Epistemology and Relativism

Epistemology is, roughly, the philosophical theory of knowledge, its nature and scope. What is the status of epistemological claims? Relativists regard the status of (at least some kinds of) epistemological claims as, in some way, relative— that is to say, that the truths which (some kinds of) epistemological claims aspire to are relative truths. Self-described relativists vary, sometimes dramatically, in how they think about relative truth and what a commitment to it involves. Section 1 outlines some of these key differences and distinguishes between broadly two kinds of approaches to epistemic relativism. Proposals under the description of traditional epistemic relativism are the focus of Sections 2-4. These are, (i) arguments that appeal in some way to the Pyrrhonian problematic; (ii) arguments that appeal to apparently irreconcilable disagreements (for example, as in the famous dispute between Galileo and Bellarmine); and (iii) arguments that appeal to the alleged incommensurability of epistemic systems or frameworks. New (semantic) epistemic relativism, a linguistically motivated form of epistemic relativism defended in the most sophistication by John MacFarlane (for example, 2014), is the focus of Sections 5-6.  According to MacFarlane’s brand of epistemic relativism, whether a given knowledge-ascribing sentence is true depends on the epistemic standards at play in what he calls the context of assessment, which is the context in which the knowledge ascription (for example, ‘Galileo knows the earth revolves around the sun’) is being assessed for truth or falsity. Because the very same knowledge ascription can be assessed for truth or falsity from indefinitely many perspectives, knowledge-ascribing sentences do not get their truth values absolutely, but only relatively. The article concludes by canvassing some of the potential ramifications this more contemporary form of epistemic relativism has for projects in mainstream epistemology.

Table of Contents

  1. Relativism in Epistemology: Two Approaches
  2. Traditional Arguments for Epistemic Relativism: The Pyrrhonian Argument
  3. Traditional Arguments for Epistemic Relativism: Non-Neutrality
  4. Traditional Arguments for Epistemic Relativism: Incommensurability and Circularity
  5. New (Semantic) Epistemic Relativism: Assessment-Sensitive Semantics for ‘Knows’
  6. New (Semantic) Epistemic Relativism: Issues and Implications in Epistemology
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Relativism in Epistemology: Two Approaches

“Relativism” is notoriously difficult to define. There are however some core insights about relativism that are more or less embraced across the board amongst self-described relativists. One such insight is negative, framed in terms of what relativists are characteristically united in denying. Take for example the following epistemological claims:

  1. Copernicus’s belief that the earth revolves around the sun is justified.
  2. Edmund does not know that the man who will get the job has ten coins in his pocket.
  3. Knowledge is not factorable into component parts.
  4. Beliefs formed on the basis of direct observation are better justified than beliefs formed on the basis of drug-induced wishful thinking.

Relativists of all stripes typically deny at least one—if not all—of the following: that the truth of claims like (a-d) are applicable to all times and frameworks; that they are objective (for example, trivially dependent on our judgments or beliefs) and monistic (for example, in the sense that competing claims are mutually exclusive) (see Baghramian and Carter (2015)). In some cases—a notable example here is Richard Rorty (1979)—philosophers have been labelled relativists primarily on the basis of their distinctive denial(s) of such claims about the status of these kinds of judgments.

Moreover, along with denying the sorts of claims characteristic of metaepistemological realism (for example, Cuneo 2007: Ch 3), the epistemic relativist is also committed to denying the metaepistemological analogues of non-relativist positions that are familiar territory in contemporary metaethics.

For example, contra epistemic error theory (for example Olson 2009), which insists that claims like (a)-(d) which attribute epistemic properties are categorically false, the epistemic relativist maintains that some claims like (a)-(d), which attribute epistemic properties, are true—albeit, true in a way that is in some interesting sense ‘relative’. Likewise, contra the epistemic expressivist (for example Chrisman 2007; Gibbard 1990; Field 1998) who insists that claims like (a-d) are expressions of attitude, the relativist is a cognitivist. Accordingly, the relativist maintains that (a)-(d) are truth-apt, while adding that the truth-aptness is not to be thought of as the realist thinks of it; expressions like (a)-(d) are relatively truth-apt in that the truths they aspire to are relative truths. (We consider shortly what this might involve—as the point is highly controversial amongst relativists).

Another core insight about relativism, generally construed, is co-variance (for example Baghramian 2004; 2014 and Swoyer 2014). Co-variance is the idea that some object, x, depends on some underlying, independent variable, y, such that, in some suitably specified sense, change in the latter results in a change in the former. In embracing relativism about some class of truths, one thereby embraces some kind of co-variance claim. For example, a cultural relativist about epistemic justification tells us that the truth of claims (a-b) varies with local cultural norms and in doing so holds that cultural norm change instances change in what one counts as knowing, justifiably believing, and so forth.

Beyond these mostly uncontroversial ingredients of a relativist proposal—or necessary conditions for being a relativist—the matter of what is sufficient for a view to count as a relativist view is controversial. One influential approach to characterizing relativism has been put forward by Paul Boghossian (2006a). As Boghossian sees things, we can attribute to the epistemic relativist the following package of three claims: epistemic non-absolutism, epistemic relationism and epistemic pluralism.

Epistemic Relativism (Boghossian’s Formulation)

  1. There are no absolute facts about what belief a particular item of information justifies. (Epistemic non-absolutism)
  2. If a person, S’s, epistemic judgments are to have any prospect of being true, we must not construe his utterances of the form ‘‘E justifies belief B’’ as expressing the claim E justifies belief B but rather as expressing the claim: According to the epistemic system C, that I, S, accept, information E justifies belief B. (Epistemic relationism)
  3. There are many fundamentally different, genuinely alternative epistemic systems, but no facts by virtue of which one of these systems is more correct than any of the others. (Epistemic pluralism)

Boghossian’s model is often called the replacement model for formulating epistemic relativism. This is largely due to the inclusion of claim (B), the epistemic relationism thesis. In attributing relationism to the epistemic relativist, Boghossian (2006a: 84) regards the relativist as effectively endorsing a replacing of unqualified epistemic claims with explicitly relational ones. As he puts it:

[…] the relativist urges, we must reform our talk so that we no longer speak simply about what is justified by the evidence, but only about what is justified by the evidence according to the particular epistemic system that we happen to accept, noting, all the while, that there are no facts by virtue of which our particular system is more correct than any of the others.

One of the central moves Boghossian makes against the epistemic relativist in his monograph Fear of Knowledge is to argue that epistemic relativism—formulated as such—is ultimately an incoherent position. In response, some critics—notably Martin Kusch (2010)—have replied that epistemic relativism, formulated in accordance with the replacement model, is not incoherent for the reasons Boghossian suggests—or, at least, in Kusch’s case, that there is a version of this view that is defensible.

A comparatively deeper issue, however, and one that is prior to whether the replacement model leads to incoherence, is whether the inclusion of the relationist clause is an apt way of representing the relativist’s view. Though Boghossian and Kusch disagree on the matter of whether epistemic relativism formulated within the replacement model is tractable, both think that the framework is capable of characterising the epistemic relativist’s core position.

But this point is highly controversial. Crispin Wright (2008: 383) for instance, says of Boghossian’s inclusion of the relationist clause in formulating epistemic relativism:

We can envision an epistemic relativist feeling very distant from this characterisation and of its implicit perception of the situation.

Wright’s complaint, in the main, is that, insisting on the relationist clause is tantamount to insisting that the only way the relativist (who must reject absolute facts about what justifies what) can make sense of how claims of the form ‘S is justified in believing X’ are true (at all) is by construing their content in an explicitly relational way, so that the explicitly relational truths (for example ‘S is justified in believing X, according to system A) are themselves candidates for absolute truth.

But this, Wright says:

[…] is just to fail to take seriously the thesis that claims such as [sic … S is justified in believing X] can indeed be true or false, albeit, only relatively so. (Ibid., 383, my italics).

Wright’s complaint, as quoted in this passage, gestures to what is probably the most substantial divide in the contemporary landscape in relation to epistemic relativism. There are really two important and connected ideas that need unpacking here. The first has to do with charity, and the second has to do with inclusiveness.

Regarding charity: to the extent that one insists that epistemic relationism is an indispensable component of epistemic relativism, one is de facto excluding (by viewing as tacitly unintelligible) the thought that non-explicitly relational claims (for example S is justified in believing p) can be true or false, albeit, only relatively so. And so if it turns out that that this excluded possibility is a viable one, then the attribution to the relativist of the relationist clause is not a suitably charitable way of formulating the relativist’s position.

New (semantic) relativists—whose motivations draw from analytic philosophy of language—regard this excluded possibility as not only viable, but moreover, the only legitimate way to capture a philosophically interesting kind of relativist position. The rationale for thinking this way has been articulated most notably by John MacFarlane (for example 2007, 2011, 2014). MacFarlane’s work over the past decade has stressed that simply relativizing propositional truth to what seem like exotic parameters (for example other than worlds and times—such as judges, perspectives, or standards (including epistemic standards)—is not in itself ‘enough to make one a relativist about truth in the most philosophically interesting sense’. This is because such relativization is compatible with truth absolutism, and MacFarlane’s position is that philosophically interesting relativism must part ways with the absolutist.

Consider, for example, that the epistemic contextualist (for example Cohen 1988; DeRose 1992, 2009) insists that whether ‘S knows that p’ is true can shift with different standards at play in different contexts in which the sentence ‘S knows that p’ is used. This is because, for the contextualist, my utterance of “Keith knows the bank is open” can express different propositions depending on the context in which I use this sentence. If I use the sentence in a context in which it doesn’t matter to me whether Keith knows the bank is open, what I’ve asserted can be true even if uttering the very same sentence would come out false if uttered in a context in which it is extremely important to me that the bank is open—and for the contextualist, this is so even if all other epistemically relevant features of Keith’s situation (for example what evidence Keith has for thinking the bank is open) are held fixed across these contexts of use. When knowledge ‘is relative to an epistemic standard’ in the way that the contextualist relativizes knowledge to an epistemic standard, it remains that a particular occurrence of ‘knows’ used in a particular context, gets its truth value absolutely. A philosophically interesting relativist, as MacFarlane sees it, denies this. The line, according to MacFarlane, between the (genuine) relativist and the non-relativist is best understood as a line that is between views that allow truth to vary with the context of assessment and those that do not’ (2014, vi). A context of assessment is a possible situation in which a use of a sentence might be assessed, where the agent of the context is the assessor of the use of a sentence. This view is described in more detail in Section 5.

This brings us to the point about inclusiveness. From the perspective of the new-age (semantic) relativist like MacFarlane, the kind of position described by Boghossian as epistemic relativism is not really an interesting relativist position. Boghossian’s epistemic relativist, modelled on Gilbert Harman’s (1975) moral relativism, is (by MacFarlane’s lights) best understood as a version of contextualism (see MacFarlane (2014: 33, fn. 5)). After all, (a la epistemic relationism) the explicitly relational claims which Boghossian regards the relativist as in the market to putting forward as true are candidates for absolute truth.

This article does not attempt to adjudicate which kind of approach to thinking about relativism, more generally, is the right one. Rather, the article is divided into two main parts: in short, (i) arguments for epistemic relativism which do not give a context of assessment a significant semantic role (Sections 2-4)—which is termed traditional arguments for epistemic relativism, and (ii) arguments that do—which is termed new (semantic) epistemic relativism (Sections 5-6). The former kinds of arguments are not primarily motivated by considerations to do with how we use language whereas the latter kind of argument strategy (the focus of Sections 5-6) is.

2. Traditional Arguments for Epistemic Relativism: The Pyrrhonian Argument

One influential argument strategy under the banner of epistemic relativism takes as a starting point a famous philosophical puzzle traditionally associated with Pyrrhonian skepticism— that is to say, the Pyrrhonian problematic. The most famous version of the puzzle, the ‘regress’ version of the problematic, goes as follows—the simple presentation here owes to John Greco (2013, 179). Suppose you claim to know that p is true but you are asked to provide a good reason for p. If it is granted that good reasons—for example the sort of reasons good enough to epistemically justify a belief—are non-arbitrary reasons, reasons that we have good reason to believe, then a regress threatens. The idea is that, at least, with the above assumptions in place, it looks as though knowledge as well as epistemic justification require an infinite number of good reasons. But it seems that this is something we do not have, and thus, as the puzzle goes, it looks like we do not know or justifiably believe anything. With reference to this puzzle, the sceptic effectively places the onus on her non-sceptical adversary to reject one or more of the assumptions underwriting the puzzle. Foundationalism, coherentism and infinitism are typically distinguished from one another with reference to which assumption(s) is rejected.

Against this background, Howard Sankey (2010; 2011; 2012) has argued, in a series of papers, that the Pyrrhonian problematic offers the tools to capture the most compelling argument strategy available to the epistemic relativist; in one place, he writes that the ancient Pyrrhonian argument “constitutes the foundation for contemporary epistemic relativism” (Sankey 2012, 184, my italics).

Sankey’s argument comes in primarily in two parts: a negative part and a positive part. Before outlining the negative part, some terminology is helpful.  Sankey (2013: 3) defines epistemic relativism in a restricted way: as a view about epistemic norms, where he defines an epistemic norm as ‘a criterion or rule that may be employed to justify a belief’.  Epistemic relativism is then defined as the thesis that there are no epistemic norms over and above the variable epistemic norms operative in different (local) cultural settings or contexts, where these local contexts are defined as always including at least a system of beliefs and a set of norms. (Sankey 2012, 187). For Sankey’s relativist, whether a belief is justified, or counts as knowledge, depends on epistemic norms, and so, given that different epistemic norms can operate in different contexts, the same belief might be rational/justified/knowledge relative to one context, and not to another.

Sankey’s ‘negative’ argument on behalf of the relativist appeals to the Pyrrhonian puzzle to generate the intermediate conclusion that all epistemic norms are on equal standing; his positive argument moves from the equal standing claim established by the negative argument to the conclusion that epistemic relativism (as he has defined it) is true. The negative argument can be summarized as follows: Take an epistemic norm, N1. Question: how is N1 to be justified? With reference to the Pyrrhonian puzzle, the options don’t look very promising. One option is to Justify N1 by appealing to a further epistemic norm N2. Another option is to justify N1 by appealing to N1. Sankey says neither of these options satisfactorily justifies N1; the former generates an infinite regress, the latter is viciously circular. Now: take any other epistemic norms, N3, N4 … Nn. By running through this same line of thinking with any of N3, N4 … Nn in an attempt to justify any of these norms, we end up in the same place. That is, each of N1 and N3, N4 … Nn are equally lacking in justification. From here, Sankey’s positive move (for example see Sankey 2011 §3, esp. pp. 564-566) on behalf of the relativist goes as follows:

If no norm is better justified than any other, all norms have equal standing. Since it is not possible to provide an ultimate grounding for any set of norms, the only possible form of justification is justification on the basis of a set of operative norms. Thus, the norms operative within a particular context provide justification for beliefs formed within that context. Those who occupy a different context in which different norms are operative are justified by the norms which apply in that context… the relativist is now in a position to claim that epistemic justification is relative to locally operative norms.

Sankey himself, not a relativist, attempts a naturalistically motivated overriding strategy to the argument—one which grants the relativistic challenge as legitimate and then attempts to meet the challenge (2010). Carter (2016) and Seidel (2013) by contrast have proposed undercutting responses which call into question whether the relativist can viably use the argument strategy which Sankey regards as the epistemic relativist’s strongest play. Carter (2016, Ch. 3) challenges the first (negative) part of the argument by noting that the intermediate conclusion (that all norms are equally justified) is one the would-be relativist is entitled to only if it is already granted that foundationalism, coherentism and infinitism are all unsuccessful. But Sankey’s relativist proposes no positive case for this—but rather takes it for granted.

Carter (2016) and Markus Seidel (2013, 137) have both expressed worries that, even if the first part of the argument were granted (and so, even if it were granted that by the Pyrrhonian strategy is effective in establishing that all epistemic norms are on epistemic standing), it’s not clear how relativism is to be motivated over scepticism. As Seidel puts it, Sankey’s relativist actually travels so far down the road with the sceptic that the relativist is “at pains to provide us with reasons [for the relativist to] part company” (137). That is: once it has been claimed that all norms are equally unjustified—no norm is more justified than in any other in any way—it is not apparent, as Seidel observes, how locally credible epistemic norms are supposed to have any positive epistemic status, positive status the relativist wants to preserve when insisting that epistemic norms aspire to relative justification.

For an alternative perspective for how relativism might be better motivated than scepticism—generally speaking—see Michael Williams (for example, 1991; 2001) who defends an anti-sceptical form of relativism (though he rejects this label), specifically a Wittgensteinian-inspired brand of contextualism’ (compare, DeRose 1992), as an alternative to both scepticism as well as metaepistemological realism.

3. Traditional Arguments for Epistemic Relativism: Non-Neutrality

Another kind of argument for traditional epistemic relativism is what Harvey Siegel (2011: 205) has termed the non-neutrality argument. A much-discussed reference point for this argument strategy is Rorty’s (1979) discussion of the famous dispute between Galileo and Cardinal Bellarmine about Copernican heliocentrism. In short, Galileo and Cardinal Bellarmine could not agree about the truth of Copernican heliocentrism, but even more, they also could not agree about what evidential standards were even relevant to settling the matter. Galileo had argued for the Copernican picture on the basis of telescopic evidence. Cardinal Bellarmine dismissed Galileo’s suggestion that Earth revolves around the sun as heretical, by appeal to Scripture. From these disparate starting points, Rorty noted, it looked as though neither was in a position to appeal to neutral ground in the service of rational adjudication—each was operating within a different “grid which determines what sorts of evidence there could be for statements about the movements of the planets” (Rorty 1979: 330-331).

Siegel (2011: 105-106) captures, with reference to this case, the relativist’s reasoning as follows:

The relativist here claims that there can be no non-relative resolution of the dispute concerning the existence of the moons, precisely because there is no neutral, non-question-begging way to resolve the dispute concerning the standards. Any proposed meta-standard that favors regarding naked eye observation, Scripture, or the writings of Aristotle as the relevant standard by which to evaluate “the moons exist” will be judged by Galileo as unfairly favoring his opponents since he thinks he has good reasons to reject the epistemic authority of all these proposed standards; likewise, any proposed metastandard that favors Galileo’s preferred standard, telescopic observation, will be judged to be unfair by his opponents, who claim to have good reasons to reject that proposed standard. In this way, the absence of neutral (meta-) standards seems to make the case for relativism.

The pro-relativist argument that is motivated by the Galileo/Bellarmine dispute, which Siegel (2011: 206) calls “No Neutrality, Therefore Relativism”, as represented in Siegel’s passage, can be pared down to the following argument:

“No Neutrality, Therefore Relativism”

  1. There can be a non-relative resolution of the dispute concerning the existence of the moons, only if there is an appropriately neutral meta-norm available.
  2. In the context of the dispute between Galileo and Bellarmine, no such metanorm is available.
  3. Therefore, it is not the case that there can be a non-relative resolution of the dispute concerning the existence of the moons.
  4. Therefore, epistemic relativism is true.

As stated, the argument is not valid. In order to make the argument valid, a further ‘bridge’ premise (or premises) would be needed to get from (3)—the premise that there can be no non-relative resolution of the dispute concerning moons [or some similar such dispute]—to the conclusion that epistemic relativism is true (4).

What are the prospects of ‘bridging’ (3) and (4)? The viability of a no-neutrality therefore relativism-style argument rests importantly on this question. Steven Hales (2014) defends a version of the no-neutrality therefore relativism argument which attempts to bridge the gap (between (3) and (4)) via process of elimination. Hales argues, with reference to a case involving a similarly deadlocked dispute concerning the nature of the human soul (by interlocutors who adhere to analytic philosophy of mind and the Catechism, respectively) that—from their irreconcilable position—the salient options for resolving the dispute are: (i) keep arguing until capitulation, (ii) compromise, (iii) locate an ambiguity or contextual factors; (iv) accept scepticism or (v) adopt relativism (Hales 2014: 63). Relativism is defended by Hales as the most satisfactory option.

Carter (2015, Ch. 4) has criticised this strategy. For one thing, appealing to relativism’s success as a disagreement-resolution strategy doesn’t obviously help move one from (3) to (4). For example, even if both parties’ can easily resolve their disagreement by adopting the belief that relativism is true, relativism might just as well be false. More generally, that interlocutors’ accepting something X is efficacious in resolving a dispute is not satisfactory grounds for thinking X is true or even probably true. Furthermore, Hales’ process of elimination strategy dismisses skepticism out of hand as “throwing in the towel.” However, this just reinvites the issue of why relativism should be (in the face of the no-neutrality, therefore relativism) argument regarded as motivated over skepticism. As with Sankey’s redeployment of the Pyrrhonian argument considered in Section 2, it is not clear how this is so.

It is worth noting that the no-neutrality therefore relativism argument is but one way philosophers have attempted to motivate relativism by pointing to disagreements. Another route is to appeal to what Max Kölbel (2003) calls “faultless disagreements” (for example, apparently genuine disagreements in some discretionary area of discourse where it seems neither party to the disagreement has made a mistake). These faultless disagreement strategies which appeal to disagreements to motivate relativism, and the neutrality-based strategy considered in this section, are only superficially similar. Unlike the no-neutrality, therefore relativism argument, faultless-disagreement arguments simply do not regard properties of any particular disagreement (for example, the disagreement between Bellarmine and Galileo) as in the market for establishing epistemic relativism. Faultless disagreement-style arguments reason from semantic and pragmatic evidence about disagreement patterns, much more generally, to the conclusion that a relativist semantics (in certain domains where we find such disagreements) best explains our practices of attributing certain terms. This kind of argument is discussed in more detail in Section 5, as it is an argument strategy used by new (semantic) epistemic relativists.

4. Traditional Arguments for Epistemic Relativism: Incommensurability and Circularity

A third kind of argument which has motivated versions of epistemic relativism appeals to incommensurability and epistemic circularity. The idea is that, upon confronting radically different epistemic systems (for example, radically different Kuhnian paradigms, Wittgensteinian framework propositions or individuals who employ what Ian Hacking (1982) calls alien ‘styles of reasoning’) we are called upon to justify not just ordinary beliefs as we usually do, but rather the very epistemic system (that is, the set of epistemic principles or rules) within which we our epistemic evaluations are made. However, once we begin to attempt to justify our own epistemic system, epistemic circularity threatens. Michael Williams (2007: 3-4) expresses the idea on behalf of the relativist as follows:

In determining whether a belief—any belief—is justified, we always rely, implicitly or explicitly, on an epistemic framework: some standards or procedures that separate justified from unjustified convictions. But what about the claims embodied in the framework itself: are they justified? In answering this question, we inevitably apply our own epistemic framework. So, assuming that our framework is coherent and does not undermine itself, the best we can hope for is a justification that is epistemically circular, employing our epistemic framework in support of itself. Since this procedure can be followed by anyone, whatever his epistemic framework, all such frameworks, provided they are coherent, are equally defensible (or indefensible).

There are really two ‘key moves’ in this line of thinking. The first key move contends that—in the face of radically different epistemic systems from our own—our activity of attempting to justify our own epistemic system will lead to epistemic circularity. The second key move adverts to the claim that all attempts to justify epistemic systems result in epistemic circularity and from this claim concludes the epistemic relativist-friendly conclusion that all epistemic systems are equally defensible, or on a par.

The first move, stated more carefully, seems to be that, when an individual S is in a position where S is trying to justify S’s own epistemic framework or system, X, by attempting to justify the claims that comprise the system (x1 … xn), then: (i)  S must (inevitably) apply that system (X); and, the application, by S, of a system X to justify the claims (x1 … xn) of that very system, X, is sufficient for leaving S’s epistemic justification for the claims of X (x1 … xn) circular.

From here, it is helpful to note three central issues which are relevant to the success of this kind of ‘pro-relativist’ strategy, in so far as the kind of epistemic circularity that is supposed to materialise via the application of a system in its own defence is itself of a sort that will leave all epistemic systems equally defensible. The first two issues concern the first key move and the third concerns the second key move.

Firstly, note that it seems in principle possible to pre-empt epistemic circularity altogether by simply rejecting that the justification of S’s epistemic framework depends on S’s ability to non-circularly justify that framework. Consider, for example, the line an externalist reliabilist might take. The process reliabilist (for example, Goldman 1979) might say that the epistemic principles constituting S’s epistemic system (X) are justified simply provided they are reliable and regardless of whether one can successfully justify or know that they are reliable. Compare here the reliabilist’s commitment to basic knowledge— that is to say, that S can know p even though S has no antecedent knowledge that the process R that produced S’s belief is reliable. Likewise, as this idea goes—at greater generality—the reliabilist is in a position to submit that any positive epistemic status which the belief that our own epistemic principles are correct has does not depend on any antecedent facts about our appreciation that they have this status. The reliabilist attempts to undercut the circularity objection then by mooting it.

Two salient replies to this line of reasoning have to do with assertion and bootstrapping, respectively. Regarding assertion: as Mikkel Gerken (2012, 379) has suggested, although some conversational contexts are ones where “S may assert something although S is unable to provide any reason for it” other contexts may not be permissive in this way.  Discursive contexts are on Gerken’s view ones where “interlocutors share a presupposition that an asserter must be able to back up unqualified assertions by reasons… and in which ‘being a cooperative speaker involves being sensitive to reasons for and against what is asserted” (2012, 379). Gerken’s position is that, in such contexts, epistemically appropriate assertion must be discursively justified, where discursive justification is something S possesses only if S is able to articulate some epistemic reasons for believing that p. But if this is right, then, there is a case to make that while an externalist line such as the one sketched above cuts epistemic circularity off at the pass, it does so in a way that would effectively leave one in no position to claim (in the face of a challenge from an interlocutor with a radically different epistemic system) to know that one’s own system is correct.

A second salient kind of reply to the externalist move is to suggest, in short, that even if (with reference to the Williams passage quoted above) it looks as though epistemic circularity materialises only once one uses the epistemic principles constituting one’s own epistemic system in the service of justifying it, this might be misleading. The idea here is that if one attempts to cut this kind of epistemic circularity off at the pass, by opting for the reliabilist move sketched above, then one at the same time (at least, potentially) encounters what is allegedly another malignant form of epistemic circularity in the form of bootstrapping (for example, Vogel 2000)— that is to say, that one would be in a position to acquire track-record evidence via the deliverances of applying one’s own epistemic principles that the application of one’s own epistemic principles is reliable. This point, in conjunction with the previous point about assertion, suggest that the kind of circularity problem Williams intimates can’t be simply circumvented by ‘going externalist’ without also incurring some further challenges.

So the viability of an attempt to block epistemic circularity ex ante by “going externalist” was the first of three issues to highlight relevant to the viability of the kind of argument strategy Williams describes. The second issue concerns the nature of the epistemic circularity in question and which on this line of argument is said to materialise when one attempts to justify one’s epistemic system by appealing to it. Consider that there are in fact two very different kinds of ways in which one might apply an epistemic principle or rule in the service of justifying one’s epistemic system (where, again, the epistemic system is understood as a set of epistemic principles).

Firstly, one might apply a principle by simply following it (for example as when one might follow an inference rule in the service of justifying that inference rule or perhaps justifying the epistemic system of which the inference rule is a part). See Boghossian (2001). However, just as a judge might apply a rule (consider, the rule that ‘one must drive only with a license’) not by following the rule but by invoking its authority (for example McCallum 1966), one might also apply one’s own epistemic principle or principles not by following them but by invoking their authority. For example, one might attempt to justify inference to the best explanation (IBE) by invoking the authority of the wider system of epistemic principles within which IBE belongs: Western Science.

The overarching point here is that the kind of epistemic circularity that materialises as a function of one’s appealing to one’s epistemic system in the service of justifying it can take on different shapes—with different kinds of premise-conclusion dependence relations. Accordingly, an argument that attempts to move from epistemic circularity to relativism must thus be appropriately sensitive to these different shapes epistemic circularity can potentially take on when one applies one’s own epistemic system in the service of justifying it. This is because it is not obvious that all such shapes are equally epistemically objectionable. (For discussion on this point, see Pryor 2004 and Wright 2007).

The third issue to raise concerns the second ‘key move’ in the sequence Williams describes: the move that is supposed to get us from circularity to relativism. Even on the assumption that the kind of epistemically circular justification one is left with for one’s own epistemic principles (and more generally, one’s epistemic system) renders all epistemic principles on an ‘equal footing’—this equal-footing option is compatible with both scepticism as well as relativism. An argument successfully establishes epistemic relativism from the position described only if provides a non-arbitrary reason to embrace relativism over scepticism.

5. New (Semantic) Epistemic Relativism: Assessment-Sensitive Semantics for ‘Knows’

One recurring objection-type to traditional arguments for epistemic relativism (of the sort surveyed in §2-4) is that these arguments face a shared difficulty when it comes to showing why, in light of the philosophical considerations adverted to, relativism is at the end of the day a more attractive option than skepticism. New (semantic) epistemic relativism doesn’t face this kind of challenge. This is because new (semantic) relativism (hereafter, new relativism) is motivated on the basis of very different kinds of philosophical considerations than the argument strategies considered in §§2-4.

The present section is organised as follows: two preliminary points about new relativism are first noted, and then MacFarlane’s most substantial (2014) argument for an assessment-sensitive semantics for “knows” is outlined; it is an argument that depends on two key premises, and MacFarlane’s rationale for defending these premises are discussed in some depth. Note that while there are other ways of motivating semantic relativism that do not appeal explicitly to ‘contexts of assessment’ (for example, Richard 2004; Egan 2007), which is MacFarlane’s distinctive terminology, I am in what follows focusing on MacFarlane’s presentation, as it is the most developed.

That said, the first preliminary point to note concerns the relationship between epistemic contextualism and relativism. As was noted in section 1, epistemic contextualism is—by MacFarlane’s lights—not on the interesting side of the line between absolutism and relativism. The point to stress here is that while the contextualist can, no less than the relativist, recognize a ‘standards’ parameter (and in this respect can allow the extension of “knows” to vary with standards), for the contextualist, its value will be supplied by the context of use, whereas the relativist (proper) takes it to be supplied completely independently of the context of use, by the context of assessment.

The second preliminary remark concerns the rationale for embracing a MacFarlane-style relativist semantics for “knows” which should be understood as differing from the kind of rationale we find in Lewis’s (1980) and Kaplan’s (1989) foundational work in semantics according to which sentence truth was relativized to familiar parameters such as worlds, times and locations. The important point here is that while Lewis’s and Kaplan’s reasons for “proliferating” parameters were primarily based on considerations to do with intensional operators, the more contemporary reasons (for example as appealed to by MacFarlane and other ‘new relativists’) for adding a standards parameter (that is in the context of assessment) are often to do with respecting linguistic use data, for example disagreement data (for example, see Baghramian and Carter 2015). For example, those who endorse truth-relativism about predicates of personal taste, (for example Lasersohn 2005; Kölbel 2003, MacFarlane 2014) take a truth-relativist semantics to better explain our patterns of using terms like “tasty” than do competing contextualist, sensitive and insensitive invariantist semantics. Accordingly, defending new-age relativism typically involves, for some area of discourse D, a philosophical comparison of costs and benefits of different competing semantic approaches to the relevant D expressions, replete with a case for thinking that the truth-relativist all-things-considered performs the best. A familiar such claimed advantage by a MacFarlane-style truth-relativist is that the kind of ‘subjectivity’ (for example standards-dependence) the contextualist claims the traditional invariantist cannot explain can be captured by the relativist without—or so the relativist tells us—“losing disagreement” where losing disagreement is a stock objection to contextualism in areas where disagreements appear genuine.

In three different places, MacFarlane (2005, 2009, 2014) has argued that knowledge attributions of the form “S knows that p” are assessment-sensitive. The focus of his presentation has varied across these three defenses of the view, but one core strand of thought resurfaces each time.

For ease of convenience, we can call this core strand MacFarlane’s “master argument” for an assessment-sensitive semantics for knowledge attributions.

Master Argument for Assessment Sensitive Semantics for Knowledge Attributions

(1) Standard invariantism, contextualism and SSI all have advantages and weaknesses.

(2) Relativism preserves the advantages while avoiding the disadvantages.
(3) Therefore, prima facie, we should be relativists about knowledge attributions.

The remainder of this section attempts to show why MacFarlane thinks that premises (1) and (2) of the master argument are true, and thus why he thinks we should embrace a relativist treatment of “knows”. The discussion to this end draws primarily from MacFarlane’s latest presentation of his relativist treatment of “knows”, one which gives the notion of relevant alternatives a central place.

Question: Why should we think (1) is true? As MacFarlane sees things, each of the three standard views of the semantics of knowledge-attributions—standard invariantism, contextualism and subject-sensitive invariantism (SSI)—has a grain of truth to it, as well as an “Achilles heel: a residuum of facts about our use of knowledge attributions that it can explain only with special pleading” (2005, 197).

His latest way of making this point relies on a kind of sceptical “conundrum”, one which arises in light of our ordinary practices of attributing knowledge, and which he uses as a frame of reference for magnifying what he regards as the salient weaknesses of the three standard views.

MacFarlane’s Conundrum: If you ask me whether I know that I have two dollars in my pocket, I will say that I do. I remember getting two dollar bills this morning as change for my breakfast; I would have stuffed them into my pocket, and I haven’t bought anything else since. On the other hand, if you ask me whether I know that my pockets have not been picked in the last few hours, I will say that I do not. Pickpockets are stealthy; one doesn’t always notice them. But how can I know that I have two dollars in my pocket if I don’t know that my pockets haven’t been picked? After all, if my pockets were picked, then I don’t have two dollars in my pocket. It is tempting to concede that I don’t know that I have two dollars in my pocket. And this capitulation seems harmless enough. All I have to do to gain the knowledge I thought I had is check my pockets. But we can play the same game again. I see the bills I received this morning. They are right there in my pocket. But can I rule out the possibility that they are counterfeits? Surely not. I don’t have the special skills that are needed to tell counterfeit from genuine bills. How, then, can I know that I have two dollars in my pocket? After all, if the bills are counterfeit, then I don’t have two dollars in my pocket (2014: 177).

MacFarlane articulates the form of the conundrum-argument as follows:

(i) p obviously entails q. [premise]

(ii) If a knows that p, then a could come to know that q without further empirical investigation. [1, Closure]

(iii) a does not know that q and could not come to know that q without further empirical investigation. [premise]

(iv) Hence a does not know that p. [2, 3, modus tollens]

Standard (insensitive) invariantism, the view that the epistemic standards that must be met for “S knows p” to be true are not (in any way) context sensitive, faces two central problems, by MacFarlane’s lights. Both problems are familiar. Firstly, standard invariantism has trouble making sense of the variability of our willingness to attribute knowledge. Secondly, standard invariantism seems stuck with an unhappy choice of either: embracing scepticism (if the invariantist simply accepts (iv)), embracing dogmatism (if the invariantist tries to avoid the sceptical conclusion (iv) by rejecting (iii)), or rejecting the closure principle which licenses the move from (i) to (ii)— that is to say, the principle that (as MacFarlane states it): ‘if a knows that p, and p obviously entails q, then a could come to know q without further empirical investigation’ (2014, 177).

By contrast, contextualism offers a way to avoid each of these problems facing standard invariantism. Unlike the invariantist whose position is at tension with data about the variability of our willingness to attribute knowledge, the contextualist has an explanation to offer for this variability: namely, our willingness to attribute knowledge varies across contexts because what is meant by “knows” is sensitive to the context in which it is used. As MacFarlane writes, “on the most natural form of this view, ‘knowing’ that p requires being able to rule out contextually relevant alternatives to p. Which alternatives are relevant depends on the context”. For instance, and with reference to MacFarlane’s Conundrum, when I’m first asked whether I know (p)—that I have two dollars in my pocket—‘knowing’ that p requires I need only to be able to rule out very basic alternatives (for example that I didn’t already spend the $2); I needn’t be able to also rule out that my pockets have been picked to count as ‘knowing’ (Ibid., p. 177). Though when someone asks me whether my pockets have been picked, then ‘knowing’ requires ruling out this alternative, and if I can’t, then the standard required for ‘knowing’ in this context is not met. Contextualism can make sense not only of the variability of our willingness to attribute knowledge, but it also avoids the unpalatable dilemma facing standard invariantism: reject closure or embrace scepticism or dogmatism. As the standard line goes, contextualists needn’t be tarred as sceptics or dogmatists because they can in fact preserve closure, at least, within any one context of use. So contextualism is looking pretty good.

However, although treating “knows” like “tall”—where the meaning of knows depends on the context in which it is being used—offers a nice escape route (vis-à-vis MacFarlane’s Conundrum), there are other respects in which treating “knows” like “tall” raises new problems. For example, an apparent disagreement between A and B about whether Michael Jordan is tall quickly is revealed to be no disagreement at all when it is clear to both parties that A means “tall for a given person” and B means “tall for an NBA player”. However, as MacFarlane notes, things are different with “know”. He writes:

If I say “I know that I have two dollars in my pocket,” and you later say, “You didn’t know that you had two dollars in your pocket, because you couldn’t rule out the possibility that the bills were counterfeit,” I will naturally take your claim to be a challenge to my own, which I will consider myself obliged either to defend or to withdraw. It does not seem an option for me to say, as the contextualist account would suggest I should: “Yes, you’re right, I didn’t know. Still, what I said was true, and I stick by it. I only meant that I could rule out the alternatives that were relevant then.” Similarly, the skeptic regards herself as disagreeing with ordinary knowledge claims—otherwise skepticism would not be very interesting. But if the contextualist is right, this is just a confusion (Ibid., p. 181; compare, Vogel 1990).

And here is where the special pleading comes in. The contextualist can attempt to say that our taking each other to agree/disagree with each other in the relevant kinds of cases is just a mistake of some sort. But, as MacFarlane sees it, this is a double edged sword: the more speaker error the contextualist must posit to explain the way we use “knows”, the less the contextualist can rely on the way we use “knows” to support contextualism. While contextualism does better than standard invariantism in that it avoids the dilemma raised to standard invariantism, standard invariantism makes better sense of disagreement.

By contrast with insensitive invariantism and contextualism, subject-sensitive invariantism (‘SSI’) might have the best offer to make yet. According to SSI, whether my utterance of “Archie knows that his car is in the parking lot” is true does depend on context, though in a different sense than it does for the contextualist: rather than depending on what alternatives I (the utterer of the sentence) can rule out (for example whether or not I know there are no thieves lurking nearby) what matters on SSI is whether Archie, the subject of the knowledge attribution, can rule out the alternatives relevant to his practical environment. This proposal has some advantages. For one thing, the ‘SSIist’ looks well-positioned to make sense of disagreement, given that ‘knows’ is not being treated like ‘tall’. Further, the SSIist unlike the insensitive invariantist can make sense of variability in willingness to attribute knowledge. Where the special pleading comes in concerns temporal and modal embedding.

The alleged problem (see, for example, Blome-Tillmann 2009) for SSIists is this: temporal and modal operators shift the circumstances of evaluation in such a way that, if SSI is true, we should expect that (in cases of temporal and modal embeddings of “know”) knowledge attributions will track whether the subject can rule out alternatives relevant in the subject’s practical environment in the (temporally or modally shifted) circumstance of evaluation. But this prediction doesn’t seem to pan out, as speakers are inclined to regard the same alternatives as relevant when evaluating non-embedded and embedded uses of “know”.

As MacFarlane sees it, I will not be inclined to say either of the following, which the SSIist predicts I should be willing to say:

Temporal embedding: I know that I had two dollars in my pocket after breakfast, but I didn’t know it this morning, when the possibility of counterfeits was relevant to my practical deliberations—even though I believed it then on the same grounds that I do now.

Modal embedding: I know that I have two dollars in my pocket, but if the possibility of counterfeiting were relevant to my practical situation, I would not know this—even if I believed it on the same grounds as now.

The moral of the story—though see Stanley (2016) for a reply on behalf of the SSIist—is supposed to be that, while each of the three leading competitor views does better than others in some respects, none of these views can make sense of our willingness to attribute knowledge without some sort of Achilles heel. And that is more or less MacFarlane’s defense of (1) in the master argument.

What about premise (2)? Premise (2) of the master argument, recall, says that:

(2) Relativism preserves the advantages while avoiding the disadvantages.

Toward the end of defending (2), MacFarlane suggests that what we want is a semantics for knowledge attributions that satisfies the following three key desiderata, desiderata such that (as he takes himself to have established in defending (1)) none of the three leading contender views can satisfy all of them:

Alternative-variation: It would explain how the alternatives one must rule out to count as knowing vary with context (otherwise, the view faces the dilemma facing insensitive invariantism, with respect to MacFarlane’s conundrum).

Alternative variation context ( use): the alternatives one must rule out to count as knowing must not vary with context of use (otherwise: disagreement cannot be preserved, a la contextualism).

Alternative variation context ( circumstances of subject): the alternatives one must rule out to count as knowing must not vary with circumstances of the subject to whom knowledge is ascribed (otherwise: temporal and modal embeddings cannot be made sense of, a la SSI).

Here is where the relativist is said to come to the rescue. The first step is to preserve alternative variation by taking the relevant alternatives to be determined by the context of assessment. As MacFarlane puts it:

The resulting view would agree with contextualism in its predictions about when speakers can attribute knowledge, since when one is considering whether to make a claim, one is assessing it from one’s current context of use. So it would explain the variability data as ably as contextualism does, and offer the same way of rescuing closure from the challenge posed by the conundrum. But it would differ from contextualism in its predictions about truth assessments of knowledge claims made by other speakers, and about when knowledge claims made earlier must be retracted. Moreover … it would vindicate our judgments about disagreement between knowledge claims across contexts (MacFarlane 2014, 188).

What about the temporal and modal embedding problem that faced SSI? Relativism, he argues, dodges this because a parameter for a set of contextually relevant alternatives is added to the index as a parameter distinct from world and time indices such that shifting the world and time indices (for example as when ‘knows’ is temporally or modally embedded) does not involve shifting also the relevant alternatives parameter (Ibid., 188).

the relation “knows” expresses does not vary with the context—there is just a single knowing relation—but the extension of that relation varies across relevant alternatives. As a result, it makes sense to ask about the extension of “knows” only relative to both a context of use (which fixes the world and time) and a context of assessment (which fixes the relevant alternatives). (Ibid., 189).

MacFarlane takes the view he hass proposed as one that escapes the sceptical conundrum while threading the gauntlet so as to avoid the disagreement problem that faces contextualists and the temporal and modal embedding problem that faces SSI. At this stage, we can see why MacFarlane thinks his view has all the advantages and none of the disadvantages. This concludes the presentation of MacFarlane’s defense of premise (2) of the master argument. And from (1) and (2) it follows that “knows” gets a relativist treatment.

6. New (Semantic) Epistemic Relativism: Issues and Implications in Epistemology

Is MacFarlane’s argument sound? Interestingly, this is relatively new terrain. The above line of argument is from 2014, so there has yet to be substantial criticism in the literature to this new form of relativism. See, however, Carter (2016, Ch. 7) for criticisms of MacFarlane’s (2014) view to the effect that the view generates the wrong results in cases of environmental epistemic luck and normative defeaters.

In this section, however, the focus is on implications in epistemology for embracing an assessment-sensitive semantics for “knows.” MacFarlane concludes his 2009 defense of an assessment-sensitive semantics for “knows” with a section entitled “Questions for the Relativist.” One question he asks, in light of his recommendation to extend a truth-relativist semantics for “knows” is: “are there other expressions for which a relativist treatment is needed? How does know relate to them?” (MacFarlane 2009: 16). A more specific version of this question is: if “know” gets a truth-relativist semantics, then since knowledge relates intimately with other epistemic concepts, do any other epistemic concepts need a relativist treatment? This is an important question and one which has obvious implications for the wider shape new epistemic relativism would take.

In tracing out epistemological ramifications of a relativist treatment of ‘knows’ in epistemology, it is helpful to begin with especially tight conceptual connections (between knowledge and other epistemic standings) and move outward from there. This section takes as a starting point two such connections: namely, connections between propositional knowledge and (i) evidence; and (ii) knowledge-how (for a more detailed discussion, see Carter 2017).

Firstly, evidence. Consider, as an example case, Williamson’s (2000) knowledge-evidence equivalence: E=K. Suppose, for reductio, that E=K, and further, that the truth-conditions for E are not assessment sensitive, but the truth-conditions for K, are. The resulting tension would be untenable (at best), at worst, contradictory. While of course Williamson’s view is controversial, it seems that if Williamson is right that our evidence is what we know, and thus that S’s evidence includes E if, and only if, S knows E, then one who embraces a relativist semantics for (propositional) knowledge ascriptions should be willing to embrace the view that that evidence ascriptions are assessment-sensitive.

Of course, E=K is a controversial position. The above point however was meant to illustrate one very straightforward sense in which a commitment to giving a relativist treatment to “knows” would have a straightforward implication in epistemological theory.

Let us move from a straightforward equivalence thesis (as was E=K) to a reductivist thesis. We needn’t look further than the most standard contemporary version of intellectualism about knowledge-how. Reductivist versions of intellectualism (compare Bengson & Moffett (2011)) insist that knowing how to do something is just a species of propositional knowledge (Stanley 2010, 207). As Stanley puts it:

[…] you know how to ride a bicycle if and only if you know in what way you could ride a bicycle. But you know in what way you could ride a bicycle if and only if you possess some propositional knowledge, viz. knowing, of a certain way w which is a way in which you could ride a bicycle, that w is a way in which you could ride a bicycle (Ibid., 209).

Like Williamson’s E=K thesis, Stanley’s reduction of knowledge-how to a kind of knowledge-that is also controversial, though very much a live and increasingly popular view in contemporary epistemology. Suppose, for reductio, that knowing how to do something is (a la Stanley) just a kind of propositional knowledge, and further, that the truth-conditions for knowing how to do something (for example, as in the case of attributions of the form “Hannah knows how to ride a bike”) are not assessment sensitive, but the truth-conditions for proposition knowledge are, such that “Hannah knows p” is assessment-sensitive, where p is a proposition specifying of a way w which is a way in which Hannah could ride a bicycle, that w is a way in which Hannah could ride a bicycle. Again, the resulting tension would be untenable (at best), at worst, contradictory.

What the foregoing brief consideration of evidence and knowledge-how indicates is that, at least for those with certain substantive commitments in epistemology where epistemic standings other than knowledge are either identified with or in some way reduced to (a kind of) propositional knowledge, an extension of an assessment-sensitive semantics to these standings as well looks potentially unavoidable. One interesting future direction of research will be to trace out the implications of a relativist semantics for “knows” even further, by moving outward to epistemic standings with (perhaps) looser but not insignificant conceptual connections to knowledge, such as justification, rationality, understanding and intellectual virtue. See Carter (2014; 2015, Ch. 8) for some discussion here. A further complementary direction for future research will be to consider how other notions, besides “knows’ for which a relativist semantics has been proposed might have implications in epistemology. A natural candidate expression here is “ought” (for example, Kolodny and MacFarlane 2010; MacFarlane 2014, Ch. 11). In short, if the moral ought gets a relativist treatment, it is hard to see how the epistemic ought would not likewise. However, if the epistemic “ought” is relative, then this has ramifications for epistemic normativity more generally. For example, if whether one ought to believe something is a relative matter, then plausibly, whether one is justified in believing something is a relative matter. Likewise, if epistemic oughts are relative, then presumably so will the epistemic norms which generate epistemic oughts.

A relativist treatment of “knows” also stands to have interesting implications for epistemologists concerned with how the kind of function the concept of knowledge plays might potentially inform our theory of knowledge. A flourishing contemporary research program within mainstream epistemology, one which Robin McKenna (2013) has called the “functional turn” in epistemology, takes as a starting point that “a successful analysis of knowledge must also fit with an account of the distinctive function or social role that the concept plays in our community […] Call this the ‘functional turn’ in epistemology (McKenna 2013: 335-336). Participants in the functional turn in epistemology appeal to practical explications of the concept of knowledge, on the basis of which they identify a function, where that function is regarded as generating an ex ante constraint on an analysis of knowledge (or a semantics of knowledge attributions). Henderson (2009; 2011), McKenna (2013; 2014), Pritchard (2012) and Hannon (2013; 2014; 2015) have for instance defended views about the concept of knowledge (or knowledge ascriptions) inspired by Craig’s (1990) favoured account of the function of knowledge as identifying good informants. By contrast, Kappel (2010), Kelp (2011) and Rysiew identify closure of inquiry as the relevant function and regard this rather than Craig’s tracking-good-informants function as generative of an ex ante constraint for theorizing about knowledge and its truth-conditions. For Krista Lawlor (2013) the relevant function is identified (a la Austin) as that of providing assurance.

Can “knows”, given a relativist treatment, potentially play (any of) these widely identified functional roles— that is, of identifying reliable informants, marking the closure of inquiry or providing assurance? This is an open question for future research.

Finally, and much more generally, semantic (new) relativism about “knows” raises some interesting metaepistemological issues. Mainstream epistemologists, by and large, take for granted within epistemological theory that the explanandum under the description of “knowledge” is not relative. If the ordinary concept of knowledge, however, requires a relativist treatment, then this presses the complicated issue of whether the ordinary concept of knowledge and the concept of interest to epistemologists are the same, and (even more generally) just how knowledge attributions should inform the theory of knowledge.

7. References and Further Reading

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Author Information

J. Adam Carter
Email: jadamcarter@gmail.com
University of Edinburgh
United Kingdom