The American Environmental Justice Movement

The origin of the American environmental justice movement can be traced back to the emergence of the American Civil Rights movement of the 1960s, and more specifically to the U.S. Civil Rights Act of 1964.  The movement reached a new level with the emergence of Robert Bullard’s work entitled Dumping in Dixie in the 1990’s, which constituted a clarion call for environmental justice. Although environmentalism and the environmental justice movement are related, there is a difference.  Environmentalism is concerned with humanity’s adverse impact upon the environment, but proponents are primarily concerned with the impact of an unhealthy environment thrust upon a collective body of life, entailing both human and non-human existence, including in some instances plant life.  The efforts of the environmental justice movement differ from those of the environmentalist movement in that, at the heart of environmental injustice, there are issues of racism and socio-economic injustice.  Although environmentalism focuses upon and acknowledges the negative impact of humanity’s actions upon the environment, the environmental justice movement builds upon the philosophy and work of environmentalism by stressing the manner in which adversely impacting the environment in turn adversely impacts the population of that environment.

Table of Contents

  1. The Definition of Environmental Justice
  2. History of the Environmental Justice Movement
  3. Environmental Racism and Environmental Justice
  4. Principles of the Environmental Justice Movement
  5. Causes of Environmental Injustice
  6. Major Events in the Environmental Justice Movement
  7. Environmental Justice Policy and Law
  8. References and Further Reading
    1. Books
    2. Journals
    3. Governmental and Legal Publications

1. The Definition of Environmental Justice

Although the origin of the environmental justice movement is traced to the passing of the Civil Rights Act of 1964, Robert Bullard’s work entitled Dumping in Dixie published in the 1990’s is considered to be the first book addressing the reality of environmental injustice.  The work examines the widening economic, health and environmental disparities between racial groups and socioeconomic groups at the end of the twentieth and the beginning of the twenty-first centuries.  Bullard states that in writing the book he operated with the assumption that all Americans have a basic right to live, work, play, go to school and worship in a clean and healthy environment (DD, xii).  Bullard’s analysis in Dumping in Dixie “chronicles the emergence of the environmental justice movement in an effort to develop common strategies that are supportive of building sustainable African American communities and other people of color communities.”  (DD, xiii).

Bullard’s wife, a practicing attorney, suggested that he study the spatial location of all the municipal solid-waste disposal facilities in Houston, Texas. This was done as part of a class-action lawsuit filed by Bullard’s wife against the city of Houston, the State of Texas, and Browning Ferris Industries.  The lawsuit originated from a plan to site a municipal landfill in a suburban, middle-income neighborhood of single-family homeowners. The lawsuit became known as Bearn v. Southwestern Waste Management and was the first lawsuit in the United States charging environmental discrimination in waste facility location under the Civil Rights Act. The Northwood Manor neighborhood consisted of over 82 percent African American residents (DD, xii).

The emergence of the environmental justice movement is directly linked to the environmental movement.  Some contend that environmentalism and the environmental justice movement are so interrelated that the movement has essentially redefined the nature of environmentalism. According to Bullard, an environmental revolution is taking shape in the United States which “has touched communities of color from New York to California and from Florida to Alaska” and any location “where African Americans, Latinos, Asians, Pacific Islanders, and Native Americans live and comprise a major portion of the population” (CER, 7).  The influence of the environmental justice movement has broadened the spectrum of environmentalism to include what might be regarded as the trivialities of life, according to Bullard. This includes activities such as play and attending school. It also has implications for something as simple as where humans, animals and plants reside. Bullard points out that the environmental justice movement in the United States focuses upon a diversity of areas including wilderness and wildlife preservation, resource conservation, pollution abatement and population control (DD, 1). The environmental justice movement served to interrelate the physical, social, and cultural dimensions of human, non-human and plant existence under the rubric of environmentalism in general and environmental justice in particular.   (Bullard, 1999) The environmental justice movement has indirectly heightened concern not only for human existence, but also for animals and plant life.  The reality is that no single definition of environmental justice exists. However, a significant legal definition used by the Environmental Protection Agency describes environmental justice as:

[T]he fair treatment and meaningful involvement of all people regardless of race, ethnicity, income, national origin, or educational level with respect to the development, implementation and enforcement of environmental laws, regulations and policies. Fair treatment means that no population, due to policy or economic disempowerment, is forced to bear a disproportionate burden of the negative human health or environmental impacts of pollution or other environmental consequences resulting from industrial, municipal, and commercial operations or the execution of federal, state, local, and tribal programs and policies (EPA, 2).

The environmental justice movement is concerned with the pursuit of social justice and the preamble to the Principles of environmental justice adopted at the First National People of Color Environmental Leadership Summit in Washington D.C., 1991 reflects the primacy of this concern.  According to the environmental justice movement, all Americans, regardless of whether they are white or black, rich or poor, are entitled to equal protection under the law.  The  environmental justice advocates for quality education, employment, and housing, as well as the health of physical environments in which individuals, families and groups live (DD, 7).

While the environmental justice movement is rooted in significant philosophical/sociological underpinnings, the movement strives to be intensely practical. Few environmentalists realize the sociologic implications of what has been termed the “not-in-my-backyard” phenomenon which entails the recognition of the reality that hazardous waste, garbage dumps and polluting industries will inevitably be located in someone’s backyard.  The question then emerges as to whose and which backyards these toxic entities will be located? Bullard concluded based upon sociological analysis that these entities frequently end up in poor, powerless, black communities rather than affluent suburbs and he adds that this has been the case repeatedly (DD, 4).

It is important to note that the movement is critical of Western theories of jurisprudence and philosophy, which are founded upon Kantian, Cartesian and Lockean assumptions. For instance, Kantian jurisprudence is committed to the idea of the universality of rules in addressing a wide range of moral issues, whereas Cartesian dualism devalues the significance of physical existence and threats to that existence, and the philosophical conclusions of John Locke preserves individualism at the expense of the collective group. The environmental justice movement rejects each of these, concluding that no universal law or rule can be applied in a diversity of moral contexts, that the physical existence of a collective body is to be aggressively protected, and, finally, that no one individual or particular group is to be victimized for the benefit of another.  In short, such theories do not “embrace the whole community of life as the relevant moral community” (Rasmussen, 12).  Not only do these traditional philosophical underpinnings of the Western worldview fail to include members of the total human community, these approaches also fail to acknowledge the significance of life in the non-human sphere.

It is also important to note that environmental justice advocates reject the Rawlsian understanding of justice as “fairness”.  In acknowledging the reality of social, economic and moral inequity, Rawls argued that these inequities must be based upon the condition of benefit to the least advantaged. In the philosophy of the environmental justice movement, however, to adopt Rawls’ definition of justice and to tolerate the existence of actual instances of inequities and injustice based upon benefit to the collective victims reflects a perpetuation of centuries of oppression, which have become part and parcel of inadequate and distorted forms of institutional decision-making (Deane Drummond, 10). Furthermore, for environmental justice proponents, “justice is justice as distribution, recognition, and participation, linked in ways that address the wellbeing of the whole community of life in a given locale” (Rasmussen, 17).

Part of the uniqueness of the environmental justice movement is the focus on injustice as a collective experience.  Consequently, those in the movement strive for the actual pursuit, promotion, and establishment of better living conditions in the midst of collective entities, both human and non-human.  As such, at its very core the environmental justice movement is transformational and strives to empower collective victims of environmental injustice with the capacity for self-provision, self-organization, and self-governance (Rasmussen, 17).

In addition and as previously indicated, there is an important distinction to be made between environmentalism and the environmental justice movement.  While environmentalism is concerned with environmental injustice and the pursuit of justice, it is primarily concerned with the abuse of the environment by a hierarchical model which places humanity at the top with the result being the abuse of nature.  On the other hand, environmental justice advocates are more concerned with what is termed “social ecology” or “human welfare ecology.” Their primary concern is the impact of institutional systemic flaws which are the natural result of a progression of historical events resulting in decisions which establish unjust living conditions upon one group of people due to a lack of organization, power and prominence. At the risk of oversimplification, whereas environmentalism is concerned with humanity’s adverse impact upon the environment, environmental justice proponents are primarily concerned with the impact of an unhealthy environment thrust upon a collective body of life, both human and non-human, including in some instances plant life. The efforts of the environmental justice movement go beyond those of the environmentalism movement.

Environmental justice advocates contend that instances of environmental injustice are not simply arbitrary realities which occur in varying contexts.  Rather, instances of environmental injustice are the outcome of an institutional oppression and isolation which have set up an inevitable framework of the powerful oppressing the powerless. The victims, through a significant occurrence of historical and social realities, have been cut off from the power required even to challenge the causes of environmental injustice.  In a very real sense, the environmental justice movement represents another dimension of social liberation, which attempts to protect victims from institutional and systemic oppression. However, the task of the environmental justice movement should not be understood only in terms of the negative.  The central and positive question of the environmental justice movement is, “What constitutes healthy, livable, sustainable, and viable communities in the place we live, work, and play as the outcome of interrelated natural, built, social, and cultural/spiritual environments?” (Lee, 141-44).

The environmental justice movement also understands environmental injustice as part of a history of oppression and contends that profound historical realities predating the contemporary context of human existence in the Western world lie at the root of environmental injustice.  Advocates of environmental justice contend that the lack of power on the part of the victims of environmental injustice have a direct relationship of continuity with events emerging from the recent civil rights issues, to the civil war, and even trace the root cause of the systemic lack of power by certain groups to the impact of European-based realities which continue to shape the modern context of environmental injustice.  Environmental justice proponents focus upon what is termed “the four interlocking C’s” which have led to the exploitation of particular groups of people.  These “C’s” are conquest, colonization, commerce, and Christian implantation.

The call for environmental justice focuses on both environmental and ecological economics, which are reflected respectively in the work of environmental economics advocates such as Herman Daly, John Kenneth Galbraith and Nicholas Georgescu-Roegen, and ecological economics advocates such as Rebecca Pates and John Hagan.  While the environmental justice movement is primarily concerned with issues related to the United States, any consideration of the movement must acknowledge the contributions of these individuals and others and their work regarding global considerations since many of the issues with which the environmental justice movement is concerned are also contained within movements outside the United States dialogue and debate.

2. History of the Environmental Justice Movement

The environmental justice movement originated with the passing of the Civil Rights Act of 1964 and of Title VI, which prohibited the use of federal funds to discriminate on the basis of race, color and national origin.  The movement is also related to the work of Dr. Martin Luther King in the late 1960’s and his efforts on behalf of black sanitation workers in the city of Memphis, Tennessee.  In 1969, Ralph Abascal of the California Rural Legal Assistance filed a suit on behalf of six migrant farm workers, which resulted in the banning of the pesticide DDT. In addition, Congress passed the National Environmental Policy Act (NEPA) that same year.  In 1971, the President’s Council on Environmental Quality (CEQ) acknowledged racial discrimination which adversely affected urban poor and the quality of their environment.  In 1978, the Houston Northwood Manor subdivision residents protested the Whispering Pines Sanitary Landfill and in 1979 Linda McKeever Bullard filed a lawsuit on behalf of Houston’s Northeast Community Action Group. This lawsuit, titled Bean v. Southwestern Waste Management Inc, constituted the first civil rights suit challenging the siting of a waste facility.  The United Church of Christ Commission for Racial Justice issued the “Toxic Waste and Race in the United States” report in 1987.  The report was the first national study exposing the relationship between waste facility location and race.  The Clean Air Act was passed in 1990 and Bullard’s book Dumping in Dixie was published in the same year.  This particular work constituted the first textbook on environmental justice.  The first National People of Color Environmental Leadership Summit was held in Washington in 1991.  In 1994, The Environmental Justice Resource Center was formed at Clark Atlanta University in Atlanta, Georgia.  In addition, during the same year the Washington Office on Environmental Justice (WOEJ) opened in Washington D.C.  The United States environmental justice movement progressed onto the global stage in 1995 when environmental justice delegates participated in the 4th World Conference on Women in Beijing.

The environmental justice movement has existed for more than two decades, reaching an apex in the 1990’s. The movement emerged from an increased awareness of the disproportionately high impacts of environmental pollution on economically and politically disadvantaged communities. It addresses issues such as social, economic and political marginalization of minorities and low income populations, and is also concerned with the perceived increase of pollution not only in neighborhoods and communities, but also in the workplace.

There is no specific founding point for the environmental justice movement, but it was largely created through the fusion of two other movements — the economic analysis of the anti-toxics movement and the racial critique of the Civil Rights movement — and the over-arching perspective of a third — faith. Other strong contributions have come from  academia, from Native Americans, and the labor. (Timeline)

African Americans did not significantly challenge the environmental problems adversely affecting their communities prior to the call for environmental justice.  The shift from denial to acknowledgment and action emerged during the 1980’s.  Until that time African American resistance was largely limited to concern with local issues and generally was concerned with the individualistic nature of the African American struggle for equality.  However, in the 1980’s a transition took place which would give rise to the environmental justice movement as an extension of the Civil Rights movement.  This shift took place under the designation of “environmental activism” (DD, 29).

The environmental justice movement is credited with having begun in Warren County, North Carolina. In this locale residents demonstrated against a landfill which would be placed in their county. The reaction of the citizens concerning the issue reflected the merging of civil rights activists and environmentalists. Representatives from these two groups are alleged to have laid down in front of trucks transferring large amounts of PCB-contaminated soil into the largely African American populated area of Warren County. While the Warren County demonstrations were unsuccessful, they did achieve the result of bringing a renewed focus to the issue of the disproportionately high impact of environmental pollution upon minority communities such as Warren County. Ultimately, this event also placed environmental justice concerns onto the political agenda.

In 1992, a National Law Journal report alleged that the Environmental Protection Agency (EPA) had discriminated in its enforcement of environmental protection law thereby supporting the observations of those among whom the movement originally emerged.  The report indicated that federal fines were more lax for industries operating in communities of color. In addition, the report also contended that the cleanup of environmental disasters in communities of color were much slower than those carried out in the context of wealthier white communities.  Furthermore, the report indicated that standards for clean up in communities of color were not as well established or rigid as those applied in white communities.

3. Environmental Racism and Environmental Justice

Environmental justice advocates argue that an intimate relationship exists between the trilogy of environmental racism, environmental discrimination, and environmental policymaking.  Environmental injustice and environmental racism have their roots in a politico-institutional context bent toward discrimination.  Municipal, state, and federal regulations are, therefore, aimed at permitting, condoning and even promoting environmental racism.

In addition, environmental justice proponents contend that governmental policy is also bent toward the deliberate targeting of communities of color for toxic waste disposal and also the establishing of polluting industries in those communities. Further, policy and legislation not only permit but also endorse the official sanctioning of life-threatening poisons and pollutants being located in communities of color. Environmental justice advocates also contend that residents of victimized people groups are ostracized from access to political power and consequently have been excluded from service on decision-making boards and regulatory bodies, thereby subtly yet deliberately promoting environmental injustice and environmental racism.  Each of these elements contributes to the existence and propagation of environmental injustice and environmental racism (CER, 3).

Environmental justice proponents contend, “Experiences of environmental racism and injustice are not random, nor are they individual.” Consequently, the environmental justice movement is concerned with these two matters, collectivism and perceived intentionality.  On the one hand, environmental justice advocates concern themselves with environmental injustice as it happens to groups; and on the other hand, environmental justice advocates are also concerned with the systemic causes of environmental injustice (Rasmussen, 3-4).

Robert Bullard states that race is a major factor in predicting the placement of Locally Unwanted Land Uses (LULUs). Some would contend that socio-economic class is the central issue, however. Bullard counters that while race and class are combined factors, race is still the predominant factor. Environmental justice activists pronounce that race dominates policy decisions made by those in positions of power since the power arrangements of socio-economic institutions are out of balance.

Bullard also advances that environmental justice is not a social program, nor is it an affirmative action program and also that ultimately the central concern of the movement is the implementation of justice.  In addition, Bullard maintains that the consideration of race in the environmental justice movement, while constituting a portion of the problematic equation associated with environmental injustice is not the only concern of the movement.

We are just as much concerned with inequities in Appalachia, for example, where the whites are basically dumped on because of lack of economic and political clout and lack of having a voice to say ‘no’ and that’s environmental injustice.  We are trying to work with folks across the political spectrums; democrats, republicans, independents, on the reservations, in the barrios, in the ghettos, on the border and internationally to se what we address these issues in a comprehensive manner. (Interview)

However, in his earlier work entitled Confronting Environmental Racism: Voices from the Grassroots, Bullard does give voice to his belief that the problem of environmental injustice is to a large extent a racially oriented problem and that this is a problem which communities of color face.  He couches his discussion concerning environmental justice in the context of the recognition that at the heart of the problem of environmental injustice is a racially divided nation in which extreme racial inequalities persist.  However, by the time of Bullard’s more major work entitled Dumping in Dixie, he had acknowledged that the reality of environmental injustice transcends the issue of the victimization of any one race or ethnic group (CER, 7).

4. Principles of the Environmental Justice Movement

The result of the 1992 National Law Journal report concluded that the EPA had discriminated in its enforcement of Environmental Protection Law Report, which was intended to remedy the reality of environmental racism in the United States. Consequently, in 1991 at the First National People of Color Leadership Summit meeting in Washington D.C., the Principles of Environmental Justice were adopted.  These principles represent an initial rallying cry on behalf of those inhabitants, human and non-human, who are the victims of environmental injustice, and eventually established a context for a guide to action regarding governmental legislation.  Those principles are:

  1. Environmental justice affirms the sacredness of Mother Earth, ecological unity and the interdependence of all species, and the right to be free from ecological destruction.
  2. Environmental justice demands that public policy be based on mutual respect and justice for all peoples, free from any form of discrimination or bias.
  3. Environmental justice mandates the right to ethical, balanced and responsible uses of land and renewable resources in the interest of a sustainable planet for humans and other living things.
  4. Environmental justice calls for universal protection from nuclear testing, extraction, production and disposal of toxic/hazardous wastes and poisons and nuclear testing that threaten the fundamental right to clean air, land, water, and food.
  5. Environmental justice affirms the fundamental right to political, economic, cultural and environmental self-determination of all peoples.
  6. Environmental justice demands the cessation of the production of all toxins, hazardous wastes, and radioactive materials, and that all past and current producers be held strictly accountable to the people for detoxification and the containment at the point of production.
  7. Environmental justice demands the right to participate as equal partners at every level of decision-making including needs assessment, planning, implementation, enforcement and evaluation.
  8. Environmental justice affirms the right of all workers to a safe and healthy work environment, without being forced to choose between an unsafe livelihood and unemployment. It also affirms the right of those who work at home to be free from environmental hazards.
  9. Environmental justice protects the right of victims of environmental injustice to receive full compensation and reparations for damages as well as quality health care.
  10. Environmental justice considers governmental acts of environmental injustice a violation of international law, the Universal Declaration on Human Rights, and the United Nations Convention on Genocide.
  11. Environmental justice must recognize a special legal and natural relationship of Native Peoples to the U.S. government through treaties, agreements, compacts, and covenants affirming sovereignty and self-determination.
  12. Environmental justice affirms the need for urban and rural ecological policies to clean up and rebuild our cities and rural areas in balance with nature, honoring the cultural integrity of all our communities, and providing fair access for all to the full range of resources.
  13. Environmental justice calls for the strict enforcement of principles of informed consent, and a halt to the testing of experimental reproductive and medical procedures and vaccinations on people of color.
  14. Environmental justice opposes the destructive operations of multi-national corporations.
  15. Environmental justice opposes military occupation, repression and exploitation of lands, peoples and cultures, and other life forms.
  16. Environmental justice calls for the education of present and future generations, which emphasizes social and environmental issues, based on our experience and an appreciation of our diverse cultural perspectives.
  17. Environmental justice requires that we, as individuals, make personal and consumer choices to consume as little of Mother Earth’s resources and to produce as little waste as possible; and make the conscious decision to challenge and reprioritize our lifestyles to insure the health of the natural world for present and future generations (ejnet).

The First National People of Color Leadership Summit brought together hundreds of environmental justice activists representing both the national as well as the global stage.  The objective of the conference was to advocate for local and regional environmental justice activism in the form of both regional and ethnic networks. The Summit led to the creation of the Asian Pacific Environmental Network, the Northeast Environmental Justice Network, the Southern Organizing Committee for Economic and Environmental Justice and the Midwest/Great Lakes Environmental Justice Network. In 1993 Max Baucus, Democrat from Montana introduced the Environmental Justice Act of 1993 that addressed assertions that poor and minority areas are disproportionately affected by environmental pollution.  Representative John Lewis, Democrat from Georgia introduced a similar bill in the House of Representatives.

5. Causes of Environmental Injustice

Environmental injustice is said to exist when members of disadvantaged ethnic minority or other groups suffer disproportionately at the local, regional (subnational), or national levels from environmental risks or hazards or from violations of fundamental human rights as a result of environmental factors.  In addition, environmental injustice has occurred when an individual or group of individuals is denied access to environmental investments, benefits, and natural resources.  Furthermore, environmental injustice has taken place when individuals or collective groups are denied access to information, and/or participation in decision-making, as well as access to justice in environment-related matters. The study of environmental injustice has the responsibilities of examining the hierarchies of power that are inherent in any given socio-cultural context and the manner in which those hierarchies not only tolerate but also propagate environmental injustice against any number of disadvantaged people groups (EIPS, 2).

One cause of environmental injustice is institutionalized racism.  Institutionalized racism is defined as the practical reality of deliberately and intentionally targeting neighborhoods and communities comprised of a majority of people of low socio-economic status and of a collective group of individuals of color and is considered to be the natural outgrowth of racism. According to environmental justice proponents, this racism has become acculturated and engrained in contemporary social institutions, not the least of which is a governmental bureaucracy on the municipal, state, and federal levels which not only permits but reinforces the imposition of environmental injustice upon these groups.  Bunyan Bryant defines environmental racism as “the systematic exclusion of people of color from environmental decisions affecting their communities” (Bryant, 5 and Rasmussen, 8).

Another factor leading to the reality of environmental injustice is the commoditization of land, water, energy and air. This has resulted in their being secured and protected for the benefit of those in power over those who lack power.  Advocates of environmental justice remind that regardless of our status in life, we all exist collectively within the context of this biosphere.  Therefore “we breathe the same air, share the same atmosphere with the same ozone layer and climate patterns, eat food from the same soils and seas, and harvest the same acid rain” (Rasmussen, 8).

In addition, the unresponsive and unaccountable governmental policies and regulations which exist at all levels of government contribute to environmental racism and environmental injustice. Government authorities are frequently unresponsive to community needs regarding environmental inequities due to the existence of an oppressive power structure.  Furthermore, governmental availability to powerful corporations who exert power as an act of self-interest also poses problems.  Consequently, the victims of environmental injustice find it difficult if not impossible to use governmental resources and power to advance their cause (Rasmussen, 8).

Moreover, the lack of resources and power in affected communities is a major contributor to the presence of environmental racism.  In addition to the previous obstacles is the common denominator of powerlessness on the part of the victimized on the basis of few financial resources to invest in the struggle for environmental justice and also the lack of power by the victims of environmental injustice.  Specifically, the groups adversely affected by environmental inequities lack the capacity to function as an organized block representing their interests against those in the contest of authority and affluence (Rasmussen, 8).

Finally, a piecemeal approach to regulation which allows loopholes and the consequent ongoing victimization of low-income populations of color contributes to the reality of environmental racism.  The ongoing process of governmental regulation also poses a problem in combating environmental injustice and the implementation of environmental justice.  The consequent gaps between pieces of legislation which are passed in an effort to combat environmental injustice frequently provide a context for the skirting the intent of this legislation (Rasmussen, 8).

6. Major Events in the Environmental Justice Movement

A major event contributing to the development of the environmental movement in the United States was the National Environmental Policy Act of 1969 (NEPA).  The Act established a foundation for United States environmental policy and required that “any major federal action significantly affecting the quality of the human environment” requires evaluation and public disclosure of potential environmental impact through the required Environmental Impact Statement (EIS).  The EIS required by NEPA applies broadly to such categories as highways and other forms of transit projects and programs, natural resource leasing and extraction, industrial farming and policies governing genetically modified crops, as well as large scale urban development projects (NEPA 1969).  NEPA was signed into law on January 1, 1970. The Act establishes national environmental policy and goals for the protection, maintenance, and enhancement of the environment and it provides a process for implementing these goals within the federal agencies.

NEPA also established the Council on Environmental Quality (CEQ).  In its 1971 annual report, CEQ noted that populations of low-income people of color were disproportionately exposed to significant environmental hazards. This recognition constitutes the earliest governmental report acknowledging the existence of what may be termed environmental inequality in the United States.  In 1983 Robert Bullard published his groundbreaking case study of waste disposal practices in Houston, Texas entitled “Solid Waste Sites and the Black Houston Community.” The case study resulted in the publication of Bullard’s Dumping in Dixie: Race, Class, and Environmental Quality in1990. Bullard’s original study discovered that waste sites were not scattered on a random basis throughout the city of Houston, but that they were more likely to be located in African American neighborhoods and even more shockingly near schools.  Bullard’s work was the first actual study to examine the causes of environmental racism.  Bullard discovered a multiplicity of factors which led to the environmental inequality including housing discrimination, lack of zoning and racially and socio-economically insensitive decisions made by public officials over a period of fifty years.

In 1983, further documenting the realities of environmental discrimination, a congressionally authorized U.S. General Accounting Office study uncovered that three out of four off-site, commercial hazardous waste landfills in the southeastern United States were located within predominately African American communities. This was the reality despite the fact that African Americans made up only one-fifth of the region’s population. In 1990, sociologist Robert Bullard published his influential work entitled Dumping in Dixie.His was the first major study of environmental racism linking hazardous facility locations with historical patterns of segregation in the South. In addition, Bullard’s study was one of the first to explore the social and psychological impacts of environmental racism on local populations, as well as acknowledging the emerging environmental justice movement as a response from the communities against these increasingly documented environmental threats.

On February 11, 1994, President Bill Clinton signed Executive Order 12898, Federal Actions to Address Environmental Justice in Minority Populations and Low-Income Populations, to focus federal attention on the environmental and human health conditions of minority and low-income populations with the goal of achieving environmental protection for all communities. The Order directed federal agencies to develop environmental justice strategies to help federal agencies address disproportionately high and adverse human health or environmental effects of their programs on minority and low-income populations. The order is also intended to promote nondiscrimination in federal programs that affect human health and the environment. It aims to provide minority and low-income communities with access to public information and public participation in matters relating to human health and the environment. The Presidential Memorandum accompanying the Order underscores certain provisions of existing law that can help ensure that all communities and persons across the nation live in a safe and healthy environment. Also in 1994, The Environmental Protection Agency renamed the Office of Environmental Equity as the Office of Environmental Justice. The Environmental Justice Act of 1999 introduced into the U.S. Legislature was also a sign of significant progress. In 2003 the EPA established the environmental justice bibliographic database.

7. Environmental Justice Policy and Law

The environmental justice movement credits its momentum and effectiveness to the U.S. Constitution and three significant pieces of legislation: Title VI 601; 602; and 42 U.S.C. 1983.

The Fourteenth Amendment and Equal Protection

Prior to the establishing of terms such as “environmental justice” or environmental racism”, residents living in minority communities who believed they were the victims of unfair environmental policy brought fourteenth amendment actions before local municipalities seeking fair treatment. In Dowdell v. City of Apopka, 1983, discrimination in street paving, water distribution, and storm draining services was established. In United Farm Workers of Florida v. City of Delray Beach, 1974 it was established that there were violations of farm workers’ civil rights by city officials. In Johnson v. City of Arcadia, 1978 the court found discrimination in access to paved streets, parks, and the water supply.  The Supreme Court’s decision in Washington v. Davis, 1976 announced the rule that impermissible discrimination under the Fourteenth Amendment requires a showing of intent, not simply of disparate impact.  In Village of Arlington Heights v. Metropolitan Housing Development Co., 1977 the Court established a set of factors to determine whether invidious discrimination underlies an otherwise legitimate exercise of government authority.

Title VI, Civil Rights Act 601, 602, and 42 U.S.C. 198

Title VI, Civil Rights Act 601 states, “no person in the United States shall on the grounds of race, color or national origin be excluded from participation in, be denied the benefits of, or be subjected to discrimination under any program or activity receiving federal financial assistance.” (U.S.C. 1994) Title VI, Civil rights Act 602 requires “agencies that disperse federal funds to promulgate regulations implementing Title VI Civil rights Act and to create an enforcement framework that details the manner in which discrimination claims will be processed” (Shanahan, 403-406).

In addition to the two foregoing Acts, environmental justice advocates also use 42 U.S.C. 1983 in order to establish that the effect of the agencies’ decision will have a negative impact on the community.  42 U.S.C. 1983 states:

Every person who, under color of any statute, ordinance, regulation, custom, or usage, of any State or Territory or the District of Columbia, subjects, or causes to be subjected, any citizen of the United States or other person within the jurisdiction thereof to the deprivation of any rights, privileges, or immunities secured by the Constitution and laws, shall be liable to the party injured in an action at law (U.S.C. 1983).

These pieces of legislation were beneficial to the environmental justice movement until 2001 when the Supreme Court, in Alexander v. Sandoval held that “602 does not provide an implied private right of action to enforce disparate impact regulations promoted by federal agencies pursuant to 602.”

8. References and Further Reading

a. Books

  • Bullard Robert, Dumping in Dixie: Race, Class, and Environmental Quality. Westview Press, 2000. (cited as DD)
  • Bullard, Robert, Confronting Environmental Racism: Voices from the Grassroots. South End Press, 1993. (cited as CER)
  • Bryant, Bunyan, ed. Environmental Justice: Issues, Problems, and Solutions. Island Press, 1995. (cited as EJ)
  • Camacho, David E. Environmental Injustices, Political Struggles: Race, Class, and the Environment. Duke University Press, 1988.  (cited as EIPS)
  • Rawls, John, Theory of Justice 2nd Edition Oxford University Press, 1999. (cited as TJ)
  • Rawls, Justice as Fairness: A Re-statement. Belknap Press, 2001. (cited as JF)

b. Journals

  • Environmental Justice: An Interview with Robert Bullard, Earth First Journal, July 1999. (cited as Interview)
  • Drummond, Celia Deane, “Environmental Justice and the Economy: A Christian Theologians Views” Ecotheology 11.3 2006: 24-34 (Deane Drummond)
  • Lee, Charles, “environmental justice: Building a Unified Vision of Health and the Environment” Environmental Health Perspectives 10, Supplement 2 (April 2002), 141-144.
  • Rasmussen, Larry, “Environmental Racism and environmental justice: Moral Theory in the Making? Journal of the Society of Christian Ethics 24 1 (2004): 11-28. (cited as Rasmussen)
  • Shanahan, Alice M. “Permitting Justice: EPA’s Revised Guidance for Investigating Title VI Administrative Complaints. ENVTL. LAWYER 403, 406 (Feb. 2001) (citing the Civil Rights Act of 1964, §602, 78 Stat. at 252-253). (cited as Shanahan)

c. Governmental and Legal Publications

  • 42 U.S.C. § 1983 (2002). (cited as U.S.C. 1983)
  • 42 U.S.C. § 2000 (d) (1994). (cited as U.S.C. 1994)
  • Alexander v. Sandoval 532 U.S. 275 (cited as Alexander)

Author Information

Eddy F. Carder
Prairie View A & M University
U. S. A.