History of African Philosophy
This article traces the history of systematic African philosophy from the early 1920s to date. In Plato’s Theaetetus, Socrates suggests that philosophy begins with wonder. Aristotle agreed. However, recent research shows that wonder may have different subsets. If that is the case, which specific subset of wonder inspired the beginning of the systematic African philosophy? In the history of Western philosophy, there is the one called thaumazein interpreted as ‘awe’ and the other called miraculum interpreted as ‘curiosity’. History shows that these two subsets manifest in the African place as well, even during the pre-systematic era. However, there is now an idea appearing in recent African philosophy literature called ọnụma interpreted as ‘frustration,’ which is regarded as the subset of wonder that jump-started the systematic African philosophy. In the 1920s, a host of Africans who went to study in the West were just returning. They had experienced terrible racism and discrimination while in the West. They were referred to as descendants of slaves, as people from the slave colony, as sub-humans, and so on. On return to their native lands, they met the same maltreatment by the colonial officials. ‘Frustrated’ by colonialism and racialism as well as the legacies of slavery, they were jolted onto the path of philosophy—African philosophy—by what can be called ọnụma.
These ugly episodes of slavery, colonialism and racialism not only shaped the world’s perception of Africa; they also instigated a form of intellectual revolt from the African intelligentsias. The frustration with the colonial order eventually led to angry questions and reactions out of which African philosophy emerged, first in the form of nationalisms, and then in the form of ideological theorizations. But the frustration was borne out of colonial caricature of Africa as culturally naïve, intellectually docile and rationally inept. This caricature was created by European scholars such as Kant, Hegel and, much later, Levy-Bruhl to name just a few. It was the reaction to this caricature that led some African scholars returning from the West into the type of philosophizing one can describe as systematic beginning with the identity of the African people, their place in history, and their contributions to civilization. To dethrone the colonially-built episteme became a ready attraction for African scholars’ vexed frustrations. Thus began the history of systematic African philosophy with the likes of JB Danquah, Meinrad Hebga, George James, SK. Akesson, Aime Cesaire, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah, Julius Nyerere, George James, William Abraham, John Mbiti and others such as Placid Tempels, and Janheinz Jahn to name a few.
Table of Contents
- Criteria of African Philosophy
- Methods of African Philosophy
- Schools of African Philosophy
- The Movements in African Philosophy
- Epochs in African Philosophy
- Periods of African Philosophy
- References and Further Reading
African philosophy as a systematic study has a very short history. This history is also a very dense one since actors sought to do in a few decades what would have been better done in many centuries. As a result, they also did in later years what ought to have been done earlier and vice versa, thus making the early and the middle periods overlap considerably. The reason for this overtime endeavor is not far-fetched. Soon after colonialism, actors realized that Africa had been sucked into the global matrix unprepared. During colonial times, the identity of the African was European; his thought system, standard and even his perception of reality were structured by the colonial shadow which stood towering behind him. It was easy for the African to position himself within these Western cultural appurtenances even though they had no real connection with his being.
The vanity of this presupposition and the emptiness of colonial assurances manifested soon after the towering colonial shadow vanished. Now, in the global matrix, it became shameful for the African to continue to identify himself within the European colonialist milieu. For one, he had just rejected colonialism, and for another, the deposed European colonialist made it clear that the identity of the African was no longer covered and insured by the European medium. So, actors realized suddenly that they had been disillusioned and had suffered severe self-deceit under colonial temper. The question which trailed every African was, “Who are you?” Of course, the answers from European perspective were savage, primitive, less than human, etc. It was the urgent, sudden need to contradict these European positions that led some post-colonial Africans in search of African identity. So, to discover or rediscover African identity in order to initiate a non-colonial or original history for Africa in the global matrix and start a course of viable economic, political and social progress that is entirely African became one of the focal points of African philosophy. Here, the likes of Cesaire, Nkrumah and Leon Damas began articulating the negritude movement.
While JB Danquah (1928, 1944) and SK Akesson (1965) rationally investigated topics in African politics, law and metaphysics, George James (1954) reconstructed African philosophical history, Meinrad Hebga (1958) probed topics in African logic. These three represent some of the early African philosophers. Placid Tempels (1959), the European missionary, also elected to help and, in his controversial book, Bantu Philosophy, sought to create Africa’s own philosophy as proof that Africa has its own peculiar identity and thought system. However, it was George James, who attempted a much more ambitious project in his work, Stolen Legacy. In this work, there were strong suggestions not only that Africa had philosophy but that the so-called Western philosophy, the very bastion of European identity, was stolen from Africa. This claim was intended to make the proud European colonialists feel indebted to the humiliated Africans, but it was unsuccessful. That Greek philosophy had roots in Egypt does not imply, as some claim, that Egyptians were high-melanated nor that high-melanated Africans created Egyptian philosophy. The use of the term “Africans” in this work is in keeping with George James’ demarcation that precludes the low-melanated people of North Africa and refers to the high-melanated people of southern Sahara.
Besides the two above, other Africans contributed ideas. Aime Cesaire, John Mbiti, Odera Oruka, Julius Nyerere, Leopold Senghor, Nnamdi Azikiwe, Kwame Nkrumah, Obafemi Awolowo, Alexis Kegame, Uzodinma Nwala, Emmanuel Edeh, Innocent Onyewuenyi, and Henry Olela, to name just a few, opened the doors of ideas. A few of the works produced sought to prove and establish the philosophical basis of African, unique identity in the history of humankind, while others sought to chart a course of Africa’s true identity through unique political and economic ideologies. It can be stated that much of these endeavors fall under the early period.
For its concerns, the middle period of African philosophy is characterized by the Great Debate. Those who seek to clarify and justify the position held in the early period and those who seek to criticize and deny the viability of such a position entangled themselves in a great debate. Some of the actors on this front include, C. S. Momoh, Robin Horton, Henri Maurier, Lacinay Keita, Peter Bodunrin, Kwasi Wiredu, Kwame Gyekye, Richard Wright, Barry Halen, Joseph Omoregbe, C. B. Okolo, Theophilus Okere, Paulin Hountondji, Gordon Hunnings, Odera Oruka and Sophie Oluwole to name a few.
The middle period eventually gave way to the later period, which has as its focus, the construction of an African episteme. Two camps rivaled each other, namely; the Critical Reconstructionists who are the evolved Universalists/Deconstructionists, and the Eclectics who are the evolved Traditionalists/Excavators. The former seek to build an African episteme untainted by ethnophilosophy; whereas, the latter seek to do the same by a delicate fusion of relevant ideals of the two camps. In the end, Critical Reconstructionism ran into a brick wall when it became clear that whatever it produced cannot truly be called African philosophy if it is all Western without African marks. The mere claim that it would be African philosophy simply because it was produced by Africans (Hountondji 1996 and Oruka 1975) would collapse like a house of cards under any argument. For this great failure, the influence of Critical Reconstructionism in the later period was whittled down, and it was later absorbed by its rival—Eclecticism.
The works of the Eclectics heralded the emergence of the New Era in African philosophy. The focus becomes the Conversational philosophizing, in which the production of philosophically rigorous and original African episteme better than what the Eclectics produced occupied the center stage.
Overall, the sum of what historians of African philosophy have done can be presented in the following two broad categorizations to wit; Pre-systematic epoch and the Systematic epoch. The former refers to Africa’s philosophical culture, thoughts of the anonymous African thinkers and may include the problems of Egyptian and Ethiopian legacies. The latter refers to the periods marking the return of Africa’s first eleven, Western-trained philosophers from the 1920’s to date. This latter category could further be delineated into four periods:
- Early period 1920s – 1960s
- Middle period 1960s – 1980s
- Later period 1980s – 1990s
- New (Contemporary) period since 1990s
Note, of course, that this does not commit us to saying that, before the early period, people in Africa never philosophized—they did. But one fact that must not be denied is that much of their thoughts were not documented in writing; most of those that may have been documented in writing are either lost or destroyed, and, as such, scholars cannot attest to their systematicity or sources. In other words, what this periodization shows is that African philosophy as a system first began in the late 1920s. There are, of course, documented writings in ancient Egypt, medieval Ethiopia, etc. The historian Cheikh Anta Diop (1974) has gazetted some of the ideas. Some of the popularly cited include St Augustine, born in present-day Algeria, but who being a Catholic Priest of the Roman Church, was trained in western-style philosophy education, and is counted amongst the medieval philosophers. Wilhelm Anton Amo, who was born in Ghana, West Africa, was sold into slavery as a little boy, and later educated in western-style philosophy in Germany where he also practised. Zera Yacob and Walda Heywat, both Ethiopian philosophers with Arabic and European educational influences. The question is, are the ideas produced by these people indubitably worthy of the name ‘African philosophies’? Their authors may be Africans by birth, but how independent are their views from foreign influences? We observe from these questions that the best that can be expected is a heated controversy. It would be uncharitable to say to the European historian of philosophy that St Augustine or Amo was not one of their own. Similarly, it may be uncharitable to say to the African historian that Amo or Yacob was not an African. But, does being an African translate to being an African philosopher? If we set sentiments aside, it would be less difficult to see that all there is in those questions is a controversy. Even if there were any substance beyond controversy, were those isolated and disconnected views (most of which were sociological, religious, ethnological and anthropological) from Egypt, Rome, Germany and Ethiopia adequate to form a coherent corpus of African philosophy? The conversationalists, a contemporary African philosophical movement, have provided us with a via-media out of this controversy. Rather than discard this body of knowledge as non-African philosophies or uncritically accept them as African philosophy as the likes of Obi Ogejiofor and Anke Graness, the conversationalists urge that they be discussed as part of the pre-systematic epoch that also include those Innocent Asouzu (2004) describes as the “Anonymous Traditional African Philosophers”. These are the ancient African philosophers whose names were forgotten through the passage of time, and whose ideas were transmitted through orality.
Because there are credible objections among African philosophers with regards to the inclusion of it in the historical chart of African philosophy, the Egyptian question (the idea that the creators of ancient Egyptian civilization were high-melanated Africans from the south of the Sahara) will be included as part of the controversies in the pre-systematic epoch. The main objection is that even if the philosophers of stolen legacy were able to prove a connection between Greece and Egypt, they could not prove in concrete terms that Egyptians who created the philosophy stolen by the Greeks were high-melanated Africans or that high-melanated Africans were Egyptians. It is understandable the frustration and desperation that motivated such ambitious effort in the ugly colonial era which was captured above, but any reasonable person, judging by the responses of time and events in the last few decades knew it was high time Africans abandoned that unproven legacy and let go of that, now helpless propaganda. If, however, some would want to retain it as part of African philosophy, it would carefully fall within the pre-systematic era.
In this essay, the discussion will focus on the history of systematic African philosophy touching prominently on the criteria, schools, movements and periods in African philosophy. As much as the philosophers of a given era may disagree, they are inevitably united by the problem of their epoch. That is to say, it is orthodoxy that each epoch is defined by a common focus or problem. Therefore, the approach of the study of the history of philosophy can be done either through personality periscope or through the periods, but whichever approach one chooses, he unavoidably runs into the person who had chosen the other. This is a sign of unity of focus. Thus philosophers are those who seek to solve the problem of their time. In this presentation, the study of the history of African philosophy will be approached from the perspectives of criteria, periods, schools, and movements. The personalities will be discussed within these purviews.
To start with, more than three decades of debate on the status of philosophy ended with the affirmation that African philosophy exists. But what is it that makes a philosophy African? Answers to this question polarized actors into two main groups, namely the Traditionalists and Universalists. Whereas the Traditionalists aver that the studies of the philosophical elements in world-view of the people constitute African philosophy, the Universalists insist that it has to be a body of analytic and critical reflections of individual African philosophers. Further probing of the issue was done during the debate by the end of which the question of what makes a philosophy “African” produced two contrasting criteria. First, as a racial criterion; a philosophy would be African if it is produced by Africans. This is the view held by people like Paulin Hountondji, Odera Oruka (in part), and early Peter Bodunrin, derived from the two constituting terms—“African” and “philosophy”. African philosophy following this criterion is the philosophy done by Africans. This has been criticized as inadequate, incorrect and exclusivist. Second, as a tradition criterion; a philosophy is “African” if it designates a non-racial-bound philosophy tradition where the predicate “African” is treated as a solidarity term of no racial import and where the approach derives inspiration from African cultural background or system of thought. It does not matter whether the issues addressed are African or that the philosophy is done by an African insofar as it has universal applicability and emerged from the purview of African system of thought. African philosophy would then be that rigorous discourse of African issues or any issues whatsoever from the critical eye of African system of thought. Actors like Odera Oruka (in part), Meinrad Hebga, C. S. Momoh, Udo Etuk, Joseph Omoregbe, the later Peter Bodunrin, Jonathan Chimakonam can be grouped here. This criterion has also been criticized as courting uncritical elements of the past when it makes reference to the controversial idea of African logic tradition. Further discussion on this is well beyond the scope of this essay. What is, however, common in the two criteria is that African philosophy is a critical discourse on issues that may or may not affect Africa by African philosophers—the purview of this discourse remains unsettled. Recently, the issue of language has come to the fore as crucial in the determination of the Africanness of a philosophy. Inspired by the works of Euphrase Kezilahabi (1985), Ngugi wa Thiong’o (1986), AGA Bello (1987), Francis Ogunmodede (1998), to name just a few, the ‘language challenge’ is now taken as an important element in the affirmation of African philosophy. Advocates ask, should authentic African philosophy be done in African languages or in a foreign language with wider reach? Godfrey Tangwa (2017), Chukwueloka Uduagwu (2022) and Enyimba Maduka (2022) are some contemporary Africans who investigate this question. Alena Rettova (2007) represents non-African philosophers who engage the question.
This method speaks to the idea of mutuality, together or harmony, the type found in the classic expression of ubuntu: “a person is a person through other persons” or that, which is credited to John Mbiti, “ I am because we are, since we are, therefore I am”. Those who employ this method wish to demonstrate the idea of mutual interdependence of variables or the relational analysis of variables. You find this most prominent in the works of researchers working in the areas of ubuntu, personhood and communalism. Some of the scholars who employ this method include; Ifeanyi Menkiti, Mogobe Ramose, Kwame Gyekye, Thaddeus Metz, Fainos Mangena, Leonhard Praeg, Bernard Matolino, Michael Eze, Olajumoke Akiode, Rianna Oelofsen, and so forth.
This method was propounded by Innocent Asouzu, and it emphasizes the idea of missing link. In it, no variable is useless. The system of reality is like a network in which each variable has an important role to play i.e. it complements and is, in return, complemented because no variable is self-sufficient. Each variable is then seen as a ‘missing link’ of reality to other variables. Here, method is viewed as a disposition or a bridge-building mechanism. As a disposition, it says a lot about the orientation of the philosopher who employs it. The method of complementary reflection seeks to bring together seemingly opposed variables into a functional unity. Other scholars whose works have followed this method include Mesembe Edet, Ada Agada, Jonathan Chimakonam and a host of others.
This is a formal procedure for assessing the relationships of opposed variables in which thoughts are shuffled through disjunctive and conjunctive modes to constantly recreate fresh thesis and anti-thesis each time at a higher level of discourse without the expectation of the synthesis. The three principal features of this method are relationality, the idea that variables necessarily interrelate; contextuality, the idea that the relationship of variables is informed and shaped by contexts; complementarity, the idea that seemingly opposed variables can complement rather than contradict. It is an encounter between philosophers of rival schools of thought and between different philosophical traditions or cultures in which one party called nwa-nsa (the defender or proponent) holds a position and another party called nwa-nju (the doubter or opponent) doubts or questions the veracity and viability of the position. On the whole, this method points to the idea of relationships among interdependent, interrelated and interconnected realities existing in a network whose peculiar truth conditions can more accurately and broadly be determined within specific contexts. This method was first proposed by Jonathan Chimakonam and endorsed by the Conversational School of Philosophy. Other scholars who now employ this method include, Victor Nweke, Mesembe Edet, Fainos Mangena, Enyimba Maduka, Ada Agada, Pius Mosima, L. Uchenna Ogbonnaya, Aribiah Attoe, Leyla Tavernaro-Haidarian, Amara Chimakonam, Chukwueloka Uduagwu, Patrick Ben, and a host of others.
This is the foremost school in systematic African philosophy which equated African philosophy with culture-bound systems of thought. For this, their enterprise was scornfully described as substandard hence the term “ethnophilosophy.” Thoughts of the members of the Excavationism movement like Tempels Placid and Alexis Kagame properly belong here, and their high point was in the early period of African philosophy.
The concern of this school was nationalist philosophical jingoism to combat colonialism and to create political philosophy and ideology for Africa from the indigenous traditional system as a project of decolonization. Thoughts of members of the Excavationism movement like Kwame Nkrumah, Leopold Sedar Senghor and Julius Nyerere in the early period can be brought under this school.
There is also the philosophic sagacity school, whose main focus is to show that standard philosophical discourse existed and still exists in traditional Africa and can only be discovered through sage conversations. The chief proponent of this school was the brilliant Kenyan philosopher Odera Oruka who took time to emphasize that Marcel Gruaile’s similar programme is less sophisticated than his. Other adherents of this school include Gail Presbey, Anke Graness and the Cameroonian philosopher Pius Mosima. But since Oruka’s approach thrives on the method of oral interview of presumed sages whose authenticity can easily be challenged be, what was produced may well distance itself from the sages and becomes the fruits of the interviewing philosopher. So, the sage connection and the tradition became questionable. Their enterprise falls within the movement of Critical Reconstructionism of the later period.
Another prominent school is the hermeneutical school. Its focus is that the best approach to studying African philosophy is through interpretations of oral traditions and emerging philosophical texts. Theophilus Okere, Okonda Okolo, Tsenay Serequeberhan and Ademola Fayemi Kazeem are some of the major proponents and members of this school. The confusion, however, is that they reject ethnophilosophy whereas the oral tradition and most of the texts available for interpretation are ethnophilosophical in nature. The works of Okere and Okolo feasted on ethno-philosophy. This school exemplifies the movement called Afro-constructionism of the middle period.
The literary school’s main concern is to make a philosophical presentation of African cultural values through literary/fictional ways. Proponents like Chinua Achebe, Okot P’Bitek, Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Wole Soyinka to name a few have been outstanding. Yet critics have found it convenient to identify their discourse with ethnophilosophy from literary angle thereby denigrating it as sub-standard. Their enterprise remarks the movement of Afro-constructionism of the middle period.
Perhaps the most controversial is the one variously described as professional, universalist or modernist school. It contends that all the other schools are engaged in one form of ethnophilosophy or the other, that standard African philosophy is critical, individual discourse and that what qualifies as African philosophy must have universal merit and thrive on the method of critical analysis and individual discursive enterprise. It is not about talking, it is about doing. Some staunch unrepentant members of this school include Kwasi Wiredu, Paulin Hountondji, Peter Bodunrin, Richard Wright, Henri Maurier to name a few. They demolished all that has been built in African philosophy and built nothing as an alternative episteme. This school champions the movement of Afro-deconstructionism and the abortive Critical Reconstructionism of the middle and later periods, respectively.
Perhaps, one of the deeper criticisms that can be leveled against the position of the professional school comes from C. S. Momoh’s scornful description of the school as African logical neo-positivism. They agitate that (1) there is nothing as yet in African traditional philosophy that qualifies as philosophy and (2) that critical analysis should be the focus of African philosophy; so, what then is there to be critically analyzed? Professional school adherents are said to forget in their overt copying of European philosophy that analysis is a recent development in European philosophy which attained maturation in the 19th century after over 2000 years of historical evolution thereby requiring some downsizing. Would they also grant that philosophy in Europe before 19th century was not philosophy? The aim of this essay is not to offer criticisms of the schools but to present historical journey of philosophy in the African tradition. It is in opposition to and the need to fill the lacuna in the enterprise of the professional school that the new school called the conversational school has emerged in African philosophy.
This new school thrives on fulfilling the yearning of the professional/modernist school to have a robust individual discourse as well as fulfilling the conviction of the traditionalists that a thorough-going African philosophy has to be erected on the foundation of African thought systems. They make the most of the criterion that presents African philosophy as a critical tradition that prioritizes engagements between philosophers and cultures, and projects individual discourses from the methodological lenses and thought system of Africa that features the principles of relationality, contextuality and complementarity. The school has an ideological structure consisting of four aspects: their working assumption that relationship and context are crucial to understanding reality; their main problem called border lines or the presentation of reality as binary opposites; their challenge, which is to trace the root cause of border lines; and their two main questions, which are: does difference amount to inferiority and are opposites irreconcilable? Those whose writings fit into this school include Pantaleon Iroegbu, Innocent Asouzu, Chris Ijiomah, Godfrey Ozumba, Andrew Uduigwomen, Bruce Janz, Jennifer Vest, Jonathan Chimakonam, Fainos Mangena, Victor Nweke, Paul Dottin, Aribiah Attoe, Leyla Tavernaro-Haidarian, Maduka Enyimba, L. Uchenna Ogbonnaya, Isaiah Negedu, Christiana Idika, Ada Agada, Amara Chimakonam, Patrick Ben, Emmanuel Ofuasia, Umezurike Ezugwu, to name a few. Their projects promote partly the movements of Afro-eclecticism and fully the conversationalism of the later and the new periods, respectively.
There are four main movements that can be identified in the history of African philosophy, they include: Excavationism, Afro-constructionism / Afro-deconstructionism, Critical Reconstructionism / Afro-Eclecticism and Conversationalism.
The Excavators are all those who sought to erect the edifice of African philosophy by systematizing the African cultural world-views. Some of them aimed at retrieving and reconstructing presumably lost African identity from the raw materials of African culture, while others sought to develop compatible political ideologies for Africa from the native political systems of African peoples. Members of this movement have all been grouped under the schools known as ethnophilosophy and nationalist/ideological schools, and they thrived in the early period of African philosophy. Their concern was to build and demonstrate unique African identity in various forms. A few of them include JB Danquah, SK Akesson, Placid Tempels, Julius Nyerere, John Mbiti, Alexis Kagame, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah and Aime Cesaire, and so on.
The Afro-deconstructionists, sometimes called the Modernists or the Universalists are those who sought to demote such edifice erected by the Excavators on the ground that their raw materials are substandard cultural paraphernalia. They are opposed to the idea of unique African identity or culture-bound philosophy and prefer a philosophy that will integrate African identity with the identity of all other races. They never built this philosophy. Some members of this movement include Paulin Hountondji, Kwasi Wiredu, Peter Bodunrin, Macien Towa, Fabien Ebousi Boulaga, Richard Wright and Henri Maurier, and partly Kwame Appiah. Their opponents are the Afro-constructionists, sometimes called the Traditionalists or Particularists who sought to add rigor and promote the works of the Excavators as true African philosophy. Some prominent actors in this movement include Ifeanyi Menkiti, Innocent Onyewuenyi, Henry Olela, Lansana Keita, C. S. Momoh, Joseph Omoregbe, Janheinz Jahn, Sophie Oluwole and, in some ways, Kwame Gyekye. Members of this twin-movement have variously been grouped under ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, professional, hermeneutical and literary schools and they thrived in the middle period of African philosophy. This is also known as the period of the Great Debate.
A few Afro-deconstructionists of the middle period evolved into Critical Reconstructionists hoping to reconstruct from scratch, the edifice of authentic African philosophy that would be critical, individualistic and universal. They hold that the edifice of ethnophilosophy, which they had demolished in the middle period, contained no critical rigor. Some of the members of this movement include, Kwasi Wiredu, Olusegun Oladipo, Kwame Appiah, V. Y. Mudimbe, D. A. Masolo, Odera Oruka and, in some ways, Barry Hallen and J. O. Sodipo. Their opponents are the Afro-Eclectics who evolved from Afro-constructionism of the middle period. Unable to sustain their advocacy and the structure of ethnophilosophy they had constructed, they stepped down a little bit to say, “Maybe we can combine meaningfully, some of the non-conflicting concerns of the Traditionalists and the Modernists.” They say (1) that African traditional philosophy is not rigorous enough as claimed by the Modernists is a fact (2) that the deconstructionist program of the Modernists did not offer and is incapable of offering an alternative episteme is also a fact (3) maybe the rigor of the Modernists can be applied on the usable and relevant elements produced by the Traditionalists to produce the much elusive, authentic African philosophy. African philosophy for this movement therefore becomes a product of synthesis resulting from the application of tools of critical reasoning on the relevant traditions of African life-world. A. F. Uduigwomen, Kwame Gyekye, Ifeanyi Menkiti, Kwame Appiah, Godwin Sogolo and Jay van Hook are some of the members of this movement. This movement played a vital reconciliatory role, the importance of which was not fully realized in African philosophy. Most importantly, they found a way out and laid the foundation for the emergence of Conversationalism. Members of this twin-movement thrived in the later period of African philosophy.
The Conversationalists are those who seek to create an enduring corpus in African philosophy by engaging elements of tradition and individual thinkers in critical conversations. They emphasize originality, creativity, innovation, peer-criticism and cross-pollination of ideas in prescribing and evaluating their ideas. They hold that new episteme in African philosophy can only be created by individual African philosophers who make use of the “usable past” and the depth of individual originality in finding solutions to contemporary demands. They do not lay emphasis on analysis alone but also on critical rigor and what is now called arumaristics—a creative reshuffling of thesis and anti-thesis that spins out new concepts and thoughts. Further, their methodological ambience features principles such as relationality, contextuality and complementarity. Members of this movement thrive in this contemporary period, and their school can be called the conversational school. Some of the philosophers that have demonstrated this trait include Pantaleon Iroegbu, Innocent Asouzu, Chris Ijomah, Godfrey Ozumba, Andrew Uduigwomen, Bruce Janz, Jonathan Chimakonam, Fainos Mangena, Jennifer Lisa Vest, L. Uchenna Ogbonnaya, Maduka Enyimba, Leyla Tervanaro-Haidarian, Aribiah Attoe, and so forth.
Various historians of African philosophy have delineated the historiography of African philosophy differently. Most, like Obenga, Abanuka, Okoro, Oguejiofor, Graness, Fayemi, etc., have merely adapted the Western periodization model of ancient, medieval, modern and contemporary. But there is a strong objection to this model. Africa, for example, did not experience the medieval age as Europe did. The intellectual history of the ancient period of Europe shares little in common with ancient Africa. The same goes for the modern period. In other words, the names ancient, medieval and modern refer to actual historical periods in Europe with specific features in their intellectual heritage, which share very little in common with those exact dates in Africa. It, thus, makes no historical, let alone philosophical sense, to adopt such a model for African philosophy. Here, we have a classic case of what Innocent Asouzu calls “copycat philosophy”, which must be rejected. The conversationalists, therefore, propose a different model, one that actually reflects the true state of things. In this model, there are two broad categorizations to wit; Pre-systematic epoch and the Systematic epoch. The latter is further divided into four periods, early, middle, later and the contemporary periods.
This refers to the era from the time of the first homo sapiens to the 1900s. African philosophers studied here are those Innocent Asouzu describes as the “Anonymous Traditional African Philosophers”, whose names have been lost in history. They may also include the ancient Egyptians, Ethiopians and Africans who thrived in Europe in that era. The controversies surrounding the nativity of the philosophies of St Augustine, Anton Amo, the Egyptian question, etc., may also be included.
This refers to the era from the 1920s to date when systematicity that involves academic training, writing, publishing, engagements, etc., inspired by African conditions and geared towards addressing those conditions, became central to philosophical practice in Africa, South of the Sahara. This latter epoch could further be delineated into four periods: early, middle, later and the contemporary periods.
The early period of African philosophy was an era of the movement called cultural/ideological excavation aimed at retrieving and reconstructing African identity. The schools that emerged and thrived in this period were ethnophilosophy and ideological/nationalist schools. Hegel wrote that the Sub-Saharan Africans had no high cultures and made no contributions to world history and “civilization” (1975: 190). Lucien Levy Bruhl also suggested that they were “pre-logical” (1947: 17). The summary of these two positions, which represent the colonial mindset, is that Africans have no dignified identity like their European counterpart. This could be deciphered in the British colonial system that sought to erode the native thought system in the constitution of social systems in their colonies and also in the French policy of assimilation. Assimilation is a concept credited to the French philosopher Chris Talbot (1837), that rests on the idea of expanding French culture to the colonies outside of France in the 19th and 20th centuries. According to Betts (2005: 8), the natives of these colonies were considered French citizens as long as the “French culture” and customs were adopted to replace the indigenous system. The purpose of the theory of assimilation, for Michael Lambert, therefore, was to turn African natives into French men by educating them in the French language and culture (1993: 239-262).
During colonial times, the British, for example, educated their colonies in the British language and culture, strictly undermining the native languages and cultures. The products of this new social system were then given the impression that they were British, though second class, the king was their king, and the empire was also theirs. Suddenly, however, colonialism ended, and they found, to their chagrin, that they were treated as slave countries in the new post-colonial order. Their native identity had been destroyed, and their fake British identity had also been taken from them; what was left was amorphous and corrupt. It was in the heat of this confusion and frustration that the African philosophers sought to retrieve and recreate the original African identity lost in the event of colonization. Ruch and Anyanwu, therefore, ask, “What is this debate about African identity concerned with and what led to it? In other words, why should Africans search for their identity?” Their response to the questions is as follows:
The simple answer to these questions is this: Africans of the first half of this (20th century) century have begun to search for their identity, because they had, rightly or wrongly, the feeling that they had lost it or that they were being deprived of it. The three main factors which led to this feeling were: slavery, colonialism and racialism. (1981: 184-85)
Racialism, as Ruch and Anyanwu believed, may have sparked it off and slavery may have dealt the heaviest blow, but it was colonialism that entrenched it. Ironically, it was the same colonialism at its stylistic conclusion that opened the eyes of the Africans by stirring the hornet’s nest. An African can never be British or French, even with the colonially imposed language and culture. With this shock, the post-colonial African philosophers of the early period set out in search of Africa’s lost identity.
James, in 1954 published his monumental work Stolen Legacy. In it, he attempted to prove that the Egyptians were the true authors of Western philosophy; that Pythagoras, Socrates, Plato and Aristotle plagiarized the Egyptians; that the authorship of the individual doctrines of Greek philosophers is mere speculation perpetuated chiefly by Aristotle and executed by his school; and that the African continent gave the world its civilization, knowledge, arts and sciences, religion and philosophy, a fact that is destined to produce a change in the mentality both of the European and African peoples. In G. M. James’ words:
In this way, the Greeks stole the legacy of the African continent and called it their own. And as has already been pointed out, the result of this dishonesty had been the creation of an enormous world opinion; that the African continent has made no contribution to civilization, because her people are backward and low in intelligence and culture…This erroneous opinion about the Black people has seriously injured them through the centuries up to modern times in which it appears to have reached a climax in the history of human relations. (1954: 54)
These robust intellectual positions supported by evidential and well-thought-out arguments quickly heralded a shift in the intellectual culture of the world. However, there was one problem George James could not fix; he could not prove that the people of North Africa (Egyptians) who were the true authors of ancient art, sciences, religion and philosophy were high-melanated Africans, as can be seen in his hopeful but inconsistent conclusions:
This is going to mean a tremendous change in world opinion, and attitude, for all people and races who accept the new philosophy of African redemption, i.e. the truth that the Greeks were not the authors of Greek philosophy; but the people of North Africa; would change their opinion from one of disrespect to one of respect for the black people throughout the world and treat them accordingly. (1954: 153)
It is inconsistent how the achievements of North Africans (Egyptians) can redeem the black Africans. This is also the problem with Henri Olela’s article “The African Foundations of Greek Philosophy”.
However, in Onyewuenyi’s The African Origin of Greek Philosophy, an ambitious attempt emerges to fill this lacuna in the argument for a new philosophy of African redemption. In the first part of chapter two, he reduced Greek philosophy to Egyptian philosophy, and in the second part, he attempted to further reduce the Egyptians of the time to high-melanated Africans. There are, however, two holes he could not fill. First, Egypt is the world’s oldest standing country which also tells its own story by themselves in different forms. At no point did they or other historians describe them as wholly high-melanated people. Second, if the Egyptians were at a time wholly high-melanated, why are they now wholly low-melanated? For the failure of this group of scholars to prove that high-melanated Africans were the authors of Egyptian philosophy, one must abandon the Egyptian legacy or discuss it as one of the precursor arguments to systematic African philosophy until more evidence emerges.
There are other scholars of the early period who tried more reliable ways to assert African identity by establishing native African philosophical heritage. Some examples include JB Danquah, who produced a text in the Akan Doctrine of God (1944), Meinrad Hebga (1958), who wrote “Logic in Africa”, and SK Akesson, who published “The Akan Concept of Soul” (1965). Another is Tempels, who authored Bantu Philosophy (1959). They all proved that rationality was an important feature of the traditional African culture. By systematizing Bantu philosophical ideas, Tempels confronted the racist orientation of the West, which depicted Africa as a continent of semi-humans. In fact, Tempels showed latent similarities in the spiritual inclinations of the Europeans and their African counterpart. In the opening passage of his work he observed that the European who has taken to atheism quickly returns to a Christian viewpoint when suffering or pain threatens his survival. In much the same way, he says the Christian Bantu returns to the ways of his ancestors when confronted by suffering and death. So, spiritual orientation or thinking is not found only in Africa.
In his attempt to explain the Bantu understanding of being, Tempels admits that this might not be the same as the understanding of the European. Instead, he argues that the Bantu construction is as much rational as that of the European. In his words:
So, the criteriology of the Bantu rests upon external evidence, upon the authority and dominating life force of the ancestors. It rests at the same time upon the internal evidence of experience of nature and of living phenomena, observed from their point of view. No doubt, anyone can show the error of their reasoning; but it must none the less be admitted that their notions are based on reason, that their criteriology and their wisdom belong to rational knowledge. (1959: 51)
Tempels obviously believes that the Bantu, like the rest of the African peoples, possess rationality, which undergird their philosophical enterprise. The error in their reasoning is only obvious in the light of European logic. But Tempels was mistaken in his supposition that the Bantu system is erroneous. The Bantu categories only differ from those of the Europeans in terms of logic, which is why a first-time European on-looker would misinterpret them to be irrational or spiritual. Hebga demonstrates this and suggests the development of African logic. Thus, the racist assumptions that Africans are less intelligent, which Tempels rejected with one hand, was smuggled in with another. For this, and his other errors such as, his depiction of Bantu ontology with vital force, his arrogant claim that the Bantu could not write his philosophy, requiring the intervention of the European, some African philosophers like Paulin Hountondji and Innocent Asouzu to name just a few, criticized Tempels. Asouzu, for one, describes what he calls the “Tempelsian Damage” in African philosophy to refer to the undue and erroneous influence, which the Bantu Philosophy has had on contemporary Africans. For example, Tempels makes a case for Africa’s true identity, which, for him, could be found in African religion within which African philosophy (ontology) is subsumed. In his words, “being is force, force is being”. This went on to influence the next generation of African philosophers like the Rwandise, Alexis Kagame. Kagame’s work The Bantu-Rwandan Philosophy (1956), which offers similar arguments, thus further strengthening the claims made by Tempels, especially from an African’s perspective. The major criticism against their industry remains the association of their thoughts with ethnophilosophy, where ethnophilosophy is a derogatory term. A much more studded criticism is offered recently by Innocent Asouzu in his work Ibuanyidanda: New Complementary Ontology (2007). His criticism was not directed at the validity of the thoughts they expressed or whether Africa could boast of a rational enterprise such as philosophy but at the logical foundation of their thoughts. Asouzu seems to quarrel with Tempels for allowing his native Aristotelian orientation to influence his construction of African philosophy and lambasts Kagame for following suit instead of correcting Tempels’ mistake. The principle of bivalence evident in the Western thought system was at the background of their construction.
Another important philosopher in this period is John Mbiti. His work African Religions and Philosophy (1969) avidly educated those who doubted Africans’ possession of their own identities before the arrival of the European by excavating and demonstrating the rationality in the religious and philosophical enterprises in African cultures. He boldly declared: “We shall use the singular, ‘philosophy’ to refer to the philosophical understanding of African peoples concerning different issues of life” (1969: 2). His presentation of time in African thought shows off the pattern of excavation in his African philosophy. Although his studies focus primarily on the Kikamba and Gikuyu tribes of Africa, he observes that there are similarities in many African cultures just as Tempels did earlier. He subsumes African philosophy in African religion on the assumption that African peoples do not know how to exist without religion. This idea is also shared by William Abraham in his book The Mind of Africa as well as Tempels’ Bantu Philosophy. African philosophy, from Mbiti’s treatment, could be likened to Tempels’ vital force, of which African religion is its outer cloak. The obvious focus of this book is on African views about God, political thought, afterlife, culture or world-view and creation, the philosophical aspects lie within these religious over-coats. Thus, Mbiti establishes that the true, and lost, identity of the African could be found within his religion. Another important observation Mbiti made was that this identity is communal and not individualistic. Hence, he states, “I am because we are and since we are therefore I am” (1969: 108). Therefore, the African has to re-enter his religion to find his philosophy and the community to find his identity. But just like Kagame, Mbiti was unduly and erroneously influenced both by Tempels and the Judeo-Christian religion in accepting the vital force theory and in cloaking the African God with the attributes of the Judeo-Christian God.
This is a view shared by William Abraham. He shares Tempels’ and Mbiti’s views that the high-melanated African peoples have many similarities in their culture, though his studies focus on the culture and political thought of the Akan of present-day Ghana. Another important aspect of Abraham’s work is that he subsumed African philosophical thought in African culture taking, as Barry Hallen described, “an essentialist interpretation of African culture” (2002: 15). Thus for Abraham, like Tempels and Mbiti, the lost African identity could be found in the seabed of African indigenous culture in which religion features prominently.
On the other hand, there were those who sought to retrieve and establish, once again, Africa’s lost identity through economic and political ways. Some names discussed here include Kwame Nkrumah, Leopold Senghor and Julius Nyerere. These actors felt that the African could never be truly decolonized unless he found his own system of living and social organization. One cannot be African living like the European. The question that guided their study, therefore, became, “What system of economic and social engineering will suit us and project our true identity?” Nkrumah advocates African socialism, which, according to Barry Hallen, is an original, social, political and philosophical theory of African origin and orientation. This system is forged from the traditional, communal structure of African society, a view strongly projected by Mbiti. Like Amilcar Cabral, and Julius Nyerere, Nkrumah suggests that a return to African cultural system with its astute moral values, communal ownership of land and a humanitarian social and political engineering holds the key to Africa rediscovering her lost identity. Systematizing this process will yield what he calls the African brand of socialism. In most of his books, he projects the idea that Africa’s lost identity is to be found in African native culture, within which is African philosophical thought and identity shaped by communal orientation. Some of his works include, Neo-colonialism: The Last Stage of Imperialism (1965), I Speak of Freedom: A Statement of African Ideology (1961), Africa Must Unite (1970), and Consciencism (1965).
Leopold Sedar Senghor of Senegal charted a course similar to that of Nkrumah. In his works Negritude et Humanisme (1964) and Negritude and the Germans (1967), Senghor traced Africa’s philosophy of social engineering down to African culture, which he said is communal and laden with brotherly emotion. This is different from the European system, which he says is individualistic, having been marshaled purely by reason. He opposed the French colonial principle of assimilation aimed at turning Africans into Frenchmen by eroding and replacing African culture with French culture. African culture and languages are the bastions of African identity, and it is in this culture that he found the pedestal for constructing a political ideology that would project African identity. Senghor is in agreement with Nkrumah, Mbiti, Abraham and Tempels in many ways, especially with regards to the basis for Africa’s true identity.
Julius Nyerere of Tanzania is another philosopher of note in the early period of African philosophy. In his books Uhuru na Ujamaa: Freedom and Socialism (1964) and Ujamaa: The Basis of African Socialism (1968), he sought to retrieve and establish African true identity through economic and political ways. For him, Africans cannot regain their identity unless they are first free, and freedom (Uhuru) transcends independence. Cultural imperialism has to be overcome. And what is the best way to achieve this if not by developing a socio-political and economic ideology from the petals of African native culture, and traditional values of togetherness and brotherliness? Hence, Nyerere proposes Ujamaa, meaning familyhood—the “being-with” philosophy or the “we” instead of the “I—spirit” (Okoro 2004: 96). In the words of Barry Hallen, “Nyerere argued that there was a form of life and system of values indigenous to the culture of pre-colonial Africa, Tanzania in particular, that was distinctive if not unique and that had survived the onslaughts of colonialism sufficiently intact to be regenerated as the basis for an African polity” (2002: 74). Thus for Nyerere, the basis of African identity is the African culture, which is communal rather than individualistic. Nyerere was in agreement with other actors of this period on the path to full recovery of Africa’s lost identity. Some of the philosophers of this era not treated here include Aime Cesaire, Nnamdi Azikiwe, Obafemi Awolowo, Amilcar Cabral, and the two foreigners, Janheinz Jahn and Marcel Griaule.
The middle period of African philosophy was also an era of the twin-movement called Afro-constructionism and afro-deconstructionism, otherwise called the Great Debate, when two rival schools—Traditionalists and Universalists clashed. While the Traditionalists sought to construct an African identity based on excavated African cultural elements, the Universalists sought to demolish such architectonic structure by associating it with ethnophilosophy. The schools that thrived in this era include Philosophic Sagacity, Professional/Modernist/Universalist, hermeneutical and Literary schools.
An important factor of the early period was that the thoughts on Africa’s true identity generated arguments that fostered the emergence of the Middle Period of African philosophy. These arguments result from questions that could be summarized as follows: (1) Is it proper to take for granted the sweeping assertion that all of Africa’s cultures share a few basic elements in common? It was this assumption that had necessitated the favorite phrase in the early period, “African philosophy,” rather than “African philosophies”. (2) Does Africa or African culture contain a philosophy in the strict sense of the term? (3) Can African philosophy emerge from the womb of African religion, world-view and culture? Answers and objections to answers soon took the shape of a debate, characterizing the middle period as the era of the Great Debate in African philosophy.
This debate was between members of Africa’s new crop of intellectual radicals. On the one hand, were the demoters and, on the other were the promoters of African philosophy established by the league of early-period intellectuals. The former sought to criticize this new philosophy of redemption, gave it the derogatory tag “ethnophilosophy” and consequently denigrated the African identity that was founded on it, as savage and primitive identity. At the other end, the promoters sought to clarify and defend this philosophy and justify the African identity that was rooted in it as true and original.
For clarity, the assessment of the debate era will begin from the middle instead of the beginning. In 1978 Odera Oruka a Kenyan philosopher presented a paper at the William Amo Symposium held in Accra, Ghana on the topic “Four Trends in Current African Philosophy” in which he identified or grouped voices on African philosophy into four schools, namely ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, nationalistic-ideological school and professional philosophy. In 1990 he wrote another work, Sage Philosophy: Indigenous Thinkers and the Modern Debate on African Philosophy in which he further added two schools to bring the number to six schools in African philosophy. Those two additions are the hermeneutic and the artistic/literary schools.
Those who uphold philosophy in African culture are the ethnophilosophers, and they include the actors treated as members of the early period of African philosophy and their followers or supporters in the Middle Period. Some would include C. S. Momoh, Joseph Omoregbe, Lansana Keita, Olusegun Oladipo, Gordon Hunnings, Kwame Gyekye, M. A. Makinde, Emmanuel Edeh, Uzodinma Nwala, K. C. Anyanwu and later E. A. Ruch, to name a few. The philosophic sagacity school, to which Oruka belongs, also accommodates C. S. Momoh, C. B. Nze, J. I. Omoregbe, C. B. Okolo and T. F. Mason. The nationalist-ideological school consists of those who sought to develop indigenous socio-political and economic ideologies for Africa. Prominent members include Julius Nyerere, Leopold Senghor, Kwame Nkrumah, Amilcar Cabral, Nnamdi Azikiwe and Obafemi Awolowo. The professional philosophy school insists that African philosophy must be done with professional philosophical methods such as analysis, critical reflection and logical argumentation, as it is in Western philosophy. Members of this school include: Paulin Hountondji, Henri Maurier, Richard Wright, Peter Bodunrin, Kwasi Wiredu, early E. A. Ruch, R. Horton, and later C. B. Okolo. The hermeneutic school recommends interpretation as a method of doing African philosophy. A few of its members include Theophilus Okere, Okonda Okolo, Tsenay Serequeberhan, Godwin Sogolo and partly J. Sodipo and B. Hallen. The Artistic/Literary school philosophically discusses the core of African norms in literary works, and includes Chinua Achebe, Okot P’Bitek, Ngugi wa Thiong’o, Wole Soyinka, Elechi Amadi and F. C. Ogbalu.
Also, in 1989, C. S. Momoh in his The Substance of African Philosophy outlined five schools, namely African logical neo-positivism, the colonial/missionary school of thought, the Egyptological school, the ideological school and the purist school. The article was titled “Nature, Issues and Substance of African Philosophy” and was reproduced in Jim Unah’s Metaphysics, Phenomenology and African Philosophy (1996).
In comparing Momoh’s delineations with Oruka’s, it can be said that the purist school encompasses Oruka’s ethnophilosophy, artistic/literary school and philosophic sagacity; The African logical neo-positivism encompasses professional philosophy and the hermeneutical schools; and the ideological and colonial/missionary schools correspond to Oruka’s nationalistic-ideological school. The Egyptological school, therefore, remains outstanding. Momoh sees it as a school that sees African philosophy as synonymous with Egyptian philosophy or, at least, as originating from it. Also, Egyptian philosophy as a product of African philosophy is expressed in the writings of George James, I. C. Onyewuenyi and Henry Olela.
Welding all these divisions together are the perspectives of Peter Bodunrin and Kwasi Wiredu. In the introduction to his 1985 edited volume Philosophy in Africa: Trends and Perspectives, Bodunrin created two broad schools for all the subdivisions in both Oruka and Momoh, namely the Traditionalist and Modernist schools. While the former includes Africa’s rich culture and past, the latter excludes them from the mainstream of African philosophy. Kwasi Wiredu also made this type of division, specifically Traditional and Modernist, in his paper “On Defining African Philosophy” in C. S. Momoh’s (1989) edited volume. Also, A. F. Uduigwomen created two broad schools, namely the Universalists and the Particularists, in his “Philosophy and the Place of African Philosophy” (1995). These can be equated to Bodunrin’s Modernist and Traditionalist schools, respectively. The significance of his contribution to the Great Debate rests on the new school he evolved from the compromise of the Universalist and the Particularist schools (1995/2009: 2-7). As Uduigwomen defines it, the Eclectic school accommodates discourses pertaining to African experiences, culture and world-view as parts of African philosophy. Those discourses must be critical, argumentative and rational. In other words, the so-called ethnophilosophy can comply with the analytic and argumentative standards that people like Bodunrin, Hountondji, and Wiredu insist upon. Some later African philosophers revived Uduigwomen’s Eclectic school as a much more decisive approach to African philosophy (Kanu 2013: 275-87). It is the era dominated by Eclecticism and meta-philosophy that is tagged the ‘Later period’ in the history of African philosophy. For perspicuity, therefore, the debate from these two broad schools shall be addressed as the perspectives of the Traditionalist or Particularist and the Modernist or Universalist.
The reader must now have understood the perspectives on which the individual philosophers of the middle period debated. Hence, when Richard Wright published his critical essay “Investigating African Philosophy” and Henri Maurier published his “Do we have an African Philosophy?” denying the existence of African philosophy at least, as yet, the reader understands why Lansana Keita’s “The African Philosophical Tradition”, C. S. Momoh’s African Philosophy … does it exist?” or J. I. Omoregbe’s “African Philosophy: Yesterday and Today” are offered as critical responses. When Wright arrived at the conclusion that the problems surrounding the study of African philosophy were so great that others were effectively prevented from any worthwhile work until their resolution, Henri Maurier responded to the question, “Do we have an African Philosophy?” with “No! Not Yet!” (1984: 25). One would understand why Lansana Keita took it up to provide concrete evidence that Africa had and still has a philosophical tradition. In his words:
It is the purpose of this paper to present evidence that a sufficiently firm literate philosophical tradition has existed in Africa since ancient times, and that this tradition is of sufficient intellectual sophistication to warrant serious analysis…it is rather…an attempt to offer a defensible idea of African philosophy. (1984: 58)
Keita went on in that paper to excavate intellectual resources to prove his case, but it was J. I. Omoregbe who tackled the demoters on every front. Of particular interest are his critical commentaries on the position of Kwasi Wiredu and others who share Wiredu’s opinion that what is called African philosophy is not philosophy, but community thought at best. Omoregbe alludes that the logic and method of African philosophy need not be the same as those of Western philosophy, which the demoters cling to. In his words:
It is not necessary to employ Aristotelian or the Russellian logic in this reflective activity before one can be deemed to be philosophizing. It is not necessary to carry out this reflective activity in the same way that the Western thinkers did. Ability to reason logically and coherently is an integral part of man’s rationality. The power of logical thinking is identical with the power of rationality. It is therefore false to say that people cannot think logically or reason coherently unless they employ Aristotle’s or Russell’s form of logic or even the Western-type argumentation. (1998: 4-5)
Omoregbe was addressing the position of most members of the Modernist school who believed that African philosophy must follow the pattern of Western philosophy if it were to exist. As he cautions:
Some people, trained in Western philosophy and its method, assert that there is no philosophy and no philosophizing outside the Western type of philosophy or the Western method of philosophizing (which they call “scientific” or “technical”. (1998: 5)
Philosophers like E. A. Ruch in some of his earlier writings, Peter Bodunrin, C. B. Okolo, and Robin Horton were direct recipients of Omoregbe’s criticism. Robin Horton’s “African Traditional Thought and Western Science” is a two-part essay that sought, in the long run, to expose the rational ineptitude in African thought. On the question of logic in African philosophy, Robin Horton’s “Traditional Thought and the emerging African Philosophy Department: A Comment on the Current Debate” first stirred the hornet’s nest and was ably challenged by Godorn Hunnings’ “Logic, Language and Culture”, as well as by Omoregbe’s “African Philosophy: Yesterday and Today”. Earlier, Meinrad Hebga’s “Logic in Africa” had made insightful ground-clearing on the matter. Recently, C.S. Momoh’s “The Logic Question in African Philosophy” and Udo Etuk’s “The Possibility of an African Logic” as well as Jonathan C. Okeke’s “Why can’t there be an African Logic” made impressions. However, this logic question is gathering new momentum in African philosophical discourse. Recently, Jonathan O Chimakonam (2020), has put together a new edited collection that compiled some of the seminal essays in the logic question debate.
On the philosophical angle, Kwasi Wiredu’s “How not to Compare African Traditional Thought with Western Thought” responded to the lopsided earlier effort of Robin Horton but ended up making its own criticisms of the status of African philosophy, which, for Wiredu, is yet to attain maturation. In his words, “[M]any traditional African institutions and cultural practices, such as the ones just mentioned, are based on superstition. By ‘superstition’ I mean a rationally unsupported belief in entities of any sort (1976: 4-8 and 1995: 194).” In his Philosophy and an African Culture, Wiredu was more pungent. He caricatured much of the discourse on African philosophy as community thought or folk thought unqualified to be called philosophy. For him, there had to be a practised distinction between “African philosophy as folk thought preserved in oral traditions and African philosophy as critical, individual reflection, using modern logical and conceptual techniques” (1980: 14). Olusegun Oladipo supports this in his Philosophy and the African Experience. As he puts it:
But this kind of attitude is mistaken. In Africa, we are engaged in the task of the improvement of “the condition of men”. There can be no successful execution of this task without a reasonable knowledge of, and control over, nature. But essential to the quest for knowledge of, and control over, nature are “logical, mathematical and analytical procedures” which are products of modern intellectual practices. The glorification of the “unanalytical cast of mind” which a conception of African philosophy as African folk thought encourages, would not avail us the opportunity of taking advantage of the theoretical and practical benefits offered by these intellectual procedures. It thus can only succeed in making the task of improving the condition of man in Africa a daunting one. (1996: 15)
Oladipo also shares similar thoughts in his The Idea of African Philosophy. African philosophy, for some of the Modernists, is practised in a debased sense. This position is considered opinionated by the Traditionalists. Later E. A. Ruch and K. C. Anyanwu in their African Philosophy: An Introduction to the Main Philosophical Trends in Contemporary Africa attempt to excavate the philosophical elements in folklore and myth. C. S. Momoh’s “The Mythological Question in African Philosophy” and K. C. Anyanwu’s “Philosophical Significance of Myth and Symbol in Dogon World-View” further reinforced the position of the Traditionalists. (cf. Momoh 1989 and Anyanwu 1989).
However, it took Paulin Hountondji in his African Philosophy: Myth and Reality to drive a long nail in the coffin. African philosophy, for him, must be done in the same frame as Western philosophy, including its principles, methodologies and all. K. C. Anyanwu again admitted that Western philosophy is one of the challenges facing African philosophy but that only calls for systematization of African philosophy not its decimation. He made these arguments in his paper “The Problem of Method in African philosophy”.
Other arguments set Greek standards for authentic African philosophy as can be found in Odera Oruka’s “The Fundamental Principles in the Question of ‘African Philosophy’ (I)” and Hountondji’s “African Wisdom and Modern Philosophy.” They readily met with Lansana Keita’s “African Philosophical Systems: A Rational Reconstruction”, J. Kinyongo’s “Philosophy in Africa: An Existence” and even P. K. Roy’s “African Theory of Knowledge”. For every step the Modernists took, the Traditionalists replied with two, a response that lingered till the early 1990’s when a certain phase of disillusionment began to set in to quell the debate. Actors on both fronts had only then begun to reach a new consciousness, realizing that a new step had to be taken beyond the debate. Even Kwasi Wiredu who had earlier justified the debate by his insistence that “without argument and clarification, there is strictly no philosophy” (1980: 47), had to admit that it was time to do something else. For him, African philosophers had to go beyond talking about African philosophy and get down to actually doing it.
It was with this sort of new orientation, which emerged from the disillusionment of the protracted debate that the later period of African philosophy was born in the 1980’s. As it is said in the Igbo proverb, “The music makers almost unanimously were changing the rhythm and the dancers had to change their dance steps.” One of the high points of the disillusionment was the emergence of the Eclectic school in the next period called ‘the Later Period’ of African philosophy.
This period of African philosophy heralds the emergence of movements that can be called Critical Reconstructionism and Afro-Eclecticism. For the Deconstructionists of the middle period, the focus shifted from deconstruction to reconstruction of African episteme in a universally integrated way; whereas, for the eclectics, finding a reconcilable middle path between traditional African philosophy and modern African philosophy should be paramount. Thus they advocate a shift from entrenched ethnophilosophy and universal hue to the reconstruction of African episteme if somewhat different from the imposed Westernism and the uncritical ethnophilosophy. So, both the Critical Reconstructionists and the Eclectics advocate one form of reconstruction or the other. The former desire a new episteme untainted by ethnophilosophy, while the latter sue for reconciled central and relevant ideals.
Not knowing how to proceed to this sort of task was a telling problem for all advocates of critical reconstruction in African philosophy, such as V. Y. Mudimbe, Ebousi Boulaga, Olusegun Oladipo, Franz Crahey, Jay van Hook, Godwin Sogolo, and Marcien Towa to name a few. At the dawn of the era, these African legionnaires pointed out, in different terms, that reconstructing African episteme was imperative. But more urgent was the need to first analyse the haggard philosophical structure patched into existence with the cement of perverse dialogues. It appeared inexorable to these scholars and others of the time that none of these could be successful outside the shadow of Westernism. For whatever one writes, if it is effectively free from ethnophilosophy, then it is either contained in Western discourse or, at the very least proceeds from its logic. If it is already contained in Western narrative or proceeds from its logic, what then makes it African? This became something of a dead-end for this illustrious group, which struggled against evolutions in their positions.
Intuitively, almost every analyst knows that discussing what has been discussed in Western philosophy or taking the cue from Western philosophy does not absolutely negate or vitiate what is produced as African philosophy. But how is this to be effectively justified? This appears to be the Achilles heel of the Critical Reconstructionists of the later period in African philosophy. The massive failure of these Critical Reconstructionists to go beyond the lines of recommendation and actually engage in reconstruction delayed their emergence as a school of thought in African philosophy. The diversionary trend which occurred at this point ensured that the later period, which began with the two rival camps of Critical Reconstructionists and Eclectics, ended with only the Eclectics left standing. Thus dying in its embryo, Critical Reconstructionism became absorbed in Eclecticism.
The campaign for Afro-reconstructionism had first emerged in the late 1980s in the writings of Peter Bodunrin, Kwasi Wiredu, V. Y. Mudimbe, Lucius Outlaw, and much later, in Godwin Sogolo, Olusegun Oladipo, and Jay van Hook, even though principals like Marcien Towa and Franz Crahey had hinted at it much earlier. The insights of the latter two never rang bells beyond the ear-shot of identity reconstruction, which was the echo of their time. Wiredu’s cry for conceptual decolonization and Hountondji’s call for the abandonment of the ship of ethnophilosophy were in the spirit of Afro-reconstructionism of the episteme. None of the Afro-reconstructionists except for Wiredu was able to truly chart a course for reconstruction. His was linguistic, even though the significance of his campaign was never truly appreciated. His 1998 work “Toward Decolonizing African Philosophy and Religion,” was a clearer recapitulation of his works of preceding years.
Beyond this modest line, no other reconstructionist crusader of the time actually went beyond deconstruction and problem identification. Almost spontaneously, Afro-reconstructionism evolved into Afro-eclecticism in the early 1990s when the emerging Critical Reconstructionism ran into a brick wall of inactivity. The argument seems to say, ‘If it is not philosophically permissible to employ alternative logic different from the one in the West or methods, perhaps we can make do with the merger of the approaches we have identified in African philosophy following the deconstructions.’ These approaches are the various schools of thought from ethnophilosophy, philosophic sagacity, ideological school, universal, literary to hermeneutic schools, which were deconstructed into two broad approaches, namely: The traditionalist school and the modernist school, also called the particularist and the universalist schools.
Eclectics, therefore, are those who think that the effective integration or complementation of the African native system and the Western system could produce a viable synthesis that is first African and then modern. Andrew Uduigwomen, the Nigerian philosopher, could be regarded as the founder of this school in African philosophy. In his 1995 work “Philosophy and the Place of African Philosophy,” he gave official birth to Afro-eclecticism. Identifying the Traditionalist and Modernist schools as the Particularist and Universalist schools, he created the eclectic school by carefully unifying their goals from the ruins of the deconstructed past.
Uduigwomen states that the eclectic school holds that an intellectual romance between the Universalist conception and the Particularist conception will give rise to an authentic African philosophy. The Universalist approach will provide the necessary analytic and conceptual framework for the Particularist school. Since, according to Uduigwomen, this framework cannot thrive in a vacuum, the Particularist approach will, in turn, supply the raw materials or indigenous data needed by the Universalist approach. From the submission of Uduigwomen above, one easily detects that eclecticism for him entails employing Western methods in analyzing African cultural paraphernalia.
However, Afro-Eclecticism is not without problems. The first problem, though is that he did not supply the yardstick for determining what is to be admitted and what must be left out of the corpus of African tradition. Everything cannot meet the standard of genuine philosophy, nor should the philosophical selection be arbitrary. Hountondji, a chronic critic of traditional efforts, once called Tempels’ Bantu philosophy a sham. For him, it was not African or Bantu philosophy but Tempels’ philosophy with African paraphernalia. This could be extended to the vision of Afro-eclecticism. On the contrary, it could be argued that if Hountondji agrees that the synthesis contains as little as African paraphernalia, then it is something new and, in this respect, can claim the tag of African philosophy. However, it leaves to be proven how philosophical that little African paraphernalia is.
Other notable eclectics include Batholomew Abanuka, Udobata Onunwa, C. C. Ekwealor and much later Chris Ijiomah. Abanuka posits in his 1994 work that a veritable way to do authentic African philosophy would be to recognize the unity of individual things and, by extension, theories in ontology, epistemology or ethics. There is a basic identity among these because they are connected and can be unified. Following C. S. Momoh (1985: 12), Abanuka went on in A History of African Philosophy to argue that synthesis should be the ultimate approach to doing African Philosophy. This position is shared by Onunwa on a micro level. He says that realities in African world-view are inter-connected and inter-dependent (1991: 66-71). Ekwealor and Ijiomah also believe in synthesis, noting that these realities are broadly dualistic, being physical and spiritual (cf. Ekwalor 1990: 30 and Ijiomah 2005: 76 and 84). So, it would be an anomaly to think of African philosophy as chiefly an exercise in analysis rather than synthesis. The ultimate methodological approach to African philosophy, therefore, has to reflect a unity of methods above all else.
Eclecticism survived in the contemporary period of African philosophy in conversational forms. Godfrey Ozumba and Jonathan Chimakonam on Njikoka philosophy, E. G. Ekwuru and later Innocent Egwutuorah on Afrizealotism, and even Innocent Asouzu on Ibuanyidanda ontology are all in a small way, various forms of eclectic thinking. However, these theories are grouped in the New Era specifically for the time of their emergence and the robust conversational structure they have.
The purest development of eclectic thinking in the later period could be found in Pantaleon Iroegbu’s Uwa Ontology. He posits uwa (worlds) as an abstract generic concept with fifteen connotations and six zones. Everything is uwa, in uwa and can be known through uwa. For him, while the fifteen connotations are the different senses and aspects which uwa concept carries in African thought, the six zones are the spatio-temporal locations of the worlds in terms of their inhabitants. He adds that these six zones are dualistic and comprise the earthly and the spiritual. They are also dynamic and mutually related. Thus, Iroegbu suggests that the approach to authentic African philosophy could consist of the conglomeration of uwa. This demonstrates a veritable eclectic method in African philosophy.
One of the major hindrances of eclecticism of the later period is that it leads straight to applied philosophy. Following this approach in this period almost makes it impossible for second readers to do original and abstract philosophizing for its own sake. Eclectic theories and methods confine one to their internal dynamics believing that for a work to be regarded as authentic African philosophy, it must follow the rules of Eclecticism. The wider implication is that while creativity might blossom, innovation and originality are stifled. Because of pertinent problems such as these, further evolutions in African philosophy became inevitable. The Kenyan philosopher Odera Oruka had magnified the thoughts concerning individual rather than group philosophizing, thoughts that had been variously expressed earlier by Peter Bodunrin, Paulin Hountondji and Kwasi Wiredu, who further admonished African philosophers to stop talking and start doing African philosophy. And V. Y. Mudimbe, in his The Invention of Africa…, suggested the development of an African conversational philosophy, and the reinvention of Africa by its philosophers, to undermine the Africa that Europe invented. The content of Lewis Gordon’s essay “African Philosophy’s search for Identity: Existential consideration of a recent effort”, and the works of Outlaw and Sogolo suggest a craving for a new line of development for African philosophy—a new approach which is to be critical, engaging and universal while still being African. This in particular, is the spirit of the conversational thinking, which was beginning to grip African philosophers in late 1990s when Gordon wrote his paper. Influences from these thoughts by the turn of the millennium year crystallized into a new mode of thinking, which then metamorphosed into conversational philosophy. The New Era in African philosophy was thus heralded. The focus of this New Era and the orientation became the conversational philosophy.
This period of African philosophy began in the late 1990s and took shape by the turn of the millennium years. The orientation of this period is conversational philosophy, so, conversationalism is the movement that thrives in this period. The University of Calabar has emerged as the international headquarters of this new movement hosting various workshops, colloquia and conferences in African philosophy under the auspices of a revolutionary forum called The Conversational/Calabar School of Philosophy. This forum can fairly be described as revolutionary for the radical way they turned the fortunes of African philosophy around. When different schools and actors were still groping about, the new school provided a completely new and authentically African approach to doing philosophy. Hinged on the triple principles of relationality (that variables necessarily interrelate), contextuality (that the relationships of variables occur in contexts) and complementarity (that seemingly opposed variables can complement rather than merely contradict), they formulated new methodologies (complementary reflection and conversational method) and developed original systems to inaugurate a new era in the history of African philosophy.
The Calabar School begins its philosophical inquiry with the assumptions that a) relationships are central to understanding the nature of reality, b) each of these relationships must be contextualized and studied as such. They also identify border lines as the main problem of the 21st century. By border lines, they mean the divisive line we draw between realities in order to establish them as binary opposites. These lines lead to all marginal problems such as racism, sexism, classisim, creedoism, etc. To address these problems, they raise two questions: does difference amount to inferiority? And, are opposites irreconcilable? In the Calabar School of Philosophy, some prominent theories have emerged to respond to the border lines problems and the two questions that trail it. Some theoretic contributions of the Calabar School include, uwa ontology (Pantaleon Iroegbu), ibuanyidanda (complementary philosophy) (Innocent Asouzu), harmonious monism (Chris Ijiomah), Njikoka philosophy (Godfrey Ozumba), conceptual mandelanism (Mesembe Edet), and conversational thinking (Jonathan Chimakonam), consolation philosophy (Ada Agada), predeterministic historicity (Aribiah Attoe), personhood-based theory of right action (Amara Chimakonam), etc. All these theories speak to the method of conversational philosophy. Conversational philosophy is defined by the focus on studying relationships existing between variables and active engagement between individual African philosophers in the creation of critical narratives therefrom, through engaging the elements of tradition or straightforwardly by producing new thoughts or by engaging other individual thinkers. It thrives on incessant questioning geared toward the production of new concepts, opening up new vistas and sustaining the conversation.
Some of the African philosophers whose works follow this trajectory ironically have emerged in the Western world, notably in America. The American philosopher Jennifer Lisa Vest is one of them. Another one is Bruce Janz. These two, to name a few, suggest that the highest purification of African philosophy is to be realized in conversational-styled philosophizing. However, it was the Nigerian philosopher Innocent Asouzu who went beyond the earlier botched attempt of Leopold Senghor and transcended the foundations of Pantaleon Iroegbu and CS Momoh to erect a new model of African philosophy that is conversational. The New Era, therefore, is the beginning of conversational philosophy.
Iroegbu in his Metaphysics: The Kpim of Philosophy inaugurated the reconstructive and conversational approach in African philosophy. He studied the relationships between the zones and connotations of uwa. From the preceding, he engaged previous writers in a critical conversation out of which he produced his own thought, (Uwa ontology) bearing the stamp of African tradition and thought systems but remarkably different in approach and method of ethnophilosophy. Franz Fanon has highlighted the importance of sourcing African philosophical paraphernalia from African indigenous culture. This is corroborated in a way by Lucius Outlaw in his African Philosophy: Deconstructive and Reconstructive Challenges. In it, Outlaw advocates the deconstruction of European-invented Africa to be replaced by a reconstruction to be done by conscientious Africans free from the grip of colonial mentality (1996: 11). Whereas the Wiredu’s crusade sought to deconstruct the invented Africa, actors in the New Era of African philosophy seek to reconstruct through conversational approach.
Iroegbu and Momoh inaugurated this drive but it was Asouzu who has made the most of it. His theory of Ibuanyidanda ontology or complementary reflection maintains that “to be” simply means to be in a mutual, complementary relationship (2007: 251-55). Every being, therefore, is a variable with the capacity to join a mutual interaction. In this capacity, every being alone is seen as a missing link and serving a missing link of reality in the network of realities. One immediately suspects the apparent contradiction that might arise from the fusion of two opposed variables when considered logically. But the logic of this theory is not the two-valued classical logic but the three-valued system of logic developed in Africa (cf. Asouzu 2004, 2013; Ijiomah 2006, 2014, 2020; Chimakonam 2012, 2013 and 2014a, 2017, 2018, 2019, 2020). In this, the two standard values are sub-contraries rather than contradictories thereby facilitating effective complementation of variables. The possibility of the two standard values merging to form the third value in the complementary mode is what makes Ezumezu logic, one of the systems developed in the Calabar school, a powerful tool of thought.
A good number of African philosophers are tuning their works into the pattern of conversational style. Elsewhere in Africa, Michael Eze, Fainos Mangena, Bernard Matolino, Motsamai Molefe, Anthony Oyowe, Thaddeus Metz and Leonhard Praeg are doing this when they engage with the idea of ubuntu ethics and ontology, except that they come short of studying relationships. Like all these scholars, the champions of the new conversational orientation are building the new edifice by reconstructing the deconstructed domain of thought in the later period of African philosophy. The central approach is conversation, as a relational methodology. By studying relationships and engaging other African philosophers, entities or traditions in creative struggle, they hope to reconstruct the deconstructed edifice of African philosophy. Hence, the New Era of African philosophy is safe from the retrogressive, perverse dialogues, which characterized the early and middle periods.
Also, with the critical deconstruction that occurred in the latter part of the middle period and the attendant eclecticism that emerged in the later period, the stage was set for the formidable reconstructions and conversational encounters that marked the arrival of the New Era of African philosophy.
The development of African philosophy through the periods yields two vital conceptions for African philosophy, namely that African philosophy is a critical engagement of tradition and individual thinkers on the one hand, and on the other hand, it is also a critical construction of futurity. When individual African philosophers engage tradition critically in order to ascertain its logical coherency and universal validity, they are doing African philosophy. And when they employ the tools of African logic in doing this, they are doing African philosophy. On the second conception, when African philosophers study relationships and engage in critical conversations with one another and in the construction of new thoughts in matters that concern Africa but which are nonetheless universal and projected from African native thought systems, they are doing African philosophy. So, the authentic African philosophy is not just a future project; it can also continue from the past.
On the whole, this essay discussed the journey of African philosophy from the beginning and focused on the criteria, schools and movements in African philosophical tradition. The historical account of the periods in African philosophy began with the early period through to the middle, the later and finally, the new period. These periods of African philosophy were covered, taking particular interest in the robust, individual contributions. Some questions still trail the development of African philosophy, many of which include, “Must African philosophy be tailored to the pattern of Western philosophy, even in less definitive issues? If African philosophy is found to be different in approach from Western philosophy, — so what? Are logical issues likely to play any major roles in the structure and future of African philosophy? What is the future direction of African philosophy? Is the problem of the language of African philosophy pregnant? Would conversations in contemporary African philosophy totally eschew perverse dialogue? What shall be the rules of engagement in African philosophy?” These questions are likely to shape the next lines of thought in African philosophy.
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- A discussion on the role of knowledge in the development of Africa.
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- A collection of essays on sundry philosophical issues pertaining to comparative and cross-cultural philosophy.
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- A discussion of the importance and relevance of the theory of conceptual decolonization in African philosophy.
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- A discourse on the parameters of the discipline of African philosophy.
- Wright, Richard A., ed. “Investigating African Philosophy”. African Philosophy: An Introduction. 3rd ed. Lanham, Md.: University Press of America, 1984.
- A critique of the existence of African philosophy as a discipline.
Jonathan O. Chimakonam
University of Calabar