Epsilon Calculi

Epsilon Calculi are extended forms of the predicate calculus that incorporate epsilon terms. Epsilon terms are individual terms of the form ‘εxFx’, being defined for all predicates in the language. The epsilon term ‘εxFx’ denotes a chosen F, if there are any F’s, and has an arbitrary reference otherwise. Epsilon calculi were originally developed to study certain forms of arithmetic, and set theory; also to prove some important meta-theorems about the predicate calculus. Later formal developments have included a variety of intensional epsilon calculi, of use in the study of necessity, and more general intensional notions, like belief. An epsilon term such as ‘εxFx’ was originally read as ‘the first F’, and in arithmetical contexts as ‘the least F’. More generally it can be read as the demonstrative description ‘that F’, when arising either deictically, that is, in a pragmatic context where some F is being pointed at, or in linguistic cross-reference situations, as with, for example, ‘There is a red-haired man in the room. That red-haired man is Caucasian’. The application of epsilon terms to natural language shares some features with the use of iota terms within the theory of descriptions given by Bertrand Russell, but differs in formalising aspects of a slightly different theory of reference, first given by Keith Donnellan. More recently, epsilon terms have been used by a number of writers to formalise cross-sentential anaphora, which would arise if ‘that red-haired man’ in the linguistic case above was replaced with a pronoun such as ‘he’. There is then also the similar application in intensional cases, like ‘There is a red-haired man in the room. Celia believed he was a woman.’

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Descriptions and Identity
  3. Rigid Epsilon Terms
  4. The Epsilon Calculus’ Problematic
  5. The Formal Semantics of Epsilon Terms
  6. Some Metatheory
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

Epsilon terms were introduced by the german mathematician David Hilbert, in Hilbert 1923, 1925, to provide explicit definitions of the existential and universal quantifiers, and resolve some problems in infinitistic mathematics. But it is not just the related formal results, and structures which are of interest. In Hilbert’s major book Grundlagen der Mathematik, which he wrote with his collaborator Paul Bernays, epsilon terms were presented as formalising certain natural language constructions, like definite descriptions. And they in fact have a considerably larger range of such applications, for instance in the symbolisation of certain cross-sentential anaphora. Hilbert and Bernays also used their epsilon calculus to prove two important meta-theorems about the predicate calculus. One theorem subsequently led, for instance, to the development of semantic tableaux: it is called the First Epsilon Theorem, and its content and proof will be given later, in section 6 below. A second theorem that Hilbert and Bernays proved, which we shall also look at then, establishes that epsilon calculi are conservative extensions of the predicate calculus, that is, that no more theorems expressible just in the quantificational language of the predicate calculus can be proved in epsilon calculi than can be proved in the predicate calculus itself. But while epsilon calculi do have these further important formal functions, we will not only be concerned to explore them, for we shall also first discuss the natural language structures upon which epsilon calculi have a considerable bearing.

The growing awareness of the larger meaning and significance of epsilon calculi has only come in stages. Hilbert and Bernays introduced epsilon terms for several meta-mathematical purposes, as above, but the extended presentation of an epsilon calculus, as a formal logic of interest in its own right, in fact only first appeared in Bourbaki’s Éléments de Mathématique (although see also Ackermann 1937-8). Bourbaki’s epsilon calculus with identity (Bourbaki, 1954, Book 1) is axiomatic, with Modus Ponens as the only primitive inference or derivation rule. Thus, in effect, we get:

(X ∨ X) → X,
X → (X ∨ Y),
(X ∨ Y) → (Y ∨ X),
(X ∨ Y) → ((Z ∨ X) → (Z ∨ Y)),
Fy → FεxFx,
x = y → (Fx ↔ Fy),
(x)(Fx ↔ Gx) → εxFx = εxGx.

This adds to a basis for the propositional calculus an epsilon axiom schema, then Leibniz’ Law, and a second epsilon axiom schema, which is a further law of identity. Bourbaki, though, used the Greek letter tau rather than epsilon to form what are now called ‘epsilon terms’; nevertheless, he defined the quantifiers in terms of his tau symbol in the manner of Hilbert and Bernays, namely:

(∃x)Fx ↔ FεxFx,
(x)Fx ↔ Fεx¬Fx;

and note that, in his system the other usual law of identity, ‘x = x’, is derivable.

The principle purpose Bourbaki found for his system of logic was in his theory of sets, although through that, in the modern manner, it thereby came to be the foundation for the rest of mathematics. Bourbaki’s theory of sets discriminates amongst predicates those which determine sets: thus some, but only some, predicates determine sets, i.e. are ‘collectivisantes’. All the main axioms of classical Set Theory are incorporated in his theory, but he does not have an Axiom of Choice as a separate axiom, since its functions are taken over by his tau symbol. The same point holds in Bernays’ epsilon version of his set theory (Bernays 1958, Ch VIII).

Epsilon calculi, during this period, were developed without any semantics, but a semantic interpretation was produced by Gunter Asser in 1957, and subsequently published in a book by A.C. Leisenring, in 1969. Even then, readings of epsilon terms in ordinary language were still uncommon. A natural language reading of epsilon terms, however, was present in Hilbert and Bernays’ work. In fact the last chapter of book 1 of the Grundlagen is a presentation of a theory of definite descriptions, and epsilon terms relate closely to this. In the more well known theory of definite descriptions by Bertrand Russell (Russell 1905) there are three clauses: with

The king of France is bald

we get, on Russell’s theory, first

there is a king of France,


there is only one king of France,

and third

anyone who is king of France is bald.

Russell uses the Greek letter iota to formalise the definite description, writing the whole


but he recognises the iota term is not a proper individual symbol. He calls it an ‘incomplete symbol’, since, because of the three parts, the whole proposition is taken to have the quantificational analysis,

(∃x)(Kx & (y)(Ky → y = x) & (y)(Ky → By)),

which is equivalent to

(∃x)(Kx & (y)(Ky→ y = x) & Bx).

And that means that it does not have the form ‘Bx’. Russell believed that, in addition to his iota terms, there was another class of individual terms, which he called ‘logically proper names’. These would simply fit into the ‘x’ place in ‘Bx’. He believed that ‘this’ and ‘that’ were in this class, but gave no symbolic characterisation of them.

Hilbert and Bernays, by contrast, produced what is called a ‘pre-suppositional theory’ of definite descriptions. The first two clauses of Russell’s definition were not taken to be part of the meaning of ‘The King of France is bald’: they were merely conditions under which they took it to be permitted to introduce a complete individual term for ‘the King of France’, which then satisfies

Kx & (y)(Ky → y = x).

Hilbert and Bernays continued to use the Greek letter iota in their individual term, although it has a quite different grammar from Russell’s iota term, since, when Hilbert and Bernays’ term can be introduced, it is provably equivalent to the corresponding epsilon term (Kneebone 1963, p102). In fact it was later suggested by many that epsilon terms are not only complete symbols, but can be seen as playing the same role as the ‘logically proper names’ Russell discussed.

It is at the start of book 2 of the Grundlagen that we find the definition of epsilon terms. There, Hilbert and Bernays first construct a theory of indefinite descriptions in a similar manner to their theory of definite descriptions. They allow, now, an eta term to be introduced as long as just the first of Russell’s conditions is met. That is to say, given


one can introduce the term ‘ηxFx’, and say


But the condition for the introduction of the eta term can be established logically, for certain predicates, since

(∃x)((∃y)Fy → Fx),

is a predicate calculus theorem (Copi 1973, p110). It is the eta term this theorem allows us to introduce which is otherwise called an epsilon term, and its logical basis enables entirely formal theories to be constructed, since such individual terms are invariably defined. Thus we may invariably introduce ‘ηx((∃y)Fy → Fx)’, and this is commonly written ‘εxFx’, about which we can therefore say

(∃y)Fy → FεxFx.

Since it is that F which exists if anything is F, Hilbert read the epsilon term in this case ‘the first F’. For instance, in arithmetic, ‘the first’ may be taken to be the least number operator. However, while if there are F’s then the first F is clearly some chosen one of them, if there are no F’s then ‘the first F’ must be a misnomer. And that form of speech only came to be fully understood in the theories of reference which appeared much later, when reference and denotation came to be more clearly separated from description and attribution. Donnellan (Donnellan 1966) used the example ‘the man with martini in his glass’, and pointed out that, in certain uses, this can refer to someone without martini in his glass. In the terminology Donnellan made popular, ‘the first F’, in the second case above works similarly: it cannot be attributive, and so, while it refers to something, it must refer arbitrarily, from a semantic point of view.

With reference in this way separated from attribution it becomes possible to symbolise the anaphoric cross-reference between, for instance, ‘There is one and only one king of France’ and ‘He is bald’. For, independently of whether the former is true, the ‘he’ in the latter is a pronoun for the epsilon term in the former — by a simple extension of the epsilon definition of the existential quantifier. Thus the pair of remarks may be symbolised

(∃x)(Kx & (y)(Ky → y = x)) & Bεx(Kx & (y)(Ky → y = x)).

Furthermore such cross-reference may occur in connection with intensional constructions of a kind Russell also considered, such as

George IV wondered whether the author of Waverley was Scott.

Thus we can say ‘There is an author of Waverley, and George IV wondered whether he was Scott’. But the epsilon analysis of these cases puts intensional epsilon calculi at odds with Russellian views of such constructions, as we shall see later. The Russellian approach, by not having complete symbols for individuals, tends to confuse cases in which assertions are made about individuals and cases in which assertions are made about identifying properties. As we shall see, epsilon terms enable us to make the discrimination between, for instance,

s = εx(y)(Ay ↔ y = x),

(i.e. ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’), and

(y)(Ay ↔ y = s),

(that is, ‘there is one and only one author of Waverley and he is Scott’), and so it enables us to locate more exactly the object of George IV’s thought.

2. Descriptions and Identity

When one starts to ask about the natural language meaning of epsilon terms, it is interesting that Leisenring just mentions the ‘formal superiority’ of the epsilon calculus (Leisenring 1969, p63, see also Routley 1969, Hazen 1987). Leisenring took the epsilon calculus to be a better logic than the predicate calculus, but merely because of the Second Epsilon Theorem. Its main virtue, to Leisenring, was that it could prove all that seemingly needed to be proved, but in a more elegant way. Epsilon terms were just neater at calculating which were the valid theorems of the predicate calculus.

Remembering Hilbert and Bernays’ discussion of definite and indefinite descriptions, clearly there is more to the epsilon calculus than this. And there are, in fact, two specific theorems provable within the epsilon calculus, though not the predicate calculus, which will start to indicate the epsilon calculus’ more general range of application. They concern individuals, since the epsilon calculus is distinctive in providing an appropriate, and systematic means of reference to them.

The need to have complete symbols for individuals became evident some years after Russell’s promotion of incomplete symbols for them. The first major book to allow for this was Rosser’s Logic for Mathematicians, in 1953, although there were precursors. For the classical difficulty with providing complete terms for individuals concerns what to do with ‘non-denoting’ terms, and Quine, for instance, following Frege, often gave them an arbitrary, though specific referent (Marciszewski 1981, p113). This idea is also present in Kalish and Montague (Kalish and Montague 1964, pp242-243), who gave the two rules:

(∃x)(y)(Fy ↔ y = x) ├ FιxFx,
¬(∃x)(y)(Fy ↔ y = x) ├ιxFx = ιx¬(x = x),

where ‘ιxFx’ is what otherwise might be written ‘εx(y)(Fy ↔ y = x)’. Kalish and Montague believed, however, that the second rule ‘has no intuitive counterpart, simply because ordinary language shuns improper definite descriptions’ (Kalish and Montague 1964, p244). And, at that time, what Donnellan was to publish in Donnellan 1966, about improper definite descriptions, was certainly not well known. In fact ordinary speech does not shun improper definite descriptions, although their referents are not as fixed as the above second rule requires. Indeed the very fact that the descriptions are improper means that their referents are not determined semantically: instead they are just a practical, pragmatic choice.

Stalnaker and Thomason recognised the need to be more liberal when they defined their referential terms, which also had to refer, in the contexts they were concerned with, in more than one possible world (Thomason and Stalnaker 1968, p363):

In contrast with the Russellian analysis, definite descriptions are treated as genuine singular terms; but in general they will not be substance terms [rigid designators]. An expression like ιxPx is assigned a referent which may vary from world to world. If in a given world there is a unique existing individual which has the property corresponding to P, this individual is the referent of ιxPx; otherwise, ιxPx refers to an arbitrarily chosen individual which does not exist in that world.

Stalnaker and Thomason appreciated that ‘A substance term is much like what Russell called a logically proper name’, but they said that an individual constant might or might not be a substance term, depending on whether it was more like ‘Socrates’ or ‘Miss America’ (Thomason and Stalnaker 1968, p362). A more complete investigation of identity and descriptions, in modal and general intensional contexts, was provided in Routley, Meyer and Goddard 1974, and Routley 1977, see also Hughes and Cresswell 1968, Ch 11. And with these writers we get the explicit rendering of definite descriptions in epsilon terms, as in Goddard and Routley 1973, p558, Routley 1980, p277, c.f. Hughes and Cresswell 1968, p203.

Certain specific theorems in the epsilon calculus, as was said before, support these kinds of identification. One theorem demonstrates directly the relation between Russell’s attributive, and some of Donnellan’s referential ideas. For

(∃x)(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x) & Gx)

is logically equivalent to

(∃x)(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)) & Ga,

where a = εx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)). This arises because the latter is equivalent to

Fa & (y)(Fy → y = a) & Ga,

which entails the former. But the former is

Fb & (y)(Fy → y = b) & Gb,

with b = εx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x) & Gx), and so entails

(∃x)(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)),


Fa & (y)(Fy → y = a).

But that means that, from the uniqueness clause,

a = b,

and so


meaning the former entails the latter, and therefore the former is equivalent to the latter.

The former, of course, gives Russell’s Theory of Descriptions, in the case of ‘The F is G’; it explicitly asserts the first two clauses, to do with the existence and uniqueness of an F. A presuppositional theory, such as we saw in Hilbert and Bernays, would not explicitly assert these two clauses: on such an account they are a precondition before the term ‘the F’ can be introduced. But neither of these theories accommodate improper definite descriptions. Since Donnellan it is more common to allow that we can always use ‘the F’: if the description is improper then the referent of this term is simply found in the term’s practical use.

One detail of Donnellan’s historical account, however, must be treated with some care, at this point. Donnellan was himself concerned with definite descriptions which were improper in the sense that they did not uniquely describe what the speaker took to be their referent. So the description might still be ‘proper’ in the above sense — if there still was something to which it uniquely applied, on account of its semantic content. Thus Donnellan allowed ‘the man with martini in his glass’ to identify someone without martini in his glass irrespective of whether there was some sole man with martini in his glass. But if one talks about ‘the man with martini in his glass’ one can be correctly taken to be talking about who this describes, if it does in fact correctly describe someone — as Devitt and Bertolet pointed out in criticism of Donnellan (Devitt 1974, Bertolet 1980). It is this aspect of our language which the epsilon account matches, for an epsilon account allows definite descriptions to refer without attribution of their semantic character, but only if nothing uniquely has that semantic character. Thus it is not the whole of the first statement above , but only the third part of the second statement which makes the remark ‘The F is G’.

The difficulty with Russell’s account becomes more plain if we read the two equivalent statements using relative and personal pronouns. They then become

There is one and only one F, which is G,
There is one and only one F; it is G.

But using just the logic derived from Frege, Russell could formalise the ‘which’, but could not separate out the last clause, ‘it is G’. In that clause ‘it’ is an anaphor for ‘the (one and only) F’, and it still has this linguistic meaning if there is no such thing, since that is just a matter of grammar. But the uniqueness clause is needed for the two statements to be equivalent — without uniqueness there is no equivalence, as we shall see – so ‘which’ is not itself equivalent to ‘it’. Russell, however, because he could not separate out the ‘it’, had to take the whole of the first expression as the analysis of ‘The F is G’ — he could not formulate the needed ‘logically proper name’.

But how can something be the one and only F ‘if there is no such thing’? That is where another important theorem provable in the epsilon calculus is illuminating, namely:

(Fa & (y)(Fy → y = a)) → a = εx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)).

The important thing is that there is a difference between the left hand side and the right hand side, i.e. between something being alone F, and that thing being the one and only F. For the left-right implication cannot be reversed. We get from the left to the right when we see that the left as a whole entails

(∃x)(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)),

and so also its epsilon equivalent

Fεx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)) & (z)(Fz → z = εx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x))).

Given Fa, then from the second clause here we get the right hand side of our original implication. But if we substitute ‘εx(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x))’ for ‘a’ in that implication then on the right we have something which is necessarily true. But the left hand side is then the same as

(∃x)(Fx & (y)(Fy → y = x)),

and that is in general contingent. Hence the implication cannot generally be reversed. Having the property of being alone F is here contingent, but possessing the identity of the one and only F is necessary.

The distinction is not made in Russell’s logic, since possession of the relevant property is the only thing which can be formally expressed there. In Russell’s theory of descriptions, a’s possession of the property of being alone a king of France is expressed as a quasi identity

a = ιxKx,

and that has the consequence that such identities are contingent. Indeed, in counterpart theories of objects in other possible worlds the idea is pervasive that an entity may be defined in terms of its contingent properties in a given world. Hughes and Cresswell, however, differentiated between contingent identities and necessary identities in the following way (Hughes and Cresswell 1968, p191):

Now it is contingent that the man who is in fact the man who lives next door is the man who lives next door, for he might have lived somewhere else; that is living next door is a property which belongs contingently, not necessarily, to the man to whom it does belong. And similarly, it is contingent that the man who is in fact the mayor is the mayor; for someone else might have been elected instead. But if we understand [The man who lives next door is the mayor] to mean that the object which (as a matter of contingent fact) possesses the property of being the man who lives next door is identical with the object which (as a matter of contingent fact) possesses the property of being the mayor, then we are understanding it to assert that a certain object (variously described) is identical with itself, and this we need have no qualms about regarding as a necessary truth. This would give us a way of construing identity statements which makes [(x = y) → L(x = y)] perfectly acceptable: for whenever x = y is true we can take it as expressing the necessary truth that a certain object is identical with itself.

There are more consequences of this matter, however, than Hughes and Cresswell drew out. For now that we have proper referring terms for individuals to go into such expressions as ‘x = y’, we first see better where the contingency of the properties of such individuals comes from — simply the linguistic facility of using improper definite descriptions. But we also see, because identities between such terms are necessary, that proper referring terms must be rigid, i.e. have the same reference in all possible worlds.

This is not how Stalnaker and Thomason saw the matter. Stalnaker and Thomason, it will be remembered, said that there were two kinds of individual constants: ones like ‘Socrates’ which can take the place of individual variables, and others like ‘Miss America’ which cannot. The latter, as a result, they took to be non-rigid. But it is strictly ‘Miss America in year t’ which is meant in the second case, and that is not a constant expression, even though such functions can take the place of individual variables. It was Routley, Meyer and Goddard who most seriously considered the resultant possibility that all properly individual terms are rigid. At least, they worked out many of the implications of this position, even though Routley was not entirely content with it.

Routley described several rigid intensional semantics (Routley 1977, pp185-186). One of these, for instance, just took the first epsilon axiom to hold in any interpretation, and made the value of an epsilon term itself. On such a basis Routley, Meyer and Goddard derived what may be called ‘Routley’s Formula’, i.e.

L(∃x)Fx → (∃x)LFx.

In fact, on their understanding, this formula holds for any operator and any predicate, but they had in mind principally the case of necessity illustrated here, with ‘Fx’ taken as ‘x numbers the planets’, making ‘εxFx’ ‘the number of the planets’. The formula is derived quite simply, in the following way: from


we can get


by the epsilon definition of the existential quantifier, and so


by existential generalisation over the rigid term (Routley, Meyer and Goddard 1974, p308, see also Hughes and Cresswell 1968, pp197, 204). Routley, however, was still inclined to think that a rigid semantics was philosophically objectionable (Routley 1977, p186):

Rigid semantics tend to clutter up the semantics for enriched systems with ad hoc modelling conditions. More important, rigid semantics, whether substitutional or objectual, are philosophically objectionable. For one thing, they make Vulcan and Hephaestus everywhere indistinguishable though there are intensional claims that hold of one but not of the other. The standard escape from this sort of problem, that of taking proper names like ‘Vulcan’ as disguised descriptions we have already found wanting… Flexible semantics, which satisfactorily avoid these objections, impose a more objectual interpretation, since, even if [the domain] is construed as the domain of terms, [the value of a term in a world] has to be permitted, in some cases at least, to vary from world to world.

As a result, while Routley, Meyer and Goddard were still prepared to defend the formula, and say, for instance, that there was a number which necessarily numbers the planets, namely the number of the planets (np), they thought that this was only in fact the same as 9, so that one still could not argue correctly that as L(np numbers the planets), so L(9 numbers the planets). ‘For extensional identity does not warrant intersubstitutivity in intensional frames’ (Routley, Meyer and Goddard 1974, p309). They held, in other words that the number of the planets was only contingently 9.

This means that they denied ‘(x = y) → L(x = y)’, but, as we shall see in more detail later, there are ways to hold onto this principle, i.e. maintain the invariable necessity of identity.

3. Rigid Epsilon Terms

There is some further work which has helped us to understand how reference in modal and general intensional contexts must be rigid. But it involves some different ideas in semantics, and starts, even, outside our main area of interest, namely predicate logic, in the semantics of propositional logic.

When one thinks of ‘semantics’ one maybe thinks of the valuation of formulas. Since the 1920s a meta-study of this kind was certainly added to the previous logical interest in proof theory. Traditional proof theory is commonly associated with axiomatic procedures, but, from a modern perspective, its distinction is that it is to do with ‘object languages’. Tarski’s theory of truth relies crucially on the distinction between object languages and meta-languages, and so semantics generally seems to be necessarily a meta-discipline. In fact Tarski believed that such an elevation of our interest was forced upon us by the threat of semantic paradoxes like The Liar. If there was, by contrast, ‘semantic closure’, i.e. if truth and other semantic notions were definable at the object level, then there would be contradictions galore (c.f. Priest 1984). In this way truth may seem to be necessarily a predicate of (object-level) sentences.

But there is another way of looking at the matter which is explicitly non-Tarskian, and which others have followed (see Prior 1971, Ch 7, Sayward 1987). This involves seeing ‘it is true that’ as not a predicate, but an object-level operator, with the truth tabulations in Truth Tables, for instance, being just another form of proof procedure. Operators indeed include ‘it is provable that’, and this is distinct from Gödel’s provability predicate, as Gödel himself pointed out (Gödel 1969). Operators are intensional expressions, as in the often discussed ‘it is necessary that’ and ‘it is believed that’, and trying to see such forms of indirect discourse as metalinguistic predicates was very common in the middle of the last century. It was pervasive, for instance, in Quine’s many discussions of modality and intensionality. Wouldn’t someone be believing that the Morning Star is in the sky, but the Evening Star is not, if, respectively, they assented to the sentence ‘the Morning Star is in the sky’, and dissented from ‘the Evening Star is in the sky’? Anyone saying ‘yes’ is still following the Quinean tradition, but after Montague’s and Thomason’s work on operators (e.g. Montague 1963, Thomason 1977, 1980) many logicians are more persuaded that indirect discourse is not quotational. It is open to doubt, that is to say, whether we should see the mind in terms of the direct words which the subject would use.

The alternative involves seeing the words ‘the Morning Star is in the sky’ in such an indirect speech locution as ‘Quine believes that the Morning Star is in the sky’ as words merely used by the reporter, which need not directly reflect what the subject actually says. That is indeed central to reported speech — putting something into the reporter’s own words rather than just parroting them from another source. Thus a reporter may say

Celia believed that the man in the room was a woman,

but clearly that does not mean that Celia would use ‘the man in the room’ for who she was thinking about. So referential terms in the subordinate proposition are only certainly in the mouth of the reporter, and as a result only certainly refer to what the reporter means by them. It is a short step from this thought to seeing

There was a man in the room, but Celia believed that he was a woman,

as involving a transparent intensional locution, with the same object, as one might say, ‘inside’ the belief as ‘outside’ in the room. So it is here where rigid constant epsilon terms are needed, to symbolise the cross-sentential anaphor ‘he’, as in:

(∃x)(Mx & Rx) & BcWεx(Mx & Rx).

To understand the matter fully, however, we must make the shift from meta- to object language we saw at the propositional level above with truth. Routley, Meyer and Goddard realised that a rigid semantics required treating such expressions as ‘BcWx’ as simple predicates, and we must now see what this implies. They derived, as we saw before, ‘Routley’s Formula’

L(∃x)Fx → (∃x)LFx,

but we can now start to spell out how this is to be understood, if we hold to the necessity of identities, i.e. if we use ‘=’ so that

x = y → L(x = y).

Again a clear illustration of the validity of Routley’s Formula is provided by the number of the planets, but now we may respect the fact that some things may lack a number, and also the fact that referential, and attributive senses of terms may be distinguished. Thus if we write ‘(nx)Px’ for ‘there are n P’s’, then εn(ny)Py will be the number of P’s, and it is what numbers them (i.e. ([εn(ny)Py]x)Px) if they have a number (i.e. if (∃n)(nx)Px) — by the epsilon definition of the existential quantifier. Then, with ‘Fx’ as the proper (necessary) identity ‘x = εn(ny)Py’ Routley’s Formula holds because the number in question exists eternally, making both sides of the formula true. But if ‘Fn’ is simply the attributive ‘(ny)Py’ then this is not necessary, since it is contingent even, in the first place, that there is a number of P’s, instead of just some P, making both sides of the formula false.

Hughes and Cresswell argue against the principle saying (Hughes and Cresswell 1968, p144):

…let [Fx] be ‘x is the number of the planets’. Then the antecedent is true, for there must be some number which is the number of the planets (even if there were no planets at all there would still be such a number, namely 0): but the consequent is false, for since it is a contingent matter how many planets there are, there is no number which must be the number of the planets.

But this forgets continuous quantities, where there are no discrete items before the nomination of a unit. The number associated with some planetary material, for instance, numbers only arbitrary units of that material, and not the material itself. So the antecedent of Routley’s Formula is not necessarily true.

Quine also used the number of the planets in his central argument against quantification into modal contexts. He said (Quine 1960, pp195-197):

If for the sake of argument we accept the term ‘analytic’ as predicable of sentences (hence as attachable predicatively to quotations or other singular terms designating sentences), then ‘necessarily’ amounts to ‘is analytic’ plus an antecedent pair of quotation marks. For example, the sentence:

(1) Necessarily 9 > 4

is explained thus:

(2) ‘9 > 4’ is analytic…

So suppose (1) explained as in (2). Why, one may ask, should we preserve the operatorial form as of (1), and therewith modal logic, instead of just leaving matters as in (2)? An apparent advantage is the possibility of quantifying into modal positions; for we know we cannot quantify into quotation, and (2) uses quotation…

But is it more legitimate to quantify into modal positions than into quotation? For consider (1) even without regard to (2); surely, on any plausible interpretation, (1) is true and this is false:

(3) Necessarily the number of major planets > 4.

Since 9 = the number of major planets, we can conclude that the position of ‘9’ in (1) is not purely referential and hence that the necessity operator is opaque.

But here Quine does not separate out the referential ‘the number of the major planets is greater than 4’, i.e. ‘εn(ny)Py > 4’, from the attributive ‘There are more than 4 major planets’, i.e. ‘(∃n)((ny)Py & n > 4)’. If 9 = εn(ny)Py, then it follows that εn(ny)Py > 4, but it does not follow that (∃n)((ny)Py & n > 4). Substitution of identicals in (1), therefore, does yield (3), even though it is not necessary that there are more than 4 major planets.

We can now go into some details of how one gets the ‘x’ in such a form as ‘LFx’ to be open for quantification. For, what one finds in traditional modal semantics (see Hughes and Cresswell 1968, passim) are formulas in the meta-linguistic style, like

V(Fx, i) = 1,

which say that the valuation put on ‘Fx’ is 1, in world i. There should be quotation marks around the ‘Fx’ in such a formula, to make it meta-linguistic, but by convention they are generally omitted. To effect the change to the non-meta-linguistic point of view, we must simply read this formula as it literally is, so that the ‘Fx’ is in indirect speech rather than direct speech, and the whole becomes the operator form ‘it would be true in world i that Fx’. In this way, the term ‘x’ gets into the language of the reporter, and the meta/object distinction is not relevant. Any variable inside the subordinate proposition can now be quantified over, just like a variable outside it, which means there is ‘quantifying in’, and indeed all the normal predicate logic operations apply, since all individual terms are rigid.

A example illustrating this rigidity involves the actual top card in a pack, and the cards which might have been top card in other circumstances (see Slater 1988a). If the actual top card is the Ace of Spades, and it is supposed that the top card is the Queen of Hearts, then clearly what would have to be true for those circumstances to obtain would be for the Ace of Spades to be the Queen of Hearts. The Ace of Spades is not in fact the Queen of Hearts, but that does not mean they cannot be identical in other worlds (c.f. Hughes and Cresswell, 1968, p190). Certainly if there were several cards people variously thought were on top, those cards in the various supposed circumstances would not provide a constant c such that Fc is true in all worlds. But that is because those cards are functions of the imagined worlds — the card a believes is top (εxBaFx) need not be the card b believes is top (εxBbFx), etc. It still remains that there is a constant, c, such that Fc is true in all worlds. Moreover, that c is not an ‘intensional object’, for the given Ace of Spades is a plain and solid extensional object, the actual top card (εxFx).

Routley, Meyer and Goddard did not accept the latter point, wanting a rigid semantics in terms of ‘intensional objects’ (Goddard and Routley, 1973, p561, Routley, Meyer and Goddard, 1974, p309, see also Hughes and Cresswell 1968, p197). Stalnaker and Thomason accepted that certain referential terms could be functional, when discriminating ‘Socrates’ from ‘Miss America’ — although the functionality of ‘Miss America in year t’ is significantly different from that of ‘the top card in y’s belief’. For if this year’s Miss America is last year’s Miss America, still it is only one thing which is identical with itself, unlike with the two cards. Also, there is nothing which can force this year’s Miss America to be last year’s different Miss America, in the way that the counterfactuality of the situation with the playing cards forces two non-identical things in the actual world to be the same thing in the other possible world. Other possible worlds are thus significantly different from other times, and so, arguably, other possible worlds should not be seen from the Realist perspective appropriate for other times — or other spaces.

4. The Epsilon Calculus’ Problematic

It might be said that Realism has delayed a proper logical understanding of many of these things. If you look ‘realistically’ at picturesque remarks like that made before, namely ‘the same object is ‘inside’ the belief as ‘outside’ in the room’, then it is easy for inappropriate views about the mind to start to interfere, and make it seem that the same object cannot be in these two places at once. But if the mind were something like another space or time, then counterfactuality could get no proper purchase — no one could be ‘wrong’, since they would only be talking about elements in their ‘world’, not any objective, common world. But really, all that is going on when one says, for instance,

There was a man in the room, but Celia believed he was a woman,

is that the same term — or one term and a pronominal surrogate for it — appears at two linguistic places in some discourse, with the same reference. Hence there is no grammatical difference between the cross reference in such an intensional case and the cross reference in a non-intensional case, such as

There was a man in the room. He was hungry.


(∃x)Mx & HεxMx.

What has been difficult has merely been getting a symbolisation of the cross-reference in this more elementary kind of case. But it just involves extending the epsilon definition of existential statements, using a reiteration of the substituted epsilon term, as we can see.

It is now widely recognised how the epsilon calculus allows us to do this (Purdy 1994, Egli and von Heusinger 1995, Meyer Viol 1995, Ch 6), the theoretical starting point being the theorem about the Russellian theory of definite descriptions proved before, which breaks up what otherwise would be a single sentence into a sequential piece of discourse, enabling the existence and uniqueness clauses to be put in one sentence while the characterising remark is in another. The relationship starts to matter when, in fact, there is no obvious way to formulate a combination of anaphoric remarks in the predicate calculus, as in, for instance,

There is a king of France. He is bald,

where there is no uniqueness clause. This difficulty became a major problem when logicians started to consider anaphoric reference in the 1960s.

Geach, for instance, in Geach 1962, even believed there could not be a syllogism of the following kind (Geach 1962, p126):

A man has just drunk a pint of sulphuric acid.
Nobody who drinks a pint of sulphuric acid lives through the day.
So, he won’t live through the day.

He said, one could only draw the conclusion:

Some man who has just drunk a pint of sulphuric acid won’t live through the day.

Certainly one can only derive

(∃x)(Mx & Dx & ¬Lx)


(∃x)(Mx & Dx),


(x)(Dx → ¬Lx),

within predicate logic. But one can still derive

¬Lεx(Mx & Dx),

within the epsilon calculus.

Geach likewise was foxed later when he produced his famous case (numbered 3 in Geach 1967):

Hob thinks a witch has blighted Bob’s mare, and Nob wonders whether she (the same witch) killed Cob’s sow,

which is, in epsilon terms

Th(∃x)(Wx & Bxb) & OnKεx(Wx & Bxb)c.

For Geach saw that this could not be (4)

(∃x)(Wx & ThBxb & OnKxc),

or (5)

(∃x)(Th(Wx & Bxb)& OnKxc).

But also a reading of the second clause as (c.f. 18)

Nob wonders whether the witch who blighted Bob’s mare killed Cob’s sow,

in which ‘the witch who blighted Bob’s mare killed Cob’s sow’ is analysed in the Russellian manner, i.e. as (20)

just one witch blighted Bob’s mare and she killed Cob’s sow,

Geach realised does not catch the specific cross-reference — amongst other things because of the uniqueness condition which is then introduced.

This difficulty with the uniqueness clause in Russellian analyses has been widely commented on, although a recent theorist, Neale, has said that Russell’s theory only needs to be modestly modified: Neale’s main idea is that, in general, definite descriptions should just be localised to the context. His resolution of Geach’s troubling cases thus involves suggesting that ‘she’, in the above, might simply be ‘the witch we have been hearing about’ (Neale 1990, p221). Neale might here have said ‘that witch who blighted Bob’s mare’, showing that an Hilbertian account of demonstrative descriptions would have a parallel effect.

A good deal of the ground breaking work on these matters, however, was done by someone again much influenced by Russell: Evans. But Evans significantly broke with Russell over uniqueness (Evans 1977, pp516-517):

One does not want to be committed, by this way of telling the story, to the existence of a day on which just one man and boy walked along a road. It was with this possibility in mind that I stated the requirement for the appropriate use of an E-type pronoun in terms of having answered, or being prepared to answer upon demand, the question ‘He? Who?’ or ‘It? Which?’ In order to effect this liberalisation we should allow the reference of the E-type pronoun to be fixed not only by predicative material explicitly in the antecedent clause, but also by material which the speaker supplies upon demand. This ruling has the effect of making the truth conditions of such remarks somewhat indeterminate; a determinate proposition will have been put forward only when the demand has been made and the material supplied.

It was Evans who gave us the title ‘E-type pronoun’ for the ‘he’ in such expressions as

A Cambridge philosopher smoked a pipe, and he drank a lot of whisky,

i.e., in epsilon terms,

(∃x)(Cx & Px) & Dεx(Cx & Px).

He also insisted (Evans 1977, p516) that what was unique about such pronouns was that this conjunction of statements was not equivalent to

A Cambridge philosopher, who smoked a pipe, drank a lot of whisky,


(∃x)(Cx & Px & Dx).

Clearly the epsilon account is entirely in line with this, since it illustrates the point made before about cases without a uniqueness clause. Only the second expression, which contains a relative pronoun, is formalisable in the predicate calculus. To formalise the first expression, which contains a personal pronoun, one at least needs something with the expressive capabilities of the epsilon calculus.

5. The Formal Semantics of Epsilon Terms

The semantics of epsilon terms is nowadays more general, but the first interpretations of epsilon terms were restricted to arithmetical cases, and specifically took epsilon to be the least number operator. Hilbert and Bernays developed Arithmetic using the epsilon calculus, using the further epsilon axiom schema (Hilbert and Bernays 1970, Book 2, p85f, c.f. Leisenring 1969, p92) :

(εxAx = st) → ¬At,

where ‘s’ is intended to be the successor function, and ‘t’ is any numeral. This constrains the interpretation of the epsilon symbol, but the least number interpretation is not strictly forced, since the axiom only ensures that no number having the property A immediately precedes εxAx.

The new axiom, however, is sufficient to prove mathematical induction, in the form:

(A0 & (x)(Ax → Asx)) → (x)Ax.

For assume the reverse, namely

A0 & (x)(Ax → Asx) & ¬(x)Ax,

and consider what happens when the term ‘εx¬Ax’ is substituted in

t = 0 ∨ t = sn,

which is derivable from the other axioms of number theory which Hilbert and Bernays are using. If we had

εx¬Ax = 0,

then, since it is given that A0, then we would have Aεx¬Ax. But since, by the definition of the universal quantifier,

Aεx¬Ax ↔ (x)Ax,

we know, because ¬(x)Ax is also given, that ¬Aεx¬Ax, which means we cannot have εx¬Ax = 0. Hence we must have the other alternative, i.e.

εx¬Ax = sn,

for some n. But from the new axiom

(εx¬Ax = sn) → An,

hence we must have An, although we must also have

An → Asn,

because (x)(Ax → Asx). All together that requires Aεx¬Ax again, which is impossible. Hence the further epsilon axiom is sufficient to establish the given principle of induction.

The more general link between epsilon terms and choice functions was first set out by Asser, although Asser’s semantics for an elementary epsilon calculus without the second epsilon axiom makes epsilon terms denote rather complex choice functions. Wilfrid Meyer Viol, calling an epsilon calculus without the second axiom an ‘intensional’ epsilon calculus, makes the epsilon terms in such a calculus instead name Skolem functions. Skolem functions are also called Herbrand functions, although they arise in a different way, namely in Skolem’s Theorem. Skolem’s Theorem states that, if a formula in prenex normal form is provable in the predicate calculus, then a certain corresponding formula, with the existential quantifiers removed, is provable in a predicate calculus enriched with function symbols. The functions symbolised are called Skolem functions, although, in another context, they would be Herbrand functions.

Skolem’s Theorem is a meta-logical theorem, about the relation between two logical calculi, but a non-metalogical version is in fact provable in the epsilon calculus from which Skolem’s actual theorem follows, since, for example, we can get, by the epsilon definition, now of the existential quantifier

(x)(∃y)Fxy ↔ (x)FxεyFxy.

As a result, if the left hand side of such an equivalence is provable in an epsilon calculus the right hand side is provable there. But the left hand side is provable in an epsilon calculus if it is provable in the predicate calculus, by the Second Epsilon Theorem; and if the right hand side is provable in an epsilon calculus it is provable in a predicate calculus enriched with certain function symbols — epsilon terms, like ‘εyFxy’. So, by generalisation, we get Skolem’s original result.

When we add to an intensional epsilon calculus the second epsilon axiom

(x)(Fx ↔ Gx) →εxFx = εxGx,

the interpretation of epsilon terms is commonly extensional, i.e. in terms of sets, since two predicates ‘F’ and ‘G’ satisfying the antecedent of this second axiom will determine the same set — if they determine sets at all, that is. For that requires the predicates to be collectivisantes, in Bourbaki’s terms, as with explicit set membership statements, like ‘x ∈ y’. In such a case the epsilon term ‘εx(x ∈ y)’ designates a choice function, i.e. a function which selects one from a given set (c.f. Leisenring 1969, p19, Meyer Viol 1995, p42). In the case where there are no members of the set the selection is arbitrary, although for all empty sets it is invariably the same. Thus the second axiom validates, for example, Kalish and Montague’s rule for this case, which they put in the form

εxFx = εx¬(x = x).

Kalish and Montague in fact prove a version of the second epsilon axiom in their system (Kalish and Montague 1964, see T407, p256). The second axiom also holds in Hermes’ system (Hermes 1965), although there one in addition finds a third epsilon axiom,

εx¬(x = x) = εx(x = x),

for which there would seem to be no real justification.

But the second epsilon axiom itself is curious. One questionable thing about it is that both Leisenring and Meyer Viol do not state that the predicates in question must determine sets before their choice function semantics can apply. That the predicates are collectivisantes is merely presumed in their theories, since ‘εxBx’ is invariably modelled by means of a choice from the presumed set of things which in the model are B. Certainly there is a special clause dealing with the empty set; but there is no consideration of the case where some things are B although those things are not discrete, as with the things which are red, for instance. If the predicate in question is not a count noun then there is no set of things involved, since with mass terms, and continuous quantities there are no given elements to be counted (c.f. Bunt 1985, pp262-263 in particular). Of course numbers can still be associated with them, but only given an arbitrary unit. With the cows in a field, for instance, we can associate a determinate number, but with the beef there we cannot, unless we consider, say, the number of pounds of it.

The point, as we saw before, has a formalisation in epsilon terms. Thus if we write ‘(nx)Fx’, for ‘there are n F’s’, then εn(ny)Fy will be the number of F’s, and it is what numbers them if they have a number. But in the reverse case the previously mentioned arbitrariness of the epsilon term comes in. For if ¬(∃n)(nx)Fx, then ¬([εn(ny)Fy]x)Fx, and so, although an arbitrary number exists, it does not number the F’s. In that case, in other words, we do not have a number of F’s, merely some F.

In fact, even when there is a set of things, the second epsilon axiom, as stated above, does not apply in general, since there are intensional differences between properties to consider, as in, for instance ‘There is a red-haired man, and a Caucasian in the room, and they are different’. Here, if there were only red-haired Caucasians in the room, then with the above second axiom, we could not find epsilon substitutions to differentiate the two individuals involved. This may remind us that it is necessary co-extensionality, and not just contingent co-extensionality which is the normal criterion for the identity of properties (c.f. Hughes and Cresswell 1968, pp209-210). So it leads us to see the appropriateness of a modalised second axiom, which uses just an intensional version of the antecedent of the previous second epsilon axiom, in which ‘L’ means ‘it is necessary that’, namely:

L(x)(Fx ↔ Gx) →εxFx = εxGx.

For with this axiom only the co-extensionalities which are necessary will produce identities between the associated epsilon terms. We can only get, for instance,

εxPx = εx(Px ∨ Px),


εxFx = εyFy,

and all other identities derivable in a similar way.

However, the original second epsilon axiom is then provable, in the special case where the predicates express set membership. For if necessarily

(x)(x ∈ y ↔ x ∈ z) ↔ y = z,

while necessarily

y = z ↔ L(y = z),

(see Hughes and Cresswell, 1968, p190) then

L(x)(x ∈ y ↔ x ∈ z) ↔ (x)(x ∈ y ↔ x ∈ z),

and so, from the modalised second axiom we can get

(x)(x ∈ y ↔ x ∈ z) →εx(x ∈ y) = εx(x ∈ z).

Note, however, that if one only has contingently

(x)(Fx ↔ x ∈ z),

then one cannot get, on this basis,

εxFx = εx(x ∈ z).

But this is something which is desirable, as well. For we have seen that it is contingent that the number of the planets does number the planets — because it is not necessary that ([εn(ny)Py]x)Px. This makes ‘(9x)Px’ contingent, even though the identity ‘9 = εn(nx)Px’ remains necessary. But also it is contingent that there is the set of planets, p, which there is, since while, say,

(x)(x ∈ p ↔ Px),


εn(nx)(x ∈ p) = εn(nx)Px = 9,

it is still possible that, in some other possible world,

(x)(x ∈ p’ ↔ Px),

with p’ the set of planets there, and

¬(εn(nx)(x ∈ p’) = 9).

We could not have this further contingency, however, if the original second epsilon axiom held universally.

It is on this fuller basis that we can continue to hold ‘x = y → L(x = y)’, i.e. the invariable necessity of identity — one merely distinguishes ‘(9x)Px’ from ‘9 = εx(nx)Px’, and from ‘9 = εx(nx)(x ∈ p)’, as above.

Adding the original second epsilon axiom to an intensional epsilon calculus is therefore acceptable only if all the predicates are about set membership. This is not an uncommon assumption, indeed it is pervasive in the usually given semantics for predicate logic, for instance. But if, by contrast, we want to allow for the fact that not all predicates are collectivisantes then we should take just the first epsilon axiom with merely a modalised version of the second epsilon axiom. The interpretation of epsilon terms is then always in terms of Skolem functions, although if we are dealing with the membership of sets, those Skolem functions naturally are choice functions.

6. Some Metatheory

To finish we shall briefly look, as promised, at some meta-theory.

The epsilon calculi that were first described were not very convenient to use, and Hilbert and Bernays’ proofs of the First and Second Epsilon Theorems were very complex. This was because the presentation was axiomatic, however, and with the development of other means of presenting the same logics we get more readily available meta-logical results. I will indicate some of the early difficulties before showing how these theorems can be proved, nowadays, much more simply.

The problem with proving the Second Epsilon Theorem, on an axiomatic basis, is that complex, and non-constant epsilon terms may enter a proof in the epsilon calculus by means of substitutions into the axioms. What has to be proved is that an epsilon calculus proof of an epsilon-free theorem (i.e. one which can be expressed just in predicate calculus language) can be replaced by a predicate calculus proof. So some analysis of complex epsilon terms is required, to show that they can be eliminated in the relevant cases, leaving only constant epsilon terms, which are sufficiently similar to the individual symbols in standard predicate logic. Hilbert and Bernays (Hilbert and Bernays 1970, Book 2, p23f) say that one epsilon term ‘εxFx’ is subordinate to another ‘εyGy’ if and only if ‘G’ contains ‘εxFx’, and a free occurrence of the variable ‘y’ lies within ‘εxFx’. For instance ‘εxRxy’ is a complex, and non-constant epsilon term, which is subordinate to ‘εySyεxRyx’. Hilbert and Bernays then define the rank of an epsilon term to be 1 if there are no epsilon terms subordinate to it, and otherwise to be one greater than the maximal rank of the epsilon terms which are subordinate to it. Using the same general ideas, Leisenring proves two theorems (Leisenring 1969, p72f). First he proves a rank reduction theorem, which shows that epsilon proofs of epsilon-free formulas in which the second epsilon axiom is not used, but in which every term is of rank less than or equal to r, may be replaced by epsilon proofs in which every term is of rank less than or equal to r – 1. Then he proves the eliminability of the second epsilon axiom in proofs of epsilon-free formulas. Together, these two theorems show that if there is an epsilon proof of an epsilon-free formula, then there is such a proof not using the second epsilon axiom, and in which all epsilon terms have rank just 1. Even though such epsilon terms might still contain free variables, if one replaces those that do with a fixed symbol ‘a’ (starting with those of maximal length) that reduces the proof to one in what is called the ‘epsilon star’ system, in which there are only constant epsilon terms (Leisenring 1969, p66f). Leisenring shows that proofs in the epsilon star system can be turned into proofs in the predicate calculus, by replacing the epsilon terms by individual symbols.

But, as was said before, there is now available a much shorter proof of the Second Epsilon Theorem. In fact there are several, but I shall just indicate one, which arises simply by modifying the predicate calculus truth trees, as found in, for instance, Jeffrey (see Jeffrey 1967). Jeffrey uses the standard propositional truth tree rules, together with the rules of quantifier interchange, which remain unaffected, and which are not material to the present purpose. He also has, however, a rule of existential quantifier elimination,

(∃x)Fx ├ Fa,

in which ‘a’ must be new, and a rule of universal quantifier elimination

(x)Fx ├ Fb,

in which ‘b’ must be old — unless no other individual terms are available. By reducing closed formulas of the form ‘P & ¬C’ to absurdity Jeffrey can then prove ‘P → C’, and validate ‘P ├ C’ in his calculus. But clearly, upon adding epsilon terms to the language, the first of these rules must be changed to

(∃x)Fx ├ FεxFx,

while also the second rule can be replaced by the pair

(x)Fx ├ Fεx¬Fx,
Fεx¬Fx ├ Fa,

(where ‘a’ is old) to produce an appropriate proof procedure. Steen reads ‘εx¬Fx’ as ‘the most un-F-like thing’ (Steen 1972, p162), which explains why Fεx¬Fx entails Fa, since if the most un-F-like thing is in fact F, then the most plausible counter-example to the generalisation is in fact not so, making the generalisation exceptionless. But there is a more important reason why the rule of universal quantifier elimination is best broken up into two parts.

For Jeffrey’s rules only allow him ‘limited upward correctness’ (Jeffrey 1967, p167), since Jeffrey has to say, with respect to his universal quantifier elimination rule, that the range of the quantification there be limited merely to the universe of discourse of the path below. This is because, if an initial sentence is false in a valuation so also must be one of its conclusions. But the first epsilon rule which replaces Jeffrey’s rule ensures, instead, that there is ‘total upwards correctness’. For if it is false that everything is F then, without any special interpretation of the quantifier, one of the given consequences of the universal statement is false, namely the immediate one — since Fεx¬Fx is in fact equivalent to (x)Fx. A similar improvement also arises with the existential quantifier elimination rule. For Jeffrey can only get ‘limited downwards correctness’, with his existential quantifier elimination rule (Jeffrey 1967, p165), since it is not an entailment. In fact, in order to show that if an initial sentence is true in a valuation so is one of its conclusions, in this case, Jeffrey has to stretch his notion of ‘truth’ to being true either in the given valuation, or some nominal variant of it.

The epsilon rule which replaces Jeffrey’s overcomes this difficulty by not employing names, only demonstrative descriptions, and by being, as a result, totally downward correct. For if there is an F then that F is F, whatever name is used to refer to it. The epsilon calculus terminology thus precedes any naming: it gets hold of the more primitive, demonstrative way we have of referring to objects, using phrases like ‘that F’. Thus in explication of the predicate calculus rule we might well have said

suppose there is an F, well, call that F ‘a’, then Fa,

but that requires we understand ‘that F’ before we come to use ‘a’.

So how does the Second Epsilon Theorem follow? This theorem, as before, states that an epsilon calculus proof of an epsilon-free theorem may be replaced by a predicate calculus proof of the same formula. But the transformation required in the present setting is now evident: simply change to new names all epsilon terms introduced in the epsilon calculus quantifier elimination rules. This covers both the new names in Jeffrey’s first rule, but also the odd case where there are no old names in Jeffrey’s second rule. The epsilon calculus proofs invariably use constant epsilon terms, and are thus effectively in Leisenring’s epsilon star system.

Epsilon terms which are non-constant, however, crucially enter the proof of the First Epsilon Theorem. The First Epsilon Theorem states that if C is a provable predicate calculus formula, in prenex normal form, i.e. with all quantifiers at the front, then a finite disjunction of instances of C’s matrix is provable in the epsilon calculus. The crucial fact is that the epsilon calculus gives us access to Herbrand functions, which arise when universal quantifiers are eliminated from formulas using their epsilon definition. Thus


for instance, is equivalent to


and so


and the resulting epsilon term ‘εxFyx’ is a Herbrand function.

Using such reductions, all universal quantifiers can evidently be removed from formulas in prenex normal form, and the additional fact that, in a certain specific way, the remaining existential quantifiers are disjunctions makes all predicate calculus formulas equivalent to disjunctions. Remember that a formula is provable if its negation is reducible to absurdity, which means that its truth tree must close. But, by König’s Lemma, if there is no open path through a truth tree then there is some finite stage at which there is no open path, so, in the case above, for instance, if no valuation makes the last formula’s negation true, then the tree of the instances of that negative statement must close in a finite length. But the negative statement is the universal formula


by the rules of quantifier interchange, so a finite conjunction of instances of the matrix of this universal formula, namely Fyx, must reduce to absurdity. For the rules of universal quantifier elimination only produce consequences with the form of this matrix. By de Morgan’s Laws, that makes necessary a finite disjunction of instances of ¬Fyx. By generalisation we thus get the First Epsilon Theorem.

The epsilon calculus, however, can take us further than the First Epsilon Theorem. Indeed, one has to take care with the impression this theorem may give that existential statements are just equivalent to disjunctions. If that were the case, then existential statements would be unlike individual statements, saying not that one specified thing has a certain property, but merely that one of a certain group of things has a certain property. The group in question is normally called the ‘domain’ of the quantification, and this, it seems, has to be specified when setting out the semantics of quantifiers. But study of the epsilon calculus shows that there is no need for such ‘domains’, or indeed for such semantics. This is because the example above, for instance, is also equivalent to


where a = εy¬FεxFyx. So the previous disjunction of instances of ¬Fyx is in fact only true because this specific disjunct is true. The First Epsilon Theorem, it must be remembered, does not prove that an existential statement is equivalent to a certain disjunction; it shows merely that an existential statement is provable if and only if a certain disjunction is provable. And what is also provable, in such a case, is a statement merely about one object. Indeed the existential statement is provably equivalent to it. It is this fact which supports the epsilon definition of the quantifiers; and it is what permits anaphoric reference to the same object by means of the same epsilon term. An existential statement is thus just another statement about an individual — merely a nameless one.

The reverse point goes for the universal quantifier: a universal statement is not the conjunction of its instances, even though it implies them. A generalisation is simply equivalent to one of its instances — to the one involving the prime putative exception to it, as we have seen. Not being able to specify that prime putative exception leaves Jeffrey saying that if a generalisation is false then one of its instances is false without any way of ensuring that that instance has been drawn as a conclusion below it in the truth tree except by limiting the interpretation of the generalisation just to the universe of discourse of the path. It thus seems necessary, within the predicate calculus, that there be a ‘model’ for the quantifiers which restricts them to a certain ‘domain’, which means that they do not necessarily range over everything. But in the epsilon calculus the quantifiers do, invariably, range over everything, and so there is no need to specify their range.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Ackermann, W. 1937-8, ‘Mengentheoretische Begründung der Logik’, Mathematische Annalen, 115, 1-22.
  • Asser, G. 1957, ‘Theorie der Logischen Auswahlfunktionen’, Zeitschrift für Mathematische Logik und Grundlagen der Mathematik, 3, 30-68.
  • Bernays, P. 1958, Axiomatic Set Theory, North Holland, Dordrecht.
  • Bertolet, R. 1980, ‘The Semantic Significance of Donnellan’s Distinction’, Philosophical Studies, 37, 281-288.
  • Bourbaki, N. 1954, Éléments de Mathématique, Hermann, Paris.
  • Bunt, H.C. 1985, Mass Terms and Model-Theoretic Semantics, C.U.P., Cambridge.
  • Church, A. 1940, ‘A Formulation of the Simple Theory of Types’, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 5, 56-68.
  • Copi, I. 1973, Symbolic Logic, 4th ed. Macmillan, New York.
  • Devitt, M. 1974, ‘Singular Terms’, The Journal of Philosophy, 71, 183-205.
  • Donnellan, K. 1966, ‘Reference and Definite Descriptions’, Philosophical Review, 75, 281-304.
  • Egli, U. and von Heusinger, K. 1995, ‘The Epsilon Operator and E-Type Pronouns’ in U. Egli et al. (eds.), Lexical Knowledge in the Organisation of Language, Benjamins, Amsterdam.
  • Evans, G. 1977, ‘Pronouns, Quantifiers and Relative Clauses’, Canadian Journal of Philosophy, 7, 467-536.
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Author Information

Barry Hartley Slater
Email: slaterbh@cyllene.uwa.edu.au
University of Western Australia