Explication is a method employed throughout philosophy and most sciences, as well as any cognitive endeavors which involve allocating concepts. It is also notably found in the sphere of law. Since explication is part and parcel of the traditionally philosophical subject of concept formation, philosophy is the main discipline to reflect on it extensively. Explication has sometimes been compared to a number of philosophical methods, such as logical (or conceptual) analysis, conceptual reduction, and conceptual engineering. Within a broad classification of kinds of analyses (Beaney 2014, sect. 1.1), explication is one kind of transformative analysis (as opposed to decompositional and regressive analysis; all three of them understood as analyses in a wide sense).

Historically, explication was most prominently described by Rudolf Carnap, according to whom “[t]he task of explication consists in transforming a given more or less inexact concept into an exact one […]. We call the given concept (or the term used for it) the explicandum, and the exact concept proposed to take the place of the first (or the term proposed for it) the explicatum.” (1950, 3) Carnap’s exposition remains the main reference point for scholars working on the topic of explication today. It is the most widely accepted general outline of the method of explication. As such, it allows for diverging interpretations in theoretical and procedural respects. This is demonstrated by the increase in research on explication around the turn of the 20th century.

A widely accepted instance of a simple and largely unproblematic explication is the 2006 definition of ‘planet’ by the International Astronomical Union (IAU). The discussion about that term was triggered by a number of discoveries of objects in orbit around the sun that are similar to the nine bodies that had until then been recognized as planets. Since there was no binding definition of ‘planet’ at that point, insecurity arose about whether to call certain objects planets. The IAU member assembly established a definition according to which a planet is “a celestial body that (a) is in orbit around the Sun, (b) has sufficient mass for its self-gravity to overcome rigid body forces so that it assumes a hydrostatic equilibrium (nearly round) shape, and (c) has cleared the neighbourhood around its orbit” (IAU 2006). This disqualified Pluto as a planet, whereas the other eight planets kept their status; and to a large degree the new understanding of the term ‘planet’ incorporated key aspects of the earlier use patterns, while at the same time being much clearer (cf. Murzi 2007).

This article provides a procedural account of explication outlining each step that is part of the overall explicative effort (2). It is prefaced by a summary of the historical development of the method (1). The latter part of the article includes a rough structural theory of explication (3) and a detailed presentation of an examplary explication taken from the history of philosophy and the foundations of mathematics (4).

Table of Contents

  1. History of the Explicative Method
    1. Pre-Analytic Reflections on Explication
    2. The Analytic Classics
    3. Recent Developments
  2. Procedure
    1. Framework
    2. Preparation of an Explicative Introduction
    3. Introducing an Explicatum
    4. Assessing Adequacy
  3. Explication Theory
    1. Constituents of Explication
    2. The Analysis Paradox
  4. An Exemplary Explication
  5. References and Further Reading

1. History of the Explicative Method

Explication is often seen as a central method in philosophy, “an activity to which philosophers are given, and scientists also in their more philosophical moments” (Quine 1951, 25). As such, it has itself become a subject of philosophy. Philosophers are therefore in the business of both performing explications and reflecting on explications. Often, either activity gives rise to the other. Explication and similar methods have been continually employed throughout all of Western philosophy since Socrates/Plato, though under other names, such as ‘definition’, ‘concept-formation’, ‘characterization’, ‘description’, and many others. In the context of definition, the term ‘explication’ was already used by Locke (1997, 378, §III.IV.8). Recent debates are ultimately caused by the methodological character of the writings of logical empiricists. Since the late 20th century revival of metaphysics and the investigation into the history of analytic philosophy, metaphilosophical questions have (re)surfaced repeatedly. Ideas of authors like Rudolf Carnap, including his conception of explication, are being revisited. This renewed activity brings with it debates about new and old issues of explication. Further investigations into the precursors of explication are to be expected in the future.

Accordingly, at least three phases of engagement with explication can be distinguished in the history of philosophy: pre-analytic reflections (1.a), the analytic classics (1.b), and recent developments (1.c).

a. Pre-Analytic Reflections on Explication

The full procedure of explication comprises both analysis of given meanings and, based on that, the stipulation of new meaning. Investigations into acts of describing or prescribing meaning can therefore be conceived as contributions to the methodology of explication in a wide sense. In a narrow sense, only considerations that relate analysis of meaning to stipulation of meaning in a specific fashion qualify as relevant to explicative methodology. In the wide sense, all comments on analysis and stipulation of meaning—by, for example, Socrates/Plato, Aristotle, Thomas Aquinas, Locke, Leibniz, and Mill—deserve to be mentioned in order to fully represent the pre-analytic history of explication. The summary following in the sequel relies on a selection: The conception of Johann Heinrich Lambert, who contributed to the methodology of explication in the narrow sense (without using the term ‘explication’), will be described. Furthermore, Immanuel Kant’s theory will be recapitulated briefly. The assessment of some commentators will be viewed critically, including that Kant provided a relevant and even distinguished contribution.

Johann Heinrich Lambert was a mathematician, scientist, and philosopher highly regarded by Kant. Lambert contributed to a methodology of pre-explicative procedures in the preface to his book “Architectonic” (1771, VI-VII), where the procedures proposed are applied to metaphysical concepts. Lambert envisioned five pre-explicative measures: (i) Many expressions, especially philosophical ones, are highly ambiguous. This needs to be addressed in an analysis of ambiguity. (ii) Many, especially philosophical, expressions have multiple synonyms. They have to be named in an analysis of synonymy. (iii) The terroir analysis, as applied to predicates, identifies examples, counterexamples, sub- and superpredicates, neighboring predicates, etc. It is directed at clarifying the surrounding field of concepts (somewhat anticipating connective analysis; see Strawson 1992, ch. 2). (iv) The final analysis enquires into the purposes that are associated with the use of given expressions. (v) The diachronic analysis reviews the history of the use and characterization of explicanda. The order of these analyses and the interrelations between their results vary on a case-to-case basis (Siegwart 2007a, 109-112). Lambert merits special mention as his remarks predate what is usually considered the starting point of the systematic treatment of explication (Carnap 1950) by over 170 years. He assembles several of the main components of explication preparation (see sect. 2.b) in one paragraph with a clear perspective toward purpose-oriented definitions, although he does not discuss the stipulative step succeeding the preparation. To Lambert, the analysis of the preexisting concepts is never the goal, however, it is a prerequisite for the explicative characterization.

Circumstances are different with Kant’s role in explication theory. In justifying his explication terminology, Carnap (1950, 3) superficially referred to Kant and Husserl (Boniolo 2003, 293-294). In recent years, it has been debated how accurate this ascription of parentage is. However, some authors (Boniolo 2003, 294-295) allege that Kant had a conception of explication superior to Carnap. In order to represent these issues faithfully, one has to pay attention to the essential synopsis regarding explanation of meaning and definition (in a wide sense) in the “Critique of Pure Reason” (Kant 1998, A 712-738/B 740-766, especially A 727-732/B 755-760). Kant started with two distinctions: (i) given and (ii) originally (to be) made concepts; (a) a priori and (b) a posteriori (or: empirical) concepts. According to Kant’s unusual terminology, explications are analyses of empirical concepts (i-b), exemplified by (the analysis of) the concept of gold. Expositions are analyses (in the sense of decompositions) or clarifications of a priori given concepts (i-a), such as the concept of substance. This is characteristic for philosophy, especially for metaphysics. Declarations create new empirical concepts (ii-b), like the concept of a chronometer. Definitions in a narrow sense create non-empirical, a priori concepts (ii-a), as in the concept of a circle. They are relevant for mathematics, but inappropriate for philosophy. The two latter kinds of concept formation are purely novative and therefore cannot be regarded as explications in Carnap’s sense. The two former kinds are analytic, according to Kant. Anyway, they seem to be limited to detection and description of meanings. Unless the characterization of these activities additionally admits a finalizing prescriptive element or at least a method of concept analysis reared toward subsequent stipulative definition, Kant did not employ a concept of explication akin to the one treated below (sect. 2).

b. The Analytic Classics

Current conscious acts of explication, as well as reflections and disputes about explication, usually stand in a methodic tradition that was started by Rudolf Carnap. He viewed Menger’s explication of ‘dimension’ (Menger 1943) as a prototypical explication. Carnap’s seminal text on the topic (1950, 1-18, ch. I) is a methodological introduction to an investigation into probability. The exposition is self-contained and does not rely on his views on probability. Earlier, explicit reference by Carnap to the method of explication can be found in (1947, 7-8, §2). In 1928, he already referenced the method of rational reconstruction, which is often likened to explication (2003, 158, §100 and v, preface to the second edition; see Beaney 2004, 125-128). Carnap named Husserl and Kant as sources of terminological inspiration, but Frege seems to have been a significant influence in this respect as well (Beaney 2004; Lavers 2013). Research on who influenced Carnap in what way is ongoing. At any rate, Frege did not propose any method of explication that, regarding conciseness, comes close to Carnap’s exposition. (But, see Frege 1969, 224, 261-262.  According to Blanchette 2012, 78: “Frege nowhere says what an adequate analysis is.”)

Carnap characterizes explication as “the transformation of an inexact, prescientific concept, the explicandum, into a new exact concept, the explicatum.” (1950, 3, §2) Though in a successful explication the explicatum is exact, Carnap does not fail to notice that the inexactness of the explicandum means that an explication cannot be said to be correct or incorrect in the sense that the explicatum exactly captures the explicandum. In order to work toward an exact explicatum, Carnap envisaged informal explicandum clarification as the first step in an explication. “[W]e must […] do all we can to make at least practically clear what is meant as the explicandum. […] Even though the terms in question are unsystematic, inexact terms, there are means for reaching a relatively good mutual understanding as to their intended meaning.” (1950, 4, §2) This involves distinguishing multiple meanings in the term associated with the explicandum (‘true’, not as used in carpentry, but as used in household language), giving examples and counterexamples (‘true’, not as in ‘a true democracy’), and naming synonyms (‘true’ in the sense of ‘accurate’). It should be noted that the clarification of the explicandum was very important to Carnap, but in (1950) a methodology of preparation of the explicative act is less explicit than in Lambert (1771). Carnap’s presentation of explication is primarily oriented toward that explicative act and its qualification with regard to certain desiderata.

Accordingly, in §3 (1950, 5-8) Carnap proceeds by naming four requirements an explicatum shall fulfill: (i) similarity to the explicandum, (ii) exactness, (iii) fruitfulness, and (iv) simplicity. All of the four requirements are partly, but not fully, explained by Carnap (see Boniolo 2003, 291-292, ch. II) and have therefore all spawned a varying amount of debate in specialized literature. – The similarity of the explicatum to the explicandum has been understood as either an overlap between the extensions of both concepts or an isomorphism between both extensions (cf. Brun 2017, sect. 4-5). Due to the different readings and the elusive nature of the explicandum, the similarity requirement is often seen as the most controversial one. (Beaney 2004, 139) In addition, occasional talk of the explicatum replacing the explicandum exerts some pressure on the similarity requirement, since things that replace one another usually have to be similar in certain respects in order to be replaceable. With regard to Carnap’s exposition, the question remains—in what respects an explicandum and an explicatum need to be similar for the latter to replace the former.

The other three requirements do not refer to the explicandum, but only to the explicatum. They are therefore not specific to a given explication. In an intuitive sense, exactness, fruitfulness, and simplicity are signs of quality for any introduction of a term. Carnap did not specify what he means by ‘exactness’, but he sympathized with the comparative concept of precision by Arne Naess. Naess said, roughly, the expression U is more precise than the expression T if and only if the set of admissible interpretations for T is a non-empty proper subset of the set of admissible interpretations for U. (Carnap 1950, 8, §3; Naess 1953, 60; on Naess’s notion of interpretation: 1953, 41-51) After Carnap, exactness of the explicatum is often viewed as either lack of vagueness or adherence to standards of formal concept formation. More specifically, fruitfulness of the explicatum is explained as figuring in a high number of universal statements. Carnap distinguished between empirical laws for non-logical and theorems for logical explicata. (1950, 6-7, §3) He did not expand on the problem of individuating and counting said statements in the face of the trivial or minor modifications that can replicate any such statement infinite times. Simplicity is presented as being subordinate to the other requirements (1950, 7, §3). It seems to refer to a low degree of syntactical complexity of the explicative definition (or other means of explicatum introduction) and, possibly, to the acceptance and handiness of the concepts and terms that are employed to introduce the explicatum.

In the two subsequent sections, Carnap gives a number of examples and distinguishes different kinds of concepts that are conceivable as explicata. This has primarily illustrative merit to the procedure of explication. However, in the last section of his exposition (1950, 15-18, §6), Carnap adds another aspect to explication that was important to him, namely interpretation. In his view, explication is a form of formalization which is the first part of the axiomatic method to establish a formal scientific theory. The second part is the interpretation of the axioms or postulates, which determine the interpretation of the definitions as well. This was a major programmatic issue for Carnap since the 1940s that was important to him independently from the method of explication. In the literature on explication, interpretation plays only a minor role.

Together with some of his other methodological publications, Carnap’s exposition influenced other scholars in one way or the other. Most notable are Nelson Goodman, Carl Gustav Hempel, Willard Van Orman Quine, and Peter Strawson. Hempel included the method into his Fundamentals of Concept Formation (1952, pt. I) where he distinguishes different ways to endow meaning. Among other things, analysis of meaning (cf. 2.b below) is described in detail. Explications considered as real definitions (in a very wide sense) he characterizes in continuity with Carnap: “Explication is concerned with expressions whose meaning in conversational language or even in scientific discourse is more or less vague […] and aims at giving those expressions a new and precisely determined meaning, so as to render them more suitable for clear and rigorous discourse on the subject matter at hand” (1952, 11). Hempel points out that the interplay between analyzed meaning on the one hand and systematic discursive interests on the other calls for a “judicious synthesis” (ibid.) of both.

Quine most notably discussed explication with reference to two set theoretic conceptions of the term ‘ordered pair’. (1960, 257-262, §53) He developed the method while discussing ontological issues related to that expression and then took the method to be representative for what happens in philosophical analysis and explication. In Quine’s own view (1960, 259, fn. 4), he followed Carnap, although he pragmatically converted the requirement of similarity: Inspired by the use of the explicandum, explicators associate the explicatum (Quine: “explicans”, see, for example, Reichenbach 1951, 49) with functional criteria of adequacy that are then supposed to be satisfied by it. In the case of the ordered pair there is just one such criterion: ∀xyzw [(x, y)=(z, w) → x=z ^ y=w]. It is satisfied by any adequate definition of the ordered pair, for example by the one presented by Kuratowski: ∀xy [(x, y)={{x}, {x, y}}]. The choice of criteria is open to those who perform explications and is guided by systematic interests that are associated with the actual use of the explicandum. For instance, the specific criterion for the ordered pair proves important when defining ‘relation’ by means of ‘ordered pair’. “We have, to begin with, an expression or form of expression that is somehow troublesome. […] But also it serves certain purposes that are not to be abandoned. Then we find a way of accomplishing those same purposes through other channels, using other and less troublesome forms of expression.” (Quine 1960, 260, §53)

Compared to Carnap (1950), these criteria of adequacy are new. Later, Carnap presupposed the Quinean understanding of adequacy in his reply to Strawson (Carnap 1963, 939). At any rate, the pragmatic outlook with its rather liberal selection of functional criteria of adequacy is more pronounced in Quine than in Carnap. (Within Quine’s own writing, the characterization of explication in (1960) is already a liberalization. According to (1951, 25, ch. II), explication relies to a higher degree on previous usage of the explicandum, which is meant to be “preserved” through the explication. This was part of Quine’s critique of synonymy relations, which according to him are presupposed by explicators, too.)

Strawson’s contribution to the method of explication (1963; see Pinder 2017b) is critical in nature. Starting with a rather strong reading of Carnap’s approach, in which the explicatum “replaces” the explicandum (Carnap 1950, 3), Strawson maintains that replacing a non-scientific concept with a scientific concept cannot be done without distorting the locutions that employ the original concept(s). “[T]ypical philosophical problems about the concepts used in non-scientific discourse cannot be solved by laying down rules of use of exact and fruitful concepts in science. To do this last is not to solve the typical philosophical problem, but to change the subject.” (1963, 506) In effect, explication prevents philosophers from dealing with their original problems that arise in a context of unexplicated concepts. The criticism that explication is “changing the subject” is still discussed among explication scholars (1.c). It is related to one version of the paradox of analysis (3.b). In a subsequent section of his paper, Strawson drops the strong reading of replacement, but maintains that in order to show the worth of an explication, one has to somehow relate the pre-explicative framework to the post-explicative one (1963, 510-514). This, to some extent, still requires an exact grasp of the pre-explicative conceptual situation. But if an exact grasp of the explicandum is possible, what does one need an explicatum (and an explication) for? (See Carnap’s reply 1963, 933-940.)

Goodman (see Cohnitz and Rossberg 2006, ch. 3) can be credited for two contributions: First, he elaborated on the similarity criterion of adequacy by proposing a criterion of “extensional isomorphism” in his 1951 Structure of Appearance (1966, 13-22, §I,3). This is a relation between, on the one hand, a set of explicanda and their semantical interrelations and, on the other hand, a set of explicata and their semantical interrelations. The criterion is different from both Carnap’s extensional overlap and Quine’s functional criteria of adequacy. The second contribution is derived from the first one, as the criterion of extensional isomorphism is usually directed at systems of expressions or concepts instead of individual ones (see Brun 2016, 1235-1236). Carnap recognized Goodman’s proposal of extensional isomorphism, but he deferred the choice of any similarity criterion to the specific explicative scenario at hand (1963, 945-946).

An outline of the development of explication in the analytic classics would be incomplete without a reference to the definition of truth by Alfred Tarski (1944; 1956; 1969; Hodges 2014). Although he does not employ the term ‘explication’, Tarski’s own depiction of his endeavors suggests classifying them as such. With regard to the explanation of meaning, for example, he distinguishes between (a) an account of the actual use of the term and (b) a normative suggestion that the term be used in some definite way. He attributes a mixed character to his own project: “What will be offered can be treated in principle as a suggestion for a definite way of using the term ‘true’, but the offering will be accompanied by the belief that it is in agreement with the prevailing use of this term in everyday language”. (Tarski 1969, 63) The so-called semantical explication of truth deserves the attention of explication theorists because it allows for all explication components to be identified with ease. Also, the core steps in the procedure are effortlessly traceable (Greimann 2007, 263). This especially applies to the criteria of explicative adequacy and the explicatum language. The criteria are condensed in convention T (Tarski 1956, 187-188). The remarks on—and the expressive power of—the explicatum language are associated with the distinction between object and metalanguage and, as a result, with the prevention of the semantical antinomies.

c. Recent Developments

Within recent discussions on explication, the mainly systematic contributions have to be distinguished from the mainly historical ones. In addition, there are numerous systematic publications that include significant exegetical sections. However, many exegetical investigations into the writings of authors referenced in the preceding section serve the purpose of correctly ascribing positions and changes of mind to pioneers of analytic philosophy and of identifying historical influences between them (such as Beaney 2004; Boniolo 2003; Carus 2007; Creath 2012; Floyd 2012). This section concerns only those contributions that are predominantly systematic.

Publications that contribute to the method of explication in systematic respects exist in a continuum with the works of Carnap, Quine, Goodman, Strawson and others. This is not true of the historical research on explication, which is a rather new phenomenon. Beginning in the 1960s, several scholars developed, criticized, and defended explication, sometimes enriching the discussion considerably. However, except for the four philosophers mentioned above, few scholars who worked on explication before 2000 are referenced in discourse after 2000. The renewed interest in explication is related to, and partly caused by, the revival of metaphysics toward the end of the 20th century and the subsequent rise of metametaphysics. Because of this historical situation, most of the recent investigations into explication consider its main field of application to be metaphysics and ontology. However, this is too narrow a view as evidenced in the settings within which some of the classic authors raise the issue of explication: such as Carnap (1950; philosophy of science), Quine (1960; set theory). In addition, many textbook examples lie outside metaphysics (Tarski’s explication of truth; 1956) or outside philosophy (IAU’s planet concept). Applications of explication in practical philosophy or in the special sciences are underrepresented within the research on explication (but see Hahn 2013, 34-53).

An example of the continuity between the pioneering efforts in explication methodology and later research is Hanna (1968). Hanna presumably was the first to develop an explicit procedural account of explication, which consists of five steps. (An incomplete procedural account is given by Naess (1953, 82-84).) Tillman (1965; 1967) transformed Strawson’s well known critique (see 1.b) into the method of “linguistic portrayal”, which can be seen as one step in a method of explication (2.b). Martin (1973) was the first to dedicate an entire paper to the explication of whole theories (systems of concepts, for example), as opposed to single concepts or expressions.

These examples can be seen as prototypes of some of roughly five very common kinds of systematic investigations into explication. (i) A number of contributions attempt, like Hanna, to establish a procedure of explication (Brun 2016; Greimann 2007; Siegwart 1997a) or to provide a formal theory of explication (Cordes 2017). It has to be noted that there is no canonical form of explication and that the various approaches are not directly compatible. A single procedure of explication that is both widely accepted and more detailed than the Carnapian exposition (1950) has yet to be devised.

(ii) Other scholars have focused, like Tillman, on single steps within a procedure of explication. Either widely accepted steps are spelled out, or new steps are proposed. Some mixed forms occur as well, like the explicandum clarification procedure by Shepherd and Justus (2015; Justus 2012; Pinder 2017a; Schupbach 2017), who in that context introduce experimental philosophy to explication. (For further examples see sect. 2 below.)

(iii) Conversely, others left the confines of isolated explications in favor of theorizing about the interrelations between multiple explications (see 3.a). This line of research on what might be called superexplicative structures continues Martin’s efforts. Brun (2017) refers to Martin’s emphasis on whole theories while trying to unify Carnap’s explication and Goodman’s reflective equilibrium. Brun’s final procedure can be seen as consisting of, among other components, multiple explications. Meanwhile, Siegwart considers chains of explications and types of disputes arising from rivalling explications (1997b, 263-265).

(iv) Another group of articles critically discusses various aspects of explication or the overall method without intending to enhance it. Strawson’s contributions were some of the first of this kind, and the various takes on the paradox of analysis and the changing-the-subject objection are often a centerpiece of both critical and sympathetic discussions. More recently, Maher’s express defense of explication (2007) has been widely noted. Reck (2012) exemplifies the kind of articles that are rather critical of explication. Both authors, like many others, base their assessments directly and only on Carnap’s conception of explication.

(v) Finally, there are those contributions that either relate explication to other methods or distinguish different kinds of explication than found in analytical classics and which had not been differentiated. Radnitzky (1989) wants to improve on Carnap’s notion of explication by transferring it from logical empiricism to the framework of Popper’s evolutionary methodology: Successful explications are exclusively considered to be a byproduct of processes of theory enhancement or theory replacement. Equally critical of Carnap, but inspired by Gaston Bachelard, Ibarra and Mormann (1992) regard the explication of a scientific concept (e.g. number or line) as its generalization in an explicative theory (number theory or geometry, respectively). Carus (2012) is concerned with two kinds of explication: local and global. Haslanger (2012, 376) distinguishes conceptual, descriptive, and ameliorative analysis, occasionally associating the latter with Carnap-Quinean explication (2012, 367). While all three kinds of analysis may—depending on their execution—have considerable overlap with explication, ameliorative analysis notably pushes the boundaries of explication because the “target concept” is picked for social or political reasons rather than, as was presupposed by the pioneers of explication, purely theoretical reasons.

The five categories are neither exhaustive nor mutually exclusive. For example, Brun (2017) was filed under (iii) and Floyd (2012) was seen as predominantly exegetical, but both could also reasonably be read as examples of category (v). A general theme throughout most recent systematic contributions to explication is that of the constantly evolving nature of languages and concepts (see Wilson 2006). Several scholars feel this nature needs to be considered more in explication—a method that is often seen as dealing with rather rigid notions of language, expressions, and concepts.

2. Procedure

This section provides a procedural account of explication. The first sub-section briefly situates explication within the field of methods of introduction (2.a). Then, three steps are distinguished within explication (Siegwart 1997a, 29): preparation (2.b), the act of explicative introduction (2.c), and postprocessing (2.d).

The act of explicative introduction is not the explication; it is only part of it. Thus, it is highly elliptical to talk about, say, an isolated definition as an explication. Preparation and postprocessing are integral parts as well. In preparation, the need for an explication is assessed, the explicandum is identified and situated within a context, and an explicatum within another context is chosen. Also, criteria of adequacy are established. Postprocessing primarily involves an assessment of adequacy.

Note that ‘explicandum’ and ‘explicatum’ are here taken to refer to expressions in order to avoid conflicting views on concepts. This is in accordance with Carnap, who admitted both concepts and terms as explicatum/explicandum (see the quote at the beginning of this article). Any theory and procedure of the term explication can be seen as concept explication once a suitable theory of concepts has been applied.

a. Framework

It is an everyday phenomenon in natural and artificial languages that we hear, read, or utter words and phrases without knowing their full meaning. We are unsure about their correct use or realize that we have used them in a way we would now consider to be questionable or even incorrect. In these situations, the meaning or use of the words may have to be fixed or entirely new words have to be fitted with novel patterns of use. Setting the meaning or use of a word in one of these ways is henceforth called introducing it. Introducing a word in this sense is to be distinguished from the didactic activity of teaching its correct use to someone. An introduction should entail the commitment and subsequent adherence to the meaning or use that was set. Thus, introduction is always stipulative (see Maher 2007, 336). What is usually called ‘reportive definition’ is not an introduction in this sense as no act that sets the meaning of an expression is being performed. Rather, the meaning that has been associated with the expression in question is being reported or its use is being described. The umbrella term ‘meaning clarification’ can be taken to refer to introduction and meaning description alike.

There are various methods and forms of introduction. Forms of introduction are, for example, definitions, axioms (or meaning postulates), and various types of metalinguistic rules. Acts of introduction are thus performed by, for example, setting definitions, setting axioms, or establishing metalinguistic rules that regulate the use of an expression. Each of these forms of introduction is compatible with explication as all of them are a means of providing an explicatum with a meaning or of determining how the explicatum is to be used correctly. In the literature on explication, the most frequent form of introduction, and sometimes the only one considered, are definitions.

When introducing an expression or a concept, there are many factors that may or may not be taken into account. Depending on what is to be taken into account, one follows a certain method of introduction. For example, previous usage of certain expressions may or may not be relevant to the act of introduction. More specifically, it is possible that there are expressions in use whose application is problematic (with respect to certain aims). If under such circumstances the introduction of expressions whose meaning or use is intended to more or less mirror the former expressions is attempted, then the method of introduction is called explicative or an explication. All other methods of introduction will be called novative. Novative introductions can be found, for example, in contexts of discovery. When, for example, a new plant species is discovered, it may receive any species predicate without the prior use of that expression being substantially relevant. For more on this topic, see Siegwart (1997a, 18-29, §§ 3-10).

b. Preparation of an Explicative Introduction

The preparation of an explicative introduction is intended to provide everything that is needed in order to perform introductions that can be evaluated according to standards of explication afterwards. Some preparatory steps are inevitable in order to yield an explication; at least the explicandum, the explicandum language, the explicatum, the explicatum language, and the criteria of explicative adequacy need to be identified in some way. Together with the explicative introduction (2.c), they constitute an explication in the sense that if one is missing, it can hardly be said that an explication has taken place. Therefore, they are constituents of an explication (3.a). But note, not all constituents need to be of a formal or explicit nature—this would be rather unusual at least for the side of the explicandum—and their identification may allow for some ambiguity. Thus, the minimal procedure of explication, which consists of the allocation of the five constituents (this sect.) and the introduction of the explicatum (the sixth constituent; 2.c), does not put any constraints on how to perform an explication.  It simply acknowledges what is needed in order to be able to speak of an explication at all (see Cordes 2017). More constructively: If, after some interpretive effort, one finds six items in a text that can be understood, respectively, as explicandum, explicandum language, explicatum, explicatum language, criteria of explicative adequacy, and explicative introduction, then, and only then, it seems reasonable to speak of an explication.

Other steps are not obligatory but help to give an explication that establishes an explicatum fit to the explicator’s locutionary purposes: posing an explicative question, assessing the need for an explication, treating ambiguity in the explicandum, considering synonyms of the explicandum, reviewing empirical research on the use of the explicandum, and reviewing the history of explication. In this sub-section, these steps are dealt with in a suitable order.

(i) Posing of an explicative question (optional): Quite frequently, explicative endeavors are prompted by a “what-is-x” question. What are qualia? What is a norm? What is truth? (see Carnap 1950, 4, §2; Audi 2015, 209) Questions of this kind help to invoke the field in which the explication takes place. By posing this question, the field is only roughly contoured so that indeterminacy still remains. When posing an explicative question, one should emphasize that it demands a characterization; examples or non-characterizing general statements (such as natural laws) are not the required answers. This emphasis can be achieved by using semantic vocabulary within the explicative question: What is the meaning of ‘beauty’? How is the term ‘rational’ to be used and understood?

(ii) Assessing the need for an explication (optional): Questions demanding characterizations may be satisfied with reportive answers. In that case, an explication may not be in order. If a questioner demands an explication, this demand may or may not be justified. Whether the need for an explication is real can be assessed by pointing to problems with the prior usage of the explicandum. Carnap names inexactness of the explicandum as the sole reason for performing an explication (1950, 4). The concept of (in)exactness in explication is frequently discussed (Reck 2012, 99-101) and seems to be inexact itself (in some intuitive sense). Hahn (2013, 36-42) investigates three specific reasons for performing an explication: ambiguity, vagueness, and semantic gaps. According to Hahn, each of these semantic defects may be innocuous (such as the ambiguity of ‘bank’) or risky (such as the vagueness of ‘medically necessary treatment’). However, a given semantic defect may be acknowledged but at the same time be desirable for non-cognitive communicative reasons. Constructive ambiguity in diplomacy is a case in point (see Pehar 2001). An expression in a context may have other defects that constitute causes for explication, such as emotive connotation, or it may have multiple defects. Naming them helps the explicative effort in establishing criteria of adequacy. Alternatively, there may be no inherent defect within prior usage, although the explicator envisions some specific discursive purpose which calls for adjustments in the use of certain expressions. Generally, any perceived relevant defect in an explicandum can be understood as a mismatch between its existing use patterns and the purposes to which one wants to use it.

(iii) Naming the explicandum (necessary): The proposal of an explication needs some expression that is supposed to be the explicandum. Posing an explicative question already involves using or mentioning that explicandum. But with further deliberation on the subject, one may want to choose a different, but related, expression as the explicandum. For example, starting with the question as to what beauty is, an explicator may determine ‘is beautiful’ as the explicandum. Although naming an explicandum is obligatory within an explication, it is possible to later retrace this step should a different expression turn out to be more suitable. In addition, there is the possibility of naming several expressions which are simultaneously explicated in one explicative endeavor. This may lead to one unifying explicatum or to several explicata, each of which are associated with one or more explicanda. Naming the explicandum is not the same as individuating the explicandum concept. If a pre-theoretic concept is considered to be the object of an explication, there are widely noted problems in individuating it, since its inexactness is presupposed by the usual understanding of ‘explication’ (Carnap 1950, 4, §2). The next four steps represent a limited remedy for that problem.

(iv) Naming the explicandum language (necessary): Since the explicandum is just an expression, it is not sufficient to serve as the basis of an explication which is supposed to build on prior usage. Thus, an explicandum language which includes the use patterns of the explicandum has to be identified. Associating some kind of use patterns with a language does not mean that this language has to be formal or even that the use patterns are known to the explicator. In fact, in this pre-explicative state, languages are often hard to individuate. For this reason, it suffices to identify a language by referring to the relevant context of use, such as a seminal text that employs the explicandum and is supposedly written in the explicandum language. Four examples of explicandum languages are contemporary philosopher’s English, the language of applied ethics, the language of the Vienna Circle debate about protocol statements, and the scientific jargon of some discipline, like physics. The most pertinent measure of what constitutes an acceptable identification of an explicandum language is the degree to which it encompasses those prior employments of the explicandum which the explicators deem to be the relevant reference points for their explicative project. For that purpose, it might be advisable to specify an explicandum theory if the distinction between theory and language is available. To give an example of this and the preceding step in one sentence: “Here I will explicate ‘velocity’ as it is used in Newtonian mechanics for engineering science.” (Carnap 1950, 3-5.)

(v) Treating ambiguity in the explicandum (optional): Risky ambiguity constitutes a reason for explication (see step (ii)). Different meanings or uses of expressions within the same context should be distinguished in an informal but systematic fashion (Siegwart 1997a, 31). This helps to clarify which of the meanings is the one that predominantly serves as the model for the later introduction of the explicatum. In some cases, multiple and systematically related but distinct meanings of the explicandum are supposed to serve as the model. In that case, it makes sense to develop an explication plan which involves multiple explicata that will be introduced in a systematic order. When, for example, explicating ‘supererogatory action’, the explicator will recognize a distinction between a type and a token understanding of actions in general. This may suggest that two explicata (‘supererogatory action type’ and ‘supererogatory action token’) are in order and two acts of explicative introduction and that one could be defined by the other. A classic Aristotelian example of disambiguation concerns ‘healthy’ in four interrelated senses: The term may be applied to things preserving health, things causing health, signs of health, and to things capable of health (Aristotle 1984, 1003a-b).

(vi) Considering synonyms of the explicandum (optional): In this step, synonyms of the explicandum are listed (Siegwart 1997a, 31). Since this is still a pre-explicative step, synonymy is taken in an intuitive sense. The list serves two purposes: (I) Synonyms may help to individuate the meaning that serves as the reference point for the explicative introduction. Thus, when explicating ‘argument’ in communication studies, one may list ‘dispute’ and ‘reason’ as two (partial) synonyms of ‘argument’ and then specify that this explication is not about ‘argument’ in the sense of ‘reason’. (II) The other purpose is to broaden the scope of explications. Some synonyms may be suitable as additional explicanda. This can lead to a refinement of the explication plan (see step (v)). Or, again, multiple explicanda can be merged into one explicatum; this then constitutes convergent explications (as in 3.a).

(vii) Reviewing empirical research on the use of the explicandum (optional): Shepherd and Justus (2015, sect. 3) argue that experimental philosophy can help with the preparation of an explication, especially with the individuation of the explicandum concept. According to them, surveys about the intuitive use of language help to uncover (I) vagueness, (II) ambiguity, (III) bias influencing intuition, (IV) non-biasing influences on intuition, and (V) central features of an explicandum concept. Data on these issues is relevant to what appears here as steps (ii) and (v). In addition, the experimental identification of central features of concepts can directly inform either the criteria of explicative adequacy or even the explicative introduction (Pinder 2017a, sect. 3). But explicators are not forced to follow the survey results in this respect. (Shepherd and Justus do not claim that either.) For example, when explicating conditional expressions of natural language, experimental philosophers may find that test subjects do not generally accept modus tollendo tollens. Explicators could still decide to put that inference pattern into the criteria of explicative adequacy in order to carve out a use of conditionals that does admit of modus tollendo tollens. Thus, experimental philosophy should primarily be seen as a heuristic in explication, an extension of the classical conceptual analysis method of contemplating and trying out acceptable and inacceptable uses of the explicandum. Similar to how explicators review results from experimental philosophy, they may also want to consider studies in corpus linguistics, but this field is not yet being investigated by scholars on explication.

(viii) Reviewing the explicative history of the explicandum (optional): Like the preceding steps, reviewing already existing explications of the same explicandum may serve heuristic purposes by contributing to the content of the current explication, as with regard to establishing criteria of adequacy (step (xi)). In addition, this step allows situating one’s own enterprise within the debate (Siegwart 1997a, 33-34). If there are no prior explications of the explicandum, it may help explicators to be aware of the potential paradigm function that their own explication may or may not serve (ius primae explicationis). On the other hand, if there are prior explications and relevant debates, explicators can point out similarities and dissimilarities and—if so disposed—may add critical remarks, thus partaking in explicative debates. Even without critical remarks, explicators should explain why they do not accede to existing explications (see 3.a).

(ix) Naming the explicatum language (necessary): Explicatum languages should be chosen carefully. Potential users of explicata and addressees of explications should be taken into account. It may help to itemize languages in a systematic fashion. If, for example, the explicatum language comprises reference to parts and wholes, one should consider both mereological and set theoretic languages. At any rate, the explicatum language should be one that is accessible, that is, one that is either intuitively useable in a correct fashion or one associated with available introductory literature. If necessary, explicators themselves have to give an introduction to the languages or even construct them ab initio. That does not imply that explicatum languages have to be formal, although this might be the case quite frequently. An explicatum language can also be “a more exact part of” the explicandum language (Carnap 1963, 935). If the explicatum language is informal, the individuation strategies are similar to those for explicandum languages (see step (iv)). Note that if the form of introduction later employed needs a background theory, then such a theory should be named in step (ix) as an explicatum theory within the explicatum language.

(x) Naming the explicatum (necessary): This step is as intricate as the preceding one. First, explicators must realize that there are several syntactical categories from which to choose in most explicatum languages. Thus, when explicating ‘beauty’, one may decide to choose a nominal expression or a predicative one as the explicatum. Both options entail several subordinate options. If the explicator decides for a predicate as the explicatum, the question of arity arises, which is connected to the question of what kind of operanda are acceptable for each place of the predicate. This is true of both formal and informal languages. Second, certain options may be excluded for various reasons. Semantical intuitions or plans about the post-explicative semantical relations between some expressions are relevant to determine which expressions are potential explicata, but since this itemization is only about expressions, none of the semantic relations is binding. It should be taken into account that prospective users of the explicata may desire explicata that can precisely describe complex relations and explicata that are simple and easy to use. Third, the explicatum or explicata must be explicitly named. The syntactical category and, if applicable, arity for each explicatum must be clear.

(xi) Naming the criteria of adequacy (necessary): The criteria of adequacy constitute the explications’ measure of success. Usually, it is a number of propositions involving the explicata that are supposed to be proven true after the explicative introduction has been performed (see Quine 1960, 257-266, §§53-54). Explicators may arrive at these propositions with the help of steps (ii) and (v) to (viii), in which various senses have been distinguished and conceptual interrelations have been scrutinized. It is advisable to assemble preliminary criteria of adequacy as a kind of wish list that is still formulated in the explicandum language. Eventually, however, conflicting criteria have to be eliminated and all criteria must be formulated in the chosen explicatum language so as to yield a demonstrably successful explication (see 2.d). Because the criteria of adequacy will often derive from pre-explicative intuitions that are associated with the explicandum, they can be seen as codifying Carnap’s requirement of similarity between explicandum concept and explicatum concept (Quine 1960, §53). Traditionally, the criteria of adequacy are thought of as explicatum language propositions that are true in the given explicatum language. However, sometimes it is important to explicators that certain propositions do not follow from the explicative introduction and that their negations do not follow either. For example, agnostic explicators of the concept of god may want to avoid a scenario which allows them to derive god’s omnipotence, or lack thereof, from the introduction of the explicatum. Formulating this kind of undecidability as a criterion of adequacy turns these criteria into partially metalinguistic propositions. Explication should allow for this kind of metalinguistic criteria because they allow us to formulate the other Carnapian requirements as criteria of adequacy. Thus, from an explication of ‘planet’ one may require as per two criteria of adequacy that (I) planets are celestial bodies and that (II) planethood implies that most planetary laws discovered before 1990 still hold. The second criterion is of a metalinguistic nature and codifies Carnap’s fruitfulness requirement (1.b).

c. Introducing an Explicatum

While preparing an explication, its explicandum, explicandum language, explicatum, explicatum language, and its criteria of explicative adequacy have to be named (2.b). The first two constituents represent the connection to a preceding language practice and affect the specification of the latter three constituents. However, only these are relevant to the introduction of the explicatum. The explicatum is introduced in the explicatum language in a way that supports the criteria of adequacy. The result of the act of introduction, such as a definitional proposition, is the sixth constituent of an explication. (see 3.a)

In order to introduce explicata in accordance with a certain form of introduction (definitions, meaning postulates/axioms, metalinguistic rules), that form of introduction needs to be available for the explicatum language. Depending on the form of introduction, further requirements must be met—for example, some definition rules are formulated with reference to theories which would have to be provided before performing the act of explicative introduction. All this applies to formal and to informal explicatum languages though informal languages often do not explicitly determine whether certain forms of introduction are available and what relevant background theories are. Explicators should keep this in mind while preparing the explication (2.b). There are at least three typical forms of introduction that are usually accepted in both formal and informal settings:

(i) Definition: Here, definitions are understood as constituting a form of introduction that is performed within (explicatum) languages. Thus, definitions are not metalinguistic. In formal languages, defining is like inferring in that it is governed by rules that can be stated in a suitable metalanguage. A considerable number of definition rules have been developed for formal languages (Suppes 1957, ch. 8). The definition of predicates by generalized biconditionals and the definition of individual constants and function constants by (generalized) identities are quite common. An example of the latter has been provided above for the ordered pair function constant ‘(.., ..)’ (1.b). It requires that in the explicandum language, or theory, the set theoretic symbols and some logical constants are already introduced. An example of a definition of predicates applied to an informal language is represented thus: any b is a piece of knowledge if and only if b is a belief and b is true and b is justified. Setting this proposition as a definition presupposes that the predicates have a definite meaning relative to the explicandum language, either by introduction or by implicit convention. Thus, when explicating the explicandum ‘knowledge’ by the explicatum ‘is a piece of knowledge’ through the definition just provided, explicators should settle on a language that (I) allows for this kind of definition and (II) provides the expressions occurring in the definiens, including their meaning.

(ii) Meaning postulate/axiom: Setting axioms or, by another terminology, meaning postulates is performed within languages as well. This excludes axiom schemes which are metalinguistic devices for describing classes of object language axioms (see (iii), below). Again, being an object language form of introduction, axioms can be seen as governed by metalinguistic rules. These rules usually call for consistency, or prima facie consistency, so that the resulting language/theory or parts of language/theory are not rendered trivializable or even inconsistent. Traditionally, axioms are thought to be true or evident, though it is not always clear according to what measures they could be judged thus. Alternatively, and instrumentally, setting axioms can itself be seen as an act of qualifying propositions as true. At any rate, while definitions have a specific syntactic form (see above) which guarantees non-creativity and eliminability, axioms are less regulated syntactically and usually allow for creativity in the sense of establishing new truths in a language (or theory). Axioms come into play when expressions cannot be defined but are seen as basic concepts which nonetheless need regulation. The various axiomatizations of set theory can be seen as explications of ‘belongs to’ or ‘is an element in’. In such an explication, the explicative introduction consists of several acts with each setting one axiom. An example of an informal explication employing axiomatic introduction is the juridical explication of ‘person’ with regard to corporations that states that in a number of respects, corporations have personhood. (‘.. has personhood’ can be seen as the explicatum.)

(iii) Metalinguistic rule: Axioms are used to introduce the basic expressions of a language. However, this is only true if logical and auxiliary expressions are disregarded. Frequently, these are not regulated by axioms but by metalinguistic rules, including rules for setting axioms and definitions as well as rules of inference and assumption. This illustrates that metalinguistic rules are yet another means of giving meaning to an expression and can be used for acts of explicative introduction. Therefore, establishing the rules of hypothetical derivation (conditional introduction) and modus ponendo ponens (conditional elimination) in a language may be seen as an act of explicative introduction which explicates the expressions ‘if … then …’ and ‘… provided …’ of ordinary language. Explication by metalinguistic rules also makes sense if the means of the object language are not sufficient to endow the explicatum with the full intended meaning. In mineralogy, hardness (explicatum) can be regulated by an operational rule that gives practical instructions to be followed, depending on the outcome of which propositions on comparative hardness may be constated. Metalinguistic rules, like axioms, are rather flexible. Usually, the only (meta-meta-)rule to be followed is that the metalinguistic rules shall not lead to any kind of prescriptive dilemma with respect to what moves they allow or forbid in their corresponding object language (but also see Prior 1960 for tonk style rules to be avoided).

The forms of introduction described here are not exhaustive. For example, forms of mixed introduction that combine metalinguistic rules and object language axioms are easily conceived. When explicating ‘heavier’ for a physical theory, the setting of axioms of irreflexivity and transitivity can be combined with an operational rule directing the use of a beam scale that leads to atomic propositions about one body being heavier than another (see Siegwart 2007b, 52-56).

d. Assessing Adequacy

After the explicatum has been introduced, the explication is commonly assessed. This can be done by verifying the criteria of explicative adequacy which have been established in the last step of the explicative preparation (2.b). A straightforward test of adequacy consists in verifying all these criteria in the explicatum language with the help of the explicative introductions performed in the preceding step (2.c) and, possibly, with the help of an explicatum theory provided beforehand (Cordes 2017). A positive test result qualifies the explication as adequate or successful. If any of the criteria is disproven in the test of adequacy, the explication is inadequate or has failed. A full test of adequacy is not always feasible. Sometimes, some criteria of adequacy (for example, metalinguistic criteria) cannot be decided by the resources available or are even undecidable. If at least all object language criteria of adequacy are proven in the test of adequacy, one may speak of a consequentially adequate explication. In any case, if there are criteria of adequacy that have neither been proven nor disproven and if all other criteria have been proven, the explication is adequate on probation. (Cordes 2016, 38)

As the criteria of adequacy constitute the salient benchmark for explications, a bad performance in tests of adequacy should motivate revisions. Accordingly, it is common for explicators to go back and forth and tweak any of the constituents of the explication. Rarely is the explicandum or the explicandum language changed in order to get the desired positive test results. Changing the explicatum, the explicatum language (or theory), the criteria of explicative adequacy, or the explicative introduction may all influence the test. Note that the to and fro of the revision process is usually omitted when an explication is presented within a publication in order to present only the final explication.

Besides the internal test of adequacy, external measures of explicative or introductive quality are conceivable. (As explicative adequacy is an internal quality measure, confusion is avoided by not attributing adequacy to explications in an external sense. Still, Stein (1992, 280) gives an externalistic view on explicative adequacy.) Carnap’s requirements of precision, fruitfulness and simplicity are generic, and thus external, criteria of introductive quality (which can be specified in various ways (cf. 1.b)). The choice of any of the following may cause external criticism despite a positive result of the internal test of adequacy: explicandum, explicandum language (and theory), explicatum, explicatum language (and theory), criteria of adequacy, explicative introduction.

One easy way of obtaining a successful explication is to employ the criteria of explicative adequacy as the explicative introduction, often as axioms/meaning postulates. This, however, trivializes the verification of the criteria. In some cases that is acceptable, but often it can be criticized on grounds of lacking fruitfulness because nothing that exceeds the criteria of adequacy will follow and a non-creative definition securing eliminability may be preferable over the ad hoc postulation of the criteria.

External assessments of explications include comparisons to other explications. Different explications may vie with one another for various desiderata, like simplicity, conciseness of the criteria of adequacy, or syntactical parsimony. Comparative assessments of explications substantiate explicative debates (3.a). A thorough exegesis of the history of explications for a given explicandum in the preparatory steps (2.b, (viii)) is an important resource to rely on in these debates.

3. Explication Theory

The second section provided an outline of an explicative procedure. It can be consulted when performing explications. When reflecting on explications, a theory of explication is needed. Such a theory can be provided with varying degrees of precision and distinguishing potential. In what follows (3.a), a theory that falls short of the formal rigor of a set theory in which languages, expressions, and explications are set theoretic entities (Cordes 2017) is developed. The aim is to provide some intuitive terminology in order to distinguish different kinds of explications and to relate explications to one another. Reflections on explications in this sense are often important when explicative disputes emerge and when the whole method of explication is discussed. A second subsection can be seen as an application of the terminology and also as a treatment of the analysis paradox that is frequently revisited when the method of explication is discussed critically.

a. Constituents of Explication

As described above, explications can be conceived as made up out of six constituents: explicandum, explicandum language, explicatum, explicatum language, criteria of explicative adequacy, and the explicative introduction. If so conceived, providing an explication means specifying these six constituents (2.b, 2.c). Reflecting on an explication means describing and theorizing on any of these constituents, their interrelations, or their relations to other entities—other explications, explicators, and the speakers of explicandum and explicatum language, background theories, etc. General discussions and justifications of the method of explication are supported by its theory, which can take the form of, for example, the six-constituent conception presupposed here. Other conceptions can be provided as well, but such activities have not received much attention in the past.

(i) On occasion, explicators or recipients of explications may reflect on one or several constituents of an explication separately. Explicators do so, for example, when following a procedure of explication akin to the one elaborated in section 2. In a strict sense, explicators cease to do so as soon as they relate the different constituents to one another, for example by considering the suitability of a specific explicatum language with regard to the potential explicata it accommodates. Nonetheless, a lot of explicators’ work is indeed directed at single constituents, like individuating the explicandum language. The same holds for recipients of explications who may take issue with one individual constituent for reasons purely internal to that constituent. For example, with regard to a certain criterion of adequacy, recipients may want to criticize it as self-contradictory or they may want to voice concerns about its intelligibility quite apart from how it relates to the other aspects of the explication.

(ii) The reflection on relations between different constituents within one explication has one prime example within the procedure of explication, namely the adequacy test. It relates the explicative introduction to the explicatum language and to the criteria of explicative adequacy. Thus, qualifying an explication as adequate, inadequate, consequentially adequate, or adequate on probation (2.d) is a matter of reflecting on some relations between the components of an explication. There are other kinds of relations that belong in this category. For example, explicators may want to compare the explicandum language and the explicatum language with respect to which is stronger or more precise or whether they are sublanguages of one another. This suggests the distinction between intra-language explications, where explicandum language and explicatum language are the same, and inter-language explications, where they are not.

(iii) Transcending isolated explications, a theory of explications provides means to compare different explications to one another. Of special interest are explications where the explicative introductions are equivalent (convergent explications) and which either start with the same explicandum from the same explicandum language (explication alternatives, as opposed to genetically different explications) or yield the same explicatum from the same explicatum language.  It is then possible to distinguish linguistic alternatives (different explicatum languages), lexical alternatives (different explicata), criterial alternatives (different criteria of adequacy) and introductory alternatives (different explicative introductions) among explication alternatives. This systematic approach to explication alternatives provides a starting point to carve explicative disputes at their joints. It allows explicators to localize their dissent and develop a productive explicative debate.

Apart from explication alternatives, other phenomena are noteworthy: If an explication starts from the results of a previous explication, then one may speak of a consecutive explication. As soon as more than two explications are related to one another, more interesting structures emerge. A history of explication is just any number of explications that are mutual explication alternatives. In contrast, chains of explications are those sequences of explications where the earlier explications provide explicata that are used in the later explications to introduce the later explicata (see sect. 4). Usually, the earlier explicata just figure in the later explicata’s definietia. For more detailed distinctions see Cordes (2017, sect. 4).

(iv) Lastly, one can reflect on relations between explications on one hand and entities that are independent from explications on the other hand. For example, when several explications provide explicata in a common explicatum language, the result can be considered a theory. This theory can be analyzed in many respects that are different from its explicative genesis. Also, as pointed out in the latter part of 2.d, explications can be externally assessed. Such an assessment accounts for the three Carnapian requirements of exactness, fruitfulness, and simplicity. But in general, explicators and the recipients of explications are free to relate explications to whatever entities they see fit.

This final group includes any investigations into the social dimension of putting forward an explication and into how explicators interact either competitively or cooperatively with one another or with other agents. Under the six-constituents conception of explication, explicators are not part of their explication. Consequentially and illustratively, when a written text is with substantial exegetic effort, interpreted as an explication, then the six-constituent conception of explication says nothing about whether the distinctness of writer and interpreter or their double effort justifies speaking of two explications. An analogous case occurs when authors develop a predecessor’s systematic-explicative ideas on some subject. These two scenarios suggest that in the vicinity of explications, the possible interactions between agents are versatile. Literature on this social-conceptual dimension of explication is rare.

b. The Analysis Paradox

The analysis paradox is a prima facie cognitive dilemma that repeatedly surfaces in, among other areas, explication theory (Stein 1992, 280; Dutilh Novaes and Reck 2017)—sometimes without explicit mention (Justus 2012). Some scholars even view the paradox of analysis as a main motivator for the development of a method of explication by Carnap (Lavers 2013, 226) or by Frege (Beaney 2004, 120; see sect. 4 below). This is a debatable view, since neither philosopher referred to the resolution of the paradox as a goal of their respective efforts. At any rate, setting up and employing any method of explication can be clearly separated from theorizing about how it relates to the paradox of analysis.

The term ‘paradox of analysis’ was first used by Langford in reference to G. E. Moore (Langford 1942, 323; see Beaney 2014, who also applies the term ‘paradox of analysis’ to some earlier problems). There are several versions of the paradox, but the one that is relevant to explication can be put as the following dilemma: Either (i) an explicator fails because the result of the explication diverges from the explicandum, thus not explicating the intended concept, or (ii) an explicator fails because the explicatum concept is identical with the explicandum, thus not improving on the pre-explicative cognitive situation.

The paradox is often associated with an underlying conflict about the role of natural and artificial (not only formal) languages in philosophy. For explications outside philosophy, this specific issue is less pertinent. Thus, Strawson (1963, 515) characterizes philosophical problems as problems about concepts, with those concepts being conveyed by natural language. Carnapian explication includes an explicatum concept (often conveyed by artificial language) that is allowed to diverge from the explicandum concept. This divergence prompts Strawson to his widely recognized charge that an explication “change[s] the subject” (1963, 506). Strawson’s critique could be framed so that it is directed against Carnap’s perceived acceptance of the first horn of the dilemma, while, at that point, Strawson takes the second horn. Consequently, this causes him to articulate his methodology in a way that diverts the appearance of failure connected to that horn.

The criticism of explication as changing the subject is thus, on the one hand, an application of the paradox of analysis to explication and, on the other hand, a manifestation of a deeper methodological dispute about the subject of philosophical problems and the language in which they are framed. Facing this situation within philosophy, explication theorists have two ways to deal with it: (i) Accept Carnapian explication and accept a central role of artificial languages, or (ii) put the emphasis in philosophy on natural language and reformulate the method of explication in divergence from Carnap.

(i) For the first way to deal with the paradox, explication theory provides a clear and intuitive understanding of explicative failure (2.d), which is different from the (negligible) failure of not exactly capturing the unaltered pre-explicative use of a term. Thus, in this approach, the first horn of the dilemma is not seen as constituting failure. In a sense, the “changing of the subject” is recognized and may in fact be encouraged. If, for example, there are inconsistencies in the explicandum language which are seen as being caused by the meaning of the explicandum, then the explicatum should diverge from the original meaning. Accordingly, when characterizing explication, Löffler (2008, 14) talks about remedy (“entstören”) instead of replacement (“ersetzen”). This is a departure from Carnap and many other scholars who portray the explicandum as being replaced by the explicatum. For another line of reasoning in partial support of conceptual change within explication, (ameliorative analysis) see Haslanger (2012, 392-394).

(ii) The second way to deal with the dilemma chooses natural over artificial language. However, this alone does not fend off the complaint of “changing the subject”. Even within natural language, the sameness or the difference of explicandum and explicatum may be seen as a dilemma. Thus, even intra-ordinary-language explications are prone to the paradox of analysis if unchanging replacement is expected.

4. An Exemplary Explication

In retrospect, the history of philosophy provides scholars of explication with numerous examples, although the exact count depends on the concept of explication. Presupposing a weak understanding, nearly any conceptual clarification in a philosophical context may count as an explication. Olsson (2015), for example, considers the JTB conception of knowledge to be an example of an explication, which is the basis for his defense against objections along Gettier’s lines. He does not cite a specific text which counts as the locus explicationis (a text documenting the execution of the explication). Instead, he trusts that the genesis of the JTB conception conforms to his 2-step conception of explication (2015, 59). In this last section, Frege’s Foundations of Arithmetic (1953) are described through the lens of an explication theorist.  That is, the book is taken as an explication exemplifying the methodology from sect. 2 and some of the terminology from sect. 3. (For a deeper investigation into Frege’s project from a different point of view, see Blanchette 2012, especially ch. 4.)

Although Frege’s book The Foundations of Arithmetic is usually seen as an explication of ‘number’ (Lavers 2013, 225), he notably starts his investigation by posing an explicative question with regard to ‘one’ or ‘1’. Frege defines ‘one’ in the latter part of the book (§77) after defining ‘number’. Carnap (1963, 935), however, refers to the work as an explication of the numerical words ‘one’, ‘two’, etc. The book can be considered to contain not only one explication, but a chain of explications (3.a) with the explication of ‘number’ at the center. Roughly, part II of the book (§§18-28) predominantly deals with ‘number’ and part III (§§29-54) with ‘one’. The very first sentence of the book (Introduction, p. I) contains two versions of the explicative question regarding ‘1’: ‘What is the number one? What does the symbol 1 mean?’ The second version emphasizes Frege’s conceptual or explicative intention when posing the question. Subsequently, he clarifies that he is asking for a definition of that numeral. The explicative question with respect to ‘number’ is posed a few paragraphs later: What is number? (Introduction, p. II)

Frege is aware that he carries the burden of proof regarding the need for an explication (p. III, and explicitly on p. V: “a desire for a stricter enquiry”) and so points out some problems with the talk of numbers in the course of the introduction. Ambiguity (p. I) and contradiction (p. IV) are two of his concerns. Frege is aware of other conceptual proposals (such as a history of explications) and that the proposals compete with one another (p. V).

The explicanda are named numerous times throughout the book, for example in the explicative questions: ‘1’ and ‘number’. After the introduction, Frege focuses on ‘number’ to illustrate his general aims, which is why this explicandum is more prominent (§§2, 4). The explicandum language can either be taken to be the everyday talk about whole-number quantitative issues or even the scientific mathematical jargon of Frege’s time. His reference to “arithmetic” seems to suggest the latter, but several of his examples stem from everyday life.

As mentioned above, ambiguity is a reason for Frege to start the explicative enterprise. When associating ‘one’ or the article ‘a’ with the partial synonym ‘unit’ or ‘unity’, he struggles with its ambiguity for several sections of the book (§§29-39). Right from the beginning of dealing with ‘unit’, Frege is skeptical of that term and rejects it as a possible explicandum. The syntactic ambiguity of ‘ein’ in the German language plays a role as well. (It can be a numeral or an indefinite article.) With regard to the ambiguity of ‘number’, Frege restricts his investigation to non-negative integers in §2, excluding other types of numbers.

Frege does not review systematic empirical research on the use of the expressions ‘one’ or ‘number’, but he gives several examples from ordinary language which he regards as representing widely shared use patterns (e.g. §52). (This is common in philosophical explications, since detailed linguistic studies for the relevant expressions are rarely available.) Frege also refrains from identifying a definite body of texts including relevant uses of the explicanda, although part II of the book is labeled “Views of certain writers on the concept of Number” which can be understood as an incidental definition of a canon of reference texts. In any case, it seems plausible to take Frege’s consideration of some proposals by other authors as an enquiry into preceding explications. Besides his repeated criticism, he positively incorporates a few aspects from earlier explications, for example Leibniz’s definition of the number two and beyond (§§6, 55). Strictly speaking, this does not concern the explicanda identified (‘number’, ‘one’) but related expressions (‘two’, ‘three’ …). When discussing the definability of ‘number’ in general, Frege recognizes the failures of some earlier attempts (§20). This can be seen as another recognition of the explicative history.

Writing before the dawn of metamathematics and thus metalanguage while also taking a leave from his own formal system (Begriffsschrift), it may be understandable that there is no section in Frege’s book where an explicatum language is explicitly named. It seems plausible to understand Frege’s explication of ‘number’ as not necessarily intended for everyday use, but for mathematical and philosophical contexts. Therefore, the explicatum language may be the scientific mathematical jargon. (In retrospect, one may understand Frege to be employing the language of a formal set theory as the explicatum language, but this defies chronology.) Thus, the scientific mathematical jargon is Frege’s explicandum language and explicatum language. This yields an intra-language explication (3.a). When considered this way, it is to be expected as per Carnap that the explicatum is situated within “a more exact part” of the explicandum language (Carnap 1963, 935). This, of course, depends on the further steps. For example, Frege’s investigation ensures that grammatical categorization is more transparent on the explicatum end. It becomes clear that ‘one’ is not supposed to be taken as a property name for objects (§§29-33). Some semantical issues (“Are units identical with one another?”, §34) are also addressed explicitly. In sum, instead of providing an explicit language and a definition of ‘number’ and ‘one’, Frege creates a “more exact part” within ordinary mathematical (or philosophical) language by answering several questions that pertain to the syntactical and semantical properties of the explicandum. Some properties of the environment in which the explicatum is to be situated is provided by Frege in passing: “I assume that it is known what the extension of a concept is.” (§68, fn.)

Since this process gradually transforms the original (explicandum) setting into the setting for the explicative introduction, the explicatum is not named explicitly, except in the definitions that are viewed as the explicative introductions (§§72, 77). The explicata are ‘… is a Number’ and ‘1’, a unary predicate constant and an individual constant in modern parlance. To avoid the ambiguous picture in which not only explicandum language and explicatum language are identical, but explicandum and explicatum as well, one may read the explicata with a suppressed index: ‘1F’.

Several definitions that are strictly part of the individuation of the explicatum language (or theory) lead up to and connect the two specific acts of explicative introduction. They are both acts of definition: “n is a Number” is to mean the same as the expression “there exists a concept such that n is the Number which belongs to it”” (§72). “1 is the Number which belongs to the concept ‘identical with 0’.” (§77) The metalinguistic character of these definitions can be discounted as they can be both easily rephrased without referring to expressions. Frege plausibly employed the quotation marks as a parsing device. The first explicative introduction introduces ‘… is a Number’ by employing the unary function constant ‘the number of …’. The second explicative introduction introducing ‘1’ also relies on the expressions ‘the number of …’ and on ‘0’. ‘0’ is introduced in §74. The definition of ‘the number of …’ relies on ‘the extension of …’—a base expression—and the predicate ‘… is equal to …’ (“gleichzahlig”), which is introduced in §72 as well. In the preceding illustrations, a segment of Frege’s definitional tree is sketched. If ‘the number of …’ and ‘0’ were included among the explicata, then at least two chains of explications (3.a) could be seen here: A1. ‘the number of …’ along with A2. ‘… is a number’ comprises one chain; and the other chain is comprised of B1. ‘the number of …’, B2. ‘0’, and B3. ‘1’. Following the explicative introductions, Frege defines further expressions, like ‘…follows in the series of natural number directly after …’ (§76).

Even before the number definition in §72, Frege launches efforts to assess the adequacy of his explication by preparing the verification of criteria of adequacy. He does this consciously, as can be seen from the headline, “Our definition completed and its worth proved”, and the consecutive section which mentions what was to become Carnap’s generic criterion of fruitfulness (§70). The specific criteria of explicative adequacy are not explicitly formulated before the explicative introduction. In fact, they are not presented until he actually verifies some of them, leaving the others without proof. This order of things is methodically not ideal because it gives the criteria an ad-hoc character. However, explicators proceed in this fashion frequently, possibly due to dramaturgical reasons. Among the specific criteria of adequacy are some theorems about equality which appear in the definiens for ‘1’. Frege comes closest to giving criteria of adequacy in §78 when he lists six theorems employing several of the expressions he defines and not only the two explicata. His motions toward full arguments supporting these theorems feature several more definitions and further theorems. Thus, Frege’s method of assessing the adequacy of his explications is not in full accord with the method of explication outlined in sect. 2. It would be better described as an argument for adequacy by use, as in the use of the explicata in a way they are usually used in arithmetic. With regard to certain theorems, Frege presupposes their truth by qualifying them as analytic in the concluding sections (§§87, 109).

5. References and Further Reading

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  • Carnap, R., 2003 [1928], The Logical Structure of the World and Pseudoproblems in Philosophy, R. A. George (transl.), Chicago, Ill.: Open Court.
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Author Information

Moritz Cordes
Email: cordesm@uni-greifswald.de
University of Greifswald


Geo Siegwart
Email: siegwart@uni-greifswald.de
University of Greifswald