Medieval Theories of Free Will

Why do human beings perform the actions they perform? What moves them to act? Why do we blame a human being for knocking over the vase and not the family dog? What gives us the idea that we are free to choose as we wish, that we have free will? These and other questions about human action have fascinated philosophers for centuries. Throughout the thousand year period of the Middle Ages, scholars provided a wide variety of different answers to these questions. These thinkers developed theories both remarkable and original in their own right that continue to be of interest to scholars working in this area today. While they shared an understanding of human psychology and enjoyed a common intellectual heritage, they nevertheless maintained a lively and diverse conversation on this topic throughout the whole of the Middle Ages, providing us with a sophisticated intellectual inheritance.

This article considers a wide range of theories written throughout the Middle Ages, from the foundational work of Augustine in the early part of the period through that of John Duns Scotus at the end. It notes the ways in which later work on the topic builds upon that developed earlier, shows the lively disagreements that often arose on the topic, and, although medieval thinkers worked within a different framework than philosophers do today, reveals how their discussions share certain affinities.

Table of Contents

  1. Medieval and Current Understandings of Free Will
  2. Individual Theories – the Early Middle Ages
    1. Augustine
    2. Anselm of Canterbury
    3. Bernard of Clairvaux
  3. Individual Theories – Sentences Commentaries
    1. Peter Lombard
    2. Albert the Great
  4. Individual Theories – the High Middle Ages
    1. Thomas Aquinas
    2. John Duns Scotus
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Medieval and Current Understandings of Free Will

Although at first glance it might not seem so, medieval philosophers were concerned with many of the same issues that interest philosophers today. The current discussion of action focuses on the topic of free will: whether free will is compatible with causal determinism, and the relationship between free will and moral responsibility. Medieval thinkers also discussed many of these issues; for example, they accept the common intuition that unless one acts freely, one cannot be held morally responsible for what one does. But the structure of their discussion often makes it difficult to recognize the extent to which their concerns both resemble and deviate from the current debate. Thinkers in the early part of the Middle Ages discussed human action and freedom in the context of broader theological concerns such as the problem of evil or the effects of the Fall, that is, the sin of the first human beings. As the Middle Ages progressed, scholars became more interested in discussing the nature of freedom for its own sake, apart from the particular theological problems in which free will forms an important part of their solution. Thus, discussions of free will become embedded in larger treatises of human psychology. This is not to say that later theorists lost interest in those theological problems; rather, discussions of the two issues diverged from each other and became discrete subjects of investigation.

Medieval philosophers did not ask the question whether free will was compatible with causal determinism, not because they did not understand the ramifications of cause and effect or because they lacked a scientific notion of the world. They recognized the regularities of the world and understood the implications of a mechanistic world-view. They did not ask this question because they accepted the position that the freedom of human action is incompatible with causal determinism and because they believed that human beings in fact do act freely, at least on some occasions. Thus, in current terms, they were libertarians about human freedom. They argued that human beings are importantly different from other animals and the rest of creation. Human beings act freely because they possess rational capacities, which are lacking in other animals. Rational capacities enable human beings to act freely because those capacities are immaterial. How does the immateriality of those capacities enable human beings to act freely? The argument, roughly, is as follows: Everything else in the world is made of matter and thus is material or physical. Material things are governed by particular laws and so are determined to particular activities. If human beings were wholly material, then their actions would also be determined and they would not act freely. But because the capacities that bring about action are immaterial in nature, and hence, not governed by physical laws, actions that come about as a result of those capacities will be uncoerced, at least under ordinary circumstances. According to medieval accounts of freedom, then, freedom is incompatible with causal determinism (although medieval philosophers would not express the point in these terms). Since they all agree on this issue, medieval accounts of freedom then attempt to answer the question “how is it that human beings are able to act freely?” The answer to this question was hotly contested.

All medieval theorists agreed that human beings have a soul that enables them to perform the actions that they perform. As the era progressed, theories of human psychology grew more and more elaborate, but even in the earliest theories, two capacities in particular stood out: the intellect and the will. The intellect is the human capacity to cognize. The will is the human motivational capacity; it is the capacity that moves us to do what we do. The will depends upon the intellect to identify what alternatives for action are possible and desirable. It is on the basis of these intellectually cognized alternatives that the will chooses. Medieval theorists recognized that it is the human being who thinks and who acts, but it is in virtue of having an intellect and having a will that human beings are able to do what they do. Talk about what the intellect thinks or what the will does is a kind of shorthand for what the individual does in virtue of those capacities In light of a common theory of human psychology, the medieval debate centered upon whether human beings act freely primarily in virtue of their wills or in virtue of their intellects. Those who argue that freedom is primarily a function of the intellect are known as intellectualists while those who argue that freedom is primarily a function of the will are known as voluntarists, from the Latin word for will, voluntas.

2. Individual Theories – the Early Middle Ages

a. Augustine

Augustine was interested in the topic of human action and freedom because he needed to explain how it is that God is not responsible for the presence of evil in the world while at the same time holding that God sustains and governs the world. On his view, human beings do evil things when they give in to their desires for the temporal things instead of pursuing eternal things such as knowledge, virtue, and God. His theory of human nature is rather rudimentary, but it helps to establish the foundation for later more elaborate accounts. Human beings possess the rational capacities of intellect and will as well as sensory capabilities and desire. Human beings perceive the world around them, including what things are available to be pursued, through their senses. Such data can also stimulate basic desires. This information is fed to the intellect, which makes judgments about the contents of perception and desire. Choices as to what to do are made in virtue of the will. Augustine argues that desire can never overwhelm an agent; because they have intellects and wills, agents are not determined by basic bodily desires. Rather, an agent gives in to desire in virtue of the will, which operates freely and never under compulsion. In fact, if a will were ever coerced, Augustine says it would not be a will. Thus, human beings commit sins freely by giving into the desire for temporal things, which the intellect and will could disregard in favor of the eternal things that human beings ought to pursue. Since human beings act freely, Augustine argues that they, and not God, are responsible for evil in the world.

Early in his career, Augustine was very optimistic about the human ability to resist temptation and sin. He argued that all one had to do in order to avoid sin was simply to will against it. This got him into a bit of trouble with a particular heresy of the time – Pelagianism. Pelagius was a contemporary of Augustine’s who held that human beings are able to bring about their own salvation and do not require grace from God. This position contradicts the traditional Christian view of the Fall of Adam and Eve and the need for the Incarnation of Jesus and grace from God. Not surprisingly, Pelagius took Augustine’s early writings to be favorable to his own position. Augustine argued that Pelagius misinterpreted his early views, and in his later writings, he was much more careful to insist upon the pernicious effects of sin upon human behavior and the need for God’s grace in order to avoid sin and achieve salvation. This sets up a tension with his insistence upon free will that exercised the minds of later theorists and one that Augustine himself did not entirely resolve.

b. Anselm of Canterbury

Anselm‘s account of action and freedom reflects a broadly Augustinian framework. Like Augustine, Anselm describes human action in terms of the workings of intellect and will. Anselm also accepts the view that unless human beings act freely, they cannot be held responsible for their actions and God will be blamed for sin. Worries over the effect of sin and grace also help to structure his account.

Anselm rejects the notion that one must be able to act in ways other than they do in order to be free. If freedom had to be defined in these terms, then God, the good angels, the blessed in heaven, the bad angels, and the damned in hell could not be free since they lack this ability to do otherwise. God, the good angels, and the blessed cannot bring about evil while the bad angels and the damned cannot bring about the good. In the medieval theological tradition, God is perfectly good so it is not possible for God to will or perform evil. Medieval theologians also argued that rational beings (human beings, angels) admitted into heaven are confirmed in the good in such a way that they are unable to choose what is bad, while rational beings who are sent to hell are confirmed in evil in such a way that they are unable to chose what is good. But Anselm believes that all of these individuals act freely even though they cannot act in ways other than they do. This is especially the case for God, who is the freest of them all. Therefore, Anselm argues freedom cannot consist in the ability to do otherwise; another account of freedom must be developed. The question, then, is how does Anselm understand the notion of freedom?

Anselm presents two different accounts of freedom, which nevertheless are related. In De libertate arbitrii (commonly translated as On Freedom of Choice), he defines freedom as “the ability to preserve uprightness of will for its own sake.” He argues that rational beings have this ability insofar as they possess intellects by which they come to understand how to preserve uprightness of will and insofar as they possess the will itself in virtue of which they will to preserve that uprightness. This might seem like a strange definition of freedom, but given the connection to moral responsibility, Anselm understands freedom not in terms of being able to act differently than one does. Rather, he understands freedom in terms of whether one has the ability to do the right thing for the right reason. It is obvious that God, the good angels, and the blessed in heaven all possess this ability, but what about sinners in this life, who from the Christian perspective are now slaves to sin in virtue of their sin? One can raise an analogous worry about the demons and the damned in hell, both of whom are confirmed in evil. Anselm needs to explain how they retain the ability to do the right thing given that they are unable to do the right thing.

Anselm explains this seemingly contradictory situation by drawing upon a distinction between possessing an ability and exercising that ability. Because sinners, demons, and the damned all possess intellect and will, they retain the ability to preserve uprightness of will. They are, however, unable to exercise that ability because of the hindrance of sin. Anselm explains this by analogy with sight. One retains the ability to see a mountain even though on a cloudy day, one cannot in fact see it due to the hindrance of the clouds. Similarly, one who is a slave to sin or who is confirmed in evil retains the ability to maintain uprightness of will even though one cannot actually maintain that uprightness because being a slave to sin or confirmation in evil hinders one from doing so. Thus, Anselm agrees with Augustine that it takes an act of God to restore the sinner to a state of grace, although human beings are capable of losing that grace by their own evil (and free) choices.

Anselm’s second account of freedom can be called the “two-wills account.” In his treatise, On the Fall of the Devil, he develops a thought-experiment in which he imagines that God is creating an angel from scratch. At the point where God has given the angel under construction only a will for happiness, the angel cannot act freely. For at this point, the angel is necessitated to will happiness and those things required for its happiness and is not able to refrain from willing happiness. Thus, the angel’s act of willing happiness is not free, for the angel could will nothing but happiness. Anselm then asks whether the situation would be any different should God give the angel only a will for justice, In this case, Anselm insists that the angel does not will justice freely since the angel is necessitated to will justice and is not able not to will justice. Only when God gives the angel both a will for happiness and a will for justice does the angel will freely. For now the angel is not necessitated to will happiness, for he could will justice; nor is the angel necessitated to will justice, for he could will happiness.

There are several questions that come to mind about this second account of freedom. First, there is the worry that Anselm is now relying on a principle that he rejected in the first account of freedom, that is, the idea that freedom requires the ability to do otherwise. Secondly, one can ask about the relationship between the two accounts. This second issue is easier to address than the first. One can see in Anselm’s two-wills account of freedom a further development of how the will of the first account is able to maintain uprightness of will for its own sake. If the will had only the will for justice, it would will justice, not because it is the right thing to do, but because it must do so. If the will had only the will for happiness, then it could not will justice at all. Thus, it is only when the will has both the will for justice and the will for happiness that the will has the ability to maintain uprightness for the sake of uprightness. That is to say that the will has the ability to will the right thing (that is, justice) for the right reason.

The first issue is harder to resolve. Anselm implies that having the will for happiness means that one need not will justice and vice versa. Thus, one who has both wills is able to will justly or not, as it pleases the agent. This implies that the one who follows the will for justice could have abandoned justice to follow the will for happiness and vice versa. But this implies the ability to act otherwise and also implies that God and the blessed could abandon justice for happiness while the demons and the damned could abandon happiness for justice, both of which Anselm denies. The answer to this conundrum lies in Anselm’s reply to a third issue raised by his discussion.

This third issue addresses the apparent implication that the pursuit of justice could require an agent to sacrifice her own happiness. For in following the will for justice, the agent turns away from the will for happiness and vice versa. This implies that an agent could be in a situation where doing what is right will make her unhappy. Anselm responds by arguing that genuine happiness never conflicts with justice. When agents are struggling between the demands of morality and happiness, the happiness in question is only apparent. For example, consider the college student who is tempted to spend the scholarship money, not on her tuition, but rather on a new car. Obviously she ought to pay the tuition bill, but she really, really wants the car and thinks she’ll be much happier with it. Anselm would argue that in the long run, the education will make her happier; for one thing, the hope is that it will lead to a better paying job that will enable her to get the car. Thus, doing the right thing in the long run will coincide with her happiness, regardless of whether she recognizes this in the short run. Anselm characterizes the will for happiness as a will for our own benefit, what we think will be advantageous to ourselves, what appears desirable to us, regardless of whether it in fact will make us happy. What actually makes us happy is pursuing happiness in the right way, that is, by doing what is in fact the right thing to do. Thus, for Anselm, there is no actual conflict between happiness and justice.

This answer helps him to resolve the first issue. The agent who acts justly simply because it is the right thing to do de facto satisfies the will for happiness. Those who act justly for its own sake recognize the connection between justice and happiness and so would not forsake justice for the sake of happiness; it would be inconceivable to them to do so. But they act freely insofar as they are not necessitated to justice in virtue of having both wills. Thus, they act freely even though they cannot act otherwise. Those who are confirmed in evil fail or failed to take seriously the connection between justice and genuine happiness. They have chosen to follow the will for happiness and, by pursuing the will for happiness in an unjust manner, forsake justice. Because they are fixed upon their own happiness, it would be inconceivable to them to pursue the will for justice even though they realize that they would be better off to do so. But they act freely insofar as they are not necessitated to happiness in virtue of having both wills. Thus, they act freely even though they cannot act otherwise.

c. Bernard of Clairvaux

Bernard (1090-1153) is not often thought of in connection with philosophy; he was an abbot and an important religious reformer as well as a prominent promoter of the First Crusade. But he wrote a short treatise titled On Grace and Free Will that was rather influential during the twelfth and first half of the thirteenth centuries. Although Bernard is mainly concerned with theological worries such as the influence of grace upon human freedom, he contributes to the voluntarist climate of the Middle Ages. He moves the discussion even further than either Augustine or Anselm, for he is one of the first medieval theorists to define the will as a rational appetite, that is, an appetite that is responsive to reasons. Such an idea is merely nascent in Anselm.

Like Augustine and Anselm before him, Bernard acknowledges that moral responsibility requires that human beings perform their actions freely. He argues that human beings act freely primarily in virtue of the will. The intellect is not entirely irrelevant; Bernard claims that only those who have an intellect and are capable of engaging in thought are capable of acting freely. Thus, children, non-rational animals, and the mentally handicapped do not act freely. As they mature, however, children become more able to do so, as do those who recover from mental illness. Nevertheless, the intellect is merely an instrument by which the will is able to exercise its primary activity, which is to choose. The will depends upon the intellect to identify what choices are available from which the will can choose. We cannot choose what we are not aware of. But once the intellect has made apparent potential alternatives for action, its job is finished. The will makes the final choice of what is to be done. Thus, it is ultimately in virtue of the will that human beings perform free actions. Furthermore, on Bernard’s account, the will is so free that nothing can determine its choices, not even the intellect. He argues that the will is free to will against a judgment of the intellect. For example, the intellect could judge that some action is against God’s decrees, and therefore not to be done, yet the will could still choose this action. Such cases, of course, happen all the time, and Bernard argues that if the will were not free to will against a particular judgment of the intellect, that would in essence destroy it. This idea that the will is able to will against a judgment of intellect will be an important claim in the late thirteenth century debates.

3. Individual Theories – Sentences Commentaries

a. Peter Lombard

Peter Lombard was a twelfth-century bishop of Paris and a theologian at what was to become the University of Paris. The final edition of his most famous work, Sententiae in IV libris distinctae, was released for circulation somewhere around 1155-57. This book became the standard theological textbook at universities throughout Europe from the thirteenth into the sixteenth centuries. It is divided into four books, the first of which has to do with God; the second, with creatures, both human and angelic, and their fall from grace; the third, with the incarnation and redemption of Jesus; and the fourth with the instruments of redemption, that is, the virtues and the sacraments. Writing a commentary on the Sentences became a standard student practice at universities during the Middle Ages.

Although use of the Latin phrase, liberum arbitrium, goes all the back to Augustine, Lombard provides a definition for it that dominates the discussion of freedom in the first half of the thirteenth century: liberum arbitrium is a faculty of intellect and will. This term, for which there is no satisfactory English translation, refers to that power or capacity that enables human beings to perform their actions freely. Lombard’s definition appears to be fairly straightforward, but theorists in the first half of the thirteenth century very much disagreed over how it was to be interpreted. Part of the problem is that Lombard himself did not discuss the meaning of the definition in any great detail. Instead, he went on to discuss the place of liberum arbitrium in a larger theological scheme, addressing such questions as whether God has liberum arbitrium, the status of liberum arbitrium both before and after the Fall, and the effects of grace upon liberum arbitrium.

Although later theologians make note of Lombard’s discussion of these topics, they are far more interested in what he didn’t discuss, that is, the basic definition of liberum arbitrium. In the first half of the thirteenth century, there occurs a lively discussion on how to interpret this definition. As far as the participants in this discussion are concerned, there are four possibilities, and there are texts from this period defending each of these possibilities. To say that liberum arbitrium is a faculty of intellect and will could mean 1) that freedom is a function primarily of the intellect and only secondarily of the will 2) that freedom is a function primarily of the will and only secondarily of the intellect 3) that freedom is equally a function of both intellect and will and 4) that freedom is a function of a third capacity independently of intellect and will but with both cognitive and appetitive abilities. Because the fourth interpretation is the most implausible (and the rarest and possibly for those reasons the most interesting) and because it was held by one of the foremost scholars in the medieval period (Albert the Great), it warrants a further look.

b. Albert the Great

Outside of scholarly circles, Albert the Great is largely a forgotten figure or, at best, is known merely as the teacher of Thomas Aquinas. In the thirteenth century, however, he was in fact one of the most famous and respected scholars of the period. He published a wide variety of writings in philosophy, theology, and especially in what we would call natural science. He wrote a number of commentaries on the works of Aristotle and argued for his importance at a time when many of Aristotle’s texts were banned from study at Europe’s universities. Albert’s theory of action is one of the most distinctive parts of his philosophy and one of the most innovative theories of the Middle Ages.

Albert takes as his starting point Lombard’s definition of liberum arbitrium and argues that it should not be interpreted too narrowly. He describes four distinct stages in the production of free human action. First, the intellect identifies viable alternatives for action from which to choose and makes a judgment about what to do. Secondly, the will develops a preference for one of the alternatives identified by the intellect and inclines toward it. Third, a choice is made between the alternative judged by the intellect and the alternative preferred by the will. The capacity for choice is exercised by a power separate from both intellect and will, which Albert calls liberum arbitrium. Finally, the choice is carried out by the will, which inclines the agent to perform the action chosen by liberum arbitrium.

One might worry that the aforementioned description of action implies that human beings are “at the mercy” of their capacities and so are not in charge of their own actions. This is a mistaken judgment. Albert is aware that it is human beings who think, judge, prefer, choose and finally act. What Albert is attempting to explain is how human beings are capable of engaging in all of these activities. He is providing what we might call a microscopic explanation for what happens at the macroscopic level. This is analogous to, say, the neuroscientist providing an explanation for why someone raises her arm in terms of what is happening on the level of the nerves firing and the muscles contracting. We of course assume that such an explanation does not negate our judgment that the agent has control over whether she moves her arm; it is the same in the case of Albert’s explanation.

Albert argues that this account is compatible with Lombard’s definition of liberum arbitrium. He argues that on his account, liberum arbitrium is a faculty of intellect and will, not because it consists of intellect and will, but because it works with intellect and will. Unless the intellect makes a judgment about what to do, and unless the will inclines toward a particular alternative (whether it be the same or different from the intellect’s judgment), there is no choice made by liberum arbitrium. Intellect and will make possible the activity of liberum arbitrium. Thus, liberum arbitrium is a power of intellect and will, not because it is composed of intellect and will, as one might think, but because it operates on the basis what goes on beforehand in intellect and will.

Recall that the whole purpose of liberum arbitrium was to frame the discussion of human freedom. Liberum arbitrium is a placeholder for whatever it is that enables human beings to act freely. Albert argues that liberum arbitrium must be a power distinct from intellect and will because of certain deficiencies or constraints in both intellect and will. The intellect cannot be the source of human freedom, for it is the power by which human beings cognize the world and come to understand truth. Thus, its judgments are constrained by the way the world is; we are not free to decide what we will and will not believe if we want to have truth as our goal. A reality that is not of our own making intrudes. By and large, that is how we want our intellects to operate. Our success in the world depends upon our being able to make accurate judgments about how the world is and what options are open to us. We will return to this view because it has certain implications for Thomas Aquinas’s account of freedom, which implications John Duns Scotus explicitly draws on in his criticism of Aquinas’s account. But for now, we want to see what use Albert makes of this observation. According to Albert, the constraints found in the intellect make it the case that the intellect cannot be the source of human freedom.

But then neither can the will. Albert notes that what distinguishes the actions of human beings from that of other animals is the human ability to contravene felt desires. To take a medieval example, if a sheep is hungry and spies a lush field of grass, the sheep eats in response to a brute felt desire for food. If the sheep is not hungry, the sheep does not eat even if it is standing in the pasture. What determine the sheep’s activities are the sheep’s desires and appetites over which the sheep has no control. It is different in the human case. A human being can feel hungry but not act on that hunger because she can judge that she has compelling reasons not to eat, say because she is waiting for her blood to be drawn for a fasting glucose level. Thus, she has a choice; she can choose either to eat or not to eat depending upon her reasons for doing one thing over the other. This ability to act on the basis of reasons, which confers freedom of action on human beings, is a cognitive ability. Since the will is an appetitive power, it cannot have this ability. The intellect is a cognitive power but is constrained by the way the world is and so cannot be the source of this ability. Albert concludes therefore that human beings must have a third power that enables them to have this ability, which power he identifies with liberum arbitrium.

4. Individual Theories – the High Middle Ages

a. Thomas Aquinas

Thomas Aquinas developed one of the most elaborate and detailed accounts of action in the Middle Ages. It is a testimony to his account that not only scholars of medieval philosophy but also non-historically oriented philosophers remain interested in the details of his view.

Aquinas’s account is roughly Aristotelian in character. Like Aristotle, Aquinas argues that human beings act for the sake of a particular end that they see as a good. Furthermore, he thinks that all human actions aim (directly or indirectly) at an ultimate end. This ultimate end is the final goal or object that human beings are trying to achieve. Aquinas follows Aristotle in arguing that the ultimate end of human life, that which human beings want most of all, is happiness. But Aquinas parts company with Aristotle in arguing that what in fact makes human beings happy is to know and love God.

Aquinas recognizes that such a definition of happiness is highly controversial. He concedes that not everyone agrees that the ultimate goal of human life is union with God. But he takes it as uncontroversial that all human beings desire happiness regardless of whether they agree with him with respect to what in fact constitutes happiness. Given Aquinas’s theological commitments, it is not surprising that he would think that what in fact will make human beings happy (whether they know it or not) is to be in a relationship with the creator and sustainer of the world.

Aquinas presents a detailed account of what goes on when human beings perform a particular course of action. This account reveals a close interaction between intellect and will in bringing about the action. In considering this account, one must keep in mind that although the description that follows is put in terms of a series of steps, these steps have only logical priority and not necessarily temporal priority. For example, Aquinas cites deliberation and choice as distinct steps, but he is willing to grant that one might not spend time deliberating over what to do. One might simply recognize what the situation calls for and choose to do it. In that case, the judgment or recognition of what to do and the choice come about simultaneously. However, Aquinas would insist that the judgment has logical priority insofar as one cannot choose what one is not at least on some level (and perhaps very quickly) cognizant of.

In bringing about a human action, first, human beings have some goal or end in mind when they think about what to do. Without that goal or end, they would in fact never act. Human beings don’t act for the sake of acting; there is always something they are trying to achieve by their actions. In other words, human behavior is always motivated. So human beings think about what they want to accomplish and settle upon a goal. This they do in virtue of their intellects in light of their fundamental desire for the good, which is built into the will. Next they feel an attraction or desire for that goal or end; their will inclines them toward it. Then they begin to think about how to achieve this goal or end; that is to say, they engage in the activity of deliberation. They then make a final judgment about what to do and choose what to do on the basis of that judgment. Aquinas argues that choice is a function of the will in light of a judgment by the intellect. In other words, the will moves the agent towards a particular action, an action that has been determined by the intellect. The will then moves the appropriate limbs of the bodies at the command of the intellect, thus executing the action. Finally, human beings feel enjoyment at their accomplishment or achievement of the end in virtue of the will.

Another aspect of human nature influences human action, and that is what Aquinas calls the passions. Passions are somewhat akin to our conception of emotions. That is, they are felt motivational states such as anger or joy that can have either a positive or a negative effect upon what we do. For example, fear and love for a child can move an otherwise timid individual to push the child out of the way of a speeding car. On the other hand, anger can move an otherwise peaceful person to road rage. Nevertheless, on Aquinas’s account, even though passions are very powerful influences upon actions and can make things appear to us as good that ordinarily would not seem good, the passions cannot simply overwhelm a (properly functioning) intellect and will and thereby determine what we do. Aquinas argues that it is always possible for us to step back and consider whether we should act on our passion as long as we possess a functional intellect and will. It might be difficult to do, since passions can be very strong, but it is always open to us to do so.

This of course is a very brief and succinct description of an account to which Aquinas devotes a significant portion of his texts. What it illustrates though is the complexity of what goes on in the course of producing an action and the ways in which the intellect and will interact with each other in producing a human action. We of course are not necessarily conscious of all of this activity, but Aquinas’s account does not depend upon our being so. He relies on the principle that if a human being is able to do something, there must be some power or capacity that enables her to do so. He then considers what goes on in the course of human action and postulates the kinds of powers or capacities that he thinks human beings must have in order to account for what goes on. So while from a strictly empirical or even scientific viewpoint, Aquinas’s account might seem rather quaint, still from a heuristic perspective, Aquinas’s account remains quite powerful.

One of the ways in which its power is revealed is in Aquinas’s account of good and bad action. He uses his basic framework for action to set up the account. Recall that action is ultimately a function of intellect and will with the potential influence of the passions. Bad action for Aquinas comes about in light of a breakdown of one of these capacities. Because the intellect has to do with knowledge and judgment, sins of the intellect have to do with mistakes in judgment due to ignorance (that is, a lack of knowledge). Aquinas also recognizes that wrongdoing can come about under the influence of passion. Although on his view, the passions are not able to overwhelm a properly functioning intellect and will, still the intellect can give in to passion under inappropriate circumstances (road rage is an obvious example). And finally, because the will is a type of (rational) desire, sins due to the will arise when one’s desire for the good is disordered, leading one to prefer a lesser good, forsaking a greater good that ought to be preferred.

For an action to count as a good action, it must satisfy several conditions. First, it must be a morally acceptable type of action. For Aquinas, such acts as murder, lying, stealing, or adultery are never right, regardless of, say, the circumstances or the end. They are in themselves disordered acts insofar as they, by their very nature, do not promote human flourishing. Secondly, the action must be performed for an appropriate end. Ordinarily, alms-giving is a good act, but it would be a bad action if one were to give alms for the sake of vainglory. And finally the act must be performed in the appropriate circumstances. Ordinarily one would be praised for taking a walk in order to maintain one’s health, but not if there is a blizzard raging outside. Under ordinary conditions (for example, no one’s life is at risk), it would be more appropriate under those circumstances to skip the walk.

For Aquinas, although some acts might be morally neutral in nature (that is, neither promoting nor detracting from human flourishing by their nature), because there are no neutral ends or circumstances, in the final analysis, no actually performed actions are truly morally neutral. Ends are either good or bad for Aquinas. Circumstances are either appropriate or not. Thus, for Aquinas, the range of actions that are candidates for moral appraisal is much broader than one often supposes. Even actions ordinarily considered rather innocuous, such as eating a candy bar or raking leaves, have moral significance for Aquinas.

Finally, although Aquinas is not a utilitarian, he does think that consequences can have an effect on the moral appraisal of an action. What matters is whether the consequences that result from performing the action are the typical consequences associated with an action of that type and whether the agent was in a position to know this. If the agent could have foreseen those consequences, then bad consequences increase the agent’s blameworthiness and good consequences increase the agent’s praiseworthiness. If the agent could not have foreseen such consequences, then they have no effect on the moral appraisal of the action.

Aquinas is interested not only in how human action comes about, but also in what enables human beings to act freely. Given his emphasis on the intellect in his account of action, it is not surprising to find Aquinas arguing that the intellect plays the larger role in the explanation of freedom. This is in contrast with the tradition he inherits, which, as we have seen so far, places the emphasis on the will in the majority of theories. For Aquinas, the fact that the intellect is able to deliberate, consider, and reconsider reasons for choosing various courses of action open to the agent enables the agent to act freely. The will is free but only insofar as the intellect is free to make or revise its judgments. Had the agent decided differently than she did, she would have chosen differently. Thus, freedom in the will is dependent upon and derivative upon freedom in the intellect. As we shall see, this position raises certain potential worries for Aquinas.

b. John Duns Scotus

John Duns Scotus was born in the town of Duns near the English-Scottish boarder sometime in the 1260s. Educated both in England and at the University of Paris, he died in Cologne, Germany in 1308. Known for the complexity of his thought, he was referred to in the Middle Ages as the Subtle Doctor.

Scotus argues that if Aquinas is correct, human beings do not act freely. This is because in Scotus’s view, the intellect is determined by the external environment, a position we saw earlier in Albert the Great. Scotus argues that the content of our beliefs and judgments is a function of the world around us and not within our control. If I see a table in front of me and I am functioning normally, I cannot help but believe that there is a table in front of me. I have some control over my beliefs; I can choose to acquire beliefs about quantum mechanics that I did not have before simply by choosing to read a book on the subject. I can take the table out of the room so that I no longer believe that there is a table in front of me. But even here my beliefs are fixed once I finish my manipulations of the world; ultimately then, I have no control over their content. Once I read the book, I have beliefs based upon what I have read and I am not in a position to alter their content unless I read something further. Once I move the table, the world as it exists at that point structures my belief about the table. As we mentioned before, this is how we want the world and our beliefs to function. If we could not arrive at beliefs that accurately reflected the state of the world around us, we would not survive. Scotus argues that this feature of our beliefs and their relationship to the world means that the intellect is not free. Thus, if Aquinas is correct that the movement of the will is determined by activity in the intellect, then if it is true that the intellect is not free, the will is not free either, and human beings would not act freely.

Scotus denies Aquinas’s tight connection between the intellect and the will, arguing that the will is not determined by a judgment of the intellect, a position we first noted in Bernard of Clairvaux. Scotus draws upon our ordinary experience to defend this claim. We have all been in situations where we know what we ought to do and yet we are not moved to do it. The student knows she ought to study for her exams, but she is so comfortable lying on the couch that she does not get up to study. She will get up to study only insofar as she really wants to do so, and no judgment will move her to do so in opposition to her desire. Scotus describes this kind of case as one in which the will, the source of her desire to remain on the couch, wills (or in this case fails to will) in opposition to the judgment of the intellect. Thus, the will is free of determination by the intellect.

Scotus agrees with Aquinas that the will depends upon the intellect to identify possible courses of action from which the will chooses, but he rejects Aquinas’s view that the intellect’s judgment determines the will’s choice. For Scotus, the intellect makes a judgment about what to do, but it is up to the will to determine which alternative–out of all those the intellect has identified as possibilities–the agent acts upon. Scotus also agrees with Aquinas that human beings cannot will misery for its own sake, but he denies that this implies that human beings are necessitated to choose happiness. On Scotus’s account, human beings choose happiness if they choose anything at all and they cannot will against happiness, but they nevertheless can fail to will happiness.

5. Conclusion

Thinkers throughout the Middle Ages found the topics of action and free will compelling for many of the same reasons why they remain of perennial interest today. Philosophers find them interesting in their own right as well as recognizing their implications for moral responsibility, the concept of personhood, and such important religious issues as the problem of evil and the tension with divine omniscience. The general character of many medieval theories of free will is voluntarist in nature, with the views of Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas the most significant departures from this trend.

The accounts of Thomas Aquinas and of John Duns Scotus are useful paradigms to illustrate some of the advantages and disadvantages of voluntarist and intellectualist approaches to action and its freedom. We have seen that the determinant nature of our beliefs raises a problem for Aquinas’s location of freedom in the intellect. Aquinas also has a harder time explaining cases of weakness of will (that is, cases where an agent recognizes the better choice but chooses the lesser one). These cases are tough for Aquinas to explain because they seem to involve a judgment that a particular action is the better thing to do, yet the agent chooses not to perform that action. Instead, the agent chooses some other action that the agent is willing to grant is worse. Scotus has a much easier time accommodating these cases, since for him, the will is never necessitated by a judgment of intellect. Yet his theory faces an important objection: the arbitrariness objection. Because there is no tight connection between intellect and will on Scotus’s account, the will is never determined by the judgment of intellect. Therefore, it is always possible for the will either to will in accordance with the intellect’s judgment or against it. This situation raises the question: why does the agent choose as she does? It can’t be because the intellect made a particular judgment, for the will is not determined by that judgment. Scotus argues that there is no further explanation for the will’s choice; the will simply chooses. But then the will’s choice and the agent’s subsequent action become very mysterious. Thus, Scotus loses a rational grounding for understanding why an agent acts as she does. He can no longer appeal to an agent’s reasons for acting one way rather than another, for those reasons do not determine the agent’s choice. Because Aquinas maintains a tight connection between the intellect’s judgment and the will’s choice, he does not face this particular objection and can maintain what is known as a reasons-explanation for action. In the end, what is an advantage for the one theory becomes a difficulty for the other, and vice versa.

See also the article Foreknowledge and Free Will in this encyclopedia.

6. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Albert the Great. Opera Omnia. Augustus Borgnet, ed., Paris: Vives, 1890-9.
    • Unfortunately, the works of Albert the Great are not yet widely available in translation.
  • Albert the Great. Opera Omnia. Bernhard Geyer et al, eds. Bonn: Institum Alerti Magni, 1951-.
    • A newer and currently incomplete edition of Albert’s works.
  • Anselm of Canterbury. Three Philosophical Dialogues. Thomas Williams, trans. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 2002.
    • This book includes Anselm’s treatises, On Freedom of Choice and On the Fall of the Devil.
  • Anselm of Canterbury. Truth, Freedom, and Evil. Jasper Hopkins and Herbert Richardson, trans. New York: Harper and Row, 1965.
    • This book includes Anselm’s treatises, On Freedom of Choice and On the Fall of the Devil.
  • Aquinas, Thomas. Summa theologiae. Fathers of the English Dominican Province, trans. Allen, TX: Christian Classics, 1981 (reprint).
  • Aquinas, Thomas. Treatise on Happiness. John A. Oesterle, trans. Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1964.
    • This book consists of the twenty-one questions from Summa theologiae that have to do with the human ultimate end, and human action and its freedom.
  • Augustine. On Free Choice of the Will. Thomas Williams, trans. Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Co., 1993.
  • Bernard of Clairvaux. On Grace and Free Choice. Daniel O’Donovan, trans. Kalamazoo, MI: Cistercian Publications, Inc., 1988.
  • Lombard, Peter. Sententiae in IV libris distinctae. Ignatius Brady, ed. Grottoferrata: Editiones Colegii S.Bonaventurae ad Claras Aquas, 1971-81.
  • Lombard, Peter. The Sentences Book 2: On Creation. Mediaeval Sources in Translation. Giulio Silano,trans. Toronto: PIMS, 2008.
    • The question on liberum arbitrium is found in book two, distinction 24.
  • Scotus, John Duns. Duns Scotus on the Will and Morality. Allan B. Wolter, O.F.M., trans. William A Frank, ed. Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press, 1997.
    • This is a reprint of an earlier (1986) edition in which the Latin text found in the 1986 edition has been removed. In addition to primary texts, it contains commentary by Wolter.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Alexander, Archibald. Theories of the Will in the History of Philosophy. New York: Scribner, 1898.
  • Bourke, Vernon J. Will in Western Thought. New York: Sheed and Ward, 1964.
  • Chappell, T.D.J. Aristotle and Augustine on Freedom: Two Theories of Freedom Voluntary Action, and Akrasia. New York: St. Martin’s Press, 1995.
  • Colish, Marcia. Peter Lombard. Leiden: E.J. Brill, 1994.
  • Davies, Brian, ed. Aquinas’s Summa Theologiae: Critical Essays. Lanham: Rowman and Littlefield, 2006.
    • Contains some essays on action and freedom.
  • Matthews, Gareth B., ed. The Augustinian Tradition. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1999.
    • A collection of essays on Augustine, some of which deal with his theory of will and freedom.
  • Matthews, Gareth B. Augustine. Blackwell Publishing, 2005.
  • McCluskey, Colleen. “Intellective Appetite and the Freedom of Human Action.” The Thomist 66 (2002): 421-56.
    • A defense of Aquinas’s theory of freedom against criticisms raised by Thomas Williams in the article listed below from The Thomist.
  • McCluskey, Colleen. “Worthy Constraints in Albertus Magnus’s Theory of Action.” Journal of the History of Philosophy 39 (2001):491-533.
  • MacDonald, Scott, and Stump, Eleonore, eds. Aquinas’s Moral Theory: Essays in Honor of Norman Kretzmann. Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1999.
    • This book includes essays on Aquinas’s theory of the passions as well as his account of practical reasoning.
  • Pope, Stephen J., ed. The Ethics of Aquinas. Washington, DC: Georgetown University Press, 2002.
    • This book contains essays on Aquinas’s theory of action and freedom as well as his ethics. It is organized around the specific questions in Summa theologiae that deal with these issues.
  • Rogers, Katherin. “Anselm on Grace and Free Will.” The Saint Anselm Journal 2 (2005): 66-72.
  • Stump, Eleonore. Aquinas. London: Routledge, 2003.
    • A broad discussion of Aquinas’s views, including his theory of action and freedom.
  • Westberg, Daniel. Right Practical Reason: Aristotle, Action, and Prudence in Aquinas. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994.
  • Williams, Thomas and Visser, Sandra. “Anselm’s Account of Freedom.” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 31 (2001): 221-244.
  • Williams, Thomas. “The Libertarian Foundations of Scotus’s Moral Philosophy.” The Thomist (1998): 193-215.
    • This article also contains a criticism of Aquinas’s theory of freedom.
  • Williams, Thomas. “How Scotus Separates Morality from Happiness.” American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 69 (1995): 425-445.

Author Information

Colleen McClusky
Saint Louis University
U. S. A.