The term ‘enaction’ was first introduced in The Embodied Mind, co-authored by Varela, Thompson, and Rosch and published in 1991. That seminal work provides the first original contemporary formulation of enactivism. Its authors define cognition as enaction, which they in turn characterize as the ‘bringing forth’ of domains of significance through organismic activity that has been itself conditioned by a history of interactions between an organism and its environment.
To understand mentality, however complex and sophisticated it may be, it is necessary to appreciate how living beings dynamically interact with their environments. From an enactivist perspective, there is no prospect of understanding minds without reference to such interactions because interactions are taken to lie at the heart of mentality in all of its varied forms.
Since 1991, enactivism has attracted interest and attention from academics and practitioners in many fields, and it is a well-established framework for thinking about and investigating mind and cognition. It has been articulated into several recognizably distinct varieties distinguished by their specific commitments. Some versions of enactivism, such as those put forward by Thompson and Di Paolo and others, focus on expanding and developing the core ideas of the original formulation of enactivism advanced by Varela, Thompson, and Rosch. Other versions of enactivism, such as sensorimotor knowledge enactivism and radical enactivism incorporate other ideas and influences in their articulation of enactivism, sometimes leaving aside and sometimes challenging the core assumptions of the original version of enactivism.
Table of Contents
- Core Commitments
- Contemporary Varieties of Enactivism
- Applications and Influence
- References and Further Reading
What unifies different articulations of enactivism is that, at their core, they all look to living systems to understand minds, and they conceive of cognition as embodied activity. In enactivist terms, perceiving, imagining, remembering, and even the most abstract forms of thinking are to be understood, first and foremost, as organismic activities that dynamically unfold across time and space.
Enactivists conceive of the embodied cognitive activity that they take to constitute cognition as fundamentally interactive in at least two ways. First, the manner and style of any given bout of cognitive activity are conditioned by the cognizer’s prior history of engagement with environments and the particularities of the current environment with which they are actively engaged. Second, cognizers shape their environments and are, in turn, shaped by them in a variety of ways across multiple timescales.
A cornerstone commitment of enactivism is that minds arise and take shape through the precarious self-creating, self-sustaining, adaptive activities of living creatures as they regulate themselves by interacting with features of its environment. To take a central case, an organism’s characteristic patterns of sensorimotor interaction are deemed to be shaped by its prior history of active engagement with aspects of their environments. Its past engagements reinforce and tend to perpetuate its sensorimotor habits and tendencies. Yet organisms are not wholly creatures of past habits. Living beings always remain flexibly open to adjusting their repertoires and ways of doing things in new and novel ways. Cognition, which takes the form of patterns of open-ended, flexible, extended spatio-temporal activity, is thus deemed ‘autonomous’ in the sense that it unfolds in ways that are viable for sustaining itself and that are not externally regulated or pre-programmed.
Enactivists regard an organism’s environment as a domain of significance populated with items of relevance, not as a neutral setting that can be adequately characterized in, say, purely physical terms. Importantly, in this regard, organisms are said to ‘enact’ or ‘bring forth’ their ‘worlds’. Organisms not only adapt to and are shaped by their environments; they also dynamically fashion, curate, and adapt to them. Through such activity and exchanges, both organisms and their environments are transformed and, in an important sense, brought into being. Enactivists often explicate the unprescribed bi-directional influence of organisms on their environments and vice versa, poetically, using the metaphor of “laying down a path in walking”.
Another signature enactivist idea is that qualitative, phenomenal aspects of lived experience—what it is like to experience something—are an achievement of organismic activity. To take a central case, perceptual experience arises and takes shape through an organism’s active exploration of aspects of its environment. It is through such engaged efforts and the specific ways they are carried out that organisms experience the world in particular ways. Accordingly, organismic activities of certain kinds are required to achieve phenomenal access to aspects of the world or for things to ‘show up’ or “to be present” phenomenally.
Minds, conceived in enactivist terms, operate in ways that are fundamentally unlike those of mechanisms that are driven entirely by externally sourced programs and algorithms. Enactivism thus sees itself as directly opposing the views of cognition that understand it as essentially computational and representational in nature. In its original formulation, enactivism strongly rejects the idea that minds are in the business of collecting, transforming, and representing information sourced from a pre-given world that is assumed to exist independently of and prior to organisms. Strikingly, to conceive of cognition in line with the original version of enactivism entails holding that when organisms actively engage with aspects of their worlds, they always do so in mentality-constituting ways. Yet, enactivists hold that such cognitive activity neither involves constructing representations of those worlds based on retrieved information nor does it depend on any kind of computational processing. So conceived, enactivism rejects the longstanding idea that the core business of cognition is to represent and compute, and, concomitantly, it rejects the familiar explanatory strategies of orthodox cognitive science.
Enactivism is a significant philosophical enterprise because, at least under standard interpretations, it offers a foundational challenge to cognitivist accounts of mind—those that conceive of mentality in representational and computational terms. Enactivists regard such conceptions of mind, which dominate much mainstream analytic philosophy and cognitive science, not only as resting on a mistaken theoretical foundation but as presenting a tempting picture of mentality that, practically, subverts efforts to develop a healthier and more accurate understanding of ourselves and our place in nature.
There are several, and importantly, different versions of enactivism occupying the contemporary philosophical landscape.
The Embodied Mind by Varela, Thompson, and Rosch, published in 1991, is the locus classicus of enactivism. That landmark work is variously described as initially formulating and advancing the most influential statement of enactivism in recent times. It is credited with being “the first and among the most profound” of the many and various enactivist offerings that have followed in its wake (Kabat-Zinn 2016, p. xiii).
Enactivism, as originally formulated, is not a neatly defined or finished theory. It is variously described in the literature as a broad, emerging ‘perspective’, ‘approach’, ‘paradigm’, or ‘framework’ for understanding mind and cognition (see, for instance, Varela, Thompson and Rosch 1991; Baerveldt and Verheggen 2012; Stewart and others 2010; Gallagher 2017). Enactivism is not a finished product; it continues to evolve as new versions of enactivism emerge which adjust, add to, or reject certain core and peripheral commitments of the original version.
Though the original version of enactivism resists definition in terms of a set of central theses, it does have distinctive features. There are three key and recurring themes emphasized in the original statement of enactivism. The first theme is that understanding organismic biological autonomy is the key to understanding minds. Original enactivism assumes that there is deep continuity between life and mind, such that understanding the biological autonomy of organisms sheds direct light on cognition. The second theme is that minds cannot be understood without coming to terms with subjective, lived experience, and consciousness. The third theme is that non-Western traditions, and in particular, Buddhist philosophy and its practices of meditation and mindfulness, should play a significant role in reforming and rethinking the future sciences of the mind, both theoretically and practically.
The original version of enactivism put forward in The Embodied Mind has been successively developed and expanded upon in works, mainly by Thompson, Di Paolo, and their co-authors (principally Thompson 2007, Froese and Di Paolo 2011, McGann and others 2013, Di Paolo and others 2017, Di Paolo and others 2018, Di Paolo 2018, 2021). Some speak of these works, collectively, as constituting and contributing to a variety of autopoietic enactivism (Hutto and Myin 2013, 2017, Ward and others 2017, Stapleton 2022). The label, which now has some purchase was chosen because the original version of enactivism and those that seek directly to expand on it, are united in looking to biological autonomy to understand the fundamentals of mindedness. Crucially, all enactivists of this stripe embrace the notion of autopoiesis —the self-creating and self-sustaining activity of living systems —as a common theoretical starting point, having been inspired by “the work of the biologists Humberto Maturana and Francisco Varela” (Baerveldt and Verheggen 2012, p. 165; see Maturana and Varela, 1980, 1987). Nevertheless, the label autopoietic enactivism is contested (see, for example, Thompson 2018, Netland 2022). It is thought to be misleading because, although these enactivists build upon the work of Varela and Maturana, they have added significant resources, expanding upon and modifying the initial conception of autopoiesis in their efforts to explicate key aspects of biological autonomy, namely, recognizing its teleological character (see, for instance, Thompson 2007, 127; Di Paolo 2009, p. 12; Di Paolo 2018 and others, p. 37). As such, enactivists working on these topics deem autopoiesis, as originally conceived, to be, at most, necessary but insufficient for important world-involving forms of cognition (see Thompson 2007, p. 149-150; see also p. 127). For these reasons, Barandiaran (2017) recommends the label autonomist enactivism instead. However, given these nuances, it may be safer and more accurate to speak of these positions simply as variants of original enactivism.
The primary aim of the original version of enactivism was to address the problem of understanding how lived experience fits into the world, as described by science, including cognitive science. On the face of it, the two appear unreconcilably different from one another. Thompson (2016) puts the apparent dilemma that motivated the first formulation of enactivism in terms of a hard choice: either “accept what science seems to be telling us and deny our experience… or hold fast to our experience and deny science” (p. xix).
The original version of enactivism was born from the aspiration of finding a way for cognitive science to give appropriate attention to lived experience. One of its key assumptions is that “we cannot begin to address… [the gap between science and experience] without relying on some kind of phenomenology, that is, on some kind of descriptive account of our experience in the everyday world” (Thompson 2016, p. xx).
Enactivism rejects mainstream conceptions of mind that strongly demarcate minds from bodies and environments. It holds that such conceptions are not justified and should be rethought. Enactivism aims to eradicate misleading dualisms that continue to dominate analytic philosophy of mind and much cognitive science. It aims to dissolve the mind-body problem by asking us to abandon our attachment to traditional dichotomies and to come to see that minds are not ultimately separate from bodies, environments, or others.
Original enactivism seeks to put the mind-body problem to rest once and for all. It also rejects the traditional input-output processing model of the mind, a model which pays homage, often explicitly, to the idea that minds are furnished by the senses by accepting that the senses supply minds with information about the external world. Original enactivism rejects this familiar characterization of mental activity, denying that minds ever pick up or process information from the environment. Concomitantly, original enactivism rejects the idea that minds are fundamentally information processing systems that manipulate informational content by categorizing, conceptualizing, and schematizing it by means of representational-computational processes. By also pressing us to radically rethink key notions —self, nature, and science – original enactivism aims to usher in “a new kind of cognitive science” (Rosch 2016, p. xxxv). So conceived, enactivism seeks to revolutionize and massively reform the sciences of the mind.
Embracing original enactivism entails rethinking foundational mainstream theoretical assumptions that are prevalent in much analytic philosophy of mind and cognitive science. Importantly, in this vein, original enactivists advocate not only for changes to our theoretical mindset but also for changes in existing practices and approaches we use in the cognitive sciences and cognate domains that study and engage with minds. Thus, the original version of enactivism envisions that future sciences of the mind will recognize and work with “another mode of knowing not based on an observer and observed” (Rosch 2016, p. x). Original enactivism, thus, issues a normative demand to create a space in which those working to understand and expand our lived experience can speak to and understand empirically focused scientists of the mind. In such a setting, there would be a dynamic and interactive ‘circulation’ and cross-fertilization of theory and practice (Thompson 2016, 2017).
This is the sense in which original enactivism seeks to provide “a framework for a far-reaching renewal of cognitive science as a whole” (Stewart, Gapenne, and Di Paolo 2010, p. viii.).
It is an open question just how much of the ambition of original enactivism has been achieved, but it is undeniable that much has changed in the fields of philosophy and the sciences of the mind since its debut. Thompson (2016) summarizes the current state of the art.
The idea that there is a deep continuity in the principles of self-organization from the simplest living things to more complex cognitive beings — an idea central to Varela’s earlier work with neurobiologist Humberto Maturana — is now a mainstay of theoretical biology. Subjective experience and consciousness, once taboo subjects for cognitive science, are now important research topics, especially in cognitive neuroscience. Phenomenology now plays an active role in the philosophy of mind and experimental cognitive science. Meditation and mindfulness practices are increasingly used in clinical contexts and are a growing subject of investigation in behavioral psychology and cognitive neuroscience. And Buddhist philosophy is increasingly recognized as an important interlocutor in contemporary philosophy (p. xix).
Notably, there have been efforts to transform the way the science of intersubjectivity is itself conducted by getting researchers to participate, at once, both as subjects and objects of research. Details of this method, called PRISMA, are set out in De Jaegher and others (2017). Thompson (2017) praises this work for being “clearly animated by the full meaning of enaction as requiring not just a change in how we think but also in how we experience” (p. 43). For a related discussion of how cognitive science practice might change by giving due attention to dynamically evolving experience, see McGann (2022).
All living systems —from simple cells to whole organisms, whether the latter are single-celled bacteria or human beings —actively individuate themselves from other aspects of their environments and maintain themselves by engaging in a constant “dynamical exchange of energy and matter that keeps the inside conditions just right for life to perpetuate itself” (Kabat-Zinn 2016, p. xiv). This is all part of the great game of life: staying far enough away from entropy, aka thermodynamic equilibrium, to survive.
Enactivists emphasize the autopoietic character—the self-creating and self-individuating results—of the activity through which living systems adaptively produce and maintain vital boundaries and relationships between themselves and what lies beyond them (Varela and others, 1991; Thompson, 2007). Accordingly, “organisms actively and continuously produce a distinction between themselves and their environment where none existed before they appeared and where none will remain after they are gone” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 23).
What determines the boundaries of a given organism? Where does a given organism end and the environment begin? Enactivists seek to answer such questions by pointing to the fact that living systems are organizationally and operationally closed, which is to say that they are “constituted as a network of interdependent processes, where the behavior of the whole emerges from the interaction dynamics of its component parts” (Barandiaran 2017, p. 411, see also Di Paolo and Thompson 2014, Di Paolo and others 2018; Kirchhoff 2018a).
The basic idea of operational closure is that self-defining autopoietic processes can be picked out by the fact that they exist in mutually enabling networks of circular means-end activities, such that “all of the processes that make up the system are enabled by other processes in the system” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 25). Operational closure is evident in the self-sustaining autonomous activity of, for example, metabolic networks in living systems. External influences —such as, say, the effects of sunlight being absorbed by chlorophyll —are any influences that are not mutually enabled or produced by processes within such a closed system.
The exact boundaries of a self-producing, self-individuating living system can be flexible. In this regard, Di Paolo and others (2018) cite the capacity of some insects and spiders to breathe underwater for certain periods of time. They manage to do this by trapping air bubbles in the hair on their abdomens. In such cases, these environmental features become part of the self-individuating enabling conditions of the organism’s operationally closed network: “These bubbles function like external gills as the partial pressure of oxygen within the bubble, diminished by respiration, equilibrates with that of the water as the external oxygen flows in” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 28, see also Turner 2000).
When we consider concrete cases, it is evident that autopoietic processes of self-production and self-distinction require living systems to continuously adjust to features of their environment. This involves the “selective opening and selective rejection of material flows—in other words, an adaptive regulation of what goes in and what stays out” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 40).
Adaptive regulation requires flexibility. It requires simultaneous adjustments at multiple timescales and various levels, where each adjustment must be responsive to particular speeds and rhythms at the scale required to meet specific thresholds. This is why the business of being and staying alive is necessarily complex, forever unfinished, precarious, and restless (Di Paolo and others, 2017; 2018). Though there is room for error, minimally, organisms that survive and propagate must actively avoid engaging in behaviors that are overly maladaptive.
Enactivists hold that such adaptive activity is autonomous. Living systems establish their own unprincipled norms of operation —norms that arise naturally from the activity of staying alive and far from entropy. It is because organisms generate their own norms through their activities that enactivists speak of them as having an immanent teleology (Thompson 2007, Di Paolo and others 2018).
It is claimed that this notion of autonomy is the very core of enactivism (Thompson 2007, Barandiaran 2017, p. 409; Di Paolo and others, 2018, p. 23). It is regarded as a notion that, strictly speaking, goes “beyond autopoiesis” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 25).
Enactivists contend that the fact that living systems are autonomous in the precise sense just defined is what distinguishes them from wholly lifeless, heteronomous machines of the sort that are driven only by external, exogenous instructions. A core idea of enactivism is that “the living body is a self-organizing system. To think of living bodies in this way “contrasts with viewing it as a machine that happens to be made of meat rather than silicon” (Rosch 2016, p. xxviii). In line with this understanding, enactivists hold that organismic processes “operate and self-organize historically rather than function” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 20). It is precisely because organisms must always be ready to adjust to new possibilities and circumstances that the self-organizing activity of living systems cannot be governed by instructions in a functionally pre-specified manner (see Barandiaran 2017, p. 411).
Enactivists hold that autonomous norm generation is a feature of all modes and styles of cognitive activity and not just as it concerns basic organismic self-production, self-individuation, and self-maintenance. Di Paolo and others (2018), for example, identify two important dimensions of autonomous self-regulation beyond the basic cycles of regulation that sustain living organisms. These additional dimensions they identify are cycles of sensorimotor interactions involved in action, perception, and emotion and cycles of intersubjectivity involved in social engagements with others (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 22).
Connected with their understanding of biological autonomy, enactivists reject the idea that organisms simply adapt to features of a pre-existing, neutrally characterized physical world. Instead, they hold that organisms are attuned to features of environments or domains that are significant to them —environments that organisms themselves bring into being. It is on this basis that enactivists “conceive of mental life as the ongoing meaningful engagement between precariously constituted embodied agents and the worlds of significance they bring forth in their self-asserting activity” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 20). Hence, a central thesis of enactivism is that “cognition is not the grasping of an independent, outside world by a separate mind or self, but instead the bringing forth or enacting of a dependent world of relevance in and through embodied action” (Thompson 2016, p. xviii).
In this view, organisms and environments dynamically co-emerge. The autonomous adaptative activity of organisms “brings forth, in the same stroke, what counts as other, the organism’s world.” (Thompson 2007, p. 153). The pre-existing world, as characterized by physics and chemistry, is not equivalent to an organism’s environment. The latter, which is effectively captured by von Uexküll’s (1957) notion of an Umwelt, is a sub-set of the physio-chemical world that is relevant to the organism in question. This environmental domain of significance or relevance for organisms, which enactivists hold, is brought into being through the activity of organisms themselves.
For example, sucrose only serves as food for a bacterium because it has certain physical and chemical properties. Yet without organisms that use it as a nutrient, sucrose, understood merely as something that exists as part of the physicochemical world, is not food. Hence, that it is food for bacteria depends not only, or even primarily, on the physiochemical properties of sucrose itself but chiefly on the existence and properties of bacteria —properties connected to their metabolic needs and processes that they brought into being. Although, taking the stance of scientists, we can and do speak of aspects of an organism’s environment using the language of physics and chemistry, describing them in organism-neutral terms, it is only if we recognize the significance that such worldly features have for the organism that we are able to pick the right aspects of the world that are relevant or important to it.
On the face of it, to suggest that organisms ‘bring forth’ or ‘enact’ their own environments may appear to be an extravagant thesis. Yet it finds support in the seminal work of biologists, principally Gould and Lewontin (1979), who question accounts of Darwinian adaptationism in two key respects. They reject construing natural selection as an external evolutionary force that separately targets and optimizes individuated organismic traits. They also reject the idea that natural selection fashions organisms to better compete against one another for the resources of the pre-existing physical world (for further details, see Godfrey-Smith 2001). In the place of strong adaptationism, original enactivists propose to understand evolution in terms of natural drift– seeing it as a holistic, “ongoing process of satisfaction that triggers (but does not specify) change in the form of viable trajectories” (see a full summary in Varela and others 1991, pp. 196-197 and also Maturana and Mpodozis 2000).
A major focus of the critique of adaptationism is the rejection of the idea that a living creature’s environment is an external, “preexistent element of nature formed by autonomous forces, as a kind of theatrical stage on which the organisms play out their lives” (Lewontin and Levins 1997, p. 96, Lewontin 2000).
Putting pressure on the idea that organisms simply adapt to a neutrally characterized external world, Lewontin and Levins (1997) observe that not all worldly forces affect every organism equally. In some cases, some forces greatly affect certain organisms, while the same forces matter to other creatures hardly at all. The all-pervasive force of gravity provides a shining example. All middle-sized plants and animals must contend with it. Not only does gravity affect the musculoskeletal, respiratory, and circulatory systems of such organisms, but also affects their single biological cells. Gravity influences cell size and processes such as mechanotransduction —processes by which cells electrochemically respond, at micro-timescales, to mechanical features and forces in the environment. Hence, even on a microlevel, gravity matters for such cognitively important activities as hearing, proprioception, touch, and balance. Due to their size, other organisms, however, must contend with and are shaped in their activities by other forces. For microorganisms, it is Brownian motion, not gravity, that matters most to their lives. It is reported that some microbes can survive the hypergravity of extraterrestrial, cosmic environments, which exert a gravitational force up to 400,000 times greater than that found on Earth (Deguchi and others 2011). This is one reason why bacteria “are ubiquitous, present in nearly every environment from the abyssal zone to the stratosphere at heights up to 60 km, from arctic ice to boiling volcanoes” (Sharma and Curtis 2022, p. 1).
These reminders support the enactivist claim that the relationship between organism and environment is dialectical —that the one cannot exist without the other. Maintaining that organisms and their environments reciprocally codetermine one another, defenders of this view of biological development hold that:
Environments are as much the product of organisms as organisms are of environments. There is no organism without an environment, but there is no environment without an organism. There is a physical world outside of organisms, and that world undergoes certain transformations that are autonomous. Volcanoes erupt, and the earth precesses on its axis of rotation. But the physical world is not an environment; only the circumstances from which environments can be made are (Lewontin and Levins 1997, p. 96).
Moreover, the relationship between organisms and their environments is not static; it coevolves dynamically over time: “As the species evolves in response to natural selection in its current environment, the world that it constructs around itself is actively changed” (Thompson 2007, p. 150). Lewontin and Levins (1997) provide a range of examples of how organisms relate to and actively construct their environments. These include organisms regulating ambient temperatures through the metabolic production of shells of warm, moist air around themselves and plant roots producing humic acids that alter the physiochemical structure of soil to help them absorb nutrients.
Looking to these foundations, Rolla and Figueiredo (2021) further explicate the evolutionary dynamics by which organisms can be said to, literally, bring forth their worlds. Drawing on the notion of niche construction, theirs is an effort to show that “enactivism is compatible with the idea of an independent reality without committing to the claim that organisms have cognitive access to a world composed of properties specified prior to any cognitive activity”. For more on the notion of niche construction, and why it is thought to be needed, see Laland and others (2014), Laland and others (2016), and Werner (2020).
In line with its overarching aim, original enactivism aims at giving an account of “situated meaningful action that remains connected both to biology and to the hermeneutic and phenomenological studies of experience” (Baerveldt and Verheggen, 2012, p. 165. See also Stapleton and Froese (2016), Netland (2022)).
See also Stapleton and Froese (2016), Netland (2022). It owes a great deal to the European tradition of phenomenology in that its account of virtual milieus and vital norms is inspired by Merleau-Ponty’s The Structure of Behaviour and, especially, his notion of “the lived body” (Kabat-Zinn 2016, p. xiii). Virtual milieus and their properties are not something found ‘objectively’ in the world; rather, they are enacted or brought forth by organisms. Organisms not only enact their environments —in the sense that sucrose might become food for certain creatures —they also enact their qualitative, felt experiences of the world. In this vein, enactivists advance the view that “our perceived world [the world as perceived]…is constituted through complex and delicate patterns of sensorimotor activity” (Varela and others, 1991, p. 164).
By appealing to arguments from biology, enactivists defend the view that organisms and their environments are bound together in ways that make it impossible to characterize one without reference to the other when it comes to understanding mental life. They apply this same thinking when it comes to thinking about qualitative, phenomenally conscious aspects of mind, holding, for example, that “we will not be able to explain colour if we seek to locate it in a world independent of our perceptual capacities” (Varela and others, 1991, p. 164). This is not meant to be a rejection of mind-independent realism in favor of mind-dependent idealism. Defenders of the original version of enactivism offer this proposal explicitly as providing a ‘middle way’ between these familiar options. By their lights, “colours are not ‘out there’ independent of our perceptual and cognitive capacities…[but equally] colors are not ‘in here’ independent of our surrounding biological and cultural world” (p. Varela and others 1991, p. 172).
For enactivists, colors cannot be understood independently of the very particular ways that experiencing beings respond to specific kinds of worldly offerings. Accordingly, it is not possible to think about the nature of colors qua colors without also referencing those ways of interacting with environmental offerings. This claim rests on two assumptions. First, the way colors appear to organisms —the way they experience them —is essential to understanding the nature of colors as such. Second, such experiential properties are inescapably bound up with organismic ways of responding to aspects of their environments.
Importantly, though enactivists deny that colors are objective properties of the world independent of organisms that perceive them, they neither claim nor imply that colors are wholly mind-dependent properties in the sense associated with classical Berkleyian idealism as it is standardly portrayed.
Furthermore, it is precisely because enactivists hold that an organism’s ways of responding to aspects of its environment are not inherently representational, or representationally mediated that “color provides a paradigm of a cognitive domain that is neither pregiven nor represented but rather experiential and enacted” (Varela and others 1991, p. 171). This conclusion is meant to generalize, applying to all phenomenological structures and aspects of what is brought forth by organisms as domains of significance through their autonomous activity.
In this regard, in its original formulation, enactivism drew on “significant resources in the phenomenological tradition for rethinking the mind” (Gallagher 2017, p. 5). Apart from explicitly borrowing from Merleau-Ponty, Varela and others (1991) also aligned their project with other classic thinkers of the phenomenological tradition, such as Husserl and Sartre, to some extent.
For example, although the enactivists wished to steer clear of what Hubert Dreyfus interpreted as Husserl’s representationalist leanings, they acknowledge the prime importance of his efforts to “develop a specific procedure for examining the structure of intentionality, which [for him] was the structure of experience itself” (Varela and others 1991, p. 16). For this reason, and by contrast, they explicitly oppose and criticize the cognitivist conviction that there is “a fundamental distinction between consciousness and intentionality” (p. 56). By their lights, drawing such a distinction creates a mind-mind problem and disunifies our understanding of the cognizing subject.
Nevertheless, despite borrowing in key respects from the Western phenomenological tradition, when formulating their initial statement of enactivism, Varela and others (1991) also criticized that tradition for, allegedly, being overly theoretical in its preoccupations. According to their assessment at the time, phenomenology “had gotten bogged down in abstract, theoretical reflection and had lost touch with its original inspiration to examine lived experience in a rigorous way” (Thompson 2016, p. xx-xxi). This critical take on phenomenology motivated the original enactivists to “turn to the tradition of Buddhist philosophy and mindfulness-awareness meditation as a more promising phenomenological partner for cognitive science” (Thompson 2007, p. 413).
In time, Thompson and Varela too, in their analysis of the specious present and their work with Natalie Depraz, at least, came to revise original enactivism’s negative verdict concerning phenomenology’s limitations. In his later writings, Thompson admits that the authors of The Embodied Mind, wrongly, gave short shrift to phenomenology. For example, by conceding that they had relied too heavily on second-hand sources and had not given careful attention to the primary texts, Thompson makes clear that the original enactivists came to hold, mistakenly, that Husserl sponsored an unwanted brand of representationalism (see Thompson 2007 appendix A, Thompson 2016).
Many contemporary enactivists, including Thompson, openly draw on and seek to renovate ideas from the phenomenological tradition, connecting them directly with current theorizing in the cognitive sciences (Gallagher 2005, Gallagher and Zahavi 2008/2021, Gallagher 2017). As Gallagher notes, for example, there has been new work in this vein on “Husserl’s concept of the ‘I can’ (the idea that I perceive things in my environment in terms of what I can do with them); Heidegger’s concept of the pragmatic ready-to-hand (Zuhanden) attitude (we experience the world primarily in terms of pre-reflective pragmatic, action-oriented use, rather than in reflective intellectual contemplation or scientific observation); and especially Merleau-Ponty’s focus on embodied practice” (Gallagher 2017, p. 5).
A major source of inspiration for original enactivists comes from Buddhist philosophy and practice. Thompson remarks in an interview that, to his knowledge, The Embodied Mind, “was the first book that related Buddhist philosophy to cognitive science, the scientific study of the mind, and the Western philosophy of mind” (Littlefair 2020).
Speaking on behalf of the authors of The Embodied Mind, Rosch (2016) reports that “We turned to Buddhism because, in our judgment, it provided what both Western psychology and phenomenology lacked, a disciplined and nonmanipulative method of allowing the mind to know itself—a method that we (in retrospect naively) simply called mindfulness” (Rosch 2016, xli). Despite having turned to Buddhist philosophy and psychology due to a mistaken assessment of what Western phenomenology has to offer, original enactivism continues to seek fruitful dialogues between Buddhist and Western traditions of philosophy of mind. Enactivism has helped to promote the recognition that phenomenological investigations need not be limited to work done in the European tradition.
There are potential gains to be had from conducting dialogues across traditions of thought for at least two reasons. Sometimes those working in a different tradition focus on phenomena unnoticed by other traditions. And sometimes those working in a different tradition offer novel observations about phenomena that are already of common interest. Recognizing the potential value of such dialogues, enactivists have a sustained interest in what Asian traditions of thought and practice have to offer when it comes to investigating and describing experience, and “in particular the various Buddhist and Hindu philosophical analyses of the nature of the mind and consciousness, based on contemplative mental training” (Thompson 2007, p. 474).
Inspired by these efforts at cross-fertilization, Varela initially formulated neurophenomenology, which was subsequently taken up by others (Varela 1996, 1999, Thompson 2007). Neurophenomenology was developed as a novel approach to the science of consciousness —one that incorporates empirical studies of mindful, meditative practice with the aim of getting beyond the hard problem of consciousness. Although, as a practical approach to the science of consciousness, neurophenomenology certainly breaks new ground, it has been criticized for failing to adequately address the theoretical roots of the hard problem of consciousness, which are grounded in particular metaphysical commitments (see, for example, Kirchhoff and Hutto 2016 and replies from commentators).
Another enactivist borrowing from Buddhist philosophy, of a more theoretical bent, is the claim that cognition and consciousness are absolutely groundless —that they are ultimately based only on empty co-dependent arising. Thompson (2016) reports that the original working title of The Embodied Mind was Worlds Without Grounds. That initial choice of title, though later changed, shows the centrality of the idea of groundlessness for the book’s authors. As Thompson explains, the notion of groundlessness in Buddhist philosophy is meant to capture the idea “that phenomena lack any inherent and independent being; they are said to be ‘empty’ of ‘own being’” (p. xviii).
The original enactivists saw a connection with the Buddhist notion of groundlessness and their view that cognition only arises through viable organismic activity and histories of interaction that are not predetermined. For them, the idea that cognition is groundless is supported by the conception of evolution as natural drift. Accordingly, they maintain that “our human embodiment and the world that is enacted by our history of coupling reflect only one of many possible evolutionary pathways. We are always constrained by the path we have laid down, but there is no ultimate ground to prescribe the steps that we take” (Varela and others 1991, p. 213). Or, as Thompson (2016) puts it, “Cognition as the enaction of a world means that cognition has no ground or foundation beyond its own history” (p. xviii).
Thompson (2021) has emphasized the apparently far-reaching consequences this view has for mainstream conceptions of science and nature. To take it fully on board is to hold that ultimate reality is ungraspable, that it is beyond conception, or that it is not ‘findable under analysis’. As such, he observes that, on the face of it, the traditional Mahāyāna Buddhist idea of ‘emptiness’ (śūnyatā—the lack of intrinsic reality) appears to be at odds with standard, realist, and objectivist conceptions of scientific naturalism. As such, this raises a deep question of what taking these Buddhist ideas seriously might mean “for scientific thinking and practice” (Thompson 2021, p. 78). Others too have sought to work through the implications of taking enactivist ideas seriously when thinking about an overall philosophy of nature (Hutto and Satne 2015, 2018a, 2018b; Gallagher 2017, 2018b; Meyer and Brancazio 2022). These developments raise the interesting question: To what extent, and at what point, might enactivist revisions to our understanding and practice of science come into direct tension with and begin to undermine attempts to make the notion of autonomous agency credible by “providing a factual, biological justification for it” (Varela 1991 p. 79)?
A foundational, signature idea associated with the original version of enactivism and its direct descendants is that the autonomous agency of living systems and what it entails are a kind of sense-making. The notion of sense–making made its debut in the title of a presentation that Varela delivered in 1981, and the idea’s first published expression arrived with the publication of that presentation, as follows: “Order is order, relative to somebody or some being who takes such a stance towards it. In the world of the living, order is indeed inseparable from the ways in which living systems make sense, so that they can be said to have a world” (Varela 1984, p. 208; see Thompson 2011 for further discussion of the origins of the idea). The idea that living systems are sense-making systems has proved popular with many enactivists, although interestingly, there is no explicit mention of sense-making in The Embodied Mind.
Sense making is variously characterised in the literature. Sometimes it is characterised austerely, serving simply as another name for the autonomous activity of living systems. In other uses, it picks out, more contentiously, what is claimed to be directly entailed by the autonomous activity of living systems. In the latter uses, different authors attribute a variety of diverse properties to sense making activity in their efforts to demonstrate how phenomenological aspects of mind derive directly from, or are otherwise somehow connected with, the autonomous agency of living systems. Making the case for links between life and mind can be seen, broadly, as a continuation of Varela’s project “to establish a direct entailment from autopoiesis to the emergence of a world of significance” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 32).
At its simplest, sense-making is used to denote the autonomous agency of living systems. For example, that is how the notion is used in the following passages:
Living is a process of sense-making, of bringing forth significance and value. In this way, the environment becomes a place of valence, of attraction and repulsion, approach or escape (Thompson 2007, p. 158).
Sense-making is the capacity of an autonomous system to adaptively regulate its operation and its relation to the environment depending on the virtual consequences for its own viability as a form of life (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 33).
Such an identification is at play when it is said that “even the simplest organisms regulate their interactions with the world in such a way that they transform the world into a place of salience, meaning, and value —into an environment (Umwelt) in the proper biological sense of the term. This transformation of the world into an environment happens through the organism’s sense-making activity” (Thompson and Stapleton 2009, p. 25). However, Di Paolo and others (2017) go further, claiming that “it is possible to deduce from processes of precarious, material self-individuation the concept of sense-making” (p. 7).
Enactivists add to this basic explication of sense-making, claiming that the autonomous activity of living systems is equivalent to, invariably gives rise to, entails, or is naturally accompanied by a plethora of additional properties: having a perspective, intentionality, interpretation, making sense of the world, care, concern, affect, values, evaluation, and meaning.
Thompson (2007) explains that the self-individuating and identity-forging activity of living systems “establishes logically and operationally the reference point or perspective for sense-making and a domain of interactions” (p. 148). It is claimed that such autonomous sense-making activity establishes “a perspective from which interactions with the world acquire a normative status” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 32). Di Paolo and others (2017) appear to add something more to this explication when they take sense-making to be equivalent to an organism not only having a perspective on things but having “a perspective of meaning on the world invested with interest for the agent itself” (p. 7).
Thompson (2007) tells us that according to Varela, sense-making “is none other than intentionality in its minimal and original biological form” (Thompson 2007, p. 148; see Varela 1997a, Thompson 2004). This fits with the account of intentionality provided in The Embodied Mindccording to which “embodied action is always about or directed toward something that is missing… actions of the system are always directed toward situations that have yet to become actual” (Varela and others 1991, p. 205). In their classic statement of this view, the original enactivists held that intentionality “consists primarily in the directedness of action… to what the system takes its possibilities for action to be and to how the resulting situations fulfill or fail to fulfill these possibilities” (Varela and others 1991, p. 205-206).
Talk of sense-making, despite the minimal operational definition provided above, is sometimes used interchangeably and synonymously with the notion that organisms make sense of their environments. This illocution is at the heart of Varela’s initial presentation of the view in Varela (1984), but others retain the language. Thompson (2007) tells us that “an autopoietic system always has to make sense of the world so as to remain viable” (p. 147-8). He also tells us, “Life is thus a self-affirming process that brings forth or enacts its own identity and makes sense of the world from the perspective of that identity.” (Thompson 2007, p. 153). Rolla and Huffermann (2021) describe enactivists as committed to the claim that “organisms make sense of their environments through autopoiesis and sensorimotor autonomy, thereby establishing meaningful environmental encounters” (p. 345).
Enactivists also regard sense-making as the basis for values and evaluations, as these, they claim, appear even in the simplest and most basic forms of life (see, for example, Rosch 2016). This claim connects with the enactivist assumption that all living things have intrinsic purposiveness and an immanent teleology (Thompson 2007, Di Paolo and others 2018, see also Gambarotto and Mossio 2022).
Certain things are adaptative or maladaptive for organisms, and, as such, through their active sense-making, they tend to be attracted to the former and repulsed by the latter (Thompson 2007, p. 154). Accordingly, it is claimed that organisms must evaluate whatever they encounter. For example, a sense-making system “… ‘evaluates’ the environmental situation as nutrient-rich or nutrient-poor” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 32). It is claimed that such evaluation is necessary given that the “organism’s ‘concern’… is to keep on going, to continue living” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 33). Moreover, it is held that the autonomous sense-making activity of organisms generates norms that “must somehow be accessible (situations must be accordingly discernible) by the organism itself.” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 32). So conceived, we are told that “sense-making… lies at the core of every form of action, perception, emotion, and cognition, since in no instance of these is the basic structure of concern or caring ever absent. This is constitutively what distinguishes mental life from other material and relational processes” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 33).
Those who have sought to develop the idea of sense-making also maintain that “cognition is behaviour in relation to meaning… that the system itself enacts or brings forth on the basis of its autonomy” (Thompson 2007, p. 126). In this regard, Cappuccio and Froese (2014) speak of an organism’s “active constitution of a meaningful ‘world-environment’ (Umwelt)” (p. 5).
Importantly, Thompson (2007) emphasizes that sense-making activity not only generates its own meaning but also simultaneously responds to it. He tells us that “meaning is generated within the system for the system itself —that is, it is generated and at the same time consumed by the system” (p. 148). This idea comes to the fore when he explicates his account of emotional responding, telling us that “an endogenously generated response… creates and carries the meaning of the stimulus for the animal. This meaning reflects the individual organism’s history, state of expectancy, and environmental context” (Thompson 2007, p. 368). Similarly, in advancing her own account of enactive emotions, Colombetti (2010) also speaks of organismic “meaning generating” activity and describes the non-neural body as a “vehicle of meaning” (2010, p. 146; p. 147).
Di Paolo and his co-authors defend similar views, holding that “the concept of sense-making describes how living organisms relate to their world in terms of meaning” (Di Paolo and others 2017, p. 7); and that an organism’s engagements with features of the environment “are appreciated as meaningful by the organism” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 32).
Enactivists who defend these views about sense-making are keen to note that the kind of ‘meaning’ that they assume is brought forth and consumed by organisms is not to be understood in terms of semantic content, nor does it entail the latter. As such, the kind of meaning that they hold organisms bring forth is not in any way connected to or dependent upon mental representations as standardly understood. We are told “if we wish to continue using the term representation, then we need to be aware of what sense this term can have for the enactive approach… “Autonomous systems do not operate on the basis of internal representations; they enact an environment” (Thompson 2007, p. 58 –59). Indeed, in moving away from cognitivist assumptions, a major ambition of this variety of enactivism is to establish that “behavior…expresses meaning-constitution rather than information processing” (Thompson 2007, p. 71).
In sum, a main aspiration of original enactivism is to bring notions such as sense-making to bear to demonstrate how key observations about biological autonomy can ground phenomenological aspects of mindedness such as “concernful affect, caring attitudes, and meaningful engagements that underscore embodied experience” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 42). The sense-making interpretation of biological autonomy is meant to justify attributing basic structures of caring, concern, meaning, sense, and value to living systems quite generally (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 22). Crucially and pivotally, it is claimed of the original version of enactivism that through its understanding of “precarious autonomy, adaptivity, and sense-making, the core aspect of mind is naturalized” (Di Paolo and others 2018, p. 33).
In pursuing its naturalizing ambition, the original version of enactivism faces a particular challenge. Simply put, the weaker —more austere and deflated —its account of sense-making, the more credible it will be for the purpose of explicating the natural origins of minds, but it will be less capable of accounting for all aspects of mindedness. Contrariwise, the stronger —more fulsome and inflated —its account of sense-making, the more capable it will be of accounting for all aspects of mindedness, but the less credible it will be for the purpose of explicating the natural origins of minds.
For example, in their original statement of enactivism, Varela and others (1991) speak of the most primitive organisms enacting domains of ‘significance’ and ‘relevance’. They add that this implies that ‘some kind of interpretation’ is going on. Yet, they are also careful to emphasize that they use their terms advisedly and are at pains to highlight that “this interpretation is a far cry from the kinds of interpretation that depend on experience” (p. 156). More recently, Stapleton (2022) maintains that:
The autopoietic enactivist is, of course, not committed to viewing the bacterium as experiencing the value that things in its environment have for it. Nor, to viewing the bacterium as purposefully regulating its coupling with the environment, where ‘purposeful’ is understood in the terms we normally use it—as implying some kind of reflection on a goal state and striving to achieve that goal state by behaving in a way in which one could have done otherwise (p. 168).
Even if it is accepted that all cognition lies along a continuum, anyone who acknowledges that there are significantly different varieties of cognition that have additional properties not exhibited by the most basic forms must face up to the ‘scaling up’ challenge. As Froese and Di Paolo (2009) ask, “Is it a question of merely adding more complexity, that is, of just having more of the same kind of organizations and mechanisms? Then why is it seemingly impossible to properly address the hallmarks of human cognition with only these basic biological principles?” (p. 441). In this regard, Froese and Di Paolo (2009) admit that even if the notion of sense-making is thought to be appropriate for characterizing the activity of the simplest living creatures, it still “cries out for further specification that can distinguish between different modes of sense-making” (p. 446).
With the scaling up challenge in sight, several enactivists have been working to explicate how certain, seemingly distinctive high-end human forms of sense-making relate to those of the most basic, primitive forms of life (Froese and Di Paolo 2009; De Jaegher and Froese 2009; Froese, Woodward and Ikegami 2013, Kee 2018). Working in this vein, Cuffari and others (2015) and Di Paolo and others (2018) have broken new ground by providing a sense-making account of human language in their efforts to dissolve the scaling-up problem and demonstrate the full scope and power of key ideas from the original version of enactivism.
At a first pass, what is sometimes called simply sensorimotor enactivism holds that perceiving and perceptual experience “isn’t something that happens in us, it is something we do” (Noë 2004, p. 216). Accordingly, perceiving and experiencing are “realized in the active life of the skillful animal” (Noë 2004, p. 227). Its main proponent, Alva Noë (2021), tells us:
The core claim of the enactive approach, as I understand it, and as this was developed in Noë, 2004, and also O’Regan and Noë, 2001… [is that] the presence of the world, in thought and experience, is not something that happens to us but rather something that we achieve or enact (p. 958).
This version of enactivism travels under various names in the literature, including the enactive approach (Noë 2004, 2009, 2012, 2016, 2021); sensorimotor theory (O’Regan and Noë 2001; Myin and O’Regan 2002; Myin and Noë 2005; O’Regan 2011); ‘the dynamic sensorimotor approach’ (Hurley and Noë 2003), which also drew on Hurley (1998); and ‘actionism’ (Noë 2012, 2016). In Noë (2021), the new label ‘sensorimotor knowledge enactivism’ was introduced to underscore the key importance of the idea that perceiving and perceptual experiences are grounded in a special kind of knowledge. Hence, a fuller and more precise explication of the core view of this version of enactivism is that experience of the world comes in the form of an understanding that is achieved through an active exploration of the world, which is mediated by practical knowledge of its relevant sensorimotor contingencies.
The emphasis on sensorimotor understanding and knowledge is what makes this version of enactivism distinctive. Sensorimotor knowledge enactivism holds that in order “to perceive, you must have sensory stimulation that you understand” (Noë 2004, p. 183; see also p. 180, p. 3). In explicating this view, Noë (2012) is thus at pains to highlight “the central role understanding, knowledge, and skill play in opening up the world for experience… the world is blank and flat until we understand it” (Noë 2012, p. 2). Later in the same book, he underscores this crucial point yet again, saying that:
According to the actionist (or enactive) direct realism that I am developing here, there is no perceptual experience of an object that is not dependent on the exercise by the perceiver of a special kind of knowledge. Perceptual awareness of objects, for actionist-direct realism, is an achievement of sensorimotor understanding. (Noë 2012, p. 65).
These claims also echo the original statement of the view, which tells us that “the central idea of our new approach is that vision is a mode of exploration of the world that is mediated by knowledge of what we call sensorimotor contingencies” (O’Regan and Noë 2001, p. 940, see also Noë 2004, p. 228).
Putting this together, Noë (2004) holds that “all perception is intrinsically thoughtful” (2004, p. 3). Accordingly, canonical forms of perceiving and thinking really just lie at different points along the same spectrum: “perception is… a kind of thoughtful exploration of the world, and thought is… a kind of extended perception” (Noë 2012, p. 104 –105). Sensorimotor knowledge enactivism thus asks us to think of the distinction between thought and perception as “a distinction among different styles of access to what there is… thought and experience are different styles of exploring and achieving, or trying to achieve, access to the world” (Noë 2012, p. 104 –105).
The view is motivated by the longstanding observation that we cannot achieve an accurate phenomenology of experience if we only focus on the raw stimulation and perturbation of sensory modalities. A range of considerations support this general position. A proper phenomenology of experience requires an account of what it is to grasp the perceptual presence of objects in the environment. But this cannot be accounted for solely by focusing on raw sensations. The visual experience of, say, seeing a tomato is an experience of a three-dimensional object that takes up space voluminously. This cannot be explained simply by appealing to what is passively ‘given’ to or supplied by the senses. For what is, strictly, provided to the visual system is only, at most, a partial, two-dimensional take of the tomato.
Empirical findings also reveal the need to distinguish between mere sensing and experiencing. It has been shown that it is possible to be sensorially stimulated in normal ways without this resulting in the experience of features or aspects of the surrounding environment in genuinely perceptual ways —in ways that allow subjects to competently engage with worldly offerings or to make genuinely perceptual reports. This is the situation, for example, for those first learning to manipulate sensory substitution devices (O’Regan and Nöe 2001, Nöe 2004, Roberts 2010)
There are longstanding philosophical and empirical reasons for thinking that something must be added to sensory stimulation to a yield full -blown experience of worldly offerings and to enable organisms to engage with them successfully. Something must be added to sensory stimulation to a yield full-blown experience of worldly offerings and enable organisms to engage with them successfully.
A familiar cognitivist answer is that the extra ingredient needed for perceiving comes in the form of inner images or mental representations. Sensorimotor knowledge enactivism rejects these proposals, denying that perceiving depends on mental representations, however rich and detailed. In this regard, sensorimotor knowledge enactivism also sets its face against the core assumption of the popular predictive processing accounts of cognition by holding that
the world does not show up for us “as it does because we project or interpret or confabulate or hypothesize… in something like the way a scientist might posit the existence of an unobserved force” (Noë 2012, p. 5).
Sensorimotor knowledge enactivism, by contrast, holds that perceptual experience proper is grounded in the possession and use of implicit, practical knowledge such that, when such knowledge is deployed properly, it constitutes understanding and allows organisms to make successful contact with the world.
Successfully perceiving the world and enjoying perceptual experiences of it are mediated and made possible by the possession and skillful deployment of a special kind of practical knowledge of sensorimotor contingencies, namely, knowledge of the ways in which stimulation of sense modalities changes, contingent upon aspects of the environment and the organism’s own activities.
Having the sensation of softness consists in being aware that one can exercise certain practical skills with respect to the sponge: one can, for example, press it, and it will yield under the pressure. The experience of the softness of the sponge is characterized by a variety of such possible patterns of interaction with the sponge, and the laws that describe these sensorimotor interactions we call, following MacKay (1962), the laws of sensorimotor contingency (O’Regan and Noë, 2001). (O’Regan and others, 2005, p. 56, emphasis added).
Knowledge of this special sort is meant to account for the expectations that perceivers have concerning how things will appear in the light of possible actions. It amounts to knowing how things will manifest themselves if the environment is perceptually explored in certain ways. At some level, so the theory claims, successful perceivers must have implicit mastery of relevant laws concerning sensorimotor contingencies.
Echoing ideas first set out in the original version of enactivism, sensorimotor knowledge enactivism holds that the phenomenal properties of experience —what-it-is-like properties —are not to be identified with extra ingredients over and above the dynamic, interactive responses of organisms. As such, its advocates hold that “we enact our perceptual experience: we act it out” (Noë 2004, p. 1). In line with the position advanced by other enactivists, Noë (2004) claims that:
Different animals inhabit different perceptual worlds even though they inhabit the same physical world. The sights, sounds, odors, and so on that are available to humans may be unavailable to some creatures, and likewise, there is much we ourselves cannot perceive. We lack the sensorimotor tuning and the understanding to encounter those qualities. The qualities themselves are not subjective in the sense of being sensations. We don’t bring them into existence. But only a very special kind of creature has the biologically capacity, as it were, to enact them (p. 156).
On their face, some of the statements Noë makes about phenomenal properties appear to be of a wholly realist bent. For example, he says, “There is a sense in which we move about in a sea of perspectival properties and are aware of them (usually without thought or notice) whenever we are perceptually conscious. Indeed, to be perceptually conscious is to be aware of them” (Noë 2004, p. 167). Yet, he also appears to endorse a middle way -position that recognizes that the world can be understood as a domain of perceptual activity just as much as it can be understood as a place consisting of or containing the properties and facts that interest us (Noë 2004, p. 167).
It is against that backdrop that Noë holds, “Colours are environmental phenomena, and colour experience depends not only on movement-dependent but also on object-dependent sensorimotor contingencies… colour experience is grounded in the complex tangle of our embodied existence” (Noë 2004, p. 158) In the end, sensorimotor knowledge enactivism offers the following answer to the problem of consciousness: “How the world shows up for us depends not only on our brains and nervous systems but also on our bodies, our skills, our environment, and the way we are placed in and at home in the world” (Noë 2012, pp. 132-3).
Ultimately, “perceptual experience presents the world as being this way or that; to have experience, therefore, one must be able to appreciate how the experience presents things as being” (Noë 2004, p. 180). This is not something that is automatically done for organisms; it is something that they sometimes achieve. Thus, “The world shows up for us thanks to what we can do… We make complicated adjustments to bring the world into focus … We achieve access to the world. We enact it by enabling it to show up for us.… If I don’t have the relevant skills of literacy, for example, the words written on the wall do not show up for me” (Noë 2012, p. 132 –133).
So understood, sensorimotor knowledge enactivism resists standard representational accounts of perception, holding that “perceivings are not about the world; they are episodes of contact with the world” (Noë 2012, p. 64). It sponsors a form of enactive realism according to which the content of perceiving only becomes properly perceptual content that represents how things are when the skillful use of knowledge makes successful contact with the world. There is no guarantee of achieving that outcome. Hence, many attempts at perceiving might be groping, provisional efforts in which we only gain access to how things appear to be and not how they are.
On this view, “perception is an activity of learning about the world by exploring it. In that sense, then, perception is mediated by appearance” (Noë 2004, p. 166). Achieving access to the world via knowledgeable, skillful exploration is to discover the relevant patterns that reveal “how things are from how they appear” (Noë 2012, p. 164). Thus, “hearing, like sight and touch, is a way of learning about the world… Auditory experience, like visual experience, can represent how things are” (Noë 2004, p. 160).
Accordingly, Noë (2004) holds that the perceptual content of experience has a dual character: it presents the world as being a certain way and presents how things are experienced, capturing how things look, or sound, or feel from the vantage point of the perceiver. It is because Noë assumes perceptual content has both of these aspects that he is able to defend the view that perceptual experience is a “way of encountering how things are by making contact with how they appear to be” (Noë 2004, p. 164).
The key equation for how this is possible, according to sensorimotor knowledge enactivism, is as follows: “How [things] (merely) appear to be plus sensorimotor knowledge gives you how things are” (Noë 2004, p. 164). Put otherwise, “for perceptual sensation to constitute experience —that is, for it to have genuine representational content —the perceiver must possess and make use of sensorimotor knowledge” (Noë 2004, p. 17).
Even though knowledge and understanding lie at the heart of sensorimotor knowledge enactivism, Noë (2012) stresses that “your consciousness of… the larger world around you is not an intellectual feat” (Noë 2012, p. 6). He proposes to explain how to square these ideas by offering a putatively de-intellectualized account of knowledge and understanding, advancing a “practical, active, tool-like conception of concepts and the understanding” (Noë 2012, p. 105).
Sensorimotor knowledge enactivism bills itself as rejecting standard representationalism about cognition while also maintaining that perceptual experiences make claims or demands on how things are (Noë 2021). Since, to this extent, sensorimotor knowledge enactivism retains this traditional notion of representational content, at its core, Noë (2021) has come to regard the ‘real task’ for defenders of this view as “to rethink what representation, content, and the other notions are or could be” (p. 961).
It remains to be seen if sensorimotor knowledge enactivism can explicate its peculiar notions of implicit, practical understanding, and representational content in sufficiently novel and deflated ways that can do all the philosophical work asked of them without collapsing into or otherwise relying on standard cognitivist conceptions of such notions. This is the longstanding major challenge faced by this version of enactivism (Block 2005, Hutto 2005).
Radical enactivism, also known as radical enactive cognition or REC, saw its debut in Hutto (2005) and was developed and supported in subsequent publications (Menary 2006, Hutto 2008, 2011a, 2011c, 2013a, 2013c, 2017, 2020, Hutto and Myin 2013, 2017, 2018a, 2018b, 2021). It was originally proposed as a critical adjustment to sensorimotor enactivists’ conservative tendencies, as set out in O’Regan and Noë (2001), tendencies which were deemed to be at odds with the professed anti-representationalism of the original version of enactivism. Radical enactivism proposes an account of enactive cognition that rejects characterizing or explaining the most basic forms of cognition in terms of mediating knowledge. This is because radical enactivists deem it unlikely that such notions can be non-vacuously explicated or accounted for naturalistically.
Importantly, radical enactivism never sought to advance a wholly original, new type or brand of enactivism. Instead, its goal was always to identify a minimal core set of tenable yet non-trivial enactivist theses and defend them through analysis and argument.
Much of the work of radical enactivists is subtractive —it adds by cutting away, operating on the assumption that often less is more. The adopted approach is explicated in greater detail in Evolving Enactivism, wherein several non-enactivist proposals about cognition are examined in an effort to assess whether they could be modified and allied with radical enactivism. This process, known as RECtification, is one “through which…. target accounts of cognition are radicalized by analysis and argument, rendering them compatible with a Radically Enactive account of Cognition” (Hutto and Myin 2017, p. xviii).
In advancing this cause, Hutto and Myin (2013) restrict radical enactivism’s ambitions to only promoting strong versions of what they call the Embodiment Thesis and the Developmental-Explanatory Thesis.
The Embodiment Thesis conceives of basic cognition in terms of concrete, spatio-temporally extended patterns of dynamic interaction between organisms and their environments. These interactions are assumed to take the form of individuals engaging with aspects of their environments across time, often in complex ways and on multiple scales. Radical enactivists maintain that these dynamic interactions are loopy, not linear. Such sensitive interactions are assumed, constitutively, to involve aspects of the non-neural bodies and environments of organisms. Hence, they hold that cognitive activity is not restricted to what goes on in the brain. In conceiving of cognition in terms of relevant kinds of world-involving organismic activity, radical enactivists characterize it as essentially extensive, not merely extended, in contrast to what Clark and Chalmers (1998) famously argued (see Hutto and Myin 2013; Hutto, Kirchhoff and Myin 2014).
The Developmental-Explanatory Thesis holds that mentality-constituting interactions are grounded in, shaped by, and explained by nothing more than the history of an organism’s previous interactions and features of its current environment. Sentience and sapience emerge, in the main, through repeated processes of organismic engagement with environmental offerings. An organism’s prolonged history of engaged encounters is the basis of its current embodied tendencies, know-how, and skills.
Radical enactivism differs from other versions of enactivism precisely in rejecting their more extravagant claims. It seeks to get by without the assumption that basic cognition involves mediating knowledge and understanding. Similarly, radical enactivism seeks to get by without assuming that basic cognition involves sense-making. It challenges the grounds for thinking that basic forms of cognition have the full array of psychological and phenomenological attributes associated with sense-making by other enactivists. Radical enactivists, for example, resist the idea that basic cognition involves organisms somehow creating, carrying, and consuming meanings.
Additionally, radical enactivists do not assume that intentionality and phenomenality are constitutively or inseparably linked. Its supporters do not endorse the connection principle according to which intentionality and phenomenal consciousness are taken to be intrinsically related (see Searle 1992, Ch. 7; compare Varela and others, 1991, p. 22). Instead, radical enactivists maintain that there can be instances of world-directed cognition that are lacking in phenomenality, even though, in the most common human cases, acts of world-directed cognition possess a distinctive phenomenal character (Hutto 2000, p. 70).
Most pivotally, radical enactivism thoroughly rejects positing representational contents at the level of basic mentality. One of its most signature claims, and one in which it agrees with original enactivism, is that basic forms of mental activity neither involve nor are best explained by the manipulation of contentful representations. Its special contribution has been to advance novel arguments designed to support the idea that organismic activity, conceived of as engaging with features of their environments in specifiable ways, suffices for the most basic kinds of cognition.
To encourage acceptance of this view, radical enactivists articulated the hard problem of content (Hutto 2013c, Hutto and Myin 2013, Hutto and Myin 2018a, 2018b). This hard problem, posed as a challenge to the whole field, rests on the observation that information understood only in terms of covariance does not constitute any kind of content. Hutto and Myin (2013) erect this observation into a principle and use it to reveal the hard choice dilemma that anyone seeking to give a naturalistic account of basic cognition must face. The first option is to rely only on the notion of information-as-covariance in securing the naturalistic credentials of explanatory resourcesthe cost of not having adequate resources to explain the natural origins of the content that basic forms of cognition are assumed to have. The second option is to presuppose an expanded or inflated notion of information, one which can adequately account for the content of basic forms of cognition, at the cost of having to surrender its naturalistic credentials. Either way, so the analysis goes, it is not possible to give a naturalized account of the content of basic forms of cognition.
Providing a straight solution to the hard problem of content requires “explaining how it is possible to get from non-semantic, non-contentful informational foundations to a theory of content using only the resources of a respectable explanatory naturalism” (Hutto 2018, pp. 24–5).
Hutto and Myin (2013) put existing naturalistic theories of content to the test, assessing their capacity to answer this challenge. As Salis (2022, p.1) describes this work, they offer “an ensemble of reasons” for thinking naturalistic accounts of content will fail.
Radical enactivism wears the moniker ‘radical’ due to its interest in getting to the root of issues concerning cognition and its conviction that not all versions of enactivism have been properly steadfast in their commitment to anti-content, anti-representational views about the character of basic mindedness. For example, when first explicating their conception of the aboutness or intentionality of cognition as embodied action, the original enactivists note that the mainstream assumption is that “in general, intentionality has two sides: first, intentionality includes how the system construes the world to be (specified in terms of the semantic content of intentional states); second, intentionality includes how the world satisfies or fails to satisfy this construal (specified in terms of the conditions of satisfaction of intentional states)” (Varela and others 1991, p. 205). That mainstream notion of intentionality, which is tied to a particular notion of content, is precisely the kind of intentionality that radical enactivism claims does not feature in basic cognition. In providing compelling arguments against the assumption that basic cognition is contentful in that sense, radical enactivism’s primary ambition is to strengthen enactivism by securely radicalizing it.
Several researchers have since argued the hard problem of content has already been solved, or, at least, that it can be answered in principle or otherwise avoided (Miłkowski 2015, Raleigh 2018, Lee 2019, Ramstead and others 2020, Buckner 2021, Piccinini 2022). Yet, see Hutto and Myin (2017, 2018a, 2018b) and Segundo-Ortin and Hutto (2021) for assessments of the potential moves.
On the positive side of the ledger, radical enactivists contend that the kind of mindedness found at the roots of cognition can be fruitfully characterized as a kind of Ur-intentionality. It is a kind of intentionality that lacks the sort of content associated with truth or accuracy conditions (Hutto and Myin 2013, 2017, 2018a, Zahnoun 2020, 2021b, 2021c). Moreover, radical enactivists hold that we can adequately account for Ur-intentionality, naturalistically, using biosemiotics – a modified teleosemantics inspired, in the main, by Millikan (1984) but stripped of its problematic semantic ambitions. This proposed adjustment of Millikan’s theory was originally advanced in Hutto (1999) in the guise of a modest biosemantics that sought to explain forms of intentionality with only nonconceptual content. That version of the position was abandoned and later radicalized to become a content-free biosemiotics (see Hutto 2006, 2008, Ch. 3). The pros and cons of the Ur-intentionality proposal continue to be debated in the literature (Abramova and Villalobos 2015, De Jesus 2016, 2018, Schlicht and Starzak 2019, Legg 2021, Paolucci 2021, Zipoli Caiani 2022, Mann and Pain 2022).
Importantly, radical enactivists only put biosemiotics to the theoretical use of explicating the properties of non-contentful forms of world-involving cognition. Relatedly, they hold that when engaged in acts of basic cognition, organisms are often sensitive to covariant environmental information, even though it is a mere metaphor to say organisms process it. Although organisms are sensitive to relevant indicative, informational relationships, “these relationships were not lying about ready-made to be pressed into service for their purposes” (Hutto 2008, p. 53 –54). When it comes to understanding biological cognition, the existence of the relevant correspondences is not explained by appeals to ahistorical natural laws but by various selectionist forces.
As Thompson (2011b) notes, if radical enactivism’s account of biosemiotics is to find common ground with original enactivism and its direct descendants, it would have to put aside strong adaptationist views of evolution. In fact, although radical enactivism does place great explanatory weight on natural selection, it agrees with original enactivism at least to the extent that it does not hold that biological traits are individually optimized —not selected for —in isolation from one another to make organisms maximally fit to deal with features of a neutral, pre-existing world.
Radical enactivists accept that content-involving cognition exists even though they hold that our basic ways of engaging with the world and others are contentless. In line with this position, they have sought to develop an account of The Natural Origins of Content, a project pursued in several publications by Hutto and Satne (2015, 2017a, 2017b) and Hutto and Myin (2017). In these works, the authors have proposed that capacities for contentful speech and thought emerge with the mastery of distinctive socio-cultural practices —specifically, varieties of discursive practices with their own special norms. These authors also hold that the mastery of such practices introduces kinks into the cognitive mix, such as the capacity for ratio-logical reasoning (see, for example, Rolla 2021). Nevertheless, defenders of radical enactivism maintain that these kinks do not constitute a gap or break in the natural or evolutionary order (see Myin and Van den Herik 2020 for a defense of this position and Moyal-Sharrock 2021b for its critique). Instead, radical enactivists argue that the content-involving practices that enable the development of distinctively kinky cognitive capacities can be best understood as a product of constructed environmental niches (Hutto and Kirchhoff 2015). Rolla and Huffermann (2021) propose that in fleshing out this account, radical enactivism could combine with Di Paolo and others (2018)’s new work on linguistic bodies to understand the cognitive basis of language mastery, characterizing it as a kind of norm-infused and acquired shared know-how.
In the opening pages of Sensorimotor Life, its authors describe their contribution to the enactive literature as that of adding a ‘tributary to the flow of ideas’ which found its first expression in Varela, Thompson and Rosch’s The Embodied Mind. Making use of that metaphor, they also astutely note the value of looking “upstream to discover ‘new’ predecessors,” namely precursors to enactivism that can only be identified in retrospect: those which might qualify as “enactivists avant la lettre” (Di Paolo and others 2017, p. 3).
Enactivism clearly has “roots that predate psychology in its modern academic form.”
(Baerveldt and Verheggen 2012, p. 165). For example, in challenging early modern Cartesian conceptions of the mind as a kind of mechanism, it reaches back to a more Aristotelian vision of the mind that emphasizes its biological basis and features shared with all living things. Baerveldt and Verheggen (2012) also see clear links between enactivism and “a particular ‘radical’ tradition in Western Enlightenment thinking that can be traced at least to Spinoza” (p. 165). Gallagher argues that Anaxagoras should be considered the first enactivist based on his claim that human hands are what make humans the most intelligent of animals.
In the domain of biological ecology, there are clear and explicit connections between enactivism and the work of the German biologist Jakob von Uexküll, who introduced the notion of Umwelt, that had great influence in cybernetics and robotics. Resonances with enactivism can also be found in the work of Helmuth Plessner, a German sociologist and philosopher who studied with Husserl and authored Levels of Organic Life and the Human.
Another philosopher, Hans Jonas, who studied with both Heidegger and Husserl, stands out in this regard. As Di Paolo and others (2017) note, “Varela read his work relatively late in his career and was impressed with the resonances with his own thinking” (p. 3). In a collection of his essays, The Phenomenon of Life, very much in the spirit of the original version of enactivism, Jonas defends the view that there exists a deep, existential continuity between life and mind.
Many key enactivist ideas have also been advanced by key figures in the American pragmatist tradition. As Gallagher (2017) observes, many of the ideas of Peirce, Dewey, and Mead can be considered forerunners of enactivism” (p. 5). Gallagher and Lindgren (2015) go a step further, maintaining that the pioneers of enactivism “could have easily drawn on the work of John Dewey and other pragmatists. Indeed, long before Varela and others (1991), Dewey (1896) clearly characterized what has become known as enactivism” (p. 392). See also Gallagher (2014), Gallagher and Miyahara (2012), and Barrett (2019).
In advocating the so-called actional turn, enactivists touch on recurrent themes of central importance in Wittgenstein’s later philosophy, in particular his emphasis on the importance of our animal nature, forms of life, and the fundamental importance of action for understanding mind, knowledge, and language use. Contemporary enactivists characterize the nature of minds and how they fundamentally relate to the world in ways that not only echo but, in many ways, fully concur with the later Wittgenstein’s trademark philosophical remarks on the same topics. Indeed, Moyal-Sharrock (2021a) goes so far as to say that “Wittgenstein is —and should be recognized to be —at the root of the important contemporary philosophical movement called enactivism” (p. 8). The connections between Wittgenstein and enactivism are set out by many other authors (Hutto 2013d, 2015c, Boncompagni 2013, Loughlin 2014, 2021a, 2021b, Heras-Escribano and others 2015. See also Loughlin 2021c, for a discussion of how some of Wittgenstein’s ideas might also challenge enactivist assumptions).
Enactivism bills itself as providing an antidote to accounts of cognition that “take representation as their central notion” (Varela and others 1991, p. 172). Most fundamentally, in proposing that minds, like all living systems, are distinguished from machines by their biological autonomy, it sees itself as opposed to and rejects computational theories and functionalist theories of mind, including extended functionalist theories of mind (Di Paolo and others 2017, Gallagher 2017). Enactivism thus looks to work in robotics in the tradition of Brooks (1991) and dynamical systems theory (Smith and Thelen 1994, Beer 1998, Juarrero 1999) for representation-free and model-free ways of characterising and potentially explaining extensive cognitive activity (Kirchhoff and Meyer 2019, Meyer 2020a, 2020b).
In a series of publications, Villalobos and coauthors offer a sustained critique of enactivism for its commitment to biological autonomy on the grounds that its conception of mind is not sufficiently naturalistic. These critics deem enactivism’s commitment to teleology as the most problematic and seek to develop, in its place, an account of biological cognition built on a more austere interpretation of autopoietic theory (Villalobos 2013, Villalobos and Ward 2015, Abramova and Villalobos 2015, Villalobos and Ward 2016, Villalobos and Silverman 2018, Villalobos 2020, Villalobos and Razeto-Barry 2020, Villalobos and Palacios 2021).
An important topic in this body of work, taken up by Villalobos and Dewhurst (2017), is the proposal that enactivism may be compatible, despite its resistance to the idea, with a computational approach to cognitive mechanisms. This possibility seems plausible to some given the articulation of conceptions of computation that allow for computation without representation (see, for example, Piccinini 2008, 2015, 2020). For a critical response to the suggestion that enactivism is or should want to be compatible with a representation-free computationalism, see Hutto and others (2019) and Hutto and others (2020).
Several authors see great potential in allying enactivism and ecological psychology, a tradition in psychology miniated by James Gibson which places responsiveness to affordances at its center (Gibson 1979). In recent times, this possibility has become more attractive with the articulation of radical embodied cognitive science (Chemero 2009), that seeks to connect Gibsonian ideas with dynamical systems theory, without invoking mental representations.
A joint ecological-enactive approach to cognition has been proposed in the form of the skilled intentionality framework (Rietveld and Kiverstein 2014, Bruineberg and Rietveld 2014, Kiverstein and Rietveld and 2015, 2018, Bruineberg and others 2016, Rietveld, Denys and Van Westen 2018, Bruineberg, Chemero and Rietveld 2019). It seeks to provide an integrated basis for understanding the situated and affective aspects of the embodied mind, emphasizing that organisms must always be sensitive to multiple affordances simultaneously in concrete situations.
The task of ironing out apparent disagreements between enactivsm and ecological psychology to forge a tenable alliance of these two traditions has also been actively pursued by others (see Heras-Escribano 2016, Stapleton 2016, Segundo-Ortin and others 2019, Heras-Escribano 2019, Crippen 2020, Heft 2020, Myin 2020, Ryan and Gallagher 2020, Segundo-Ortin 2020, McGann and others 2020, Heras-Escribano 2021, Jurgens 2021, Rolla and Novaes 2022).
A longstanding sticking point that has impeded a fully-fledged enactivist-ecological psychology alliance is the apparent tension between enactivism’s wholesale rejection of the notion that cognition involves information processing and the tendency of those in the ecological psychology tradition to talk of perception as involving the ‘pickup’ of information ‘about’ environmental affordances (see Varela and others 1991, p. 201-204; Hutto and Myin 2017, p. 86). See also Van Dijk and others (2015). The use of such language can make it appear as if the Gibsonian framework is committed to the view that perceiving is a matter of organisms attuning to the covariant structures of a pre-given world. Notably, Baggs and Chemero (2021) attempt to directly address this obstacle to uniting the two frameworks (see also de Carvalho and Rolla 2020).
There have been attempts to take enactivist ideas seriously by some versions of predictive processing theories of cognition. In several publications, Andy Clark (2013, 2015, 2016) has sought to develop a version of predictive processing accounts of cognition that is informed, to some extent, by the embodied, non-intellectualist, action-orientated vision of mind promoted by enactivists.
Yet most enactivist-friendly advocates of predictive processing accounts of cognition tend to baulk when it comes to giving up the idea that cognition is grounded in models and mental representations. Clark (2015) tells us that he can’t imagine how to get by without such constructs when he rhetorically asks himself, “Why not simply ditch the talk of inner models and internal representations and stay on the true path of enactivist virtue?” (Clark 2015, p. 4; see also Clark 2016, p. 293). Whether a tenable compromise is achievable or whether there is a way around this impasse is a recurring and now prominent theme in the literature on predictive processing (see, for example, Gärtner and Clowes 2017, Constant and others 2021, Venter 2021, Constant and others 2022, Gallagher and others 2022, Gallagher 2022b).
Several philosophers have argued that it is possible to develop entirely non-representationalist predictive processing accounts of cognition that could be fully compatible with enactivism (Bruineberg and Rietveld 2014; Bruineberg, Kiverstein, and Rietveld 2016; Bruineberg and others, 2018; Bruineberg and Rietveld 2019). This promised union comes in the form of what Venter (2021) has called free energy enactivism. The Free Energy Principle articulated by Friston (2010, 2011) maintains that what unites all self-organizing systems (including non-living systems) is that they work to minimize free energy. Many have sought to build similar bridges between enactivism and free energy theorizing (Kirchhoff 2015, Kirchhoff and Froese 2017, Kirchhoff and Robertson 2018, Kirchhoff 2018a, 2018b,
Kirchhoff and others 2018, Robertson and Kirchhoff 2019, Ramstead and others 2020a, Hesp and others 2019). However, Di Paolo, Thompson, and Beer (2022) identify what they take to be fundamental differences between the enactive approach and the free energy framework that appear to make such a union unlikely, if not impossible.
Enactivism’s novel framework for conceiving of minds and our place in nature has proved fertile and fecund. Enactivism serves as an attractive philosophical platform from which many researchers and practitioners are inspired to launch fresh investigations into a great variety of topics—investigations that have potentially deep and wide-ranging implications for theory and practice.
In the domain of philosophy of psychology, beyond breaking new ground in our thinking about the phenomenality and intentionality of perception and perceptual experience, enactivism has generated many fresh lines of research. Enactivists have contributed to new thinking about: the nature of habits and their intelligence (for example, Di Paolo and others 2017; Ramírez-Vizcaya and Froese 2019; Zarco and Egbert 2019; Hutto and Robertson 2020); emotions and, especially, the distinction in the affective sciences between basic and non-basic emotions ( for example, Colombetti and Thompson 2008; Hutto 2012; Colombetti 2014; Hutto, Robertson, and Kirchhoff 2018); pretense (Rucińska 2016, 2019; Weichold and Rucińska 2021, 2022); imagination (for example, Thompson 2007; Medina 2013; Hutto 2015a; Roelofs 2018; Facchin 2021); memory (for example, Hutto and Peeters 2018; Michaelian and Sant’Anna 2021); mathematical cognition (for example, Zahidi and Myin 2016; Gallagher 2017, 2019; Hutto 2019; Zahidi 2021); social cognition – and, in particular, advanced the proposal that the most basic forms of intersubjectivity take the form of direct, engaged interactions between agents, where this is variously understood in terms of unprincipled embodied engagements scaffolded by narrative practices (Hutto 2006, Gallagher and Hutto 2008 – see also Paolucci 2020, Hutto and Jurgens 2019), interaction theory (Gallagher 2005, 2017, 2020a), and participatory sense-making (De Jaegher and Di Paolo 2007; De Jaegher 2009).
In addition to stimulating new thinking about mind and cognition, enactive ideas have also influenced research on topics in many other domains, including: AI and technological development (Froese and Ziemke 2009; Froese and others 2012; Ihde and Malafouris 2019; Sato and McKinney 2022; Rolla and others 2022); art, music, and aesthetics (Noë 2015; Schiavio and De Jaegher 2017; Fingerhut 2018, Murphy 2019; Gallagher 2021; Høffding and Schiavio 2021); cognitive archaeology (Garofoli 2015, 2018, 2019; Garofoli and Iliopoulos 2018); cross-cultural philosophy (McKinney 2020, Janz 2022, Lai 2022); education and pedagogical design (Hutto and others 2015; Gallagher and Lindgren 2015; Abrahamson and others 2016; Hutto and Abrahamson 2022); epistemology (Vörös 2016; Venturinha 2016; Rolla 2018; De Jaegher 2021; Moyal-Sharrock 2021); ethics and values (Varela 1999a; Colombetti and Torrance 2009; Di Paolo and De Jeagher 2022); expertise and skilled performance (Hutto and Sánchez-García 2015; Miyahara and Segundo-Ortin 2022; Robertson and Hutto 2023); mental health, psychopathology, and psychiatry (Fuchs 2018; de Haan 2020; Jurgens and others 2020; Maiese 2022b, 2022c, 2022d); rationality (Rolla 2021).
There can be no doubt that enactivism is making waves in today’s philosophy, cognitive science, and beyond the boundaries of the academy. Although only newly born, enactivism has established itself as a force to be reckoned with in our thinking about mind, cognition, the world around us, and many other related topics. What remains to be seen is whether, and to what extent, different versions of enactivism will continue to develop productively, whether they will unite or diverge, whether they will find new partners, and, most crucially, whether enactivist ideas will continue to be actively taken up and widely influential. For now, this much is certain: The enactivist game is very much afoot.
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Daniel D. Hutto
University of Wollongong