Empirical Aesthetics

Empirical aesthetics is a research area at the intersection of psychology and neuroscience that aims to understand how people experience, evaluate, and create objects aesthetically. Its central two questions are: How do we experience beauty? How do we experience art? In practice, this means that empirical aesthetics studies (1) prototypically aesthetic responses, such as beauty or chills, and (2) responses to prototypically aesthetic objects, such as paintings and music. Empirical aesthetics also encompasses broader questions about how we experience other aesthetic experiences, such as ugliness and the sublime, and about how we create art. The field of empirical aesthetics aims to understand how such aesthetic experiences and behaviors emerge and unfold. To do so, researchers in the field link the observer’s characteristics to her responses, link the object properties to the observer’s responses, or describe an interaction between them. As a science, empirical aesthetics relies heavily on the analysis and interpretation of data. Data is primarily generated from experiments: Researchers conduct studies in which they manipulate the independent variables to observe the effect of those manipulations on one or more independent variables. In addition, empirical aesthetics relies on observational data, where people’s behavior is observed or surveyed without the introduction of manipulations.

Empirical aesthetics is as old as empirical psychology. The first thorough written account dates back to Gustav Fechner, who published Vorschule der Aesthetik in 1876. Nonetheless, the modern field of empirical aesthetics can be considered rather young. Its gain in popularity in the 21st century can be linked to the emergence of neuroaesthetics—the study of brain responses associated with aesthetic experiences—in the late 1990s. Contemporary empirical aesthetics studies aesthetic experiences with a variety of methods, including brain-imaging and measures of other physiological responses, such as the movements of the eyes and facial muscles.

Table of Contents

  1. History
    1. Fechner’s Vorschule der Aesthetik
    2. Empirical Aesthetics in the 20th century
    3. First Renaissance: Berlyne’s Aesthetics and Psychobiology
    4. Early Modern Empirical Aesthetics
    5. Second Renaissance: The Emergence of Neuroaesthetics
    6. Empirical Aesthetics in the 21st Century
  2. Subfields of Empirical Aesthetics
    1. Perceptual (Visual) Aesthetics
    2. Neuroaesthetics
    3. Music Science
    4. Other Subfields
  3. Relations to Other Fields
    1. Relations to Other Fields of Psychology and Neuroscience
    2. Relationship to Computational Sciences
    3. Relationship to Aesthetics in Philosophy
  4. Controversies
    1. Is Aesthetics Special?
    2. What Should Empirical Aesthetics Mainly be About?
    3. Population Averages vs. Individual Differences
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History

a. Fechner’s Vorschule der Aesthetik

The first comprehensive treatise on what has become known as “empirical aesthetics” was written by Gustav Fechner and published in 1876 is the two-volume book Vorschule der Aesthetik (VdA). The first volume primarily contains the descriptions of 6 principles of aesthetics, as posited by Fechner himself. Notable is also the last chapter on taste. The second volume contains a large section on art as well as the description of a further seven aesthetic principles.

The main purpose of the book is to demonstrate that aesthetic experiences, primarily aesthetic pleasure or beauty, can be studied empirically just like any other form of perception. Fechner called this empirical approach to aesthetics one “from below” and distinguished it clearly from the philosophical approach “from above.” The basic distinction made is the following: Aesthetics from below observes individual cases of aesthetic responses and infers the laws that govern all of these responses from the pattern that crystallizes across individual cases. Aesthetics from above, in contrast, posits general laws and infers from those what an individual aesthetic response should look like. While the VdA itself only contains data and descriptions of a few experiments, Fechner’s descriptions of the proposed laws clearly focus on their observable effects, implying that they can be documented in an experiment.

The direct impact of the VdA on modern empirical aesthetics remains modest. This may be because it has not been published in a translated version, or it may reflect a general reluctance to cite early work in empirical aesthetics. It is, however, well known and cited as the first major work on aesthetics by an empirical psychologist. From its content, only one experiment often serves as reference probably because the associated article exists in English. This experiment examined the effect of a rectangle’s aspect ratio on aesthetic preference. Famously, Fechner found that his participants most often named the rectangle with an aspect ratio equivalent to the golden section (1:1.618) as the one they liked best. What is less well known is that Fechner himself was critical of this finding and reported an equal preference for the square ratio (1:1) in a population of blue-collar workers. His main worry about the findings concerned the potential influence of associations on the result, specifically that participants did not merely judge the rectangular form but also its resemblance to the familiar shapes of envelopes, books, and so on.

b. Empirical Aesthetics in the 20th century

After the pioneering days of Gustav Fechner and his colleagues, psychology (and philosophy) went through an era known as Behaviorism. Behaviorism effectively claimed that psychology, as a science, can only study observable behavior. Research on inner states and subjective experiences, which form the core interest of aesthetics, was shunned. This did not deter researchers like Edgar Pierce, Oswald Külpe, Lillien Jane Martin, Robert Ogden, Kate Gordon, and many others from continuing the study of people’s preferences for visual design, art, color, and particularly individual differences in such preferences.

Most of the work on empirical aesthetics in the early and mid-20th century has not had a remarkable impact on the field. Worth mentioning, however, is the early work of Edward Thorndike, and later of Hans Eysenck, on individual differences in aesthetic responsiveness and creativity. Most other studies during this time period focused on determining what kinds of object properties—specifically consonance and dissonance of tones, as well as colors—are most rewarding to specific groups of people.

Another notable exception to the mostly forgotten early research on aesthetics is Rudolph Arnheim’s work. He looked at aesthetic experiences through the lens of Gestalt psychology’s principles of organization: balance, symmetry, composition, and dynamical complexity (the trade-off between order and complexity). Arnheim saw aesthetic experiences as a product of the integration of two sources of information: the structural configurations of the image and the particular focus of the viewer that depends on her experience and disposition. One should also note that the writings of the art historian and critic Ernst Gombrich during the same time period have informed modern empirical aesthetics.

A look at the institutional level also reveals that empirical aesthetics continued to evolve during the 20th century. A division of Esthetics was among the 19 charter divisions when the American Psychological Association (APA) was founded. This 10th division of the APA was renamed “Psychology and the Arts” in 1965. Its size was modest then, relative to other divisions, and has stayed so throughout the years.

c. First Renaissance: Berlyne’s Aesthetics and Psychobiology

After what in retrospect appears like a relative drought during behaviorism, empirical aesthetics re-emerged with Daniel Berlyne and the foundation of the International Association of Empirical Aesthetics (IAEA). The IAEA was founded at the first international congress in Paris in 1965 by Daniel Berlyne (University of Toronto, Canada), Robert Francès (Université de Paris, France), Carmelo Genovese (Università di Bologna, Italy), and Albert Wellek (Johann-Gutenberg-Universität Mainz, Germany).

The most visible effort of establishing the “studies in the new experimental aesthetics” is the so-named book edited by Berlyne (1974) which contains a collection of study reports, many conducted by Berlyne himself. In addition, Berlyne had earlier published the book Aesthetics and Psychobiology (1971) which is often cited as the main reference for Berlyne’s hypotheses on the relationship between object properties and hedonic responses.

Central to Daniel Berlyne’s own ideas on aesthetic experiences is the concept of arousal. Berlyne postulated that arousal is relevant to aesthetics in that an intermediate level of arousal would lead to the greatest hedonic response. Arousal itself is conceptualized as the result of “collative,” psychophysical, and ecological variables. The best-known and most-investigated determinants of arousal are an object’s complexity and novelty. Berlyne’s theory thus links an object’s properties, such as complexity, to their effects on the observer (arousal) and then to the aesthetic response (pleasantness, liking). The concreteness of the proposed links and variables has led many researchers to test his theory. The results have been mixed at best and therefore Berlyne’s arousal theory of aesthetic appreciation has been mostly abandoned.

d. Early Modern Empirical Aesthetics

After Berlyne’s work had again highlighted that aesthetic responses can be studied with the methods and rigor of modern experimental psychology, research and theory development in the field of empirical aesthetics continued slowly but steadily for about another 20 years. This phase of empirical aesthetics was primarily concerned with linking certain stimulus properties (mostly of images) to preference or liking judgments.

One notable theoretical step forward after Berlyne’s Aesthetics and Psychobiology was Colin Martindale’s connectionist model that viewed aesthetic pleasure as a function of the strength of so-called “cognitive units” activation. Martindale (1988) maintained that “[the apprehension of a work of art of any sort will involve activation of cognitive units … the pleasure engendered by a work of art will be a positive monotonic function of how activated this entire ensemble of cognitive units is. The more activated the ensemble of units, the more pleasurable an observer will find the stimulus to be.” Combined with the assumption that more prototypical objects activate stronger cognitive units, this led to the hypothesis that more prototypical, meaningful objects are aesthetically preferred. The results of Martindale’s experiments were in line with this view and foreshadowed the development of contemporary theories that emphasize processing fluency and meaningfulness as sources of aesthetic pleasure.

e. Second Renaissance: The Emergence of Neuroaesthetics

The introduction of modern brain-imaging techniques has changed the face of psychology forever. The introduction of functional magnetic brain imaging (fMRI) to empirical aesthetics was no exception. The first fMRI experiments that focused on aesthetic experiences were conducted in the early 2000s, and the term “neuroaesthetics” subsequently emerged. The boundary between neuroaesthetics and empirical aesthetics has since been blurred and even studies that are strictly speaking not “neuro”-aesthetic—because they do not measure brain activity—are often labeled as such.

Neuroaesthetics in its initial phase asked a simple question: Which area(s) of the brain is responsive to experiences that are beautiful? The answer, across a variety of stimuli such as paintings, music, and math equations, seemed to be: the orbitofrontal cortex (OFC). This brain area at the bottom of the front-most part of the brain had previously been associated with the anticipation of various other pleasurable things, such as food and money.

Findings like these spurred one of the questions that still lies at the core of empirical aesthetics: What—if anything—makes aesthetic experiences special? Some scholars, like Martin Skov and Marcos Nadal, are skeptical that they are at all. They base their view on the findings from neuroscience mentioned above: The signature of brain activity that is linked to intensely pleasurable aesthetic experiences does not seem to differ from the one that is linked to other pleasures, such as food or winning money. Others continue to make the case for aesthetics being special. For instance, Winfried Menninghaus and his colleagues argue that “aesthetic emotions” are distinct from everyday emotions in that they always relate to an aesthetic evaluation, an aesthetic virtue, and a notion of pleasure, and that they predict liking. This debate about whether and how aesthetic experiences are special persists and has been spurred by the first findings of studies in neuroaesthetics. At the same time, this debate is not a new one and is present in the writings of intellectuals such as William James and George Santayana.

f. Empirical Aesthetics in the 21st Century

Empirical aesthetics embraces all the different approaches that have shaped its history. Both theoretical and empirical work follow a multi-methodological approach that takes stimulus properties, observer characteristics, environmental conditions, and neurological processes into account. The amount of empirical data and reports is rapidly growing.

Empirical aesthetics in the 21st century continues to work on and clarify research questions present since its beginnings. For instance, Marco Bertamini and his colleagues clarified in 2016 that the preference for objects with curved contours is, in fact, due to an increased liking of roundness and not merely a dislike of angularity. At the same time, the field also adds new research questions to its agenda, notably the question about the generalizability of previous findings beyond the laboratory setting. The emergence of tablets, portable eye trackers and EEG systems has greatly facilitated data collection in natural environments, such as museums. At the same time, virtual reality settings enable more controlled experiments in at least simulations of more naturalistic environments than isolated cubicles.

On an institutional level, the import of empirical aesthetics has been acknowledged in the form of new institutions with an explicit focus on empirical aesthetics. Among them are the Max Planck Institute of Empirical Aesthetics in Frankfurt, Germany, founded 2012; the Penn Center for Neuroaesthetics, Pennsylvania, USA, founded 2019; and the Goldsmiths University’s MSc Program for Arts, Neuroaesthetics and Creativity, which started in 2018.

On the level of theory development, several models of art appreciation have emerged in the 21st century. One of the most cited models was developed by Helmut Leder in 2004 and later modified by him and Marcos Nadal (see Further Readings). The most comprehensive model developed so far is the Vienna integrated model of top-down and bottom-up processes in art perception (VIMAP) that was mainly proposed by Matthew Pelowski and also co-authored by Helmut Leder as well as other members of their research group. It is worth noting that both of these, as well as many other theoretical models, focus on visual art.

Theories about the aesthetic appreciation of music have been developed independently from those about visual arts. Since the late 2010s, the idea that music is liked because it affords the right balance between predictability and surprise has become popular. It relies on the notion of predictive coding, the view that our perceptual system constantly tries to predict what it will encounter next, and that it updates its predictions based on the observed differences between prediction and reality. This difference is called prediction error. The main thesis of the predictive coding view is that small prediction errors and/or a decrease of prediction errors over time are rewarding. In other words, we are hard-wired to enjoy the process of learning, and aesthetic experiences are but one kind of experience that enables us to do so.

A predictive coding account for visual aesthetic experiences was formulated for visual experiences by Sande Van de Cruys and Johan Wagemans, too. It has also been present and dominating views on creativity, art, and the experience of beauty in the computer sciences based on a model developed by Juergen Schmidhuber in the 1990s. However, to date, Schmidhuber’s ideas are little known to psychologists and neuroscientists and his theory remains uncited in the empirical aesthetics literature. This may, however, change, as interdisciplinary collaborations between psychologists, neuroscientists, and computer scientists become more frequent.

2. Subfields of Empirical Aesthetics

a. Perceptual (Visual) Aesthetics

Empirical aesthetics was pioneered by the psychophysicist Gustav Fechner. Psychophysics is the study of the relation between stimulus properties and human perception. Whilst applicable to all senses, most of the psychophysics research (in humans) has focused on vision. True to its roots, most of the past research on empirical aesthetics has also focused on which stimulus properties lead to particular aesthetic perceptions and judgments, and most of it concerns visual object properties.

Most work on perceptual aesthetics aims to uncover which stimulus properties are, on average, liked most. The best-supported findings along these lines are that curvature is preferred to angularity and that symmetry is preferred over asymmetry. In addition, people show a preference for average as opposed to unusual objects, in particular for faces. In the realm of color, green-blue hues are liked better than yellow ones in the great majority of the world. As opposed to popular rumors, a preference for the golden ratio has not found empirical support.

Apart from the above-listed widely supported findings, researchers in empirical aesthetics are studying a diverse number of other visual object properties that are hypothesized to be linked to aesthetic preference. Among these, the spatial frequency distribution has been of particular interest. The spatial frequency distribution of an image is a measure for how many sharp to blurry contours are present in an image; high spatial frequencies correspond to sharp and low spatial frequencies to blurry edges. Some evidence shows that art images with a spatial frequency distribution mimicking the one found in nature photography is preferred.

Researchers also investigate how fractal dimensionality influences aesthetic preferences. Fractal dimensionality refers to the degree to which the same pattern repeats itself on a smaller scale within the same image. An image of tree branches, for instance, has a high fractal dimensionality because the same pattern of twigs crossing one another is repeated in a similar way, no matter how far one ‘zooms into’ the overall image. In contrast, an image of differently shaped clouds in the sky has a lower fractal dimensionality because the visible pattern changes considerably depending on how far one ‘zooms into’ the image. Fractal dimensionality studies have revealed a certain intra-individual stability in preference for relatively high or low fractal dimensionality across different stimuli and even sensory domains.

Another quantifiable image property that is linked to people’s preferences is the so-called image self-similarity. Self-similarity and fractal dimensionality are related constructs but computed differently. They do follow a similar logic in that they compare a cut-out portion of the reference image to the reference image and then take the cut-out portion as the next reference image. Self-similarity can be conceived as an objective measure of complexity. In that sense, this line of research walks in the footsteps of Berlyne’s ideas. However, it also faces the same problem that Berlyne did. On one hand, it aims to measure object properties objectively and relate those to people’s aesthetic responses. On the other hand, it also wants to relate these objective measures to their immediate subjective impression. In the case of self-similarity, researchers are both interested in how well self-similarity metrics map onto subjectively perceived complexity, and at the same time they use self-similarity as a measure of complexity to relate this ‘objective’ complexity metric to subjective aesthetic evaluations. Neither of these relationships—self-similarity to complexity; self-similarity to aesthetic ratings—is a perfect one. Thus, the question of how all possible associations—self-similarity to subjective complexity, self-similarity to subjective rating, or subjective complexity to subjective rating—work together, and what portion of the aesthetic response can truly be attributed to the objective measure alone, remains open.

Other scholars are less concerned with objective stimulus properties and, instead, focus on the relation between different subjective impressions of the same stimulus. Coming back to the example of Berlyne’s hypothesis: Stimulus complexity is omitted (or merely introduced as a means of plausibly altering arousal), and the main relation of interest is the one between subjective arousal and subjective pleasure or liking. Studies that investigate exactly this relation between subjective arousal and aesthetic pleasure have overall been unable to support Berlyne’s claim that intermediate arousal causes the greatest aesthetic pleasure.

However, other relationships between aesthetic ratings have proven stable. Pleasure, liking, and beauty ratings are so closely related to one another that a differentiation between them is empirically speaking close to impossible. Research on people with a self-reported impairment in the ability to feel pleasure (anhedonia) additionally shows that people who cannot feel pleasure in general or in response to music are also much less likely to experience beauty from images or music respectively. This strong link between pleasure and beauty has also been taken as a further argument for the claim that (hedonic) aesthetic responses are undistinguishable from other hedonic responses (see Neuroaesthetics below).

Study results like the ones above draw a picture of the population average. However, researchers are increasingly aware of and interested in documenting individual differences in aesthetic judgments. They quantify the relative contribution of individual versus shared taste by asking a large number of observers to rate the same set of images, at least some of which are rated several times by the same observer. In this way, they determine what fraction of the rating can be predicted at all (factoring out inconsistencies of the same observer rating the same image) and what fraction can, in turn, be predicted by others’ ratings (shared taste) or not (individual taste). The contribution of shared taste seems so far smaller than the one of individual taste with a 50% contribution to face attractiveness and a mere 10% contribution to the liking of abstract art.

Thus, inter-individual differences in aesthetic responses are prominent. The different explanations for their occurrence can all be summarized under one common concept: prior exposure. The effects of prior exposure to a certain kind of stimulus are sometimes studied in the form of expertise within a certain art realm. Such studies compare the responses of, for example, architects and laypersons to photographs of buildings. Another way of studying effects of prior knowledge is the comparison of how people perceive and evaluate art from their own culture versus a foreign culture. Prior knowledge can also be experimentally introduced by showing the same observer the same image(s) repeatedly and thus making her more and more familiar with the stimulus set. Like the popular claim that the golden ratio is preferred, the notion of a “mere exposure” effect—that repeatedly presented stimuli are liked better—has not found consistent empirical support. A meta-analysis pooling results from more than 250 studies suggests that exposure increases positive evaluations, among them liking and beauty, up to a point after which further exposure becomes detrimental. Across all studies, this point seems to occur after about 30-40 exposures but the number varies depending on the kind of evaluation, other experimental details, and the kind of population studied.

Beyond the concern of understanding inter-individual differences, one of the big goals of empirical aesthetics remains to find processing principles that do generalize across all observers. To some extent, this kind of thinking was already present in Berlyne’s early writings when he posited that intermediate subjective arousal leads to the highest pleasure. Whilst this connection between subjective arousal and pleasure has not found consistent support, the notion of pleasure is still a central one in the quest of finding a general processing principle in empirical aesthetics. Intense pleasure is associated with intense beauty, with high liking, and a greater preference. This is true not only in the visual but also in the auditory, gustatory, and tentatively even the olfactory domain. Studies that assess anhedonia, the inability to experience pleasure, also find that this absence of pleasure also leads to impoverished beauty judgments.

The great majority of these findings (as well as the ones reported below) were obtained in a laboratory setting or online. That means that people experienced images, sounds, and some other objects in a highly controlled setting or on their own devices, almost always via a screen. For those scholars that are primarily interested in people’s response to art, these settings pose considerable concerns about ecologic validity: Can we really infer how someone will experience seeing a grand master’s work in real life from her responses to a miniature replica on a screen in a little cubicle? An entire line of research tries to answer this question and identify the similarities and differences between how people perceive and evaluate art in the laboratory versus in museums or at live performances.

b. Neuroaesthetics

Neuroaesthetics is different from other subfields of empirical aesthetics in terms of its methodology, not its subject. Neuroaesthetics is the science of the neural correlates of aesthetic experiences and behavior—that is, the brain activity and structures associated with them. Researchers use a variety of tools to measure brain activity: functional magnetic resonance imaging (fMRI); electroencephalography (EEG); magnetoencephalography (MEG); and more. In addition, diffusion tensor imaging (DTI) can provide insights into the strength of the anatomical connection between different areas of the brain. Due to the relatively poor temporal resolution compared to EEG and MEG, fMRI experiments predominantly use static objects, like images. In contrast, EEG and MEG methods are popular amongst researchers who are interested in stimuli that dynamically change over time, such as music and film. Neuroaesthetics has also begun to use non-invasive methods for stimulating and suppressing brain activity, such as transcranial direct-current stimulation (tDCS).

One of the best-supported findings from neuroimaging studies in aesthetics is that the experience of intensely pleasurable or beautiful objects increases activity in the reward circuitry of the brain, most notably the orbitofrontal cortex (OFC). Even though different studies with varying kinds of objects presented—such as music, paintings, stock images—find slightly different patterns of brain activations, increased activation in the OFC is observed in the vast majority of studies. This finding is of great significance because the same network of brain regions is active during the anticipation or reception of various other kinds of rewards, like food and money, too.

There is one line of studies that does point towards a difference between intensely pleasurable art experiences and other kinds of rewarding experiences. Edward Vessel and his colleagues find that when people view the most aesthetically moving art images, areas of the brain that are part of the “default mode network” (DMN) are activated. The DMN is usually associated with not being engaged with a stimulus or task, and hence, in the absence of another object, with self-reflection. The co-activation of perceptual-, reward-, and default-mode-regions is therefore unusual. According to these researchers, it is the best contender for explaining what makes aesthetic experiences special. This claim has to be taken with a grain of salt; they have yet to show that this co-activation does not occur during highly moving, non-aesthetic experiences.

Neuroaesthetics is, in principle, also concerned with changes in the different chemical substances involved in brain function, so-called neurotransmitters, associated with aesthetic experiences. In practice, inferences about the contribution of neurotransmitters are only rarely possible from the data, and direct manipulations of their concentration is even rarer.

c. Music Science

The study of music (and other sounds) in empirical aesthetics deserves separate mention from the research that concerns vision and other sensory modalities. While research on aesthetics in all but the auditory domain is often published and discussed in general outlets, research on music has a number of dedicated journals, such as Psychomusicology. Psychological theories of aesthetics also tend to focus on static stimuli, neglecting many of the variables of interest for those primarily interested in music, specifically those related to dynamic changes of the stimulus over time.

It is most likely due to the fact that music lends itself to studying changes of percepts over time that the idea of prediction and prediction errors are most prominently present in music science compared to other specialty fields of empirical aesthetics. The intuition is the following: A sequence of tones is liked if the next tone sounds subjectively better than the tone the listener had anticipated. The discrepancy between the expected and actually perceived pleasure (or reward) of an event has been termed “reward prediction error” in reward learning theories. However, this reward prediction error is not the only one being discussed in music science. Some researchers have also shown that ‘factual’ prediction errors can also predict how much one likes a sequence of tones. Here, the intuition is that a sequence of tones is liked if the listener is able to make a reasonable prediction about the next tone but is nonetheless surprised by the actually presented tone. From this point of view, people like musical sequences that elicit low uncertainty but at the same time relatively high surprise. Of note for this line of research is that the quantification of its core measures—uncertainty and surprise—can be automated by an algorithm first introduced in the mid-2000s: The Information Dynamics of Music (IDyOM) system provides a statistical learning model that can calculate both uncertainty and surprise scores for each note in a series of standardized musical notes. Its application in contemporary studies has provided results that are in line with a prediction-error account of aesthetic pleasure.

Music science is also a special field because there is a unique condition called musical anhedonia. People with musical anhedonia do not feel pleasure from music even though they are able to enjoy other experiences, like food, sex, or visual art, and have normal hearing abilities. This very circumscribed condition has enabled researchers to tackle a number of questions about the development, neural basis, and purpose of the human ability to produce and enjoy music. Contemporary insights from this line of research suggest that the functional connection between brain regions that guide auditory perception and regions that are associated with processing rewards of all kinds is key for music enjoyment. The picture is still complicated by the fact that a disruption of this connectivity cannot only lead to musical anhedonia but also to an extremely high craving for music, so-called “musicophilia.”

Music science is marked not only by its interest in understanding and predicting what kind of music people like. A considerable research effort also goes into understanding whether and how music can communicate and elicit a wide range of emotions from happiness to anger to sadness. It is a matter of debate whether music elicits the same kind of emotions in the listener as the emotional events that typically provoke them. An additional point of controversy is whether certain structural properties of music, such as the key it is played in, are consistently associated with the identification or experience of a certain emotion. What does seem to be clear, however, is that certain pieces of music are consistently rated as sounding like they express a particular emotion or even a particular narrative. At the same time, playing specific musical pieces has also been shown to be an effective means of changing people’s self-reported happiness, sadness, or anger. The idea that music can serve as a tool for emotion regulation—either by evoking or mitigating emotions in the listener—forms the core of many practical applications of music science.

A last phenomenon that deserves special mention within the realms of music and emotion is the so called “sad-music paradox”, the phenomenon that people report that they like to listen to sad music when they are already in a sad mood themselves. This apparent contradiction between the hedonic tone the music expresses (sad, negative) and the judgment of the listener (liked, positive) poses a problem for those claiming that music elicits the same genuine emotion in its listener that it expresses. The question why people report to like listening to sad music when sad has yet to be answered. It is worth noting, though, that little research has to date recorded the actual emotional response of sad people listening to sad versus neutral or happy music.

d. Other Subfields

Even though the three areas of concentration mentioned above represent the majority of the research on aesthetics, a few more distinct areas deserve to be mentioned.

One art form that should not go unmentioned is literature. Aesthetic responses to text are less frequently studied by empirical aesthetics than images or music, even though some scholars occasionally use short poems—preferably haikus—in their studies. The bias towards very short poetic forms of literature reveals one of the main reasons why the study of aesthetic responses to literature is not as common: It takes time to read a longer passage of text, and empirical scientists ideally want their participants to experience and respond to a large number of different objects. Overall, there is little data available on who likes what kind of written words and why. Arthur M. Jacobs has nonetheless developed a theory on aesthetic responses to literature, called “Neurocognitive Poetics Model.” It suggests that literary texts can be analyzed along a 4 x 4 matrix, crossing 4 levels along the text dimension (metric, phonological, morpho-syntactical and semantic) with 4 levels of author and reader related dimensions (sub-lexical, lexical, inter-lexical, and supra-lexical). Scholars who focus on the investigation of literature are also the ones who, in empirical aesthetics, come closest to addressing the paradox of fiction. The most common way of thinking about it in the field is that readers (or listeners or viewers) empathize with fictive characters and that they do experience genuine emotions during their aesthetic experience, much as if they would witness the characters having the experiences depicted in real life. There is some evidence from neuroimaging studies that at least shows that similar brain structures that are involved in genuine emotional responses are involved in processing fictive emotional content. At the same time, it is often presumed that people are nonetheless aware of the fact that they are emotionally responding to fiction, not reality, and that this allows them to distance themselves from eventual negative responses. Winfried Menninghaus and his colleagues have developed this line of thought into the “distancing-embracing model of the enjoyment of negative responses in art reception”.

The second art form that deserves mentioning but suffers from being less frequently studied is dance. There have been relatively few studies that experimentally investigated what kinds of dance movements elicit what kinds of aesthetic responses, potentially due to the fact that the production of well-controlled variations of dance sequences is labor-intensive and does not offer the same amount of experimental control as, for instance, the manipulation of static images. There are, however, efforts to link the relatively small and isolated study of dance to the rest of empirical aesthetics by, for instance, linking the variability of the velocity of a dancer’s movements as a measure of complexity to the aesthetic pleasure the dance sequence elicits.

Finally, a related, complex, and dynamic class of experiences that accordingly suffers from the same scarcity of data as dance is movies. Even though some scholars have used sections of movies to study correlations between people’s neural responses to identical but complex stimuli, we know relatively little about people’s aesthetic responses to movies. Self-report studies indicate that aesthetic evaluations of movies are highly idiosyncratic and that laypeople do not seem to agree with critics.

A separate area of research that can fall under the umbrella of empirical aesthetics, broadly conceived, is the one of creativity and, closely related to that, the study of art production. This field is interested in creativity both as a personality trait as well as an acquired skill or temporary act. The question as to how far creativity can be viewed as a stable trait of a person is one of the questions of interest to the field.

3. Relations to Other Fields

a. Relations to Other Fields of Psychology and Neuroscience

Like most areas of psychology, the boundaries of empirical aesthetics are porous. Aesthetic judgments become a subject of social psychology when they concern people. Aesthetic experiences become a subject of affective psychology when conceived as emotional responses. Evolutionary psychology perspectives have been used to explain various aesthetic preferences and why people create art. Aesthetic preferences have an undeniable effect on decision making. The list can be extended to include any number of subsections of psychology.

One connection between empirical aesthetics and other fields that has been emphasized more is the one to general neuroscience research on reward processing, learning, and decision making. The link to this area of neuroscience has become apparent starting with the first fMRI studies on aesthetic appreciation that showed that the same brain regions involved in processing various other kinds of rewards are active while experiencing aesthetically pleasing, beautiful stimuli. Nonetheless, it is rare that decision-making studies use aesthetically pleasing objects as rewards. One major hurdle that seems to prevent the integration of aesthetically pleasing experiences as one kind of reward into the fields of decision-making and reward-learning is the fact that the reward obtained from an aesthetic experience has yet to be expressed in a mathematically tractable way.

Consumer psychology is a field that has established close ties with empirical aesthetics. Product appearance and other aesthetic qualities matter when it comes to our decisions about which products to buy. At first glance, consumer research also seems to tie empirical aesthetics to the field of neuroeconomics and decision-making. In practice, however, there is a marked difference between the application-oriented experimental research that dominates consumer psychology and the theory- and model-oriented research in neuroeconomics and decision-making. Consumer psychology aims to document the effects of certain aesthetic variables in well-defined environments and has thus provided evidence that aesthetic variables do influence decision-making in environments that have relatively high ecologic validity. Neuroeconomics and the study of decision-making from the cognitive and computational psychology perspective, in contrast, aim to develop mathematically precise models of decision-making strategies with a particular interest in optimal strategies. This focus necessitates tightly controlled laboratory settings in which aesthetic variables are omitted.

Empirical aesthetics also has a natural connection to social psychology when it comes to the aesthetic evaluation of people, specifically in terms of attractiveness. The implications of such subjective impressions about a person have been well-documented even before the re-emergence of aesthetics as a part of psychology. The “what is beautiful is good” heuristic and the Halo-effect are the best-known findings from this line of research. Attractiveness research has been partially conducted without much regard to empirical aesthetics and rather as a natural extension of person evaluation and face perception. However, attractiveness is also increasingly studied by scholars primarily interested in empirical aesthetics. In this sense, the study of facial attractiveness represents a two-way connection between empirical aesthetics and social-cognitive psychology.

Empirical aesthetics connects with evolutionary psychology in at least two major ways. One, evolutionary theories are popular for explaining aesthetic preferences for natural environments and faces, human bodies, or faces. This line of investigation ties together empirical aesthetics, social psychology, and evolutionary psychology with regard to human and non-human mate choice. Two, arguments against the existence of a specialized ‘aesthetic circuitry’ in the brain also rest on an argument of evolutionary implausibility: It seems unlikely that such a circuit should have evolved when the use of existing reward systems would be able to perform the same functions.

b. Relationship to Computational Sciences

Even though it has become increasingly hard to draw a line between computer science, computational (cognitive) psychology, and neuroscience, it is worth mentioning computational approaches separately from other frameworks in psychology and neuroscience when it comes to empirical aesthetics.

For one, attempts to use machine learning algorithms to classify objects (again, mostly images) based on their aesthetic appeal to humans are by no means always related to psychological research. In a broader sense, algorithms that create aesthetically appealing images have been developed for commercial purposes long before scientists started to systematically harness the tools of machine learning to study aesthetics.

Second, a dominant framework for how to think about the engagement with art and beauty emerged in computational sciences in the 1990s—arguably before mainstream psychology and neuroscience had turned computational, too. As briefly discussed in the History section, this framework was most prominently popularized by Juergen Schmidhuber.

Third, computer scientists have an additional interest in not only understanding the appreciation and creation of aesthetic experiences by humans, but also in striving to ‘artificially’ create them. Deep-learning algorithms have become famous for beating master-players of chess and Go. Now, computer scientists also try to use them to create art or apply certain art styles unto other images.

c. Relationship to Aesthetics in Philosophy

Like any science, empirical aesthetics is deeply rooted in its philosophical precedents. Even more so than in other sciences, scholars in empirical aesthetics acknowledge this in their writing. Theories and experiments are sometimes partially based on classic philosophical perspectives on aesthetics. Contemporary aesthetic philosophy, however, is rarely mentioned. This disconnect between modern empirical and philosophical aesthetics is mostly due to the fact that the scope of empirical aesthetics remains close to the narrow, older definition of aesthetics as “theory of beauty” and art, whereas aesthetics in modern philosophy has shifted its focus towards new definitions of art, expression, and representation.

During the early days of empirical aesthetics, and psychology as a science in general, the divide between psychology and philosophy used to be less pronounced. Ernst Gombrich and Rudolf Arnheim, for instance, have influenced both fields.

Psychologists and neuroscientists are uninterested in what counts as “art” and what does not count as “art,” in stark contrast to their philosopher colleagues. They are also much less concerned about the normative definition of the aesthetic responses they intend to measure. This core difference between the psychological and philosophical approach to aesthetics is rooted in the diverging goals of the two fields. Empirical aesthetics aims to describe what people deem an aesthetic experience, in contrast to most philosophers who seek to prescribe what should be a proper aesthetic experience.

When it comes to aesthetic emotional responses, the divide between philosophy and psychology lies on a different level. While the paradox of fictional emotions is one that leaves many philosophers doubting that one does indeed show true emotional responses to fictional texts or music, psychologists rarely doubt that people experience emotions when experiencing art in whatever form. On the contrary, a lot of psychological research on emotions relies on the presumption that texts, music, movies, and so on, do elicit genuine emotions since those media are used to manipulate an observer’s emotional state and then study it. And while philosophers question the rationality of these emotions, presuming they exist, psychologists do not question whether or not an emotional response is rational or not. Again, the contrast between philosophy and psychology seems to originate from the different approach towards people’s self-reports. Psychologists take those self-reports, along with neural and physiological data, as evidence of the state of the world, as their subject of study. Philosophers question how far these self-reports reflect the concept in question. Importantly, however, both philosophers and psychologists still do ponder a related question: Are aesthetic emotions special? Or are they the same emotions as any others and just happen to have been elicited by an aesthetic experience?

This historically important link between morality and aesthetics, especially beauty, in philosophy is rarely made in psychology. Apart from the above mentioned “what is beautiful is good” phenomenon, psychologists do not usually link aesthetic and moral judgments. However, there is evidence that facial and moral beauty judgments are linked to activation in overlapping brain regions, specifically the orbitofrontal cortex (OFC). It should be noted, though, that this orbitofrontal region is the same one that is even more generally implied in encoding the experienced or anticipated pleasure of objects of many different kinds. In addition, the so-called “Trait Appreciation of Beauty” framework proposed by Rhett Diessner and his colleagues explicitly contains a morality dimension. This framework is, however, not widely used.

The topic of aesthetic attitude is viewed from very different angles by psychologists and philosophers. In experiments, psychologists use instructions to elicit a change in their participant’s attitude to study the effect of such an attitude change on how objects are perceived. They, for instance, tell people to either judge an image’s positivity as part of a brochure on hygiene behavior or as a piece of abstract art. Research along these lines has found that people do indeed change their evaluations of images depending on whether it is presented as art or non-art. Neuroaesthetics studies have also investigated whether neural activation during image viewing changes depending on the instructions that are given to people, such as to look at them neutrally or with a detached, aesthetic stance. These researchers have indeed uncovered differences in how and when brain activity changes due to these different instructions.

Psychology has so far stayed silent on the issue of whether aesthetic representations, art, can contribute to knowledge. With the exception of some research on the effect of different modes of representing graphs in the context of data visualization, there does not seem to be an interest in exploring the potential contribution of aesthetic factors to learning. However, the inverse idea—that the potential for learning may be a driving force for seeking out aesthetic experiences—seems to be gaining some traction in empirical aesthetics of the 21st century.

It is worth noting, too, that some philosophers combine theories that were developed in the philosophical tradition with experimental methods. Some of these philosophers conduct this empirical philosophy of aesthetics in collaboration with psychologists. This kind of collaboration is in its infancy but does show similar promise as in the field of moral philosophy and psychology.

4. Controversies

a. Is Aesthetics Special?

The major controversy in empirical aesthetics concerns the very core of its existence: Is there anything special about aesthetic experiences and behaviors that distinguishes them from others? For example: Is the pleasure from looking at the Mona Lisa any different from the pleasure of eating a piece of chocolate? Some scholars argue that the current data show that the same neural reward circuit underlies both experiences. In addition, they argue that it would be evolutionarily implausible for a special aesthetic appreciation network to evolve as well as that there is evidence that even non-mammalian animals exhibit behavior that can be classified as signals of aesthetic preferences. Scholars who take the opposing view argue that aesthetic experiences do have properties that distinguish them from other pleasant experiences, especially that they also include unpleasant sensations such as fear or disgust. They also point out the symbolic and communicative function of art that goes beyond the mere evocation of aesthetic pleasure.

b. What Should Empirical Aesthetics Mainly be About?

Empirical aesthetics as a field is far from having found a consensus about its identity. The center of an ongoing tension within the field is the relative balance between a focus on the arts, including all kinds of responses associated with it, versus a focus on aesthetic appreciation, including all kinds of objects that can be aesthetically appreciated. It is therefore unsurprising that most research in the past has occurred at the intersection of both topics, which is to say that it has dealt with aesthetic preferences for artworks or sensory properties that can at least be considered fundamental properties of artworks.

At the two other ends of the extreme, scholars criticize each other for presenting data that is irrelevant for the field. Proponents of an empirical aesthetics of the arts criticize studies that use stock photographs or image databases like the International Affective Picture System because these kinds of objects supposedly cannot elicit genuine aesthetic responses. Proponents of an empirical aesthetics of appreciation in general criticize studies that use only a narrow selection of certain artworks because these supposedly cannot generalize to a broad enough range of experiences to yield significant insights.

c. Population Averages vs. Individual Differences

Another big controversy in the field has accompanied it since its early beginnings. Should we study population averages or individual differences? This question arises within almost any field in psychology, but it has created a particularly marked division of research approaches within empirical aesthetics. The ones studying population averages and object properties criticize the other side by saying that their subjective measures are fundamentally flawed. The ones focusing on individual differences point out that object properties can often only account for a small proportion of the observed responses.

Most contemporary researchers still operate on the level of understanding and predicting average responses across a pre-defined population, mostly Western-educated, rich populations in industrialized democracies. In contrast to Berlyne, however, this choice is often not based on the conviction that this approach is the best one. It is, instead, often the only feasible one based on the amount of data that can be obtained from a single participant. The fewer data points per participant, the less feasible it is to make substantial claims about individual participants. The very nature of aesthetic experiences and responses—that is, that an object needs to be experienced for a certain time; that judgments may not always be made instantaneously; that one cannot make repeated, independent judgments of the same object; that aesthetic judgments may be compromised as the experiment progresses due to boredom and fatigue; that one cannot assume stability of aesthetic responses over longer delays of days or even hours—complicates the collection of many data points for a single participant.

Still, a paradigm shift seems to be taking place, slowly. In the early 21st century, more and more studies have at least reported to what extent their overall findings generalize across participants, or to what extent aesthetic judgments were driven by individual differences versus common taste. In addition, some have reported stable preferences for certain stimulus characteristics across modalities or object kinds within a given participant.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Berlyne, D. E. (Ed.). (1974). Studies in the New Experimental Aesthetics: Steps toward an Objective Psychology of Aesthetic Appreciation. Washington D. C.: Hemisphere Publishing Corporation.
  • Brielmann, A. A., & Pelli, D. G. (2018). Aesthetics. Current Biology, 28(16), R859-R863.
  • Brown, S., Gao, X., Tisdelle, L., Eickhoff, S. B., and Liotti, M. (2011). Naturalizing aesthetics: brain areas for aesthetic appraisal across sensory modalities. Neuroimage, 58(1), 250-258.
  • Chatterjee, A., and Vartanian, O. (2014). Neuroaesthetics. Trends Cogn. Sci., 18, 370–375.
  • Fechner, G. T. (1876). Vorschule der Aesthetik. Leipzig: Breitkopf & Hartel.
  • Graf, L. K. M., and Landwehr, J. R. (2015). A dual-process perspective on fluency-based aesthetics: the pleasure-interest model of aesthetic liking. Pers. Soc. Psychol. Rev., 19, 395–410.
  • Ishizu, T., and Zeki, S. (2011). Toward a brain-based theory of beauty. Plos ONE, 6, e21852.
  • Leder, H., and Nadal, M. (2014). Ten years of a model of aesthetic appreciation and aesthetic judgments: the aesthetic episode — developments and challenges in empirical aesthetics. Br. J. Psychol., 105, 443–446.
  • Montoya, R. M., Horton, R. S., Vevea, J. L., Citkowicz, M., & Lauber, E. A. (2017). A re-examination of the mere exposure effect: The influence of repeated exposure on recognition, familiarity, and liking. Psychological bulletin, 143(5), 459.
  • Nadal, M. and Ureña, E. (2021). One hundred years of Empirical Aesthetics: Fechner to Berlyne (1876 – 1976). In M. Nadal & O. Vartanian (Eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Empirical Aesthetics. New York: Oxford University Press, https://psyarxiv.com/c92y7/
  • Palmer, S. E., Schloss, K. B., and Sammartino, J. (2013). Visual aesthetics and human preference. Annu. Rev. Psychol., 64, 77–107.
  • Pelowski, M., Markey, P. S., Forster, M., Gerger, G., and Leder, H. (2017). Move me, astonish me… delight my eyes and brain: The Vienna integrated model of top-down and bottom-up processes in art perception (VIMAP) and corresponding affective, evaluative, and neurophysiological correlates. Physics of Life Reviews, 21, 80-125.


Author Information

Aenne Brielmann
Email: aenne.brielmann@tuebingen.mpg.de
Max Planck Institute for Biological Cybernetics