Epistemic Entitlement

In the early 1990s there emerged a growing interest with the concept of epistemic entitlement. Philosophers who acknowledge the existence of entitlements maintain that there are beliefs or judgments unsupported by evidence available to the subject, but which the subject nonetheless has the epistemic right to hold. Some of these may include beliefs non-inferentially sourced in perception, memory, introspection, testimony, and the a priori.  Unlike the traditional notion of justification, entitlement is often characterized as an externalist type of epistemic warrant, in the sense that a subject’s being entitled is determined by facts and circumstances that are independent of any reasoning capacities she may or may not have, and which the subject herself need not understand or be able to recognize. One key motivation for this view is that the inclusion of entitlement in epistemology can account for the commonly held intuition that largely unreflective individuals, such as children and non-human animals, possess warrant and basic knowledge about the world.  It also paves the way for a tenable foundationalist epistemology, according to which there exist warranted beliefs which are not themselves warranted or justified by any further beliefs.  This article explores theories of entitlement as presented by four prominent philosophers: Fred Dretske, Tyler Burge, Crispin Wright, and Christopher Peacocke.

Table of Contents

  1. Dretske on Entitlement
  2. Burge on Entitlement
  3. Wright on Entitlement
  4. Peacocke on Entitlement
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Dretske on Entitlement

Fred Dretske has argued for the existence of epistemic entitlements.  Like justification, entitlement is an epistemic property of belief which, when the belief is true (and the subject is not in a Gettier-style situation), constitutes knowledge.  Much of Dretske’s work on this topic rises out of his (2000) article: “Entitlements: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?”  Part of understanding his view involves having a grasp of the question being posed in the article’s title.  Unlike justifications, entitlements are epistemic rights we have to believe various propositions without having any added requirements to engage, or be able to engage, in some sophisticated mental exercise.  Considering what is included in the conception of justification, the traditional answer suggests that being justified is a matter of fulfilling various epistemic duties or obligations.  Some of these duties may include: gathering ample evidence, arriving at beliefs carefully and methodically, deliberating over the strength of one’s supportive reasons, and so forth.  For instance, if it is true that Detective Johnson is justified in believing

GUILTY: Smith is guilty of the murder,

then it must be that she has good reasons for thinking GUILTY true, reasons of which she herself is aware and could appeal to if she needed to defend her belief.  Johnson’s reasons may be, for example, that Smith’s fingerprints were on the murder weapon and Smith had strong motive to kill.  Though these sorts of epistemic requirements obtain for beliefs like GUILTY (as we shall assume), Dretske thinks there are other sorts of beliefs you and I have which: (1) amount to genuine knowledge, but that also (2) are not justified in the sense just described.  Consider your perceptual belief that

BRIGHT: There is a bright screen ahead of me,

or a memorial belief that

ATE: I ate breakfast this morning.

Given that you know these propositions, it seems too strong a condition that you must recognize that which provides the epistemic support for these beliefs, or be in a position to defend them by way of some argument.  Additionally, many philosophers think that children and lower animals have perceptual and memorial knowledge, yet they lack the conceptual skills needed to be able to think about what it is that gives them this knowledge.  The point is that the conditions for acquiring a justification for a belief like GUILTY are harder to satisfy than they are for acquiring an entitlement for a belief like BRIGHT.  Thus, Dretske holds that there exists a kind of epistemic good that attaches to our various perceptual beliefs and memorial beliefs (and perhaps others) but which is distinct from the traditional notion of justification.  This epistemic good is what he calls entitlement.  To have an entitlement is to have the epistemic right to believe a proposition in which the possessor need not be consciously reflective of that which awards the entitlement.  (Notice that the relevant kinds of beliefs Dretske has in mind, like BRIGHT or ATE, are about things in the outer world, not our own conscious experiences or memories.)

In this way epistemic entitlements are analogous to various legal or constitutional rights we have.  There is no added physical effort or labor you had to exert to be awarded the right to vote in the U.S. presidential election; you have this right solely in virtue of having the status of being a U.S. citizen and at least eighteen years old.  Indeed, you have this right whether or not you know that you do.  The same goes for one’s right to the property bequeathed by a passing family member.  The recipient did not have to do anything to “earn” her entitlement to that property; that she is simply listed in the will suffices.  Similarly, what gives people the epistemic right, or entitlement, to hold various beliefs is determined by circumstances independent of any reasoning capacities they may or may not have.  A subject may have an entitlement to her belief even if she is unaware that she has it.

Before proceeding, note that Dretske is operating with a narrow characterization of justification.  He thinks that justification is an epistemically internalist notion in the sense that to be justified in holding a belief, there must be some proposition (or propositions) one already believes and which one has reflective access to and could be used to justify that belief.  On the other hand, entitlement receives an externalist characterization in the sense that one can have an entitlement without having access to that which makes one entitled.  It is worth mentioning, however, that not all epistemologists understand justification in the way Dretske does.  Whereas for Dretske, the things that do the justifying are other beliefs one has, some internalists allow other sorts of mental states, like perceptual experiences and memories, to count as reasons or justifications (Audi 1993 and Pryor 2000).  Also, some philosophers prefer to use ‘internalism’ simply as the claim that the things that justify a belief are internal to one’s mental life.  One could be an internalist about justification in this weaker sense, which is commonly referred to as mentalism (see Conee and Feldman 2003), without requiring that one be able to access or become aware of one’s justifying mental states or to believe that these states are reliable.  Thus, according to a mentalist, a child may be justified in believing BRIGHT, provided that it is properly grounded in her experience of a bright screen ahead, even if the child does not herself recognize her experience as that which makes her justified.  The point is that Dretskean entitlement, if it is a distinctive epistemic concept, differs from justification only as understood in Dretske’s restricted sense of the term as that of being backed by other beliefs to which one could appeal in support of one’s belief.

The main question Dretske wishes to answer is: if there are things we are entitled to accept as true, what grounds this entitlement?  In other words, what entitles us to believe various propositions?  It is important to emphasize that these are questions posed specifically to philosophers; entitled subjects themselves need not know, and quite often do not know, the answer to them.  Dretske begins his answer by distancing his view of entitlement from a pure reliabilist view that one has the epistemic right to the belief that p if and only if the belief that p was produced by a reliable process.  For a pure reliabilist, given that your perceptual system produced your belief that BRIGHT, and assuming that perception yields true beliefs on most occasions, you are epistemically permitted to hold this belief.  But according to Dretske, there are (at least) two reasons why entitlement must not be associated with this form of reliabilism.  First, one can surely hold what is in fact a reliably-produced belief while at the same time having independent reasons for doubting its truth (for example, you have evidence that you’ve taken a mind-altering drug, yet you continue to trust your senses as they indicate a three-foot bumble bee).  To maintain the belief in such a situation would, intuitively, be irrational on the subject’s part, which, it seems, would thereby strip the subject of her epistemic right to that belief.  However, by concentrating entirely on the reliability of a belief-forming process, a pure reliabilist cannot accommodate this intuition.  Entitlement must therefore be understood as a defeasible epistemic right, one that can be defeated by countervailing evidence.  Secondly, Dretske holds that entitlements supervene on the subjective resources of the subject.  This implies that two subjects with identical psychological make-ups cannot differ with respect to the entitlements they possess (For this reason, it is plausible that Dretskean entitlement has an element of internalism, but only of the weaker, mentalist sort described above).  For example, suppose there is some being who has the exact same experiences, beliefs, methods of reasoning, and so forth, as you do.  Suppose further that this “mental twin” of yours is, unbeknownst to her, nothing but a bodiless brain in a vat whose experiences are systematically being fed by a powerful supercomputer.  While your perceptual system is highly reliable (as we shall assume), your twin’s system is massively unreliable, because all of her experiences and corresponding beliefs are erroneous.  According to a pure reliabilist, then, whereas you have the epistemic right to believe BRIGHT when you have an experience of a bright screen before you, your envatted twin lacks the right to BRIGHT when she has the exact same experience.  Dretske, however, thinks that this is the wrong result. (The sort of case described here is commonly referred to as the New Evil Demon Problem, first introduced by Lehrer & Cohen 1983.)  He thinks it is intuitively correct that your twin has the right to believe whatever you have a right to believe, even if your beliefs are true and her’s false.  You have knowledge and your twin lacks it because knowledge requires truth and your twin’s beliefs are false; however, it seems that the unfortunate twin still retains some epistemic good.  The correct account of entitlement should allow for this intuition and therefore be suited to award entitlements to subjects who are in unfavorable, illusory environments. (Although the New Evil Demon Problem does pose a challenge to the pure version of reliabilism Dretske considers, it bears mentioning that several philosophers have advanced other versions of reliabilism which purport to avoid this problem.  See, for instance, Bach 1985, Goldman 1988, Comesaña 2002, Majors and Sawyer 2005.)

If the concept of entitlement is not grounded in the reliability of a belief-forming process, what is it grounded in?  Dretske argues that we have entitlements to beliefs which are psychologically immediate and irresistible to us.  There are certain sorts of beliefs over which we have no choice whether we hold them or not.  Perceptual beliefs are a prime example.  As you gaze your eyes on a computer screen, your visual experience of a bright screen causes you to believe BRIGHT.  The causal sequence between experience and belief is simply out of your control, and it occurs much too quickly to avoid it.  This fact about our psychologies, that we cannot resist some of our beliefs, is what accounts for our entitlements.  As Dretske says, “We have a right to accept what we are powerless to reject” (2000, p. 598).  In saying this, Dretske appeals to the well-known principle that ‘Ought implies Can’.  Given that you are unable to refrain from believing BRIGHT, it would be unreasonable to suppose that you epistemically ought not to believe it.  If this is correct, then we can see how your brain-in-a-vat twin is entitled to believe BRIGHT.  Although her experience of the screen is inaccurate, and her perceptual system is unreliable, she enjoys an entitlement to her belief because she is equally as compelled to form the belief as you are.

Entitlements are defeated when the formation of a belief is avoidable, that is, when there are things the subject could have done, or more precisely, should have done that would have prevented her from being caused to believe.  Suppose, for example, that you have independent evidence from a credible source that you are now looking at a well-crafted poster of a computer screen instead of a real one.  Suppose further that you disregard this evidence, so that when you have the experience of a bright screen you are caused to believe BRIGHT.  In this sort of case you lack an entitlement to this belief, because had you been properly responsive to the evidence in your possession, your experience would have failed to cause you to believe BRIGHT.  One might interject here that this suggestion runs contrary to Dretske’s original proposal, because even though you have ignored the countervailing evidence, you still cannot avoid being compelled to believe BRIGHT when you had the experience.  In response, Dretske maintains that entitlements should be reserved only for those beliefs that an epistemically responsible agent could not avoid being caused to form in similar circumstances.  Because of this, given that you have this evidence, you epistemically ought to refrain from believing BRIGHT.  Analogously, when a drunk driver accidentally runs over a child in the street, it may be that the driver is, at that time, in a situation where hitting the child was unavoidable.  We do not say, though, that the driver therefore had the right to run over the child.  The reason the driver is culpable for the accident is that were she more responsible, she would have taken measures to ensure that she did not get into the situation in the first place (for example, by taking a taxi home rather than driving).  Similarly, even if you cannot avoid being caused by your experience to believe BRIGHT, your entitlement to that belief is stripped because a responsible agent in that same circumstance, recognizing that she has evidence that she is looking at a computer-screen poster, would have avoided being so caused.

We will now consider two objections to Dretske’s view.  First, Michael Williams (2000) rejects Dretske’s contention that epistemic rights can exist in the complete absence of any epistemic duties.  Given that Dretske takes entitlements to be defeasible rights, it is plausible that were one’s belief challenged by another person, that would cancel the entitlement one had to that belief.  The only way to re-establish the entitlement, it seems, would be by providing reasons that defeat the challenge.  If this is right, it suggests that Dretske overstates his position that entitlements are completely free of justificational obligations.  While it may be correct that we need not actively provide positive evidential backing for every belief to which we are entitled, having an entitlement requires that one at least be able to justify or defend one’s belief in situations when one is presented with an appropriate challenge.  As Williams notes, defeasibility and justificational commitments go together.  The result, presumably, is that most young children and unreflective adults would lack entitlements to many of their perceptual and memorial beliefs, for they may lack the cognitive resources needed to be able to defend their own beliefs. However, this is a result some philosophers are willing to accept.

As for the second objection, many philosophers think that insofar as entitlements are epistemic goods that contribute to knowledge, they must be suitably connected to truth; they must be truth-conducive, or have a sufficiently high likelihood of being true.  But this suggestion appears to be at odds with Dretske’s claim that your brain-in-a-vat mental twin, whose beliefs are almost all false, is entitled to the same beliefs that you are.  One way epistemologists sometimes react to the New Evil Demon Problem is to draw a distinction between two kinds of epistemic standings: being epistemically blameless for holding a belief, on the one hand, and being fully entitled (or justified or warranted) in holding a belief, such that having this property makes an essential contribution to knowledge, on the other (see Pryor 2001).  According to this distinction, whereas you are entitled to the belief (and also know) that BRIGHT, your envatted twin is merely blameless when she forms the same belief.  It is through no fault of her own that she arrives at a false, unreliably-produced belief; nonetheless, she lacks an epistemic right which you possess.  She is simply unlucky that her experiences and beliefs are not connected to the external world in the proper way.

In response to this charge, one could claim that the envatted subject’s beliefs are conducive to truth, but only relative to more favorable environments (see Goldman 1986 and Henderson & Horgan 2006).  Given that the brain in a vat is a responsible agent, her beliefs would be mostly true if she were in an environment similar to the actual one.  Alternatively, one could deny that a distinction between being blameless and being entitled (or justified or warranted) exists at all.  The suggestion would be that to be justly entitled is for you (or an epistemically responsible agent) to be blameless in holding the belief (for defenders of this move see Ginet 1975, Chisholm 1977, and Bonjour 1985; for objections see Alston 1989a).  Whether either of these options have promise, however, is something that Dretske would need to argue for.

2. Burge on Entitlement

Tyler Burge has argued that “[w]e are entitled to rely, other things equal, on perception, memory, deductive and inductive reasoning, and on…the word of others” (1993, p. 458).  Because his work on perceptual entitlement is arguably the most developed, we shall focus our attention on perceptual beliefs: beliefs non-inferentially based on a perceptual experience.

Burge begins by introducing the concept of warrant, which he says is the most fundamental type of epistemic good.  What makes it specifically an epistemic good is that a belief’s being warranted depends first and foremost on its being a good route to truth.  Yet, it also depends on the subject’s own limitations: what information the subject has; what information is available; and how well that information is used.  Thus, when he says warrant must be a good route to truth, he does not mean that warranted beliefs necessarily are true; one can be warranted in a belief which happens to be false.  Nonetheless, the warranted subject must, at a minimum, be well-positioned to achieve truth.  Being warranted entails being reliable, that is, the productive warranted belief has a sufficiently high likelihood of being true (at least under normal circumstances).

Warrant is divided into two sub-species.  The first is justification.  Justification is epistemically internalist in the sense that it is warrant by reason that is conceptually accessible upon reflection to the subject.  Beliefs we are justified in holding are those that result from having engaged in reasoning or from having drawn an inference from other beliefs (Consider again the example from the previous section in which Johnson infers that Smith is guilty on the basis of her reasons that Smith’s fingerprints were on the murder weapon and he had motive to kill).  But when we turn to the epistemology of perceptual belief, Burge thinks the transition from a perceptual state (for example, seeing a round and red apple on the table) to a belief (for example, APPLE: There is round and red apple there) is nothing at all like drawing an inference.  In most typical situations, we do not reason our way from experience to belief; hence the warrant for our perceptual beliefs must not come in the form of justification.  There are two primary reasons why Burge thinks this is so.  First, reasoning is a sophisticated, intellectual mental exercise.  The capacities necessary for reasoning are too complex for us to plausibly attribute them to certain groups of individuals, like children and higher non-human animals.  If justification were the only form of warrant that there is, these individuals’ perceptual beliefs would lack warrant; yet it is commonly thought that these individuals are no less warranted in their perceptual beliefs than mature adults are.  The second reason why it’s wrong to think we reason from experience to belief is that reasoning essentially involves progressing from one or more propositional attitudes one has, like a belief, to another as one would draw a conclusion from the premises of an argument.  But Burge argues that perceptual states are not propositional attitudes.  In other words, perception has nonpropositional content (see also Evans 1982, Peacock 2001, Heck 2007).  Whereas a belief’s content (or what that belief concerns or is about) has predicational (or sentence-like) structure, perceptual content does not.  The content of a perceptual state is more akin to a topographical map rather than a sentence. (For more on nonpropositional perceptual content, see Peacocke 1992.) Therefore, unlike beliefs, experiences are not the kinds of mental states from which one can draw inferences.  Nonetheless, what is common among beliefs and perceptual states, and unlike other kinds of mental states like wishes and imaginings, is that they are both capable of being veridical: they have accuracy conditions that can be either satisfied or unsatisfied.

Given that perceptual beliefs are not justified in the sense just described, the type of warrant they receive must come under a different form.  This brings us to the second sub-species of warrant: entitlement.  Burgean entitlement is epistemically externalist in the sense that it is warrant that need not be fully conceptually accessible to the subject.  Like Dretskean entitlement, one can have a Burgean entitlement to a perceptual belief, such as APPLE, without knowing or justifiably believing that one does.  Also similar to Dretske’s view is the claim that entitlement is a defeasible kind of epistemic good: it can be defeated by independent reasons one may have for doubting that one’s perceptual faculties are properly functioning or that the believed proposition in question is true.  Thus, absent reasons for doubt, one has an entitlement to conceptualize one’s perceptual experience in the form of a belief (for example, to believe APPLE when one has an experience of a round, red apple).

As one clarification, Burge’s claim is not that entitlement is the only kind of warrant that can attach to perceptual beliefs.  People certainly can, and do, reason and deliberate about these sorts of beliefs.  One can think, for example: “There appears to be a round and red apple, and when things appear this way they generally turn out to be accurate.  Therefore, there is a round and red apple there.”  This is a perfectly permissible way to reason, and doing so can result in acquiring a justification in addition to the perceptual entitlement one already possesses.  The crucial point is that securing a warrant for this belief does not require that one reasons, or be able to reason, in this way.  To impose such a requirement on all forms of warrant would result, as Burge says, in hyper-intellectualizing perceptual belief.

The key question Burge wants to answer is: What is the contribution of perceptual states per se to entitlements to perceptual beliefs?  He thinks that two conditions must be met in order for a perceptual state to award the subject the epistemic right to believe as that state represents the world as being.  To understand what these conditions are, it is important first to appreciate Burge’s claim that the perceptual system has a characteristic function.  Some philosophers have argued that the function of any natural system can only be understood in terms of how it contributes to meeting the basic biological needs of the organism (see Millikan 1984).  For example, on this view the perceptual system functions well only insofar as it enables the perceiver to identify mates, avoid predators, find food, and so on.  Burge, however, distances himself from this sort of explanation.  He holds instead that it is known on a priori grounds that the perceptual system is a representational system that has the function to represent the subject’s environment veridically and reliably (2003, p. 508).  Although he agrees that reliable perception can, and oftentimes does, contribute to satisfying one’s biological needs (for example, being able to perceptually discriminate different colors can help one spot red berries to eat in a green forest), it is a mistake for philosophers to attempt to reduce the perceptual system’s function or explain it solely in terms of biological fitness.  The sense in which the perceptual system “has done a good job” in a given situation should be evaluated in terms of its capacity for producing veridical perceptual states.

Provided that this is the perceptual system’s function, there is the further question of how the system is capable of producing states that accurately represent the environment.  Burge’s answer centers on the thesis of perceptual anti-individualism (sometimes called perceptual content externalism).  According to this thesis, the nature of a perceptual state (what that state represents) is partially determined by a history of causal interactions that have occurred between objects and properties in the environment, on the one hand, and the perceiver, or the perceiver’s evolutionary ancestors, on the other (see Burge 2003; 2005, Section I; 2007, Introduction; 2007a).  What explains the fact that you are capable of (accurately or inaccurately) perceptually representing, say, shapes like roundness and colors like redness in the environment is that you, within your own lifetime, or your ancestors throughout the evolution of the species, regularly came into contact with various features in the environment, such as instances of these very shapes and colors.  According to the view, these causal interactions help to establish the principles that govern the formation of the perceptual system’s states and inform the perceptual system of what it ought to represent when it is presented, in a given situation, with some array of stimuli (for example, light waves impacting the retina in the eyes or sound waves impacting the ear drums).

Thus one of the conditions that must be met for a perceptual state to confer an entitlement to a corresponding perceptual belief is that the state is anti-individualistically individuated.  The other condition is as follows: one has an entitlement to believe as one’s perceptual state represents the environment as being, only if that type of perceptual state is reliably veridical in the subject’s normal environment.  Burge defines the normal environment as the one in which the contents of the subject’s perceptual states are established.  What this means is that for those perceptual states that do deliver entitlements, the existence of those types of perceptual states (for example, a state indicating roundness or redness) is explained by a history of causal interactions that were highly successful.  That is, one has the general ability to perceptually represent property F because the perceptual system, in its evolutionary development, regularly confronted instances of F-ness in the environment.  Thus, the normal environment might be where one currently lives, but it need not be.  It is possible that the environment a subject currently lives in is different from the one in which her perceptual system evolved, where she, or her ancestors, first acquired the abilities to represent various objects and properties.

The reason why this second condition is important is that entitlement, insofar as it is a type of epistemic warrant, must be a good route to truth.  Provided that perceptual states are established by high degrees of successful interactions with features in the environment, and hence are reliably veridical in the normal environment, “[v]eridicality enters into the very nature of perceptual states and abilities.” (Burge 2003, p. 532) To rely on a particular perceptual state the general type of which was established in this fashion in the formation of a belief makes it likely that that belief is true in the normal environment.

Burge goes on to argue that when these two conditions are met (that is, the perceptual state is anti-individualistically individuated and it is reliably veridical in the normal environment) one has a defeasible entitlement to rely on that state in any environment.  This further point provides a novel solution to the New Evil Demon Problem, which was discussed in the previous section.  Recall that this problem draws on a commonly held intuition that subjects in skeptical situations can hold warranted beliefs.  Suppose you are a regular embodied person, and an apple on the table causes you to have a perceptual experience of a round and red apple, which subsequently causes you to believe APPLE.  At the very next instant you are unknowingly transported to a different world where your brain is placed in a vat, and a computer produces the same experiences you were just having in your regular embodied state.  You have the exact same experience of a round and red apple, except that now the experience is inaccurate (there are no apples nearby, just other brains and computer equipment).  Not only is your belief false, it was produced by an unreliable process relative to this new environment.  Nevertheless, you still possess an entitlement to this belief, because the perceptual state that produced it (that is, your experience of the round and red apple) is reliably veridical, relative to the normal environment.  Because it was interactions with genuine apples (in the actual world) and instances of roundness and redness that helped to establish this type of perceptual state, you retain the epistemic right to believe as your experience represents, even though it is currently not at all indicative of what is going on in this new hostile environment.

We will now consider two criticisms of Burgean entitlement.  As for the first criticism, Burge states explicitly that his view of entitlement is not meant to speak to the problem of skepticism.  His objective is not to prove that we have perceptual entitlements, but rather to explain on the assumption that we do have them what they are.  But some epistemologists might urge that skepticism needs to be addressed in order to get his view off the ground.  Skeptical issues have typically been raised in connection with epistemic closure, which states roughly:

(Closure)    If subject S is warranted in believing that p, and S knows that p logically entails q, and S deduces q on the basis of p, then S is warranted in believing that q.

Suppose I have a warrant in the form of a Burgean perceptual entitlement to believe HAND (that I have hands).  HAND logically entails ~BIV (that I am not a handless brain in a vat).  According to Closure, I would be warranted in believing ~BIV were I to deduce it from HAND.  But many think this procedure makes it much too easy to secure warrant for beliefs like ~BIV.  It is unclear what Burge’s position on this matter is, but it is something he may need to speak to if his view is to be tenable.  Note finally that Dretske is not faced with the same problem, because he rejects closure altogether (Dretske 2005).

A different sort of criticism has to do with whether there is any real conceptual difference between how Burge characterizes entitlement and how other epistemologists have characterized justification.  Albert Casullo (2009) argues that there is not.  As we have seen, the chief distinction between justification and entitlement, according to Burge, is:

(ACC) Justification is warrant that is conceptually accessible to the subject, and entitlement is warrant that need not be conceptually accessible to the subject.

It is not immediately clear, says Casullo, what is meant by the term ‘access’ or ‘accessible’, and he suggests three possible interpretations:

A1) Subject S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the epistemic ground that warrants S’s belief, that is, to the content of S’s warranting experience or belief.

A2) S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the adequacy of that ground, that is, to the justification for the belief that S’s ground is adequate to warrant the belief that p.

A3) S has access to the warrant for S’s belief that p if S has access to the epistemic principle governing the ground of S’s belief that p, that is, to the conditions under which the ground warrants the belief that p and the conditions under which that warrant is undermined.

Bearing these separate interpretations in mind, Casullo provides textual evidence from Burge’s works that ACC should be read as claiming that justification satisfies A1 and A3 but not A2, whereas entitlement satisfies A1 but not A2 or A3.  But if this is the sense in which entitlements need not be accessible to the subject, this is just the view William Alston (1989b) had already proposed, which he calls an internalist externalism account of justification.  Thus, Casullo contends that any differences that exist between Burgean entitlement and Alstonian justification are terminological at best.

3. Wright on Entitlement

Crispin Wright’s approach to entitlement is motivated primarily by an attempt to ward off skeptical paradoxes.  In his (2004) paper, “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” he introduces the notion of a “cornerstone proposition” for a given region of thought, according to which “it would follow from a lack of warrant for it that one could not rationally claim warrant for any belief in that region” (p. 167-68).  The skeptical project involves two steps: (1) make a case that a certain proposition, which we characteristically accept, is a cornerstone for a much wider class of belief, and (2) argue that we lack warrant for that proposition.  Wright then identifies two general patterns of skeptical reasoning that deploy these two steps.  The first comes from the Cartesian skeptic, who argues that the proposition that we are not cognitively detached from reality (instances of which come in the more common skeptical-scenario varieties like ‘I am not dreaming’ or ‘I am not a brain in a vat’, and so forth) is a cornerstone proposition for our ordinary perceptual beliefs. As for this latter claim, the skeptic reasons that for any procedure one might utilize to try to determine, say, that one is not dreaming (for example, pinching oneself or trying to read the lines of a newspaper), one must already have an independent warrant for thinking that the procedure was executed properly, and moreover that one did not simply dream carrying it out.  But since utilizing any such procedure would require that one already have warrant for believing that one is not dreaming, there is no procedure one could effectively utilize to gain a warrant for this proposition.  Thus, our perceptual beliefs are unwarranted.

The second kind of skeptic, the Humean skeptic, reveals an implicit circularity embedded in our practices of inductive reasoning, where the observance of facts about a sample population causes us to make a claim about all of the population’s members (for example, the inference from ‘All observed Fs are G’ to ‘All Fs are G’).  The inductive inference relies on one’s being warranted in accepting a cornerstone proposition, which Wright calls the Uniformity Thesis: that nature abounds in regularities.  However, there is no way to gain warrant for the Uniformity Thesis, because this could only be accomplished by relying on induction itself (For an overview of the Humean Problem of Induction, see Stroud 1977).

According to Wright, the skeptical problem can be generalized in the following way:  Let P be a proposition representing some feature of observable reality (for example, ‘I have hands’), where the best and as the skeptic will argue only evidence in favor of P is rooted in perceptual experience.  To arrive at an anti-skeptical conclusion, one will typically deploy what Wright calls the I-II-III argument:

I: My current experience is in all respects as if P


III: There is a material world

The same argumentative structure can be utilized to refute skepticisms of a variety of subject matters.  For instance, where I stands for ‘X’s behavior and physical condition are in all respects as if X is in mental state M’, III stands for ‘There are minds besides my own’.  Or where I stands for ‘I seem to remember it being the case that P yesterday’, III stands for ‘The world did not come into being today replete with apparent traces of a more extended history’.  Although the I-II-III argument may appear to warrant the conclusion, Wright contests that it engenders a failure of warrant transmission, a notion he has developed (2003).  According to Wright, it is oftentimes the case that a body of evidence e is an information-dependent warrant for a proposition P, where e is an information-dependent warrant for P if whether e is correctly regarded as warranting P depends on what one has by way of collateral information C.  In cases where C is entailed by P, the warrant for P (which is sourced in e) would fail to transmit to C, were one to infer C from P.  Setting the skeptical problem aside for the moment, consider one of Wright’s own examples.  Suppose that e is your experience of seeing a ball kicked into a net, from which you infer P, the proposition that a goal has just been scored.  Let C be the proposition that a soccer game is in progress.  Now, although C is a logical consequence of P, were you to start with e and infer P and subsequently deduce C, this chain of reasoning could not provide you with any new warrant for believing C, because e’s warranting you in believing P presupposes that you already have a warrant for believing C.  That is, the warrant for P fails to transmit to C because P cannot be warranted (by e) unless C is something for which you already have warrant.

Returning to the anti-skeptical I-II-III argument, Wright claims that III (‘There is an external world’) is a cornerstone proposition for a range of observation-sourced propositions which may be expressed by II (for example, ‘I have hands’).  The point is that whether I successfully warrants II depends on one’s already having warrant for III.  But the warrant for III cannot come by way of the I-II-III argument.  One crucial difference between this situation and the soccer example is that whereas there are means by which you can secure independent warrant for the proposition that a soccer game is in progress (you can, for example, look up the start time of the game in the local newspaper), there appears to be no way to acquire warrant, independent of one’s experiential evidence, for the proposition that there is an external world.  The skeptic will therefore conclude that type-III propositions are unwarranted, and as they are cornerstones so are the associated type-II propositions.

Wright’s aim is not to defend but rather to alleviate skeptical worries.  His strategy is to argue that we do possess warrant for type-III cornerstone propositions, but that warrant does not come in the form of evidential justification, as the skeptic assumes it must.  He says:

Suppose there is a type of rational warrant which one does not have to do any specific evidential work to earn: better, a type of rational warrant whose possession does not require the existence of evidence in the broadest sense encompassing both a priori and empirical considerations for the truth of the warranted proposition.  Call it entitlement.  If I am entitled to accept P, then my doing so is beyond rational reproach even though I can point to no cognitive accomplishment in my life, whether empirical or a priori, inferential or non-inferential, whose upshot could reasonably be contended to be that I had come to know that P, or had succeeded in getting evidence justifying P (2004, p. 174-75).

According to Wright, we have entitlements to accept various cornerstone propositions, such as: ‘There is an external world’; ‘There are other minds’; ‘The world has an ancient past’; and ‘There are regularities present in nature’.  Entitlement is a kind of rational warrant that, unlike justification, does not depend on one’s having evidence one could point to that would speak to the truth of the proposition in question.  Whereas Detective Johnson’s believing that Smith is guilty of the murder is underwritten by her own cognitive accomplishment, by way of basing that belief on recognizable empirical evidence (see Section I above), and is therefore justified, entitlements are secured in a different way.  Similar to the views of both Dretske and Burge, having a Wrightean entitlement to accept a proposition does not require that one be able to think about what it is that gives one the entitlement (Wright 2007, Fn 6).  If Wright’s proposal is tenable, we find a way to circumvent the skeptical problem: we have unearned warrants (in the form of entitlements) to type-III propositions that are acquired independently of the I-II-III argument. Hence the skeptic has no grounds for accusing the anti-skeptic of viciously circular reasoning.

It is helpful to briefly compare and contrast Wrightean entitlement with the Burgean view discussed in the previous section.  One interesting similarity has to do with the connection between entitlement and justification as they relate to the structure of our warranted beliefs.  For both Burge and Wright, entitlements reside at the very foundation of the epistemic architecture of our beliefs.  All of our justified beliefs are ultimately based upon, or at least presuppose, entitlements.  For this reason, defenders of the entitlement-justification distinction are naturally affiliated with foundationalism, the view that there exist warranted beliefs which are not themselves warranted, or justified, by any further beliefs to which one could appeal.  In contrast, those who deny that such a distinction exists naturally steer toward coherentism or holism (see Sellars 1963, Davidson 1986, Cohen 2002).  However, Burge and Wright differ with respect to the propositions they claim reside at the foundation.  As we saw in the previous section, Burgean entitlements attach to beliefs concerning ordinary objects and properties in the world, which are non-inferentially sourced in perception, testimony, and memory.  The beliefs we rationally infer on the basis of them are justified.  In contrast, Wrightean entitlements attach to cornerstone propositions.  Although we do not typically infer further propositions on the basis of them, cornerstones provide the vital preconditions needed for our experiences or memory states to evidentially justify other (type-II) propositions.

Related to this last point, Burge can be seen as taking a liberal stance toward perceptual warrant, in that one’s experience alone provides one with immediate, non-inferential warrant for one’s perceptual beliefs.  In contrast, Wright adopts epistemic conservatism, according to which an experience provides warrant for a perceptual belief only on the condition that one has a prior warrant to accept the relevant type-III propositions (The terms ‘liberal’ and ‘conservative’ in epistemology are due to Pryor 2004.  See also Wright 2007).

One question that Wright raises is: What do our entitlements give us the right to do? Whereas for both Dretske and Burge our entitlements are rights to believe propositions, Wright has a different answer.  He suggests that part of what it is to hold a belief attitude toward a proposition is for that attitude to be controlled by reasoning and evidence.  Since entitlements are characteristically unaccompanied by evidence, he denies that they attach to belief.  Rather, where P is a proposition to which we have an entitlement, we are entitled to accept P.  Acceptance is a general kind of attitude of which belief is only one mode.  But, if belief is not the appropriate mode of acceptance for entitlement, what is it?  One suggestion Wright considers is ‘acting on the assumption that P’, but he immediately dismisses this because one can surely act on the assumption that a proposition is true while at the same time remaining agnostic or even skeptical of its truth.  Because entitlements provide essential preconditions for our having any warrant at all, whatever kind of attitude we have entitlements to must be something wherein one’s coming to doubt its truth would commit one to doubting the competence of the particular project in question.  Wright in the end settles on our having an entitlement to rationally trust P, where trust is a kind of acceptance weaker than belief (because it is not controlled by evidence), but stronger than acting on the assumption (because one is non-evidentially committed to the truth of P).

Wright’s position on what we have entitlements to raises a serious question regarding epistemic closure, according to which it is a necessary condition on being justified in believing P that one is also justified in believing those propositions one knows to be entailed by P.  Thus, given that my experience as of hands justifies me in believing HAND (the type-II proposition that I have hands), and I know that this entails ~BIV (the type-III proposition that I am not a handless brain in a vat) I must also be justified, according to closure, in believing ~BIV.  Yet, although Wright maintains that we have non-evidential entitlements to rationally trust type-III propositions, he denies that we are justified in believing them.  His proposal, therefore, appears to be at odds with closure.

In response to this alleged problem, Wright advises that we should qualify standard closure principles in such a way that we need not accept that evidentially justified belief is closed under known entailment.  Rather, if we let warrant range disjunctively over both entitlement and justification, we can allow that warranted acceptance (which ranges over belief; taking for granted; rational trust; acting on the assumption; and so forth) is so closed.  Thus, given that I am warranted in accepting HAND (in the form of a justified belief), and also that I know HAND entails ~BIV, I am warranted in accepting ~BIV (in the form of an entitled trust).  The upshot is that the warrant for a type-III proposition does not come by way inferring it from the related type-II proposition (for the type-II fails to transmit its warrant to the type-III), but this is nonetheless consistent with Wright’s qualified closure principle.

We will now consider two possible objections to Wright’s view.  As for the first objection, many will agree that:

(*) If it were antecedently reasonable to reject a type-III proposition, the warrant for the relevant type-II propositions would be removed.

The skeptic takes this thought one step further and concludes that:

(**) Type-II propositions can be warranted only if it is antecedently reasonable to accept type-III propositions.

Wright endorses (**), prompting him to characterize entitlements as positive warrants to trust.  However, Martin Davies (2004) has argued that by accepting (**), Wright concedes too much to the skeptic.  Instead, Davies claims that the inference from (*) to (**) is invalid: from the fact that my having reasonable doubt that ~BIV would defeat my warrant for believing HAND, it does not follow that I must have warrant for ~BIV in order to have warrant for HAND.  An alternative strategy would be to agree that doubt of ~BIV would defeat the warrant for HAND, while at the same time denying that one needs warranted trust in ~BIV in order for my experience as of hands to warrant HAND.  Davies thinks both of these claims can be met by attributing a different kind of entitlement to type-III propositions like ~BIV.  His suggestion is that we have entitlements not to doubt, not to call in question, or not to bother about, type-III propositions (2004, p. 226).  Thus, whereas a Wrightean entitlement is an entitlement to adopt a positive attitude of trust, Davies holds that it is an entitlement to adopt a negative attitude of not doubting; one would not need any positive warrant, earned or unearned, for type-III propositions to have warrant for type-II propositions.  One could take this approach one step even further and claim that type-II propositions do, contrary to what Wright says, transmit their warrants to type-III propositions.  In other words, the I-II-III argument is epistemically victorious: where I have no reason to doubt that I am a brain in a vat, my experience as of hands warrants me in believing HAND, which thereby warrants me in believing ~BIV when I draw the inference.  Whether or not this is a plausible anti-skeptical outcome is highly controversial (For a defense, see Pryor 2000 and 2004; for a rejection, see Cohen 2002).

A second objection to Wright’s view comes from Carrie Jenkins (2007), who has argued that even if we grant Wright that it is rational for us to accept, without evidence, cornerstone propositions, this cannot be an epistemic kind of rationality.  For any proposition P, one can be epistemically rational in accepting P only if one’s acceptance is brought about in a way that addresses the specific question of whether P is true.  Thus, in order for it to be epistemically rational of you to accept the proposition that China is the most populous country, your coming into this state of acceptance must be due, in part at least, to the fact that you take it to be true that China is the most populous country.  However, where P is a cornerstone proposition, like “My sensory apparatus is properly connected to the external world,” one’s acceptance of P is divorced from any considerations on the truth or falsity of P.  Instead, on the Wrightean view, accepting P is rational, roughly, because its acceptance is necessary in order to undertake the indispensible cognitive project of forming beliefs about the world based on perception.  This is a different kind of rationality, grounded not in terms of whether P is true, but in what fortunate consequences would result from one’s accepting P.  This is similar to the sense in which it would be rational (perhaps practically rational) for a runner in a race to believe she is not tired, since the act of forming this belief could actually prevent her from slowing down in the race.  It is doubtful that we could have epistemic entitlements to cornerstone propositions without it being epistemically rational to accept them.  This creates an obstacle for Wright given that his ultimate aim is to resolve the problem of skepticism in epistemology.

4. Peacocke on Entitlement

In his book, The Realm of Reason, Christopher Peacocke argues that we have entitlements to our perceptual beliefs, a priori beliefs, beliefs based on inductive inference, beliefs about our own actions, and moral beliefs.  Our entitlements to the latter four classes of belief are explained as extensions and consequences of the explanatory structure of our entitlement to perceptual beliefs.  Accordingly, this section will focus on Peacocke’s account of perceptual entitlement.

Peacocke does not distinguish entitlement from justification in the way that Dretske, Burge, and Wright do.  His notion of ‘entitlement’ is intended to range over both inferential and non-inferential transitions between mental states.  For Peacocke, entitlement plays a more central role in epistemology, for he claims that a judgment or belief is knowledge only if it is reached by a transition to which the subject is entitled.  Indeed, at times he seems to use the terms ‘entitlement’ and ‘justification’ interchangeably.  So, whereas for Dretske, Burge, and Wright, entitlements and justifications are distinct epistemic goods that make separable contributions to knowledge, Peacocke seems only to be operating with one epistemic concept, which he frequently refers to as entitlement.  As for another difference, we saw that entitlements for Burge and Dretske attach to beliefs, while Wrightean entitlements attach to attitudes of rational trust.  For Peacocke, we have entitlements not only to beliefs or judgments, but also to the transitions that link beliefs to antecedent mental states.  So, part of what it takes to have a perceptual entitlement to the belief, for example, that there is something round ahead, is that one is also entitled to the transition that brings one from having an experience of something round to the formation of that belief.  Nonetheless, a crucial element of Peacockean entitlement common to those of the other three authors discussed in this article is his position that “[a] thinker may be entitled to make a judgment without having the capacity to think about the states which entitle him to make the judgment” (2004, p. 7).

In order to understand Peacocke’s account of perceptual entitlement, it is important first to appreciate two conditions he thinks any transition must meet in order to award a subject an entitlement.  The first condition is conveyed in what he calls the Special Truth Conduciveness Thesis:

A fundamental and irreducible part of what makes a transition one to which one is entitled is that the transition tends to lead to true judgments…in a distinctive way characteristic of rational transitions (2004, p. 11).

Here we see that Peacocke agrees with Burge that entitlement (or for Burge, all forms of warrant) must be a good route to truth.  A necessary condition on entitlement for both Peacocke and Burge is that whichever state produces the entitled judgment or belief is a reliable indicator of the way things are in the world.  Note that this condition is not necessary for Dretskean entitlement, for it could be that a fully responsible agent cannot avoid believing there to be a bright screen ahead of her while her perceptual faculties are in fact highly unreliable (as would be the case were the agent a brain in a vat).  But the principle also implies that not just any transition leading to true judgments is sufficient for an entitlement.  In addition, the transition must be one that is characteristic of rational transitions.  Some processes encompass transitions between states which are highly reliable, yet these transitions are not what we would consider rational.  For example, suppose that due to some psychological defect, whenever I see a cardinal fly above me, this visual experience causes me to judge that the St. Louis Cardinals baseball team won today.  By sheer coincidence the only time that I see cardinals flying are on days when the Cardinals happen to win.  This transition between the state of seeing a cardinal and the state of judging that the Cardinals won tends to lead to true judgments, yet it is clear that it is quite irrational of me to form these judgments (for a similar sort of example, see Bonjour 1985).  What, then, is it that distinguishes specifically rational transitions?  The answer is given by what Peacocke calls the Rationalist Dependence Thesis, which is the second condition necessary for securing an entitlement:

The rational truth-conduciveness of any given transition to which a thinker is entitled is to be philosophically explained in terms of the nature of the intentional contents and states involved in the transition (2004, p. 52).

According to this second condition, whether or not a transition is rational depends on the specific explanation for why that transition is reliable.  The feature that is characteristic of rational transitions, according to Peacocke, is that they are reliable because of the very nature of the mental states involved, the contents that they have and how it is that those states are capable of representing the world in a certain way.  If the reliability of some transition is explained by something other than the very identity of the states involved in the transition and the individuation of their contents (such as if it were some mere accident that a type of experience reliably led to true judgments, as in the cardinal example above), then that transition, though reliable, would not be rational and would therefore fail to yield any entitlement.

With the two above theses introduced, we see that transitions between states yield entitlements only if they are conducive to truth, and furthermore their being reliable can be philosophically explained in terms of the states involved in the transition.  With regard to perceptual entitlement in particular, the kinds of experiences Peacocke thinks are relevant to meeting this criterion are those which have instance-individuated contents, such as the experience expressed by “That thing looks round.”  What makes this experience’s content instance-individuated is that when one’s perceptual faculties are properly functioning, and the environment is normal, one’s having this experience with this content is “caused by the holding of the condition which is in fact the correctness condition for that content” (2004, p. 67).  In simpler terms, the correct perceptual representation of an object as round does not causally depend on any other mental states or relations aside from the subject’s being properly connected to that round object in the world.  In contrast, an experience expressed by “There looks to be a soldier over there” does not have instance-individuated content because one’s correctly representing a soldier causally depends not only on there being a soldier where one represents it as being, but also on the background empirical knowledge one needs to have of what it is to be a soldier, how soldiers typically dress, and so on.

A Peacockean perceptual entitlement can thus be described as follows: “A subject enjoying an experience with a content which is instance-individuated is entitled to judge that content (that is, accept that experience at face value), in the absence of reasons for doubting that she is perceiving properly.”  Note that in the presence of reasons for doubt, one’s entitlement is removed.  Thus, Peacockean entitlement, like that of Dretske, Burge and Wright, has defeasibility conditions built into it.

The central task for Peacocke is to offer a philosophical explanation of the entitlement relation between experiences with instance-individuated contents and their corresponding perceptual judgments, which will consist of an a priori argument that demonstrates that the transitions between these states are conducive to truth.  His strategy is to argue that the existence of perceptual experiences with instance-individuated contents is best explained by the fact that those experiences are produced by a device that evolved by natural selection to represent the world to the subject, and that the perceptual experiences produced in the subject are predominantly correct.  Moreover, judgments based on these experiences are likely to be true.  To defend this claim, he relies on what he calls the Complexity Reduction Principle:

Other things equal, good explanations of complex phenomena explain the more complex in terms of the less complex; they reduce complexity (2004, p. 83).

This principle describes a key feature of what makes an explanation a good one.  When we are presented with some complex phenomenon, the explanation we should endorse, out of all the alternatives, is the one that explains the phenomenon in the least complex terms.  By accepting this principle, we are accepting that “it is…more rational to hold, other things equal, that [things] have come about in an easy, rather than in a highly improbable, way” (2004, p. 83).  Consider one of Peacocke’s own cases stemming from natural science.  Every snowflake contains six identical patterns separated by sixty-degree segments around its center.  This is an example of a complex phenomenon, one that immediately strikes us as highly improbable.  The best explanation for why snowflakes exhibit this pattern will inform us, by reducing complexity, that the alleged improbability is merely apparent: oxygen molecules in frozen water are roughly spherical and they are arranged on a plane.  The frozen crystals grow in a way that minimizes energy, and the most energy-efficient way of packing spheres on a plane results in a hexagonal arrangement (2004, p. 75-6).  One possible alternative explanation could be that snowflakes are built on skeletons that exhibit six-fold symmetry.  However, the latter explanation is less preferable to the former, because the latter is no less complex than the phenomenon itself: we would simply shift the question to why it is that the skeleton, rather than the snowflake, exhibits this pattern.

Like the example of snowflakes, our having experiences with instance-individuated contents is a highly complex phenomenon.  That the perceptual system produces states that are in large part correct, and was naturally selected to accurately represent the world to the subject, explains the phenomenon with the least amount of complexity.  A subject’s being in a state of perceptually representing an object o as having property F would not appear improbable if an Fo in the environment caused the state, and the subject had a properly functioning system that had adapted over the millennia, by way of interacting with objects like o’s and properties like F-ness, to accurately represent features in the environment.  It is a virtue of this explanation that it does not posit any further representational states that are equally as complex as the perceptual states under discussion and are, in turn, in need of explanation.

Peacocke argues further that the proposed explanation succeeds at reducing complexity better than alternative skeptical hypotheses.  There are two general types of such hypotheses he considers.  The first is one in which the subject’s illusory perceptual states are produced by some intentional agent, such as the Cartesian Demon.  In this scenario, it is typically postulated that the deceiver either has experiences herself, in which case our perceptual states get explained in terms of another’s perceptual states, or she lacks experiences but has other intentional states with comparable complexity.  Either way, the hypothesis purporting to explain the phenomenon under discussion would stand in need of further explanation.  In the second type of skeptical hypothesis, our illusory experiences are not intentionally produced, but are instead generated randomly or coincidentally, such as your being a member of a randomly generated universe containing nothing but a population of deluded brains in vats (see Putnam 2000).  However, this sort of hypothesis involves highly complex initial conditions, such as the original set up describing how the vats are capable of producing conscious, intentional states.  Thus, it fails to reduce the complexity of the phenomenon of our having perceptual states.

To summarize, Peacocke justifies the claim that we are entitled to form judgments about the world on the basis of our experiences with instance-individuated contents, on the grounds that our having these experiences with these contents is best explained by the evolution of the perceptual system and its selection for accurate representation of the environment.  We will consider a number of criticisms of Peacocke’s view.  First, in attempting to give a philosophical explanation of the truth-conduciveness of the transition between experience and judgment, we have seen that Peacocke invokes the theory of natural selection.  But because his aim is to prove that our experiences are by and large correct, his argument cannot depend on any empirically justified premises.  However, natural selection is an empirical scientific theory that is justified in part by our experiences, so we should not expect that it could be used to answer the skeptic.  Peacocke insists though that his argument “does not have the truth of the whole empirical biological theory of evolution by natural selection as one of its premises” (2004, p. 98).  But if Peacocke’s argument is sound, and he is right that each premise is justified a priori, the implication, as Ralph Wedgwood (2007) notes, is that no scientific investigation was required whatsoever for Darwin to justify the claim that he evolved through natural selection—all he needed to do to learn that the theory of evolution is true was to engage in philosophical contemplation and to reflect on his own experiences.  But the suggestion that a theory such as this one could be justified a priori seems highly implausible.

Another challenge to Peacocke’s project is to question whether the natural selection-based explanation reduces complexity any more than the alternative explanations.  The skeptic will argue that the existence of living creatures and the evolution of psychological systems within some of its members is itself a complex phenomenon standing in need of further explanation.  In addition, the skeptic could reject the Complexity Reduction Principle altogether: that an explanation is simpler, or succeeds at reducing complexity, does not speak to whether it is the one we ought to accept (see Lycan 1988; for Peacocke’s response see 2004, p. 94-7).

Finally, even if we grant that the Complexity Reduction Principle is true and that the natural selection-based explanation demonstrates that judgments sourced in perception tend toward truth, one might still question whether it adequately demonstrates how transitions between experience and judgment are characteristically rational (that is, whether it appropriately conforms to the Rationalist Dependence Thesis).  In order for us to rationally rely on our (reliably accurate) experiences, is it the case that we must also know, or justifiably believe, that the natural selection-based explanation most reduces complexity?  Peacocke thinks the answer must be negative; otherwise, anyone unaware of the Complexity Reduction Principle (which, presumably, is most people) would lack entitlements to their perceptual beliefs, and moreover would lack perceptual knowledge.  Instead, he holds that it is sufficient that the transition from experience to judgment be rational from the subject’s own point of view, that is, that the subject appreciates that her experiential grounds for the transition to the judgment that P suffice for the truth of P (2004, p. 176).  However, Miguel Fernández (2006) notes a problem with this move.  When one comes to “appreciate one’s grounds,” this involves, at least on a natural interpretation of appreciate, that one forms an additional judgment, specifically, a second-order judgment of the form:

SOJ: This experience representing P provides adequate grounds for the truth of P.

Of course, if one’s judgment that SOJ is partially underwriting one’s entitlement to judge that P, then it must be that the transition leading one to judge SOJ is also rational from the subject’s own point of view.  To meet this requirement, however, one would need to then hold a third-order judgment of the form:

TOJ: My grounds for judging SOJ are adequate for the truth of SOJ.

The problem is that because TOJ would also need to be rational from the subject’s own point of view, we are forced into an implausible infinite regress of increasingly higher-order judgments, each used to rationalize the transition attached to the lower-ordered judgment.  Demanding that one form all of these judgments would seem to hyper-intellectualize perceptual entitlement, and it would go against Peacocke’s position, mentioned at the beginning of the section, that a subject can be entitled to a judgment without having the capacity to think about the states that entitle that judgment.  In order to avoid this undesirable outcome, Peacocke could attempt to elucidate the notion of “appreciating one’s grounds” in a way that does not suggest forming a higher-order judgment.  Or, if that option is not feasible, he could, in following Dretske and Burge, relinquish the requirement altogether that a transition be rational from the subject’s own point of view.

5. Conclusion

This article has explored the views of epistemic entitlement as presented by four prominent philosophers: Dretske, Burge, Wright, and Peacocke.  As we have seen, there are important similarities and differences among these views.  Burge and Peacocke both hold that reliability is necessary for enjoying perceptual entitlements, but also that the reliability must be explained in terms of the nature and individuation of the perceptual states involved.  For both Wright and Peacocke, their accounts of entitlement purport to provide anti-skeptical outcomes about knowledge, while Dretskean and Burgean entitlement is explained independently of the skeptical problem.  According to Dretske and Burge we have entitlements to hold various non-inferential beliefs.  In contrast, Wright holds that what we are entitled to do is to rationally trust certain corner stone propositions, like that there is an external world and there is a past.  Peacocke differs from the other three authors in that he claims that all rational judgments, as well as the transitions leading to those judgments, are underwritten by entitlements.  Despite these differences, one element common to each of the views we have discussed is the idea that entitlements are defeasible epistemic rights that are not grounded in conceptually accessible reasons or evidence.  One can have an entitlement even if one is unable to think about the states that provide the entitlement.  In this regard, distinguishing entitlement from justification has the advantage of attributing a kind of positive epistemic status to individuals who lack the critical reasoning skills needed to justify their own beliefs.  The inclusion of the concept of entitlement therefore steers away from hyper-intellectualizing the warrant for our basic beliefs about the world.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston W. (1989). Epistemic Justification: Essays in the Theory of Knowledge. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
    • A collection of essays on justification and knowledge written by William Alston.
  • Alston, W. (1989a). “The Deontological Conception of Epistemic Justification.” in Alston (1989).
    • Provides a series of arguments against deontological views of justification which center around the concepts of duty, praiseworthy, requirement, blameless by relying heavily on the impossibility of our having control over our beliefs.
  • Alston, W. (1989b). “An Internalist Externalism.” in Alston (1989).
    • Attempts to reconcile the internalism/externalism debate in epistemology by advancing a view of justification that incorporates both internalist and externalist elements.
  • Bach, K. (1985). “A Rationale for Reliabilism.” The Monist, 68: 246-265.
    • Defends reliabilism against its more well-known objections by drawing a distinction between a justified belief and a subject’s being justified in holding a belief.
  • Bonjour, L. (1985). The Structure of Empirical Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Develops an anti-foundationalist, coherentist theory of knowledge.
  • Burge, T. (1993). “Content Preservation.” The Philosophical Review, 102 (4): 457-488.
    • Argues that we have non-inferential entitlements to rely on the testimony of others.
  • Burge T. (1996). “Our Entitlement to Self-knowledge.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 96 (1): 91-116.
    • Argues that we have entitlements to beliefs about our own mental states.
  • Burge, T. (2003). “Perceptual Entitlement.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 67 (3): 503-548.
    • Provides a teleological account of perceptual entitlements as grounded in the anti-individualistic nature of perception.
  • Burge, T. (2005). “Disjunctivism and Perceptual Psychology.” Philosophical Topics, 33 (1): 1-78.
    • Argues against the view of perception called Disjunctivism on the grounds that it conflicts with established psychological theories of vision.
  • Burge T. (2007). Foundations of Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • A collection of Burge’s papers in philosophy of mind on anti-individualism.
  • Burge, T. (2007a). “Cartesian Error and the Objectivity of Perception.” in Burge (2007).
    • Defends the claim that our perceptual states are anti-individualistically individuated and introduces his famous Crack-Shadow thought experiment.
  • Casullo, A. (2009). “What is Entitlement?” Acta Analytica, 22: 267-279.
    • Provides a detailed overview and critique of Burge’s proposed distinction between entitlement and justification.
  • Chisholm, R. (1977). Theory of Knowledge. (2nd edition) Englewood Cliffs, NJ: Prentice-Hall.
    • Defends a deontological conception of knowledge and justification.
  • Cohen, S. (2002). “Basic Knowledge and the Problem of Easy Knowledge.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 65 (2): 309-329.
    • Denies the existence of basic knowledge (knowledge obtained from a source prior to one’s knowing that that source is reliable) through considerations involving closure and bootstrapping.
  • Comesaña, J. (2002). “The Diagonal and the Demon.” Philosophical Studies, 110: 249-266.
    • Advances a new version of reliabilism called Indexical Reliabilism, then argues it circumvents the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Conee, E and Feldman, R. (1985). “Evidentialism.” Philosophical Studies, 48: 15-34.
    • Defends evidentialism in epistemology, the view that the justification of one’s belief is determined by the strength of one’s evidence for that belief.
  • Davidson, D. (1986). “A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge.” in E. Lepore (ed.) Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. Blackwell Publishing.
    • Argues for coherentism about truth and knowledge.
  • Davies, M. (2004). “Epistemic Entitlement, Warrant Transmission and Easy Knowledge.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Issue 78 (1): 213-245.
    • Critically discusses Crispin Wright’s views on entitlement, and advances the idea of a negative entitlement not to doubt cornerstone propositions.
  • Dretske, F. (2000). “Entitlement: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 60 (3): 591-606.
    • Argues for the existence of epistemic entitlements as grounded in the immediacy and irresistibility of various beliefs and motivated by the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Dretske, F. (2005). “The Case Against Closure.” in M. Steup and E. Sosa (eds.) Contemporary Debates in Epistemology. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
    • Rejects closure by first assuming skepticism is false, and secondly by arguing for the disjunction that either closure is false or skepticism is true.
  • Evans, G. (1982). The Varieties of Reference. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Proposes a theory of demonstrative thought in this seminal work, and introduces the notion of nonconceptual content.
  • Fernandez. M. (2006). “Troubles with Peacocke’s Rationalism.” Critica, 38 (112): 81-103.
    • Critically discusses Christopher Peacocke’s (2004) book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Ginet, C. (1975). Knowledge, Perception, and Memory. Dordrecht: D. Reidel.
    • Argues for a strong version of internalism, according to which all of the facts that make a subject’s beliefs justified are directly recognizable by the subject upon reflection.
  • Goldman, A. (1986). Epistemology and Cognition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
    • Makes a case for epistemology to draw upon the findings in cognitive science.
  • Goldman. A. (1988). “Strong and Weak Justification.” Philosophical Perspectives, 2: 51-69.
    • Advances a modified version of reliabilism that places a distinction between the concepts of strong justification and weak justification.
  • Heck, R. (2007). “Are There Different Kinds of Content?” in B. McLaughlin and J. Cohen (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Mind. Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing.
    • Argues for the existence of nonconceptual content based on the implausibility of perceptual content, satisfying Gareth Evans’ generality constraint on thought.
  • Henderson, D. and Horgan, T. (2007). “Some Ins and Outs of Transglobal Reliabilism.” in S. Goldberg (ed.), Internalism and Externalism in Semantics and Epistemology. New York: Oxford University Press.
    • Advances a new version of reliabilism called transglobal reliabilism, according to which the reliability of a belief process is evaluated relative to the set of experientially possible global environments.
  • Janvid, M. (2009). “The Value of Lesser Goods: The Epistemic Value of Entitlement.”  Acta Analytica, 24: 263-274.
    • Compares the epistemic value of entitlement with that of justification, and criticizes both Burgean and Dretskean entitlement.
  • Jenkins, C. (2007). “Entitlement and Rationality.” Synthese, 157: 25-45.
    • Challenges Crispin Wright’s entitlement of cognitive project, arguing that such entitlement to accept a proposition cannot be construed as epistemically rational.
  • Lehrer, K and Cohen, S. (1983). “Justification, Truth, and Coherence.” Synthese, 55: 191-207.
    • Challenges the time-honored connection between justification and truth by introducing what is nowadays commonly referred to as the New Evil Demon Problem.
  • Lycan, W. (1988). Judgement and Justification. Cambridge, MA: Cambridge University Press.
    • Defends a version of epistemological explanationism as a theory of justification.
  • Majors, B. (2005). “The New Rationalism.” Philosophical Papers, 34 (2): 289-305.
    • A critical discussion of Christopher Peacocke’s (2004) book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Majors, B and Sawyer, S. (2005). “The Epistemological Argument for Content Externalism.” Philosophical Perspectives, 19: 257-280.
    • Argues that that the only epistemological view that can adequately account for the constitutive relation between justification and truth is one that involves a commitment to content externalism.
  • Millikan, R. (1984). Language, Thought and Other Biological Categories. Cambridge, MA: MIT press.
    • Develops a naturalistic account of language and thought, wherein the meaning associated with sentences and the intentionality associated with thoughts are to be explicated in terms of how sentences and thoughts properly function.
  • Peacocke, C. (1992). A Study of Concepts. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Proposes a theory of concepts in which concepts are individuated by their possession conditions, and also introduces the notions of ‘scenario content’ and ‘protoproposition’ as they apply to perceptual content.
  • Peacocke, C. (2001). “Does Perception have a Nonconceptual Content?” Journal of Philosophy, 98: 609-615.
    • Defends the claim that perception has nonconceptual content, and wards off criticisms from John McDowell and Bill Brewer.
  • Peacocke, C. (2004). The Realm of Reason. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Develops a rationalist picture of epistemic entitlement according to which we have entitlements to our perceptual beliefs, a priori beliefs, beliefs based on inductive inference, beliefs about our own actions, and moral beliefs.
  • Pryor, J. (2000). “The Skeptic and the Dogmatist.” Nous, 34: 517-49.
    • Defends dogmatism, a modest foundationalist view according to which an experience as of p’s being the case provides one with a prima facie justification to believe that p, without requiring that one have independent reason to believe one is not in a skeptical scenario.
  • Pryor, J. (2001). “Recent Highlights of Epistemology.” The British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 52: 95-124.
    • Canvases a host of popular topics in contemporary epistemology, including contextualism, modest foundationalism, the internalism/externalism debate, and the ethics of belief.
  • Pryor, J. (2004). “What’s wrong with Moore’s Argument?” Philosophical Issues, 14: 349-378.
    • Defends the Moorean response to skepticism.
  • Putnam, H. (2000). “Brains in a Vat.” in S. Bernecker and F. Dretske (eds.), Knowledge: Readings in Contemporary Epistemology. Oxford University Press.
    • Appeals to externalist accounts of meaning to argue that the statement, “I am a brain in a vat,” is self-defeating, and so cannot be true.
  • Sellars, W. (1963). Science, Perception and Reality. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Famously argues against the “Myth of the Given” and develops a broadly coherentist epistemology.
  • Stroud, B. (1977). Hume. New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul.
    • Offers a detailed overview of Hume’s philosophy, including the Problem of Induction.
  • Wedgwood, R. (2007). “Christopher Peacocke’s The Realm of Reason.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 74 (3): 776-791.
    • Critically discusses Christopher Peacocke’s book, The Realm of Reason.
  • Williams, M. (2000). “Dretske on Epistemic Entitlement.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 60 (3): 607-612.
    • Critically discusses Fred Dretske’s (2000) paper, “Entitlement: Epistemic Rights without Epistemic Duties?”
  • Wright, C. (2003). “Some Reflections on the Acquisition of Warrant by Inference” in S. Nuccetelli (ed.), New Essays on Semantic Externalism, Skepticism and Self-Knowledge. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
    • Explains the difference between a cogent argument and an argument in which the premises fails to transmit their warrants to the conclusion.
  • Wright, C. (2004). “Warrant for Nothing (and Foundations for Free)?” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume, 78 (1):167–212.
    • Develops the notion of unearned entitlements for cornerstone propositions, and explores the prospects and limitations on strategic entitlement, entitlement of cognitive project, entitlement of rational deliberation, and entitlement of substance.
  • Wright, C. (2007). “The Perils of Dogmatism.” in S. Nuccetelli and G. Seay (eds.), Themes from G. E. Moore: New Essays in Epistemology and Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
    • Presents a series of problems for dogmatist accounts of justification.


Author Information

Jon Altschul
Email: jlaltsch@loyno.edu
Loyola University-New Orleans
U. S. A.