pp. 189-190). It is true that this is not how we form our commonsense beliefs. However, McCain makes an important assumption when clarifying his defeating condition C2. C2 prohibits that not-p cohere equally as well or better than the belief that p does with S’s other beliefs. This prompts the question of what sort of beliefs should be included in that repertoire when one is assessing whether the belief that p is justified. On pain of guaranteeing that C2 would not be met, McCain thinks that, as a necessary condition, neither p nor “any belief q that is directly dependent upon the belief that p for its justification should…be included in S’s set of beliefs in regard to [C2]” (2008, p.187). As this remark clearly indicates, beliefs that are to be included in the agent’s belief system are supposed not to depend on the target belief p in an epistemic, rather than an inferential, sense. They are supposed not to be “directly dependent upon the belief that p for [their] justification.” In other words, McCain is assuming that commonsense beliefs can be justified independently of whether or not one is justified in believing that there is an external world, and this is where his conservatism is helping itself to an assumption from outside of conservatism’s sphere.

To explain, just as his version of conservatism owed its epistemic bite to the involvement of such notions as evidence and coherence, its purported broader epistemic uses in resolving long standing epistemic disputes equally derives its power not from the thesis itself but from some substantive epistemological theory, namely dogmatism (liberalism), in its background. According to dogmatism, absent defeaters, experience is sufficient, on its own, to confer justification on the belief in its content. This accounts for why McCain thinks that commonsense beliefs (in the subject’s belief set) can be justified without being dependent for their justification on belief about the external world. By contrast, a rival theory such as Crispin Wright’s conservatism maintains that experiences can only justify one’s commonsense beliefs provided one is already warranted in believing that there is an external world. It is clear then that what is really doing the epistemic work in McCain’s response to the skeptical argument is not his conservatism as such but the dogmatist account of perceptual justification that is presupposed in that account. With such a view in place, there would be no need to appeal to doxastic conservatism.

iii. Conservatism as a Dynamic Strategy

 Another approach, from Abelard Podgorski (2016), recommends a dynamic strategy in response to the problems discussed so far. Podgorski agrees with many of the objections that have been leveled against conservatism, such as bootstrapping and arbitrariness. Accordingly, he seeks to present an alternative conservative view that, while incorporating the basic motivations for GC, is not susceptible to its weaknesses. His proposal involves a dynamic interpretation of the rational relevance of two types of considerations: those that bear on the question of whether p and those that bear on the question of whether to make up one’s mind about p. He intends the dynamic slant to make it clear that the relevant norms governing our epistemic life are those that govern processes, rather than states, in particular the process of considering whether p, for some proposition p. Two such norms are distinguished: those that regulate when to initiate the process of considering whether p is true and those that govern the rational operation of that process.

Accordingly, what is distinctive of dynamic conservatism is that it appeals not to the norms that generate an agent’s mental states at particular times but to the norms that govern the process of considering whether p. To see how the dynamic approach intends to secure conservatism, Podgorski introduces the following norm for regulating the initiation of consideration.

Inconsiderate One is not always rationally required to initiate consideration whether p when one believes that p and one’s evidence does not make p worth believing (from one’s perspective).

If Inconsiderate is true, one may permissibly fail to reconsider belief in p while one’s evidence does not make p worth believing. Now, just as there are things that bear on whether or not something is worth believing, there are things that bear on whether a question is worth opening for consideration. For example, it is worth considering whether p if it is important that my belief p is true, or my evidential situation regarding p is significantly better now than it was before or will be in the future. On the other hand, it is less worth considering whether p if, say, it does not matter whether my belief p is true, or if my evidential situation regarding p is worse than it was when I last considered p. Costs involving time and cognitive effort can also negatively bear on if it is worth considering whether p. Since Podgorski takes not considering to have a default permissible status, he concludes that “[w]e are not required to consider a question until we have some special positive reason to do so. So agents will be rational in maintaining any given belief for at least as long as they do not encounter such a reason” (2016, pp. 366-67).

Podgorski claims that, like standard conservatism, dynamic conservatism is also sensitive to the fact that changing beliefs incurs cognitive costs. It also explains the phenomenon of lost justification or evidence, for as long as an agent lacks reasons to reconsider her belief, she may, even having lost her evidence, persist in her belief. However, by rejecting the claim that bare belief can confer justification on its content, dynamic conservatism differs from the standard version. On the dynamic view, the belief that is held by an agent need not be worth having, because “by rejecting state-oriented norms demanding the worthiness of our beliefs, we allow that there are periods of time where what a belief has going for it simply does not matter for an agent’s rationality” (2016, p. 372).

However, it may be that by rejecting the main tenet of GC, dynamic conservatism becomes too modest to have an epistemic impact when it comes to regulating our belief-forming processes. Consider, for example, a case of forgotten evidence where, having forgotten the original evidence, there happens to be some reason to effectively reconsider our belief, since its truth turns out to be important in that context. Here, evidentialists usually appeal to second-order evidence (about, say, the general reliability of memory, and so forth). As we have seen, however, this sort of evidence is legitimate only if the belief in question was originally based on that evidence. Therefore, while this evidence can be used to ground the rationality of one’s active reaffirmation of that belief, it fails to explain one’s rationality when one does not perform such affirmation. Dynamic conservatism, however, seems to fall short in the opposite direction.

It can explain the rationality of the agent’s holding on to his belief in the cases of forgotten evidence, where he lacks a special reason to reconsider that belief. It also explains such cases without locating the source of this rationality in the agent’s current or past evidence. It seems to fall short of accounting for the agent’s rationality in the sort of cases described above, where there is reason to reconsider one’s belief. As Podgorski admits, “[t]he cases the [dynamic] view does not endorse as rational are those where an agent actively reaffirms their belief without relevant second-order information. And these are the cases where it is least intuitive that doxastic inertia is rational. Nevertheless, if these are taken to be core cases, it must be admitted that this is a genuine disadvantage of the dynamic approach” (2016, p. 370).

6. Conclusion

The doxastic conservatism debate develops out of the attempts to show that our tendency to maintain and preserve our beliefs beyond the evidence at our disposal is a rational phenomenon. Conservatism presents itself as a normative thesis with the potential to resolve a number of outstanding issues in epistemology. It turns out, however, that there is not just one single conservative principle, but a variety of such theses. Further discussions of doxastic conservatism may focus on these contenders and how they relate to the properties of belief relevant to the epistemic evaluation of doxastic states when one encounters evidentially equivalent alternatives, the perseverance of doxastic states in the absence of specific reasons to change them, and whether features of one’s doxastic state can add to the justification of the beliefs that constitute it.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Adler, J. 1990. “Conservatism and Tacit Confirmation,” Mind 99: 559-570.
  • Alston, W. 1989. Epistemic Justification, Cornell University Press.
  • Chisholm, R. 1980. “A Version of Foundationalism” in Wettstein, et al (eds.), Midwest Studies in Philosophy V, University of Minnesota Press.
  • Christensen, D. 1994. “Conservatism in Epistemology,” Nous 28: 69-89.
  • Christensen, D. 2000. “Diachronic coherence and epistemic impartiality,” The Philosophical review 109, 3: 349-371.
  • Coren, D. 2018. “Epistemic conservatism and bare beliefs,” Synthese
  • Davidson, D. 1984. “Radical Interpretation,” reprinted in Inquires into Truth and Interpretation, Oxford: Clarendon.
  • Feldman, R. 2014. “Evidence of evidence is evidence” in Matheson, J. and R. Vitz (eds.), The Ethics of Belief, New York: Oxford University Press: 284–300.
  • Fodor, J. 1983. The Modularity of Mind. MIT Press.
  • Foley, R. 1982. “Epistemic Conservatism,” Philosophical Studies 43: 165-182.
  • Foley, R. 1987. The Theory of Epistemic Rationality, Harvard University Press.
  • Frise, M. 2017. “Internalism and the problem of stored beliefs,” Erkenntnis 82: 285–304.
  • Fumerton, R. 2007. “Epistemic conservatism: Theft or honest toil?” Oxford Studies in Epistemology 2: 63–86.
  • Goldman, A. 1979. “Varieties of Epistemic Appraisal,” Nous 13: 23-38.
  • Goldman, A. 1986. Epistemology and Cognition, Harvard University Press.
  • Goldman, A. 1999. “Internalism Exposed,” The Journal of Philosophy 96: 271-293.
  • Goldstick, D. 1971. “Methodological Conservatism,” American Philosophical Quarterly 8: 186-191.
  • Harman, G. 1986. Change in View, MIT Press.
  • Huemer, Michael. 2001. Skepticism and the Veil of Perception, Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Kvanvig, J. 1989. “Conservatism and its Virtues,” Synthese, 79:143–163.
  • Lycan, W. 1988. Judgement and Justification, Cambridge University Press.
  • McCain, K. 2008. “The Virtues of Epistemic Conservatism,” Synthese, 164:185–200.
  • McCain, K. 2020. “Epistemic Conservatism and the Basing relation,” in Carter, A. and P. Bondy (eds.) Well-Founded Belief, Routledge.
  • McGrath, M. 2007. “Memory and Epistemic Conservatism,” Synthese, 157: 1–24.
  • Moffett, M. 2007. “Reasonable Disagreement and Rational Group Inquiry”, Episteme 4, 3: 352-367.
  • Podgorski, A. 2016. “Dynamic Conservatism,” Ergo, 3: 349–376.
  • Poston, T. 2012. “Is There an ‘I’ in Epistemology?” Dialectica 6, 4: 517-541.
  • Poston, T. 2014. Reason and Explanation: A Defense of Explanatory Coherentism, Palgrave Macmillan.
  • Pryor, J. 2000. “The Skeptic and the Dogmatist,” Nous, 34: 517-49.
  • Sklar, L. 1975. “Methodological Conservatism,” Philosophical Review LXXIV: 186-191.
  • Smithies, D. 2019. The Epistemic Role of Consciousness, Oxford University Press.
  • Stich, Stephen. 1978. “Beliefs and Subdoxastic States,” Philosophy of Science 45: 499– 518.
  • Quine, W.V.O. 1951, “Two Dogmas of Empiricism” in From a Logical Point of View, 2nd ed. New York: Harper & Row.
  • Vahid, H. 2004. “Varieties of Epistemic Conservatism,” Synthese 141: 97-122.
  • Vogel, J. 1992. “Sklar on Methodological Conservatism,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 52: 125-131.
  • White, R. 2007. “Epistemic Subjectivism,” Episteme 4: 115-129.
  • Wright, C. 2004. “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 78, 1:167–212.


Author Information

Hamid Vahid
Institute for Research in Fundamental Sciences