The Experience Machine
The experience machine is a thought experiment first devised by Robert Nozick in the 1970s. In the last decades of the 20th century, an argument based on this thought experiment has been considered a knock-down objection to hedonism about well-being, the thesis that our well-being—that is, the goodness or badness of our lives for us—is entirely determined by our pains and pleasures. The consensus about the strength of this argument was so vigorous that, in manuals about ethics, it had become canonical to present hedonism as a surely false view because of the experience machine thought experiment. However, in the second decade of the 21st century, an experimental literature emerged that successfully questioned whether this thought experiment is compelling. This suggests that the experience machine thought experiment, in addition to being central to the debate on hedonism about well-being, touches other topical debates, such as the desirability of an experimental method in philosophy and the possibility of progress in this discipline. Moreover, since the experience machine thought experiment addresses the question of the value of virtual lives, it has become particularly relevant with the technological developments of virtual reality. In fact, the debate on the experience machine thought experiment or “intuition pump” also affects the debate on the value of virtual lives in relation to technological advances.
In this article, one of the original formulations of the experience machine thought experiment (EMTE) is first presented, together with the question that it is meant to isolate, its target theory, how to best understand the argument based on it, and the implications that have historically been attributed to it. Second, a revisionist trend in the scholarship that undermines traditional confidence in the argument based on the experience machine thought experiment is introduced. Third, some objections to this revisionist trend, especially the expertise objection, are considered. Finally, some further versions of the experience machine thought experiment are discussed that have been advanced in response to the “death” of the original one.
Table of Contents
- Nozick’s Thought Experiment
- Target Theory: Mental Statism
- Some Stipulations of the Experience Machine Thought Experiment
- The Argument Based on the Experience Machine Thought Experiment
- The Experience Machine Thought Experiment as an Intuition Pump
- Imaginative Failures
- The Status Quo Bias
- Methodological Challenges
- The Expertise Objection
- The Experience Pill
- A New Generation of Experience Machine Thought Experiments
- Concluding Remarks
- References and Further Reading
Nozick first introduced the experience machine thought experiment in 1974 in his book Anarchy, State, and Utopia. This section focuses, however, on the formulation found in Nozick’s book The Examined Life (1989), because this version is particularly effective in capturing the narrative of the thought experiment. After this presentation, the structure of the thought experiment and the implications that it has traditionally been thought to have are summarized..
In The Examined Life (1989), Nozick presented the EMTE as follows:
Imagine a machine that could give you any experience (or sequence of experiences) you might desire. When connected to this experience machine, you can have the experience of writing a great poem or bringing about world peace or loving someone and being loved in return. You can experience the felt pleasures of these things, how they feel “from the inside.” You can program your experiences for tomorrow, or this week, or this year, or even for the rest of your life. If your imagination is impoverished, you can use the library of suggestions extracted from biographies and enhanced by novelists and psychologists. You can live your fondest dreams “from the inside.” Would you choose to do this for the rest of your life? If not, why not? (Other people also have the same option of using these machines which, let us suppose, are provided by friendly and trustworthy beings from another galaxy, so you need not refuse connecting in order to help others.) The question is not whether to try the machine temporarily, but whether to enter it for the rest of your life. Upon entering, you will not remember having done this; so no pleasures will get ruined by realizing they are machine-produced. Uncertainty too might be programmed by using the machine’s optional random device (upon which various preselected alternatives can depend).
The most relevant difference between Nozick’s two versions of the thought experiment lies in the temporal description of plugging in. In the 1974’s EMTE the plugging in is for two years, while in the 1989’s EMTE the plugging in is for life. In his testing of the 1974’s EMTE, Weijers (2014) reported that 9% of the participants averse to plugging in justified it by saying something like “getting out every two years would be depressing”. On the one hand, this kind of reply is legitimate: well-being concerns lives and to maximize a life’s net pleasure, it is fully legitimate to consider the possible displeasure felt every two years when unplugging. Yet, on the other hand, this kind of reply seems to elude the question that the thought experiment is designed to isolate. Thus, the 1989’s EMTE is more effective in tracking the choice between two lives, one spent in touch with reality and one spent inside an experience machine (EM), that the thought experiment aims at isolating.
Several studies have suggested that the majority of readers of the EMTE are averse to plugging in. Weijers (2014) found that this judgement was shared by 84% of the participants asked to respond to Nozick’s 1974’s EMTE. Similarly, 71% of the subjects facing the succinct version of EMTE developed by Hindriks and Douven (2018) shared the pro-reality judgement, a percentage different from Weijers’ but still a considerable majority. Since spending one’s life, or at least a part of it, inside the EM should be favored according to mental state theories of well-being in general and prudential hedonism—that is, hedonism about well-being—in particular, these majority’s preferences might be taken as evidence against mental state theories of well-being and prudential hedonism. In fact, people’s judgements in favor of living in touch with reality have been thought to mean that reality must be intrinsically prudentially valuable. In this context, the term “prudential” is understood as referring to what is good for a person, which is often taken to correspond to well-being. If reality is intrinsically prudentially valuable, theories of well-being that hold that only how experiences feel “from the inside” directly contributes to well-being are false. With this argument based on the EMTE and on the response it elicits in the majority of subjects, this thought experiment has been widely considered as providing a knock-down argument against mental state theories of well-being and prudential hedonism. In other words, these theories have been traditionally quickly dismissed through appeal to the EMTE. Weijers (2014), for example, compiled a non-exhaustive list of twenty-eight scholars writing that the EMTE constitutes a successful refutation of prudential hedonism and mental state theories of well-being.
This section identifies the target theory of the thought experiment. Traditionally, the experience machine has been mostly understood as a thought experiment directed against prudential hedonism. It should however be noted that the points being made against prudential hedonism by the EMTE equally apply to non-hedonistic mental state theories of well-being. Mental state theories of well-being value subjective mental states¾how our experiences feel to us from the inside¾and nothing else. Put simply, what does not affect our consciousness cannot be good or bad for us. Accordingly, for mental state theories, well-being is necessarily experiential. Notice that these theories do not dispute that states of affairs contribute to well-being. For example, they do not dispute that winning a Nobel Prize makes one’s life go better. Mental state theories dispute that states of affairs intrinsically affect well-being. According to these theories, winning a Nobel Prize makes one’s life go better only instrumentally because, for example, it causes pleasure.
Different mental states theories can point to different mental states as the ultimate prudential good. For example, according to subjective desire-satisfactionism, well-being is increased by believing that one is getting what one wants, rather than by states of affairs aligning with what one wants, as in the standard version of desire-satisfactionism. Standard desire-satisfactionism—a prominent alternative to hedonism in philosophy of well-being—is usually thought to be immune from objections based on the EMTE: since most of us want to live in touch with reality, plugging into the EM would frustrate this desire and make our lives go worse. However, the supposed insusceptibility of standard desire-satisfactionism to the EMTE is questionable. In fact, given that a minority of people want to plug into the EM, these people’s lives, according to standard desire-satisfactionism, would be better inside the EM. This implication conflicts with the majority’s judgement that a life inside the EM is not a good life. Note that if a person’s desires concern only mental states, standard desire-satisfactionism becomes undistinguishable from a mental state theory of well-being.
In any case, probably because prudential hedonism is the most famous mental state theory of well-being, the EMTE has traditionally been used against this particular theory. Thus, this article refers to prudential hedonism as the target theory of the EMTE, although the argument based on it is equally applicable to any other mental state theory of well-being.
By Nozick’s stipulation, we should be able to disregard any metaphysical and epistemological concerns that the thought experiment might elicit. Since the EMTE is meant to evoke the intuition that physical reality, in contrast to the virtual reality of the EM, is intrinsically valuable, it might seem natural to ask “what is reality?” and “how can we know it?”. If there is no such thing as reality, reality cannot be intrinsically valuable. In other words, if there is no mind-independent reality, mental state theories of well-being cannot be objected to on the ground of not intrinsically valuing mind-independent reality (the metaphysical issue).
Similarly, someone might say that even if there is a mind-independent reality, we cannot know it. In this case, reality would collapse in a supposed intrinsic value with no use in evaluating lives¾if we cannot know what is real, we cannot judge whether a life has more or less of it. For example, if we do not have knowledge of reality, we cannot say whether a life in touch with the physical world or a life inside an EM is more real (the epistemological issue).
Nevertheless, the EMTE is designed to isolate a prudential concern and stipulates that we should ignore any metaphysical or epistemological concern elicited by the narrative of the thought experiment. Thus, below, Nozick’s stipulation of common-sense conceptions of reality and our access to it are adopted (for a thought experiment with an EMTE-like narrative directed against metaphysical realism, see The Brain in a Vat Argument).
Nozick also asks readers to ignore contextual factors. For example, he claims, we should not evaluate whether a life inside an EM is worse than a life of torture. In fact, it seems reasonable to prefer a life plugged into an EM to a life of intense suffering, but this preference does not respect the thought experiment’s stipulation. To isolate the relevant prudential question, we should think of a hedonically average life. Having said that, we might doubt that our trade-off between pleasure and reality can be insensitive to contextual factors. If we are among the hedonically less privileged people, for example someone being afflicted by chronic depression or pain, it seems reasonable to want to plug in.
The argument based on the EMTE has sometimes been interpreted as a deductive argument. According to this version of the argument, if the vast majority of reasonable people value reality in addition to pleasure, then reality has intrinsic prudential value; therefore, prudential hedonism is false. The main problem with this deductive argument consists in disregarding the is-ought dichotomy: knowing “what is” does not by itself entail knowing “what ought to be”. This argument jumps too boldly from a descriptive claim—the majority of people prefer reality—to a normative claim—reality is intrinsically valuable. The deductive argument is thus invalid because the fact that reality intrinsically matters to many of us does not necessarily imply that it should be intrinsically valued by all of us. For example, the majority of us, perhaps instrumentally, value wealth, but it does not necessarily follow that is wrong not to value wealth.
Instead, the most convincing argument based on the EMTE seems to be an appeal to the best explanation. According to this version of the argument, the best explanation for something intrinsically mattering to many people is something being intrinsically valuable. In the abductive argument, the passage from the descriptive level to the normative level, from “reality intrinsically matters to the majority of people” to “reality is intrinsically valuable”, is more plausibly understood as an inference to the best explanation.
As explained above, according to the abductive argument based on the EMTE intuition pump, reality being intrinsically prudentially valuable is the best explanation for reality intrinsically mattering to the majority of people. One can however wonder whether this is really the best explanation available. In the first two decades of the 21st century, a trend in the scholarship on the EMTE questioned this abduction by pointing to several biases that might determine, and thus explain, people’s apparent preference for reality. In this and the next two sections, phenomena advanced by this revisionist scholarship that seem to partially or significantly bias judgments about the EMTE are presented. These distorting factors are grouped under hedonistic bias, imaginative failures, and status quo bias.
The hedonistic bias is the most speculative of the proposed biases that have been thought to affect our responses to the EMTE. According to Silverstein (2000), who argued for the influence of such a hedonistic bias on our reactions to the EMTE, the preferences apparently conflicting with prudential hedonism are themselves hedonistically motivated, because, he claimed, the preference for not plugging in is motivated by a pleasure-maximizing concern. Silverstein’s argument is based on the thesis that the desire for pleasure is at the heart of our motivational system, in the sense that pleasure determines the formation of all desires.
The existence of a similar phenomenon affecting the formation of preferences has also been put forward by Hewitt (2009). Following Hewitt, reported judgements cannot be directly taken as evidence regarding intrinsic value. In fact, we usually devise thought experiments to investigate our pre-reflective preferences. The resulting judgements are therefore also pre-reflective, which means that their genesis is not transparent to us and that reflection on them does not guarantee their sources becoming transparent. Thus, our judgements elicited by the EMTE do not necessarily track intrinsic value.
Notice that Silverstein’s argument for the claim that pleasure-maximization alone explains the anti-hedonistic preferences depends on the truth of psychological hedonism—that is, the idea that our motivational system is exclusively directed at pleasure. However, the EMTE can be taken as constituting itself a counterexample to psychological hedonism. In fact, the majority of us, when facing the choice of plugging into an EM, have a preference for the pleasure-minimizing option. What the studies on our responses to the EMTE tell us is precisely that most people have preferences conflicting with psychological hedonism. The majority of people do not seem to have an exclusively pleasure-maximizing motivational system. The descriptive claim of psychological hedonism seems to struggle with a convincing counterexample. Psychological hedonists are thus forced to appeal to unproven unconscious desires¾conscious pleasure-minimizing preferences as a result of an unconscious desire for pleasure—to defend their theory.
Nevertheless, a week version of Silverstein’s hedonistic bias, according to which pleasure-maximization partly explains the anti-hedonistic judgements, seems plausible. In fact, empirical research has shown a partial role of immediate pleasure-maximization in decision-making. This conclusion points in the direction of a weak hedonistic bias—that is, the fact that apparently non-hedonistic judgements might be partly motivated by pleasure-maximization. For example, Nozick asks to disregard the distress that choosing to plug in might cause in the short-term. According to Nozick, we should eventually be rational and accept an immediate suffering for the sake of long-term pleasure. Still, as everyday experience shows us, we do not always have such a rational attitude toward immediate suffering for a long-term gain. Some people do not go to the dentist although it would benefit them, or do not overcome their fear of flying although they would love to visit a different continent. Again, it seems doubtful that the factor “distress about plugging in” is actually disregarded just because Nozick asks to do so. Our adverse judgement about plugging in might be hedonistically motivated by the avoidance of this displeasure, regardless of Nozick asking us to disregard it. However, the claim that pleasure-maximization plays a remarkable role in our anti-hedonistic responses to the EMTE is an empirically testable claim. As a result, even if the hedonistic bias seems to be a real phenomenon, it would be speculative to advance that it crucially affects our judgements about the EMTE without appealing to empirical evidence.
Thought experiments are devices of the imagination. In this section, two confounding factors involving imagination are discussed: imaginative resistance and overactive imagination. Those phenomena are empirically shown to significantly distort our judgements about the EMTE. Imaginative resistance occurs when subjects reject some important stipulation of a thought experiment. Regarding the EMTE, examples include worrying about an EM’s malfunctioning or its inability to provide the promised bliss, although the scenario is explicit that the EM works perfectly and provides blissful feelings. According to Weijers’ study (2014), imaginative resistance affected 34% of the subjects that did not want to plug into the EM. In other words, one third of the participants that chose reality appeared to disregard some of the thought experiment’s stipulations. This is important because it shows, in general, that imagined scenarios are not fully reliable tools of investigation and, in particular, that a large portion of the pro-reality judgements are potentially untrustworthy because they do not comply with the EMTE’s stipulations.
Notice that philosophers can suffer from imaginative resistance too. Bramble (2016), while arguing that prudential hedonism might not entail the choice of plugging in, claims that the EM does not provide the pleasures of love and friendship. According to him, artificial intelligence is so primitive in regard to language, facial expressions, bodily gestures, and actions that it cannot deliver us the full extent of social pleasures. While his claim seems true of the technology of the mid-2010s, it clearly violates the thought experiment’s stipulations. In addition to being implied by the 1974’s version of EMTE, Nozick says explicitly in his 1989’s version that the machine has to be imagined as perfectly simulating the pleasure of loving and being loved.
Overactive imagination is another distorting phenomenon related to imagination. This phenomenon consists in subjects imagining non-intended features of the EMTE. In his test of Nozick’s 1974’s scenario, Weijers (2014) claimed to have found that 10% of the pro-reality responses displayed signs of overactive imagination. In other words, he claimed that a non-negligible proportion of participants unnecessarily exaggerated aspects of the thought experiment’s narrative. Notice that, here, Weijers’ claim seems problematic. Weijers reported that some subjects declared that they did not want to plug in because “the machine seems scary or unnatural” and he took these declarations as indicating cases of overactive imagination. Yet, the artificiality of the EM is one of the main reasons advanced by Nozick for not plugging in: ruling out such a response as biased seems therefore unfair. Nevertheless, putting aside this issue, the possibility of the EMTE eliciting judgements biased by technophobic concerns seems very plausible. This possibility has been made more likely by the popularity of the film The Matrix, in which a similar choice between reality and comfort is presented. Yet, this movie elicits a new set of intuitions that the EMTE is not supposed to elicit. For example, political freedom is severely hampered in The Matrix. The machines, after having defeated us in a war, enslaved us. Notice the difference with the 1989’s version of EMTE where “friendly and trustworthy beings from another galaxy” serve us. Thus, the narrative of The Matrix should not be used to understand the EMTE because it elicits a further layer of intuitions, such as, for example, the (intuitive) desire not to be exploited.
Considering overall imaginative failures (imaginative resistance and overactive imagination together), in Löhr’s study (2018) on the EMTE, it affected 46% of the pro-reality philosophers and 39% of the pro-reality laypeople. Thus, given the imaginative failures that affect the EMTE, it seems that this thought experiment may legitimately be accused of being far-fetched both in its narrative—at least in its first version, as the second version clarifies the benevolent intention of the EM providers—and in its stipulations. In fact, it might be that we lack the capacity to properly form judgements in outlandish cases, such as the one the EMTE asks us to imagine.
Nevertheless, concerning the role of technophobia and fantasy in imaginative failures, consider that the technological innovations of the beginning of the 21st century render virtual reality progressively less fantastic. This increasing concreteness of virtual reality technology, compared to the 1970s when the thought experiment was first devised, might lead to a progressive reduction of the influence of these factors on responses to the EMTE. Even more, it is not implausible that one day the pro-reality judgement will not anymore be shared by the majority of people. The evidential power of thought experiments is likely to be locally and historically restricted; therefore, we cannot exclude the fact that changes in technology and culture will determine different judgements in subjects presented with the EMTE.
Remember that the EMTE’s target theory is prudential hedonism, not hedonistic utilitarianism. The offer to plug in does not concern maximizing pleasure in general, but one’s own pleasure. Well-being concerns what is ultimately good for a person. Thus, in deliberating about what is in your best interest, you need to be certain about the persistence of the you in question. Given that, the thought experiment would be disrupted if the continuation of your personal identity were not guaranteed by the EM.
Bramble (2016) expressed precisely this worry. Remember that the EM is thought to provide a virtual reality that is experientially real; thus, the users need to be oblivious of the experiences and choices that led them to plug in. Following Nozick’s infelicitous mentioning of plugging in as a “kind of suicide”, Bramble held that the EM, in order to provide this kind of feeling of reality, might kill you in the sense that your consciousness will be replaced with a distinct one. Personal identity would therefore be threatened by the EM, and since we are trying to understand what is a good life for the person living it, it seems easy to see that ending this life would not be good. Following Bramble, it seems that we have a strong reason for not plugging in: it is bad for us to die. Similarly, Belshaw (2014) expressed concerns about the EMTE and personal identity. In particular, Belshaw claimed that to preserve a sense of reality inside an EM, the memory erasure operated by the machine should be invasive. Belshaw’s point seems stronger than Bramble’s because it does not concern a small memory-dampening. Belshaw points to a tension between two requirements of the EM: preserving personal identity and providing exceptional experiences that feel real (“You are, as you know, nothing special. So, seeming to rush up mountains, rival Proust as a novelist, become the love-interest of scores of youngsters, will all strike you as odd”). For him, if some alterations of one’s psychology do not threaten personal identity, this is not the case of the EM, where invasive alterations are required to provide realistic exceptional experiences.
Nevertheless, both Bramble’s and Benshaw’s points can be seen as cases of imaginative resistance. In fact, although the experience machine thought experiment does not explicitly stipulate that the EM’s memory erasure can occur while guaranteeing the persistence of personal identity, this can be considered as implied by it. It should be imagined that the amnestic re-embodiment—that is, the re-embodiment of the subject of experience inside the EM without the conscious knowledge that he is presently immersed in a virtual environment and possesses a virtual body—preserves personal identity. If you pay attention to the text of the thought experiment, it emerges that nothing in the wording insinuates that personal identity is not preserved. The continuation of personal identity results as implicitly stipulated by the thought-experiment. Neither Bramble’s point nor Belshaw’s does comply with this implicit stipulation and they thus end up constituting cases of imaginative resistance. In fact, whether the preservation of personal identity is technically problematic or not does not concern the prudential question at stake.
Drawing a clear-cut distinction between moral and prudential concerns should help refine the relevant judgements regarding the EMTE. By Nozick’s stipulation, only prudential judgements are at stake in this though experiment. However, imaginative resistance is a plausible phenomenon supported by empirical evidence. According to it, subjects do not fully comply with the stipulations of thought experiments. The possibility that judgements elicited by the EMTE are distorted by moral concerns seems therefore likely. In fact, according to experimental evidence, the absence of a clear-cut distinction between morality and well-being, such as laypeople’s evaluative conception of happiness, seems to be the default framework.
Weijers (2014) reported answers to the EMTE like “I can’t because I have responsibilities to others” among participants that did not want to connect. Similarly, Löhr (2018) mentioned pro-reality philosophers’ answers like: “I cannot ignore my husband and son,” “I cannot ignore the dependents”, or “Gf[girlfriend] would be sad”. These answers can be seen as examples of imaginative resistance. When considering the EMTE, we should by stipulation disregard our moral judgements—that is, to “play by the rules” of the thought experiment one should be able to disregard morality. In his 1974’s version, Nozick claims “others can also plug in to have the experiences they want, so there’s no need to stay unplugged to serve them. Ignore problems such as who will service the machines if everyone plugs in”. Nozick asks us to imagine a scenario where everyone could plug into an EM. Since, by stipulation, there is no need to care for others, we should disregard our preference for it. Taking moral evaluations into account in one’s decision about plugging into an EM constitutes a possible case of imaginative resistance.
However, it is far from clear that we are actually able to disregard our moral concerns. In any case, it seems unlikely that stipulating that we should not worry about something necessarily implies that we will actually not worry about it. For example, being told to suspend our moral judgement in a sexual violence case because of the perpetrator’s mental incapacity does not imply that, as jurors, we will be able to do so. Prudential value is not the only kind of value that we employ in evaluating life-choices: the majority of people value more in life than their well-being. Concerning the EMTE, common-sense morality seems to deny the moral goodness of plugging in. Common-sense morality views plugging in as self-indulgent and therefore blameworthy. Moreover, it values making a real impact on the world, such as saving lives, not just having the experience of making such an impact.
To understand the imaginative resistance observed in philosophers’ answers to the EMTE, it should be noted that the main philosophical ethical systems seem to deny the moral goodness of plugging in. It seems that even hedonistic utilitarianism, the only ethical system prima facie sympathetic to plugging in, would not consider this choice morally good. To morally plug in, a hedonistic utilitarian agent should believe that this would maximize net happiness. This seems plausible only if all the other existing sentient beings are already inside an EM (and they have no obligations toward future generations). Otherwise, net happiness would be maximized by the agent’s not plugging in, since this would allow her to eventually convince two or more other beings to plug in, and two or more blissful lives, rather than only hers, will be a greater contribution to overall happiness. Given that moral philosophical concerns seem to oppose the choice of plugging in, it appears plausible that philosophers’ judgements elicited by the EMTE are also distorted by morality.
To sum up, moral concerns constitute a plausible case of imaginative resistance distorting philosophers’ and laypeople’s judgements about the EMTE. Most people seem to agree that pleasant mental states are valuable. Yet, it is unlikely that everyone is persuaded by the claim that, all things considered, only personal pleasure is intrinsically valuable. Nevertheless, if we consider only prudential good, this claim seems importantly more convincing. In other words, if we carefully reason to dismiss our moral concerns, plugging into an EM seems a more appealing choice.
In addition to the biases mentioned above, the status quo bias has received special attention in the literature. The status quo bias is the phenomenon according to which subjects tend to irrationally prefer the status quo—that is, the way things currently are. In other words, when facing complex decision-making, subjects tend to follow the adage “when in doubt, do nothing”. This bias is thought to show up in many decisions, such as voting for an incumbent office holder or not trading in a car. Moving to the relevance of the status quo bias for the EMTE, it seems that when subjects are presented with the choice of leaving reality and plugging in, most appear averse to it. However, when they are presented with the choice of leaving the EM to “move” into reality, they also appear averse to it (see Kolber, 1994). This phenomenon seems best explained by our irrational preference for the status quo, rather than by a constant valuing of pleasure and reality. In 1994, Kolber advanced the idea of the reverse experience machine (REM). In this revised version of the thought experiment, readers are asked: “would you get off of an experience machine to which you are already connected?”. In the REM, subjects have thus to choose between staying into the EM or moving to reality while losing a significant amount of net pleasure. Since the REM is supposed to isolate the same prudential concern as the EMTE through a choice between pleasure and reality (with a proportion of pleasure and reality similar in both thought experiments), the REM should elicit the same reactions as the EMTE. The replication of the results would indicate that Nozick’s thought experiment is able to isolate this concern. Instead, when De Brigard tested a version of the REM, the results did not fulfill this prediction. While a large majority of readers of the original EMTE are unwilling to plug in, when imagining being already connected to an EM and having to decide whether to unplug or stay, the percentage of subjects that chose reality over the machine dropped significantly to 13%. De Brigard (2010) and the following literature have interpreted this result as demonstrating the influence of the status quo bias. Because of the status quo bias, when choosing between alternatives, subjects display an unreasonable tendency to leave things as they are. Applied to the EMTE, the status quo bias explains why the majority of subjects prefer to stay in reality when they are (or think they are) in reality and to stay in an EM when imagining being already inside one.
This interpretation is also supported by another empirical study conducted by Weijers (2014). Weijers introduced a scenario—called “the stranger No Status Quo scenario” (or “the stranger NSQ”)—that is meant to reduce the impact of status quo bias. This scenario is partly based on the idea that the more we are detached from the subject for whom we have to take a decision, the more rational we should be. Accordingly, the scenario NSQ asks us to decide not whether we would plug into an EM, but whether a stranger should. Moreover, the Stranger NSQ scenario adds a 50-50 time split: at the time of the choice, the stranger has already spent half of her time inside an EM and has had most of her enjoyable experiences while plugged into it. Both elements—that is, the fact that we are asked to choose for a stranger and the fact that this stranger has already spent half of her life inside an EM—are meant to minimize the influence of the status quo bias. Weijers observed that in this case a tiny majority (55%) of the participants chose pleasure over reality. In other words, a small majority of subjects, when primed to choose the best life for a stranger who has already spent half of her life into an EM, preferred pleasure over reality. This result again contradicts the vast majority of pro-reality responses elicited by Nozick’s original thought experiment. Importantly, Weijers’ study is noteworthy because it avoided the main methodological flaws of De Brigard’s (2010), such as a small sample size and a lack of details on the conduct of the experiments.
To sum up, the aforementioned studies and the scholarship on them have challenged the inference to the best explanation of the abductive argument based on the EMTE. Note that something can be considered good evidence in favor of a hypothesis when it is consistent only with that hypothesis. According to this new scholarship, the fact that the large majority of people respond to the original EMTE in a non-hedonistic way by choosing reality over pleasure is not best explained by reality being intrinsically valuable. In fact, modifications of the EMTE like the REM and the stranger NSQ scenario, while supposedly isolating the same prudential question, elicit considerably different preferences in the experimental subjects. The best explanation of this phenomenon seems to be the status quo bias, a case of deviation from rational choice that has been repeatedly observed by psychologists in many contexts.
Smith (2011) criticized the above-mentioned studies for the lack of representativeness of the experimental subjects. In fact, De Brigard’s studies were conducted on philosophy students and Weijers’ studies on marketing and philosophy students, both in Anglo-Saxon universities. Obviously, these groups do not represent the whole English-speaking population, let alone the whole human population. Nevertheless, this objection seems misplaced. Although it would be interesting to know what the whole world thinks of the EMTE, or to test an indigenous population that has never had any contact with Western philosophy, that is not what is relevant for the negative experimental program concerning the EMTE—that is, the experimental program devoted to question the abductive argument against prudential hedonism based on the EMTE. Smith seems to confuse the revisionist scholarship’s goal of challenging philosophers’ previous use of intuitions with the sociological or anthropological goal of knowing what humans think.
Another methodological objection advanced by Smith (2011) concerns the fact that experimental subjects in these studies are not in the position of confronted agents. The participants are asked to imagine some fantastical scenarios rather than being in a real decision-making situation, with the affective responses that this would elicit. Again, Smith’s objection seems flawed: what Smith considers a methodological problem might actually be a methodological strength. Unconfronted agents are very likely to be more rational in the formation of their judgements about the EMTE. Once again, the experimental program on the EMTE is interested in how to refine and properly use intuitions for the sake of rational deliberation, not in the psychological project of knowing what people would choose, under the grip of affects, in a real situation. In other words, the reported judgements expressed in questionnaires, although not indicative of what intuitions we would have in front of a real EM, seem less biased by affects and more apt to be the starting point for a rational judgement about what has intrinsic prudential value.
A major methodological challenge to much of experimental philosophy concerns the use of laypeople’s judgements as evidence. According to the expertise objection, the judgements reported by laypeople cannot be granted the same epistemic status as the judgements of philosophers (that is, the responses of trained professionals with years of experience in thinking about philosophical issues). Philosophers, accordingly, should know how to come up with “better” judgements. Following this objection, the responses of subjects with no prior background in philosophy, which inform the aforementioned studies, lack philosophical significance.
Although the concern appears legitimate, it seems disproved by empirical evidence from both experimental philosophy in general and experiments about the EMTE in particular. Concerning the EMTE in particular, Löhr (2018) tested whether philosophers are more proficient than laypeople in disregarding irrelevant factors when thinking about several versions of EMTE. He observed that philosophers gave inconsistent answers when presented with different versions of EMTE and that their degree of consistency was only slightly superior to laypeople. Also, philosophers were found to be susceptible to imaginative failures approximately as much as laypeople. This suggests that philosophers do not show a higher proficiency than laypeople in complying with the stipulations of the thought experiment and that their consistency between different EMTE’s scenarios is only slightly better.
The empirical evidence we possess on philosophers’ judgements in general and philosophers’ judgements concerning the EMTE in particular seems therefore to cast much doubt on the expertise objection. The current empirical evidence does not support granting an inferior epistemic status to the preferences of laypeople that inform the aforementioned studies on the EMTE. The burden of proof, it seems, lies squarely on anyone wishing to revive the expertise objection. Moreover, given the value of equality than informs our democratic worldview, the burden of proof should always lie on the individual or group—philosophers in this case—that aspires to a privileged status.
Furthermore, in addition to philosophical expertise not significantly reducing the influence of biases, philosophers might have their own environmental and training-specific set of biases. For example, a philosopher assessing a thought experiment might be biased by the dominant view about this thought experiment in the previous literature or in the philosophical community. This worry seems particularly plausible in the case of the EMTE because there is a strong consensus among philosophers not specialized in this thought experiment that one should not enter the EM. In other words, it is reasonable to hypothesize that the “textbook consensus”—that is, the philosophical mainstream position as expressed by undergraduate textbooks—adds a further layer of difficulty for philosophers trying to have an unbiased response to the EMTE.
In a recent study, Hindriks and Douven (2018) changed the EM into an experience pill. With this modification, an increase of pro-pleasure judgements from 29% to 53% was observed. In other words, substituting, in the narrative of the thought experiment, the science fiction technology by a pill seems to cause a significant shift in the subjects’ responses. This can be attributed to the more usual delivery mechanism and, more importantly, to the fact that the experience pill does not threaten in many respects the relationship with reality. The experience pill does not resemble psychedelic drugs such as LSD (notice that interestingly Nozick took the view of psychedelic drugs fans, together with traditional religious views, as examples of views that deeply value reality). In fact, while the experience pill drastically alters the hedonic experience, perhaps similarly to amphetamines or cocaine, it does not affect the perception of the world.
Therefore, the experience pill though experiment does not seem to propose a narrative that can be compared with the EMTE. Here, the choice is not between reality and pleasure but rather between affective appropriateness¾having feelings considered appropriate to the situation¾and pleasure. Thus, the experience pill should be seen as an interesting but different thought experiment not to be compared with the EMTE. Concerning this issue, it should be noted that the EMTE’s scenarios that are used across both armchair and experimental philosophy literature vary significantly. This is worrying because the experimental philosophy and psychology literature on intuitions seems to show that the wording of scenarios can greatly affect the responses they elicit. We might thus find that a particular wording of the scenario will get different results, adding new layers of difficulty to answering the question at stake. In other words, the inter-comparability of different scenarios adopted by different authors is limited.
Some authors have challenged the revisionist scholarship on the EMTE presented above by claiming that it does not address the most effective version of this thought experiment. According to them, the narrative of the original EMTE should be drastically modified in order to effectively isolate the question at stake. Moreover, they claim that a new argument based on this transformed version of the EMTE can be advanced against prudential hedonism: the experientially identical lifetime comparison argument. For example, Crisp (2006) attempted to eliminate the status quo bias and the concern that the technology may malfunction (imaginative resistance) by significantly modifying the narrative of the EMTE. He asks us to compare two lives. Life A is pleasant, rich, full, autonomously chosen, involves writing a great novel, making important scientific discoveries, as well as virtues such as courage, wittiness, and love. B is a life experientially identical to A but lived inside an EM. A and B, according to prudential hedonism, are equal in value. However, it seems that the majority of us has an intuition contrary to that. This is the starting point of the experientially identical lifetime comparison argument. Likewise, according to Lin (2016), to isolate the question that the EMTE is supposed to address, we should consider the choice between two lives that are experientially identical but differently related to reality, because this locates reality as the value in question. According to Lin, his version of the EMTE has also the advantages of not being affected by the status quo bias and not involving claims about whether we would or should plug in or not.
Rowland (2017) conducted empirical research on a version of the EMTE in which two hedonically equal lives of a stranger must be compared. Presented with Rowland’s EMTE, more than 90% of the subjects answered that the stranger should choose the life in touch with reality. Surprisingly, Rowland does not provide the possibility of answering that the two lives have equal value. Unfortunately, this methodological mistake is so macroscopic that it severely undermines the significance of Rowland’s study.
Notice that, once the narrative of the thought experiment is devised in this way, it assumes the same structure as Kagan’s deceived businessman thought experiment (Kagan, 1994). In fact, both thought experiments are based on the strategy of arguing against a view according to which B-facts are equal in value with A-facts, by devising a scenario where there is intuitively a difference of value between A-facts and B-facts. In his thought experiment, Kagan asks to imagine the life A of a successful businessman that has a happy life because he is loved by his family and respected by his community and colleagues. Then, Kagan asks to imagine an experientially equal life B where the businessman is deceived about the causes of his happiness—everyone is deceiving him for their personal gain. Lives B and A contain the same amount of pleasure, thus, according to prudential hedonism, they are equal in value. Nevertheless, we have again the intuition that life A is better than life B.
Discussing this new version of the EMTE, de Lazari-Radek and Singer (2014) concluded that our judgements about it are also biased. They attributed this biased component to morality. Life A contributes to the world while life B does not; thus, life A is morally superior to life B. Therefore, according to them, our judgement that life A is better is affected by moral considerations extraneous to the prudential question at stake. As in the case of imaginative failures regarding the original EMTE, it seems possible that the comparison intuition is based on scales of evaluation different than well-being.
Moreover, the structure of this new version of the thought experiment seems to suffer from the freebie problem. Since it is irrational to have 100% confidence in the truth of prudential hedonism, it is irrational not to prefer life A to life B. If you are not 100% confident about the truth of prudential hedonism, life A has a >0% chance of being more prudentially valuable than life B, making it unreasonable to decline the reality freebie. Note that this is especially true when the decision between the two lives is forced (that is, when there is no “equal value” option) as in Rowland’s study. Because of the freebie problem, transforming the narrative of the EMTE in this drastic way does not seem to increase its strength. Rather, it seems to make this thought experiment unhelpful to compare our judgements about two lives that roughly track the competing values of pleasure and reality.
To reiterate, since a person cannot be 100% sure about the truth of prudential hedonism, they would be a bad decision-maker if they did not choose the life with both pleasure and reality. Reality has a greater than 0% chance of being intrinsically prudentially valuable, as is presumably true of all the other candidate goods that philosophers of well-being discuss. Importantly, the original structure of the EMTE traded off more reality against more pleasure. That the vast majority of people reported a preference for reality was therefore a sign that they really valued reality, since they were ready to sacrifice something of value (pleasure) to get more of another value (reality). A properly devised EMTE, aiming at revealing subjects’ relevant preferences, has to trade off against each other non-negligible amounts of two competing goods. The supposed intrinsic value of reality can be intuitively apprehended only if you have to sacrifice an amount of pleasure computed as significant by the brain. The epistemic value of the EMTE lies in presenting two options, one capturing the pro-reality intuition and one the pro-pleasure intuition. In fact, the strength of EMTE against prudential hedonism is that the vast majority of subjects agree that connecting to an EM is not desirable even though bliss is offered by connecting to the machine. Thus, the proper design of the thought experiment involves a meaningful pairwise comparison. Pairwise comparison is the method of comparing entities in pairs to reveal our preferences toward them. This simple comparison can constitute the building block of more complex decision-making. Symmetrically, complex decision-making can be reduced to a set of binary comparisons. That is indeed what we want from the EMTE: reducing a complex decision about intrinsic prudential value to a binary comparison between two competing lives that allows us to study people’s judgements about the prudential value of two competing goods.
Another example of this new generation of the EMTE is to be found in Inglis’s (2021) universal pure pleasure machine (UPPM). Inglis imagined a machine that provides a high heroine-like constant—that is, a machine that provides pure pleasure, without producing any virtual reality—and a world where every sentient being is plugged into such a machine (universality condition). Then, Inglis asked her participants: “is this a good future that we should desire to achieve?”. Only 5.3% of the subjects presented with this question replied positively. Interestingly, notice that this study was the first to be conducted in a Chinese university. From her results, Inglis concluded that the UPPM is once again able to disprove prudential hedonism. Nevertheless, more studies are necessary for accepting confidently this conclusion. For example, the universality condition that, according to Inglis, is able to reduce biases descending from morality, might, on the contrary, work as a moral intuition pump. In fact, empirical evidence shows that moral judgements, contrary to prudential judgements, seems to be characterized by universality (for example, it is wrong for everyone to commit murder vs. it is wrong for me to play videogames). Also, the UPPM might determine significant imaginative failures, for example if subjects view the machine with no virtual reality as boring (imaginative resistance) or perceive its heroin-like bliss as a disgusting kind of existence (overactive imagination).
This article reviewed the salient points of the literature on the EMTE, since its introduction in 1974 by Nozick until the beginning of the 2020s. In presenting the scholarship on this thought experiment, a historical turn was emphasized. In fact, the debate on the EMTE can be divided in two phases. In a first phase, starting with the publication of Nozick’s Anarchy, State, and Utopia in 1974 and ending about 2010, we observe a huge consensus on the strength of the EMTE in proving prudential hedonism and mental state theories of well-being wrong. In a second phase, starting more or less at the beginning of the 2010s, we witness the emergence of a scholarship specialized in the EMTE that crushes the confidence about its ability to generate a knock-down argument against prudential hedonism and mental statism about well-being. Anecdotally, it should be noticed that the philosophical community at large—that is, not specialized in the EMTE—is not necessarily updated with the latest scholarship and it is common to encounter views more in line with the previous confidence. Nevertheless, the necessity felt by anti-hedonistic scholars to devise a new generation of EMTE demonstrates that the first generation is dead. Further scholarship is needed to establish whether and to what extent these new versions are able to resuscitate the EMTE and its goal.
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University of Waikato