Gottlob Frege (1848—1925)
Gottlob Frege was a German logician, mathematician and philosopher who played a crucial role in the emergence of modern logic and analytic philosophy. Frege’s logical works were revolutionary, and are often taken to represent the fundamental break between contemporary approaches and the older, Aristotelian tradition. He invented modern quantificational logic, and created the first fully axiomatic system for logic, which was complete in its treatment of propositional and first-order logic, and also represented the first treatment of higher-order logic. In the philosophy of mathematics, he was one of the most ardent proponents of logicism, the thesis that mathematical truths are logical truths, and presented influential criticisms of rival views such as psychologism and formalism. His theory of meaning, especially his distinction between the sense and reference of linguistic expressions, was groundbreaking in semantics and the philosophy of language. He had a profound and direct influence on such thinkers as Russell, Carnap and Wittgenstein. Frege is often called the founder of modern logic, and he is sometimes even heralded as the founder of analytic philosophy.
Table of Contents
- Life and Works
- Contributions to Logic
- Contributions to the Philosophy of Mathematics
- The Theory of Sense and Reference
- References and Further Reading
Frege was born on November 8, 1848 in the coastal city of Wismar in Northern Germany. His full christened name was Friedrich Ludwig Gottlob Frege. Little is known about his youth. His father, Karl Alexander Frege, and his mother, Auguste (Bialloblotzsky) Frege, both worked at a girl’s private school founded in part by Karl. Both were also principals of the school at various points: Karl held the position until his death 1866, when Auguste took over until her death in 1878. The German writer Arnold Frege, born in Wismar in 1852, may have been Frege’s younger brother, but this has not been confirmed. Frege probably lived in Wismar until 1869; in the years from 1864-1869 he is known to have studied at the Gymnasium in Wismar.
In Spring 1869, Frege began studies at the University of Jena. There, he studied chemistry, philosophy and mathematics, and must have solidly impressed Ernst Abbe in mathematics, who later become of Frege’s benefactors. After four semesters, Frege transferred to the University of Göttingen, where he studied mathematics and physics, as well as philosophy of religion under Hermann Lotze. (Lotze is sometimes thought to have had a profound impact on Frege’s philosophical views.) In late 1873, Frege finished his doctoral dissertation, under the guidance of Ernst Schering, entitled Über eine geometrische Darstellung der imaginären Gebilde in der Ebene (“On a Geometrical Representation of Imaginary Figures in a Plane”), and received his Ph.D.
In 1874, with the recommendation of Ernst Abbe, Frege received a lectureship at the University of Jena, where he stayed the rest of his intellectual life. His position was unsalaried during his first five years, and he was supported by his mother. Frege’s Habilitationsschrift, entitled Rechnungsmethoden, die auf eine Erweiterung des Grössenbegriffes gründen (“Methods of Calculation Based upon An Amplification of the Concept of Magnitude,”), was included with the material submitted to obtain the position. It involves the theory of complex mathematical functions, and contains seeds of Frege’s advances in logic and the philosophy of mathematics.
Frege had a heavy teaching load during his first few years at Jena. However, he still had time to work on his first major work in logic, which was published in 1879 under the title Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens (“Concept-Script: A Formula Language for Pure Thought Modeled on That of Arithmetic”). Therein, Frege presented for the first time his invention of a new method for the construction of a logical language. Upon the publication of the Begriffsschrift, he was promoted to ausserordentlicher Professor, his first salaried position. However, the book was not well-reviewed by Frege’s contemporaries, who apparently found its two-dimensional logical notation difficult to comprehend, and failed to see its advantages over previous approaches, such as that of Boole.
Sometime after the publication of the Begriffsschrift, Frege was married to Margaret Lieseburg (1856-1905). They had at least two children, who unfortunately died young. Years later they adopted a son, Alfred. However, little else is known about Frege’s family life.
Frege had aimed to use the logical language of the Begriffsschrift to carry out his logicist program of attempting to show that all of the basic truths of arithmetic could be derived from purely logical axioms. However, on the advice of Carl Stumpf, and given the poor reception of the Begriffsschrift, Frege decided to write a work in which he would describe his logicist views informally in ordinary language, and argue against rival views. The result was his Die Grundlagen der Arithmetik (“The Foundations of Arithmetic”), published in 1884. However, this work seems to have been virtually ignored by most of Frege’s contemporaries.
Soon thereafter, Frege began working on his attempt to derive the basic laws of arithmetic within his logical language. However, his work was interrupted by changes to his views. In the late 1880s and early 1890s Frege developed new and interesting theories regarding the nature of language, functions and concepts, and philosophical logic, including a novel theory of meaning based on the distinction between sense and reference. These views were published in influential articles such as “Funktion und Begriff” (“Function and Concept”, 1891), “Über Sinn und Bedeutung” (“On Sense and Reference”, 1892) and “Über Begriff und Gegenstand” (“On Concept and Object”, 1892). This maturation of Frege’s semantic and philosophical views lead to changes in his logical language, forcing him to abandon an almost completed draft of his work in logic and the foundations of mathematics. However, in 1893, Frege finally finished a revised volume, employing a slightly revised logical system. This was his magnum opus, Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (“Basic Laws of Arithmetic”), volume I. In the first volume, Frege presented his new logical language, and proceeded to use it to define the natural numbers and their properties. His aim was to make this the first of a three volume work; in the second and third, he would move on to the definition of real numbers, and the demonstration of their properties.
Again, however, Frege’s work was unfavorably reviewed by his contemporaries. Nevertheless, he was promoted once again in 1894, now to the position of Honorary Ordinary Professor. It is likely that Frege was offered a position as full Professor, but turned it down to avoid taking on additional administrative duties. His new position was unsalaried, but he was able to support himself and his family with a stipend from the Carl Zeiss Stiftung, a foundation that gave money to the University of Jena, and with which Ernst Abbe was intimately involved.
Because of the unfavorable reception of his earlier works, Frege was forced to arrange to have volume II of the Grundgesetze published at his own expense. It was not until 1902 that Frege was able to make such arrangements. However, while the volume was already in the publication process, Frege received a letter from Bertrand Russell, informing him that it was possible to prove a contradiction in the logical system of the first volume of the Grundgesetze, which included a naive calculus for classes. For more information, see the article on “Russell’s Paradox“. Frege was, in his own words, “thunderstruck”. He was forced to quickly prepare an appendix in response. For the next couple years, he continued to do important work. A series of articles entitled “Über die Grundlagen der Geometrie,” (“On the Foundations of Geometry”) was published between 1903 and 1906, representing Frege’s side of a debate with David Hilbert over the nature of geometry and the proper construction and understanding of axiomatic systems within mathematics.
However, around 1906, probably due to some combination of poor health, the early loss of his wife in 1905, frustration with his failure to find an adequate solution to Russell’s paradox, and disappointment over the continued poor reception of his work, Frege seems to have lost his intellectual steam. He produced very little work between 1906 and his retirement in 1918. However, he continued to influence others during this period. Russell had included an appendix on Frege in his 1903 Principles of Mathematics. It is from this that Frege came be to be a bit wider known, including to an Austrian student studying engineering in Manchester, England, named Ludwig Wittgenstein. Wittgenstein studied the work of Frege and Russell closely, and in 1911, he wrote to both of them concerning his own solution to Russell’s paradox. Frege invited him to Jena to discuss his views. Wittgenstein did so in late 1911. The two engaged in a philosophical debate, and while Wittgenstein reported that Frege “wiped the floor” with him, Frege was sufficiently impressed with Wittgenstein that he suggested that he go to Cambridge to study with Russell–a suggestion that had profound importance for the history of philosophy. Moreover, Rudolf Carnap was one of Frege’s students from 1910 to 1913, and doubtlessly Frege had significant influence on Carnap’s interest in logic and semantics and his subsequent intellectual development and successes.
After his retirement in 1918, Frege moved to Bad Kleinen, near Wismar, and managed to publish a number of important articles, “Der Gedanke” (“The Thought”, 1918), “Der Verneinung” (“Negation”, 1918), and “Gedankengefüge” (“Compound Thoughts”, 1923). However, these were not wholly new works, but later drafts of works he had initiated in the 1890s. In 1924, a year before his death, Frege finally returned to the attempt to understand the foundations of arithmetic. However, by this time, he had completely given up on his logicism, concluding that the paradoxes of class or set theory made it impossible. He instead attempted to develop a new theory of the nature of arithmetic based on Kantian pure intuitions of space. However, he was not able to write much or publish anything about his new theory. Frege died on July 26, 1925 at the age of 76.
At the time of his death, Frege’s own works were still not very widely known. He did not live to see the profound impact he would have on the emergence of analytic philosophy, nor to see his brand of logic–due to the championship of Russell–virtually wholly supersede earlier forms of logic. However, in bequeathing his unpublished work to his adopted son, Alfred, he wrote prophetically, “I believe there are things here which will one day be prized much more highly than they are now. Take care that nothing gets lost.” Alfred later gave Frege’s papers to Heinrich Scholz of the University of Münster for safekeeping. Unfortunately, however, they were destroyed in an Allied bombing raid on March 25, 1945. Although Scholz had made copies of some of the more important pieces, a good portion of Frege’s unpublished works were lost.
Although he was a fierce, sometimes even satirical, polemicist, Frege himself was a quiet, reserved man. He was right-wing in his political views, and like many conservatives of his generation in Germany, he is known to have been distrustful of foreigners and rather anti-semitic. Himself Lutheran, Frege seems to have wanted to see all Jews expelled from Germany, or at least deprived of certain political rights. This distasteful feature of Frege’s personality has gravely disappointed some of Frege’s intellectual progeny.
Trained as a mathematician, Frege’s interests in logic grew out of his interests in the foundations of arithmetic. Early in his career, Frege became convinced that the truths of arithmetic are logical, analytic truths, agreeing with Leibniz, and disagreeing with Kant, who thought that arithmetical knowledge was grounded in “pure intuition”, as well as more empiricist thinkers such as J. S. Mill, who thought that arithmetic was grounded in observation. In other words, Frege subscribed to logicism. His logicism was modest in one sense, but very ambitious in others. Frege’s logicism was limited to arithmetic; unlike other important historical logicists, such as Russell, Frege did not think that geometry was a branch of logic. However, Frege’s logicism was very ambitious in another regard, as he believed that one could prove all of the truths of arithmetic deductively from a limited number of logical axioms. Indeed, Frege himself set out to demonstrate all of the basic laws of arithmetic within his own system of logic.
Frege concurred with Leibniz that natural language was unsuited to such a task. Thus, Frege sought to create a language that would combine the tasks of what Leibniz called a “calculus ratiocinator” and “lingua characterica“, that is, a logically perspicuous language in which logical relations and possible inferences would be clear and unambiguous. Frege’s own term for such a language, “Begriffsschrift” was likely borrowed from a paper on Leibniz’s ideas written by Adolf Trendelenburg. Although there had been attempts to fashion at least the core of such a language made by Boole and others working in the Leibnizian tradition, Frege found their work unsuitable for a number of reasons. Boole’s logic used some of the same signs used in mathematics, except with different logical meanings. Frege found this unacceptable for a language which was to be used to demonstrate mathematical truths, because the signs would be ambiguous. Boole’s logic, though innovative in some respects, was weak in others. It was divided into a “primary logic” and “secondary logic”, bifurcating its propositional and categorical elements, and could not deal adequately with multiple generalities. It analyzed propositions in terms of subject and predicate concepts, which Frege found to be imprecise and antiquated.
Frege saw the formulae of mathematics as the paradigm of clear, unambiguous writing. Frege’s brand of logical language was modeled upon the international language of arithmetic, and it replaced the subject/predicate style of logical analysis with the notions of function and argument. In mathematics, an equation such as “f(x) = x2 + 1″ states that f is a function that takes x as argument and yields as value the result of multiplying x by itself and adding one. In order to make his logical language suitable for purposes other than arithmetic, Frege expanded the notion of function to allow arguments and values other than numbers. He defined a concept (Begriff) as a function that has a truth-value, either of the abstract objects the True or the False, as its value for any object as argument. See below for more on Frege’s understanding of concepts, functions and objects. The concept being human is understood as a function that has the True as value for any argument that is human, and the False as value for anything else. Suppose that “H( )” stands for this concept, and “a” is a constant for Aristotle, and “b” is a constant for the city of Boston. Then “H(a)” stands for the True, while “H(b)” stands for the False. In Frege’s terminology, an object for which a concept has the True as value is said to “fall under” the concept.
The values of such concepts could then be used as arguments to other functions. In his own logical systems, Frege introduced signs standing for the negation and conditional functions. His own logical notation was two-dimensional. However, let us instead replace Frege’s own notation with more contemporary notation. For Frege, the conditional function, “→” is understood as a function the value of which is the False if its first argument is the True and the second argument is anything other than the True, and is the True otherwise. Therefore, “H(b) → H(a)” stands for the True, while “H(a) → H(b)” stands for the False. The negation sign “~” stands for a function whose value is the True for every argument except the True, for which its value is the False. Conjunction and disjunction signs could then be defined from the negation and conditional signs. Frege also introduced an identity sign, standing for a function whose value is the True if the two arguments are the same object, and the False otherwise, and a sign, which he called “the horizontal,” namely “—”, that stands for a function that has the True as value for the True as argument, and has the False as value for any other argument.
Variables and quantifiers are used to express generalities. Frege understands quantifiers as “second-level concepts”. The distinction between levels of functions involves what kind of arguments the functions take. In Frege’s view, unlike objects, all functions are “unsaturated” insofar as they require arguments to yield values. But different sorts of functions require different sorts of arguments. Functions that take objects as argument, such as those referred to by “( ) + ( )” or “H( )”, are called first-level functions. Functions that take first-level functions as argument are called second-level functions. The quantifier, “∀x(…x…)”, is understood as standing for a function that takes a first-level function as argument, and yields the True as value if the argument-function has the True as value for all values of x, and has the False as value otherwise. Thus, “∀xH(x)” stands for the False, since the concept H( ) does not have the True as value for all arguments. However, “∀x[H(x) → H(x)]” stands for True, since the complex concept H( ) → H( ) does have the True as value for all arguments. The existential quantifier, now written “∃x(…x…)” is defined as “~∀x~(…x…)”.
Those familiar with modern predicate logic will recognize the parallels between it and Frege’s logic. Frege is often credited with having founded predicate logic. However, Frege’s logic is in some ways different from modern predicate logic. As we have seen, a sign such as “H( )” is a sign for a function in the strictest sense, as are the conditional and negation connectives. Frege’s conditional is not, like the modern connective, something that flanks statements to form a statement. Rather, it flanks terms for truth-values to form a term for a truth-value. Frege’s “H(b) → H(a)” is simply a name for the True, by itself it does not assert anything. Therefore, Frege introduces a sign he called the “judgment stroke”, ⊢, used to assert that what follows it stands for the True. Thus, while “H(b) → H(a)” is simply a term for a truth-value, “⊢ H(b) → H(a)” asserts that this truth-value is the True, or in this case, that if Boston is human, then Aristotle is human. Moreover, Frege’s logical system was second-order. In addition to quantifiers ranging over objects, it also contained quantifiers ranging over first-level functions. Thus, “⊢∀x∃F[F(x)]” asserts that every object falls under at least one concept.
Frege’s logic took the form of an axiomatic system. In fact, Frege was the first to take a fully axiomatic approach to logic, and the first even to suggest that inference rules ought to be explicitly formulated and distinguished from axioms. He began with a limited number of fixed axioms, introduced explicit inference rules, and aimed to derive all other logical truths (including, for him, the truths of arithmetic) from them. Frege’s first logical system, that of the 1879 Begriffsschrift, had nine axioms (one of which was not independent), one explicit inference rule, and also employed a second and third inference rule implicitly. It represented the first axiomatization of logic, and was complete in its treatment of both propositional logic and first-order quantified logic. Unlike Frege’s later system, the system of the Begriffsschrift was fully consistent. (It has since been proven impossible to devise a system for higher-order logic with a finite number of axioms that is both complete and consistent.)
In order to make deduction easier, in the 1893 logical system of the Grundgesetze, Frege used fewer axioms and more inference rules: seven and twelve, respectively, this time leaving nothing implicit. The Grundgesetze also expanded upon the system of the Begriffsschrift by adding axioms governing what Frege called the “value-ranges” (Werthverlaüfe) of functions, understood as objects corresponding to the complete argument-value mappings generated by functions. In the case of concepts, their value-ranges were identified with their extensions. While Frege did sometimes also refer to the extensions of concepts as “classes“, he did not conceive of such classes as aggregates or collections. They were simply understood as objects corresponding to the complete argument-value mappings generated by concepts considered as functions. Frege then introduced two axioms dealing with these value-ranges. Most infamous was his Basic Law V, which asserts that the truth-value of the value-range of function F being identical to the value-range of function G is the same as the truth-value of F and G having the same value for every argument. If one conceives of value-ranges as argument-value mappings, then this certainly seems to be a plausible hypothesis. However, from it, it is possible to prove a strong theorem of class membership: that for any object x, that object is in the extension of concept F if and only if the value of F for x as argument is the True. Given that value-ranges themselves are taken to be objects, if the concept in question is that of being a extension of a concept not included in itself, one can conclude that the extension of this concept is in itself just in case it is not. Therefore, the logical system of the Grundgesetze was inconsistent due to Russell’s Paradox. See the entry on Russell’s Paradox for more details. However, the core of the system of the Grundgesetze, that is, the system minus the axioms governing value-ranges, is consistent and, like the system of the Begriffsschrift, is complete in its treatment of propositional logic and first-order predicate logic.
Given the extent to which it is taken granted today, it can be difficult to fully appreciate the truly innovative and radical approach Frege took to logic. Frege was the first to attempt to transcribe the old statements of categorical logic in a language employing variables, quantifiers and truth-functions. Frege was the first to understand a statement such as “all students are hardworking” as saying roughly the same as, “for all values of x, if x is a student, then x is hardworking”. This made it possible to capture the logical connection between statements such as “either all students are hardworking or all students are intelligent” and “all students are either hardworking or intelligent” (for example, that the first implies the second). In earlier logical systems such as that of Boole, in which the propositional and quantificational elements were bifurcated, the connection was wholly lost. Moreover, Frege’s logical system was the first to be able to capture statements of multiple generality, such as “every person loves some city” by using multiple quantifiers in the same logical formula. This too was impossible in all earlier logical systems. Indeed, Frege’s “firsts” in logic are almost too numerous to list. We have seen here that he invented modern quantification theory, presented the first complete axiomatization of propositional and first-order “predicate” logic (the latter of which he invented outright), attempted the first formulation of higher-order logic, presented the first coherent and full analysis of variables and functions, first showed it possible to reduce all truth-functions to negation and the conditional, and made the first clear distinction between axioms and inference rules in a formal system. As we shall see, he also made advances in the logic of mathematics. It is small wonder that he is often heralded as the founder of modern logic.
On Frege’s “philosophy of logic”, logic is made true by a realm of logical entities. Logical functions, value-ranges, and the truth-values the True and the False, are thought to be objectively real entities, existing apart from the material and mental worlds. (As we shall see below, Frege was also committed to other logical entities such as senses and thoughts.) Logical axioms are true because they express true thoughts about these entities. Thus, Frege denied the popular view that logic is without content and without metaphysical commitment. Frege was also a harsh critic of psychologism in logic: the view that logical truths are truths about psychology. While Frege believed that logic might prescribe laws about how people should think, logic is not the science of how people do think. Logical truths would remain true even if no one believed them nor used them in their reasoning. If humans were genetically designed to use regularly the so-called “inference rule” of affirming the consequent, etc., this would not make it logically valid. What is true or false, valid of invalid, does not depend on anyone’s psychology or anyone’s beliefs. To think otherwise is to confuse something’s being true with something’s being-taken-to-be-true.
Frege was an ardent proponent of logicism, the view that the truths of arithmetic are logical truths. Perhaps his most important contributions to the philosophy of mathematics were his arguments for this view. He also presented significant criticisms against rival views. We have seen that Frege was a harsh critic of psychologism in logic. He thought similarly about psychologism in mathematics. Numbers cannot be equated with anyone’s mental images, nor truths of mathematics with psychological truths. Mathematical truths are objective, not subjective. Frege was also a critic of Mill’s view that arithmetical truths are empirical truths, based on observation. Frege pointed out that it is not just observable things that can be counted, and that mathematical truths seem to apply also to these things. On Mill’s view, numbers must be taken to be conglomerations of objects. Frege rejects this view for a number of reasons. Firstly, is one conglomeration of two things the same as a different conglomeration of two things, and if not, in what sense are they equal? Secondly, a conglomeration can be seen as made up of a different number of things, depending on how the parts are counted. One deck of cards contains fifty two cards, but each card consists of a multitude of atoms. There is no one uniquely determined “number” of the whole conglomeration. He also reiterated the arguments of others: that mathematical truths seem apodictic and knowable a priori. He also argued against the Kantian view that arithmetic truths are based on the pure intuition of the succession of time. His main argument against this view, however, was simply his own work in which he showed that truths about the nature of succession and sequence can be proven purely from the axioms of logic.
Frege was also an opponent of formalism, the view that arithmetic can be understood as the study of uninterpreted formal systems. While Frege’s logical language represented a kind of formal system, he insisted that his formal system was important only because of what its signs represent and its propositions mean. The signs themselves, independently of what they mean, are unimportant. To suggest that mathematics is the study simply of the formal system, is, in Frege’s eyes, to confuse the sign and thing signified. To suggest that arithmetic is the study of formal systems also suggests, absurdly, that the formula “5 + 7 = 12”, written in Arabic numerals, is not the same truth as the formula, “V + VII = XII”, written in Roman numerals. Frege suggests also that this confusion would have the absurd result that numbers simply are the numerals, the signs on the page, and that we should be able to study their properties with a microscope.
Frege suggests that rival views are often the result of attempting to understand the meaning of number terms in the wrong way, for example, in attempting to understand their meaning independently of the contexts in which they appear in sentences. If we are simply asked to consider what “two” means independently of the context of a sentence, we are likely to simply imagine the numeral “2”, or perhaps some conglomeration of two things. Thus, in the Grundlagen, Frege espouses his famous context principle, to “never ask for the meaning of a word in isolation, but only in the context of a proposition.” The Grundlagen is an earlier work, written before Frege had made the distinction between sense and reference (see below). It is an active matter of debate and discussion to what extent and how this principle coheres with Frege’s later theory of meaning, but what is clear is that it plays an important role in his own philosophy of mathematics as described in the Grundlagen.
According to Frege, if we look at the contexts in which number words usually occur in a proposition, they appear as part of a sentence about a concept, specifically, as part of an expression that tells us how many times a certain concept is instantiated. Consider, for example, “I have six cards in my hand” or “There are 11 members of congress from Wisconsin.” These propositions seem to tell us how many times the concepts of being a card in my hand and being a member of congress from Wisconsin are instantiated. Thus, Frege concludes that statements about numbers are statements about concepts. This insight was very important for Frege’s case for logicism, as Frege was able to show that it is possible to define what it means for a concept to be instantiated a certain number of times purely logically by making use of quantifiers and identity. To say that the concept F is instantiated zero times is to say that there are no objects that instantiate F, or, equivalently, that everything does not instantiate F. To say that F is instantiated one time is to say there is an object x that instantiates F, and that for all objects y, either y does not instantiate F or y is x. To say that F is instantiated twice is to say that there are two objects, x and y, each of which instantiates F, but which are not the same as each other, and for all z, either z does not instantiate F, or z is x or z is y. One could then consider numbers as “second-level concepts”, or concepts of concepts, which can be defined in purely logical terms. (For more on the distinction of levels of concepts, see above.)
Frege, however, does not leave his analysis of numbers there. Understanding number-claims as involving second-level concepts does give us some insight into the nature of numbers, but it cannot be left at this. Mathematics requires that numbers be treated as objects, and that we be able to provide a definition of the number “two” simpliciter, without having to speak of two Fs. For this purpose, Frege appeals to his theory of the value-ranges of concepts. On the notion of a value-range, see above. We saw above that we can gain some understanding of number claims as involving second-level concepts, or concepts of concepts. In order to find a definition of numbers as objects, Frege treats them instead as value-ranges of value-ranges. Exactly, however, are they to be understood?
Frege notes that we have an understanding of what it means to say that there are the same number of Fs as there are Gs. It is to say that there is a one-one mapping between the objects that instantiate F and the objects instantiating G, i.e. that there is some function f from entities that instantiate F onto entities that instantiate G such that there is a different F for every G, and a different G for every F, with none left over. (In this, Frege’s views on the nature of cardinality were in part anticipated by Georg Cantor.) However, we must bear in mind that the propositions:
(1) There are equally many Fs as there are Gs.
(2) The number of Fs = the number of Gs
must obviously have the same truth-value, as they seem to express the same fact. We must, therefore, look for a way of understanding the phrase “the number of Fs” that occurs in (2) that makes clear how and why the whole proposition will be true or false for the same reason as (1) is true or false. Frege’s suggestion is that “the number of Fs” means the same as “the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F.” This means that the number of Fs is a certain value-range, containing value-ranges, and in particular, all those value-ranges that have as many members as there are Fs. Then (2) is understood as saying the same as “the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F = the value-range of the concept being a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as G“, which will be true if and only if there are equally many Fs as Gs, i.e. if every value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as F is also a value-range of a concept instantiated equally many times as G.
To give some examples, if there are zero Fs, then the number of Fs, i.e. zero, is the value-range consisting of all value-ranges with no members. Recall that for Frege, classes are identified with value-ranges of concepts. (See above.) To rephrase the same point in terms of classes, zero is the class of all classes with no members. Since there is only one such class, zero is the class containing only the empty class. If there is one F, then the number of Fs, i.e. one, is the class consisting of all classes with one member (the extensions of concepts instantiated once). Here we can see the connection with the understanding of number expressions as being statements about concepts. Rather than understanding zero as the concept a concept has just in case it is not instantiated, zero is understood as the value-range consisting of value-ranges of concepts that are not instantiated. Rather than understanding one as the concept a concept has just in case it is instantiated by a unique object, it is understood as the value-range consisting of value-ranges of concepts instantiated by unique objects. This allows us to understand numbers as abstract objects, and provide a clear definition of the meaning of number signs in arithmetic such as “1”, “2”, “3”, etc.
Some of Frege’s most brilliant work came in providing definitions of the natural numbers in his logical language, and in proving some of their properties therein. After laying out the basic laws of logic, and defining axioms governing the truth-functions and value-ranges, etc., Frege begins by defining a relation that holds between two value-ranges just in case they are the value-ranges of concepts instantiated equally many times. This relation holds between value-ranges just in case they are the same size, i.e. just in case there is one-one correspondence between the entities that fall under their concepts. Using this, he then defines a function that takes a value-range as argument and yields as value the value-range consisting of all value-ranges the same size as it. The number zero is then defined as the value-range consisting of all value-ranges the same size as the value-range of the concept being non-self-identical. Since this concept is not instantiated, zero is defined as the value-range of all value-ranges with no members, as described above. There is only one such number zero. Since this is true, then the concept of being identical to zero is instantiated once. Frege then uses this to define one. One is defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept being identical to zero. Having defined one is this way, Frege is able to define two. He has already defined one and zero; they are each unique, but different from each other. Therefore, two can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept being identical to zero or identical to one. Frege is able to define all natural numbers in this way, and indeed, prove that there are infinitely many of them. Each natural number can be defined in terms of the previous one: for each natural number n, its successor (n + 1) can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges equal in size to the value-range of the concept of being identical to one of the numbers between zero and n.
In the Begriffsschrift, Frege had already been able to prove certain results regarding series and sequences, and was able to define the ancestral of a relation. To understand the ancestral of a relation, consider the example of the relation of being the child of. A person x bears this relation to y just in case x is y‘s child. However, x falls in the ancestral of this relation with respect to y just in case x is the child of y, or is the child of y‘s child, or is the child of y‘s child’s child, etc. Frege was able to define the ancestral of relations logically even in his early work. He put this to use in the Grundgesetze to define the natural numbers. We have seen how the notion of successorship can be defined for Frege, i.e. the relation n + 1 bears to n. The natural numbers can be defined as the value-range of all value-ranges that fall under the ancestral of the successor relation with respect to zero. The natural numbers then consist of zero, the successor of zero (one), the successor of the successor of zero (two), and so on ad infinitum. Frege was then able to use this definition of the natural numbers to provide a logical analysis of mathematical induction, and prove that mathematical induction can be used validly to demonstrate the properties of the natural numbers, an extremely important result for making good on his logicist ambitions. Frege could then use mathematical induction to prove some of the basic laws of the natural numbers. Frege next turned his logicist method to an analysis of integers (including negative numbers) and then to the real numbers, defining them using the natural numbers and certain relations holding between them. We need not dwell on the details of this work here.
Frege’s approach to providing a logical analysis of cardinality, the natural numbers, infinity and mathematical induction were groundbreaking, and have had a lasting importance within mathematical logic. Indeed, prior to 1902, it must have seemed to him that he had been completely successful in showing that the basic laws of arithmetic could be understood purely as logical truths. However, as we have seen, Frege’s definition of numbers heavily involves the notion of classes or value-ranges, but his logical treatment of them is shown to be impossible due to Russell’s paradox. This presents a serious problem for Frege’s logicist approach. Another heavy blow came after Frege’s death. In 1931, Kurt Gödel discovered his famous incompleteness proof to the effect that there can be no consistent formal system with a finite number of axioms in which it is possible to derive all of the truths of arithmetic. This presents a serious blow to more ambitious forms of logicism, such as Frege’s, which aimed to provide precisely the sort of system Gödel showed impossible. Nevertheless, it cannot be denied that Frege’s work in the philosophy of mathematics was important and insightful.
Frege’s influential theory of meaning, the theory of sense (Sinn) and reference (Bedeutung) was first outlined, albeit briefly, in his article, “Funktion und Begriff” of 1891, and was expanded and explained in greater detail in perhaps his most famous work, “Über Sinn und Bedeutung” of 1892. In “Funktion und Begriff”, the distinction between the sense and reference of signs in language is first made in regard to mathematical equations. During Frege’s time, there was a widespread dispute among mathematicians as to how the sign, “=”, should be understood. If we consider an equation such as, “4 x 2 = 11 – 3″, a number of Frege’s contemporaries, for a variety of reasons, were wary of viewing this as an expression of an identity, or, in this case, as the claim that 4 x 2 and 11 – 3 are one and the same thing. Instead, they posited some weaker form of “equality” such that the numbers 4 x 2 and 11 – 3 would be said to be equal in number or equal in magnitude without thereby constituting one and the same thing. In opposition to the view that “=” signifies identity, such thinkers would point out that 4 x 2 and 11 – 3 cannot in all ways be thought to be the same. The former is a product, the latter a difference, etc.
In his mature period, however, Frege was an ardent opponent of this view, and argued in favor of understanding “=” as identity proper, accusing rival views of confusing form and content. He argues instead that expressions such as “4 x 2″ and “11 – 3” can be understood as standing for one and the same thing, the number eight, but that this single entity is determined or presented differently by the two expressions. Thus, he makes a distinction between the actual number a mathematical expression such as “4 x 2″ stands for, and the way in which that number is determined or picked out. The former he called the reference (Bedeutung) of the expression, and the latter was called the sense (Sinn) of the expression. In Fregean terminology, an expression is said to express its sense, and denote or refer to its reference.
The distinction between reference and sense was expanded, primarily in “Über Sinn und Bedeutung” as holding not only for mathematical expressions, but for all linguistic expressions (whether the language in question is natural language or a formal language). One of his primary examples therein involves the expressions “the morning star” and “the evening star”. Both of these expressions refer to the planet Venus, yet they obviously denote Venus in virtue of different properties that it has. Thus, Frege claims that these two expressions have the same reference but different senses. The reference of an expression is the actual thing corresponding to it, in the case of “the morning star”, the reference is the planet Venus itself. The sense of an expression, however, is the “mode of presentation” or cognitive content associated with the expression in virtue of which the reference is picked out.
Frege puts the distinction to work in solving a puzzle concerning identity claims. If we consider the two claims:
(1) the morning star = the morning star
(2) the morning star = the evening star
The first appears to be a trivial case of the law of self-identity, knowable a priori, while the second seems to be something that was discovered a posteriori by astronomers. However, if “the morning star” means the same thing as “the evening star”, then the two statements themselves would also seem to have the same meaning, both involving a thing’s relation of identity to itself. However, it then becomes to difficult to explain why (2) seems informative while (1) does not. Frege’s response to this puzzle, given the distinction between sense and reference, should be apparent. Because the reference of “the evening star” and “the morning star” is the same, both statements are true in virtue of the same object’s relation of identity to itself. However, because the senses of these expressions are different–in (1) the object is presented the same way twice, and in (2) it is presented in two different ways–it is informative to learn of (2). While the truth of an identity statement involves only the references of the component expressions, the informativity of such statements involves additionally the way in which those references are determined, i.e. the senses of the component expressions.
So far we have only considered the distinction as it applies to expressions that name some object (including abstract objects, such as numbers). For Frege, the distinction applies also to other sorts of expressions and even whole sentences or propositions. If the sense/reference distinction can be applied to whole propositions, it stands to reason that the reference of the whole proposition depends on the references of the parts and the sense of the proposition depends of the senses of the parts. (At some points, Frege even suggests that the sense of a whole proposition is composed of the senses of the component expressions.) In the example considered in the previous paragraph, it was seen that the truth-value of the identity claim depends on the references of the component expressions, while the informativity of what was understood by the identity claim depends on the senses. For this and other reasons, Frege concluded that the reference of an entire proposition is its truth-value, either the True or the False. The sense of a complete proposition is what it is we understand when we understand a proposition, which Frege calls “a thought” (Gedanke). Just as the sense of a name of an object determines how that object is presented, the sense of a proposition determines a method of determination for a truth-value. The propositions, “2 + 4 = 6” and “the Earth rotates”, both have the True as their references, though this is in virtue of very different conditions holding in the two cases, just as “the morning star” and “the evening star” refer to Venus in virtue of different properties.
In “Über Sinn und Bedeutung”, Frege limits his discussion of the sense/reference distinction to “complete expressions” such as names purporting to pick out some object and whole propositions. However, in other works, Frege makes it quite clear that the distinction can also be applied to “incomplete expressions”, which include functional expressions and grammatical predicates. These expressions are incomplete in the sense that they contain an “empty space”, which, when filled, yields either a complex name referring to an object, or a complete proposition. Thus, the incomplete expression “the square root of ( )” contains a blank spot, which, when completed by an expression referring to a number, yields a complex expression also referring to a number, e.g., “the square root of sixteen”. The incomplete expression, “( ) is a planet” contains an empty place, which, when filled with a name, yields a complete proposition. According to Frege, the references of these incomplete expressions are not objects but functions. Objects (Gegenstände), in Frege’s terminology, are self-standing, complete entities, while functions are essentially incomplete, or as Frege says, “unsaturated” (ungesättigt) in that they must take something else as argument in order to yield a value. The reference of the expression “square root of ( )” is thus a function, which takes numbers as arguments and yields numbers as values. The situation may appear somewhat different in the case of grammatical predicates. However, because Frege holds that complete propositions, like names, have objects as their references, and in particular, the truth-values the True or the False, he is able to treat predicates also as having functions as their references. In particular, they are functions mapping objects onto truth-values. The expression, “( ) is a planet” has as its reference a function that yields as value the True when saturated by an object such as Saturn or Venus, but the False when saturated by a person or the number three. Frege calls such a function of one argument place that yields the True or False for every possible argument a “concept” (Begriff), and calls similar functions of more than one argument place (such as that denoted by “( ) > ( )”, which is doubly in need of saturation), “relations”.
It is clear that functions are to be understood as the references of incomplete expressions, but what of the senses of such expressions? Here, Frege tells us relatively little save that they exist. There is some amount of controversy among interpreters of Frege as to how they should be understood. It suffices here to note that just as the same object (e.g. the planet Venus), can be presented in different ways, so also can a function be presented in different ways. While “identity”, as Frege uses the term, is a relation holding only between objects, Frege believes that there is a relation similar to identity that holds between functions just in case they always share the same value for every argument. Since all and only those things that have hearts have kidneys, strictly speaking, the concepts denoted by the expressions “( ) has a heart”, and “( ) has a kidney” are one and the same. Clearly, however, these expressions do not present that concept in the same way. For Frege, these expressions would have different senses but the same reference. Frege also tells us that it is the incomplete nature of these senses that provides the “glue” holding together the thoughts of which they form a part.
Frege also uses the distinction to solve what appears to be a difficulty with Leibniz’s law with regard to identity. This law was stated by Leibniz as, “those things are the same of which one can be substituted for another without loss of truth,” a sentiment with which Frege was in full agreement. As Frege understands this, it means that if two expressions have the same reference, they should be able to replace each other within any proposition without changing the truth-value of that proposition. Normally, this poses no problem. The inference from:
(3) The morning star is a planet.
to the conclusion:
(4) The evening star is a planet.
in virtue of (2) above and Leibniz’s law is unproblematically valid. However, there seem to be some serious counterexamples to this principle. We know for example that “the morning star” and “the evening star” have the same customary reference. However, it is not always true that they can replace one another without changing the truth of a sentence. For example, if we consider the propositions:
(5) Gottlob believes that the morning star is a planet.
(6) Gottlob believes that the evening star is a planet.
If we assume that Gottlob does not know that the morning star is the same heavenly body as the evening star, (5) may be true while (6) false or vice versa.
Frege meets this challenge to Leibniz’s law by making a distinction between what he calls the primary and secondary references of expressions. Frege suggests that when expressions appear in certain unusual contexts, they have as their references what is customarily their senses. In such cases, the expressions are said to have their secondary references. Typically, such cases involve what Frege calls “indirect speech” or “oratio obliqua“, as in the case of statements of beliefs, thoughts, desires and other so-called “propositional attitudes”, such as the examples of (5) and (6). However, expressions also have their secondary references (for reasons which should already be apparent) in contexts such as “it is informative that…” or “… is analytically true”.
Let us consider the examples of (5) and (6) more closely. To Frege’s mind, these statements do not deal directly with the morning star and the evening star itself. Rather, they involve a relation between a believer and a thought believed. Thoughts, as we have seen, are the senses of complete propositions. Beliefs depend for their make-up on how certain objects and concepts are presented, not only on the objects and concepts themselves. The truth of belief claims, therefore, will depend not on the customary references of the component expressions of the stated belief, but their senses. Since the truth-value of the whole belief claim is the reference of that belief claim, and the reference of any proposition, for Frege, depends on the references of its component expressions, we are lead to the conclusion that the typical senses of expressions that appear in oratio obliqua are in fact the references of those expressions when they appear in that context. Such contexts can be referred to as “oblique contexts”, contexts in which the reference of an expression is shifted from its customary reference to its customary sense.
In this way, Frege is able to actually retain his commitment in Leibniz’s law. The expressions “the morning star” and “the evening star” have the same primary reference, and in any non-oblique context, they can replace each other without changing the truth-value of the proposition. However, since the senses of these expressions are not the same, they cannot replace each other in oblique contexts, because in such contexts, their references are non-identical.
Frege ascribes to senses and thoughts objective existence. In his mind, they are objects every bit as real as tables and chairs. Their existence is not dependent on language or the mind. Instead, they are said to exist in a timeless “third realm” of sense, existing apart from both the mental and the physical. Frege concludes this because, although senses are obviously not physical entities, their existence likewise does not depend on any one person’s psychology. A thought, for example, has a truth-value regardless of whether or not anyone believes it and even whether or not anyone has grasped it at all. Moreover, senses are interpersonal. Different people are able to grasp the same senses and same thoughts and communicate them, and it is even possible for expressions in different languages to express the same sense or thought. Frege concludes that they are abstract objects, incapable of full causal interaction with the physical world. They are actual only in the very limited sense that they can have an effect on those who grasp them, but are themselves incapable of being changed or acted upon. They are neither created by our uses of language or acts of thinking, nor destroyed by their cessation.
Unfortunately, Frege does not tell us very much about exactly how these abstract objects pick out or present their references. Exactly what is it that makes a sense a “way of determining” or “mode of presenting” a reference? In the wake of Russell’s theory of descriptions, a Fregean sense is often interpreted as a set of descriptive information or criteria that picks out its reference in virtue of the reference alone satisfying or fitting that descriptive information. In giving examples, Frege implies that a person might attach to the name “Aristotle” the sense the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great. This sense picks out Aristotle the person because he alone matches this description. Here, care must be taken to avoid misunderstanding. The sense of the name “Aristotle” is not the words “the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great”; to repeat, senses are not linguistic items. It is rather that the sense consists in some set of descriptive information, and this information is best described by a descriptive phrase of this form. The property of being the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander is unique to Aristotle, and thus, it may be in virtue of associating this information with the name “Aristotle” that this name may be used to refer to Aristotle. As certain commentators have noted, it is not even necessary that the sense of the name be expressible by some descriptive phrase, because the descriptive information or properties in virtue of which the reference is determined may not be directly nameable in any natural language.
From this standpoint, it is easy to understand how there might be senses that do not pick out any reference. Names such as “Romulus” or “Odysseus”, and phrases such as “the least rapidly converging series” or “the present King of France” express senses, insofar as they lay out criteria that things would have to satisfy if they were to be the references of these expressions. However, there are no things which do in fact satisfy these criteria. Therefore, these expressions are meaningful, but do not have references. Because the sense of a whole proposition is determined by the senses of the parts, and the reference of a whole proposition is determined by the parts, Frege claims that propositions in which such expressions appear are able to express thoughts, but are neither true nor false, because no references are determined for them.
This interpretation of the nature of senses makes Frege a forerunner to what has since been come to be known as the “descriptivist” theory of meaning and reference in the philosophy of language. The view that the sense of a proper name such as “Aristotle” could be descriptive information as simple as the pupil of Plato and teacher of Alexander the Great, however, has been harshly criticized by many philosophers, and perhaps most notably by Saul Kripke. Kripke points out that this would make a claim such as “Aristotle taught Alexander” seem to be a necessary and analytic truth, which it does not appear to be. Moreover, he claims that many of us seem to be able to use a name to refer to an individual even if we are unaware of any properties uniquely held by that individual. For example, many of us don’t know enough about the physicist Richard Feynman to be able to identify a property differentiating him from other prominent physicists such as Murray Gell-Mann, but we still seem to be able to refer to Feynman with the name “Feynman”. John Searle, Michael Dummett and others, however, have proposed ways of expanding or altering Frege’s notion of a sense to circumvent Kripke’s worries. This has lead to a very important debate in the philosophy of language, which, unfortunately, we cannot fully discuss here.
- “Antwort auf die Ferienplauderei des Herrn Thomae.” Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker-Vereinigung 15 (1906): 586-90. Translated as “Reply to Thomae’s Holiday Causerie.” In Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic and Philosophy [CP], 341-5. Translated by M. Black, V. Dudman, P. Geach, H. Kaal, E.-H. W. Kluge, B. McGuinness and R. H. Stoothoff. New York: Basil Blackwell, 1984.
- “Über Begriff und Gegenstand.” Vierteljahrsschrift für wissenschaftliche Philosophie 16 (1892): 192-205. Translated as “On Concept and Object.” In >CP 182-94. Also in The Frege Reader [FR], 181-93. Edited by Michael Beaney. Oxford: Blackwell, 1997. And In Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege [TPW], 42-55. 3d ed. Edited by Peter Geach and Max Black. Oxford: Blackwell, 1980.
- Begriffsschrift, eine der arithmetischen nachgebildete Formelsprache des reinen Denkens. Halle: L. Nebert, 1879. Translated as Begriffsschrift, a Formula Language, Modeled upon that of Arithmetic, for Pure Thought. In From Frege to Gödel, edited by Jean van Heijenoort. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1967. Also as Conceptual Notation and Related Articles. Edited and translated by Terrell W. Bynum. London: Oxford University Press, 1972.
- “Über die Begriffsschrift des Herrn Peano und meine eigene.” Verhandlungen der Königlich Sächsischen Gesellschaft der Wissenschaften zu Leipzig 48 (1897): 362-8. Translated as “On Mr. Peano’s Conceptual Notation and My Own.” In CP 234-48.
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- Über eine geometrische Darstellung der imaginären Gebilde in der Ebene. Ph. D. Dissertation: University of Göttingen, 1873. Translated as “On a Geometrical Representation of Imaginary Forms in the Plane.” In CP 1-55.
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Kevin C. Klement
University of Massachusetts, Amherst
U. S. A.