Thomas Hobbes: Methodology

hobbesThomas Hobbes (1588-1679) is one of England’s most influential political philosophers. According to his own estimation, he was probably the most important philosopher of his time, if not of history, since he believed himself to be the first to discover a genuine “science of politics.” Modeled on the surefire method of geometry, his political science was supposed to demonstrate political truths with the certainty of a geometric proof. Such a science was desperately needed by his fellow English citizens, Hobbes believed, because political disagreements and conflicts were tearing apart his country. According to Hobbes, civil war is primarily caused by differing opinions over who is the ultimate political authority in a commonwealth. In his own time, the King’s claim of having the final say on political matters was called into question by members of Parliament. For example, when King Charles tried to raise funds for a war against Spain and France in 1626, Parliament denied his request. In response, the King used a “forced loan” to force individual subjects to finance his needs. This action contributed to the rising tensions between King and Parliament, tensions that ultimately erupted in civil war. According to Hobbes, the only way to escape civil war and to maintain a state of peace in a commonwealth is to institute an impartial and absolute sovereign power that is the final authority on all political issues. Hobbes believes his own political philosophy scientifically proves such a conclusion. If Hobbes’s political argument is as sound as a geometric proof, then his own estimation of his philosophical importance may not be exaggerated.

Table of Contents

  1. History and Politics: The Political Problem
    1. Hobbes’s Translation of Thucydides
    2. Hobbes’s History of the English Civil War
    3. Hobbes’s Philosophy of Law
  2. Scientific Views
    1. Philosophical Method: Resolution and Composition
    2. Scientific Demonstration
    3. Motion and Science
    4. Geometry and Physics
  3. Philosophy of Human Nature
    1. Hobbes’s Moral Philosophy
    2. The State of Nature
  4. Science of Politics
  5. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. History and Politics: The Political Problem

Hobbes presented his “science of politics” as a response to a specific historical situation characterized by acute political problems. This science of politics is primarily found in Hobbes’s “political works,” as they may be called, which include The Elements of Law (1640), De Cive (1642) and Leviathan (1651). Although these texts provide detailed insight into Hobbes’s solution to civil war, they provide only a general understanding of the problem itself. Hobbes’s so-called historical treatises, on the other hand, reveal the specific causes of the deteriorating political situation in seventeenth century England. These works include his translation of Thucydides’ History of the Peloponnesian Wars (1628), Behemoth (1668) and A Dialogue between a Philosopher and a Student of the Common Laws of England (1669). As some Hobbes scholars have pointed out, there is a logical priority to Hobbes’s political works because they provide solutions to the problems presented in the historical works. To gain a better appreciation of Hobbes’s political solution, then, it is useful to first summarize his historical works, which reveal his understanding of the particular problem he faced.

a. Hobbes’s Translation of Thucydides

Hobbes’s decision to translate and publish Thucydides’ history in 1628 was certainly a reaction to the growing political tensions in England at this time. In the 1620s, troubles between Charles I and Parliament escalated due to the King’s insistence on raising funds for as series of unpopular wars. After the King openly declared war on Spain, he began to amass the largest military entourage since 1588. For a variety of reasons, including early losses suffered at Cadiz at the hands of the Spanish and the negative effects of war on trade, Parliament was reluctant to grant additional funds to the King. This situation was compounded by a progressively deteriorating relationship with France. France’s own maritime conflicts led to embargoes that created more barriers to international trade. Furthermore, tensions between England and France increased on account of France’s continued possession of English ships (which were originally on loan) and because of long-simmering religious differences between the two nations. After the Parliament of 1626 denied Charles’ request for supply, the King raised funds through a forced loan, by which private individuals were made to loan money to the crown. Such actions not only strained the relationship between the Parliament and King, but also revealed a number of ideological differences between these two centers of power with serious political implications. The most important issue concerned the King’s authority and its relationship to the law. Charles advocated a divine right theory of kingship according to which God granted him the power, by the grace of his royal anointment, to act outside the law at his own prerogative. The King tempered his view by claiming he would take extra-legal actions only when necessary and only for the good of the commonwealth. Despite this claim of self-restraint, some of his actions conflicted with his declaration of good faith. The King’s insistence on the right to imprison outside the law, for example, sparked serious doubts as to whether his word could be trusted. The Petition of Right, presented in Parliament in 1628, attempted to preserve the liberties of the subjects against the threatening actions of the King, such as forced loans, extra-legal imprisonment, and the billeting of soldiers. Religious differences, as well as politics, were partly to blame for the political problems of Hobbes’ England. It was well understood that religious leaders were not always content with some of the policies of the crown. English Protestants, including both traditional Anglicans and the more radical Puritans, for example, were highly suspicious of Charles’ fervent support of the Anglican Archbishop Laud. The primary reason for their reservations was Laud’s advocacy of certain anti-Calvinist notions, including the view that the elect could fall from God’s grace through sin. Such a view questioned the bedrock Calvinist notion of predestination to which most English Protestants adhered. In effect, Charles asserted his right as king to declare the traditional position and dictate orthodox dogma by supporting his Archbishop. Historical circumstances strongly suggest that Hobbes’s translation of Thucydides was meant to be a political argument for the royalist cause. Hobbes himself supports the truth of this when he states that Thucydides’ history provides instruction useful for the defense of the King. But what specific lessons does this ancient history hold? Hobbes believes democracy is inadequate partly because common people are easily swayed towards politically destructive actions by “demagogues” and religious zealots. If political power is placed in the hands of the common people, who are under the influence of power hungry individuals seeking their own advantage, then the commonwealth will likely fall. Hobbes’s publication of Thucydides was a political act meant to support the royalist cause and to warn against the dangerous consequences of usurping the King’s power.

b. Hobbes’s History of the English Civil War

In Behemoth, Hobbes shows his readers that an ideological dispute concerning politics and religion was the root cause of the English Civil War. The work begins with a simple question: How did King Charles I, a strong and capable leader, lose the sovereign power that he held by the legal right of succession? The initial answer is that the King lost control of the kingdom because he lacked the financial resources required to maintain a military. Upon further consideration, however, Hobbes reveals that a deeper cause of conflict was the fact that the “people were corrupted” by “seducers” to accept opinions and beliefs contrary to social and political harmony. Hobbes claims that religious leaders were mostly to blame for creating dissension in the commonwealth because they are responsible for the dissemination of politically dangerous beliefs. In addition, Hobbes placed some of the blame on Aristotle or, more precisely, on religious and political leaders who misused Aristotelian ideas to their own advantage. As noted above, Hobbes had suggested the dangerous consequences of religious fervor in his translation of Thucydides. In Behemoth, religious leaders directly bear the brunt of his critical remarks. According to Hobbes, religious leaders sow disorder by creating situations of divided loyalty between God and King. Hobbes first blamed Presbyterian preachers for using rhetorical tricks to capture the minds and loyalties of their parishioners. These preachers did not instill beliefs by using reason or argument, nor did they necessarily seek to teach people to understand. Instead, they indoctrinated their listeners with seditious principles. For Hobbes, preachers are actors who bedazzle their audience by claiming to be divinely inspired. Many “fruitless and dangerous doctrines,” Hobbes says, are adopted by people because they are “terrified and amazed by preachers” (B 252). In short, preachers used the word of God as a means to undermine the lawful authority of the King. Hobbes also criticized Catholics for their belief that the Pope should reign over the spiritual lives of the people. Although the Pope’s power is supposed to operate solely within the realm of religious faith and morality, papal orders frequently bled over into the world of politics. The problem, for Hobbes, is that the Pope may extend his power over spiritual concerns to the point where it infringes upon and restricts the legitimate scope of the King’s power over civil matters. The most dangerous problem with Catholicism, for example, is the Pope’s self-proclaimed right to absolve the duties of citizens to “heretic” Kings. In Behemoth, Hobbes also launches an attack on Independents, Anabaptists, Quakers, and Adamites for their role in creating civil discontent. These religious groups, discontented with both Protestantism and Catholicism, encouraged individuals to read and interpret the Bible for themselves. The result was that “every man became a judge of religion, and an interpreter of the Scriptures” and so “they thought they spoke with God Almighty, and understood what he said” (B 190). The private, antinomian interpretation of Scripture, Hobbes claims, frequently lead to situations of divided loyalty between God and King. If individuals may speak with God directly, then each person may decide for him or herself what civil laws are contrary to God’s word, and thereby what laws may be justly broken. Furthermore, Hobbes indirectly blames Aristotle for problems in his country when he criticizes the destructive use of Aristotelian metaphysical and ethical ideas. Hobbes points out, for example, that priests used Aristotelian philosophy to explain their power to transform a piece of bread into the “body of Christ.” The notion of the transubstantiation of the Eucharist, according to Hobbes, gives the impression that priests deserve reverence because they possess godly powers. Priests exploited the metaphysical doctrines of Aristotle to convince people “there is but one way to salvation, that is, extraordinary devotion and liberality to the Church, and a readiness for the Church’s sake, if it be required, to fight against their natural and lawful sovereign” (B 215). In the same vein, Hobbes points out that Aristotle’s ethical ideas were used to undermine the legitimacy of the sovereign power. According to Aristotle’s doctrine of the mean, to determine what is virtuous in a particular situation one must find the middle path between two extremes. In Hobbes’s opinion, this leaded individuals to determine for themselves what is right or wrong in a given situation. The political problem with this view, as might be expected, is that it leads to questioning the validity and regulatory power of civil law, and it thereby could foster resistance and rebellion.

c. Hobbes’s Philosophy of Law

In A Dialogue between a Philosopher and a Student of the Common Laws of England, Hobbes claims that common law lawyers, such as Sir Edward Coke, are partly to blame for the civil strife in England. According to Coke, the King is legally restricted by the common law, which is a set of laws determined and refined over the course of time by the application of an ‘artificial reason’ possessed by wise lawyers and judges. Hobbes agrees with Coke that reason plays an important part in law, but argues that the King’s reason is responsible for determining the meaning of laws. In the political situation prior to the outbreak of civil war, this philosophical difference revealed itself when the King requested funds and was denied. Hobbes, as we have seen, believed the immediate cause of Charles’ inability to maintain the sovereign power was his lack of funds to support a military. Charles’ request was denied on the basis, in part, of certain statutes claiming that kings shall not levy taxes or enact other means of funding without the common consent of the realm. The interpretation of these statutes according to the ‘reason’ of the lawyers in Parliament, Hobbes says, is partly to blame for the King’s failure to acquire needed funding. As with the religious seducers, common law lawyers often created situations of divided loyalty. In their interpretation of the law, barristers such as Coke sometimes claimed the ‘law’ is in conflict with the dictates of the King. In such situations, is one’s duty of obedience to the law (as interpreted by the ‘wise men’ of Parliament) higher than one’s duty to the King? These kinds of questions, Hobbes believes, inevitably lead to division in the commonwealth and this, in turn, leads to factions within the body politic and civil discord.

2. Scientific Views

Hobbes’s “science of politics” was supposed to provide a solution to the ideological conflicts that lead to civil war by providing a method of achieving consensus on political matters. If the conflicting parties could ultimately agree on political ideas, then peace and prosperity in the commonwealth could be achieved. Hobbes’s aim was to put politics onto a scientific footing and thereby establish an enduring state of peace. To understand Hobbes’s idea of science one needs to turn to De Corpore (or On the Body), which is his most developed text on scientific ideas. In this manuscript of natural philosophy, Hobbes presents his views on philosophical method, mathematics, geometry, physics, and human nature. In his own opinion, the views contained in De Corpore represented the foundational principles of his entire philosophical system and, therefore, of his “science of politics.”

a. Philosophical Method: Resolution and Composition

Hobbes, like many of his contemporaries, stresses the importance of having a proper philosophical method for attaining knowledge. In contrast to the reliance on authority that was typical of medieval scholasticism, leading intellectuals and scientists of Hobbes’s time believed that knowledge is not attained by appealing to authority, but by employing an appropriately objective method. For Hobbes, such a method was not only important for attaining knowledge, but also served the practical end of avoiding disputes which arose from speculation and subjective interpretation. Although Hobbes did not consistently describe his philosophical methodology, most scholars agree that he used a “resolutive-compositive” method. According to this method, one comes to understand a given object of inquiry by intellectually “resolving” it into its constituent parts and then subsequently “composing” it back into a whole. For Hobbes, such a process may be used when investigating a natural body (such as a chair or a man), an abstract body (such as a circle), or a political body (such as a commonwealth). So, to use Hobbes’s example, one can intellectually resolve the idea of a human being into the following ideas: “rational,” “animated,” and “body.” On the other hand, one can compose the idea of a man by reconstructing these concepts. In the process of resolving and composing a thing, one is able to discover its essential qualities. This process is analogous to taking apart a watch and putting it back together again to find out what makes it tick. Hobbes used the method of resolution and composition in his science of politics. He first resolved the commonwealth into its parts (that is, human beings), and then resolved these parts into their parts (i.e. the motions of natural bodies), and then resolved these into their parts (that is, abstract figures). After such a resolution, Hobbes recomposed the commonwealth in his grand trilogy that progressed from the abstract and physical investigation of natural bodies, to the study of human bodies, to finally the examination of political bodies.

b. Scientific Demonstration

It was important for Hobbes not only to acquire knowledge for himself, but also to demonstrate his conclusions to others. According to Hobbes, scientific demonstration is a linguistic activity of constructing syllogisms out of propositions, which themselves are constructed out of names. The basic linguistic unit of scientific demonstration, then, is the “name.” Hobbes believes that names may be used either as “marks,” which recall certain thoughts to our minds, or as “signs,” which communicate our thoughts to others. One may, for example, use the name “man” as a mark, or mnemonic device, to remember what a man is, or one may use the name to communicate something about men to others. When two or more names are joined with a copula (an “is”), a proposition is created. For example, “man is an animal” is a proposition that joins “man” with “animal.” A syllogism is a series of three propositions where the first two (that is, the premises) logically support the third (that is, the conclusion). From the two premises “men are animals” and “animals are alive,” for example, one may logically conclude that, “men are alive.” This is how one constructs syllogisms out of propositions. Scientific demonstration, however, is not simply a matter of logically deducing conclusions; the conclusions must also be universal and true. According to Hobbes, a universal conclusion is one that attributes a characteristic to an entire class of things. For example, “all human beings are rational” is a statement in which the term “rational” is used to describe all humans. Hobbes continues, if the predicate term in such a statement ‘comprehends’ the subject term, then the statement is also a true one. For example, in the statement “Human beings are animals,” the subject term (“human beings”) is included within the predicate term (“animals”) and so is a true statement. A scientific demonstration, then, is a syllogism that deduces universal and true propositions on the basis of premises with the same characteristics. (Interestingly, in geometry, which is Hobbes’s paradigm of scientific demonstration, the truth of the first principles is established by agreement. In this case, Hobbes adheres to a “conventional view of truth,” according to which the truth of propositions is determined by consensus.)

c. Motion and Science

It is not possible to speak of Hobbes’s view of science without referring to the concept of motion. Hobbes believes that motion, understood as any kind of change, is the universal cause of all things. The various branches of science, therefore, are ultimately sciences of motion. For example, Hobbes believes that geometry is a science of motion because it involves the construction of figures through the movement of points. Physics, similarly, is the science that studies the motion of physical bodies. Even moral philosophy is a science of motion because it studies the “motions of the mind” (such as envy, greed, and selfishness) that cause human actions. Thus, one may discover the motions, or actions, that lead to the creation of a commonwealth by understanding the “motions” of the human mind in a parallel way as when one studies points and physical bodies.

d. Geometry and Physics

After presenting his ideas on philosophical method in the first part of De Corpore, Hobbes applies this method to both the abstract world of geometry and to the real and existing world of physical objects. Keeping to his goal of scientifically demonstrating his conclusions, Hobbes begins his geometrical investigations with a number of foundational definitions, including those of space, time and bodies; he uses these definitions to compose an abstract world of geometric figures and then to draw a number of conclusions about them. At the end of Part III, the investigation shifts away from the abstract world to the ‘real and existent’ one, signifying a shift from geometry to physics. At the start of his physical investigations, Hobbes reiterates his point that resolution and composition are the methods to obtain philosophical knowledge. The appropriate method for scientifically investigating the natural world, Hobbes says, is resolution. The goal of physics is to understand the motions of the world as experienced by us. Since our knowledge of the physical world comes from our experiences, Hobbes believes the first job of physics is to analyze the faculty of sense. Hobbes resolves human sensation into its various “parts”: the sense organs, the faculties of imagination and fancy, and the sensations of pleasure and pain. Hobbes then resolves natural bodies, starting with a resolution of the “whole” world, to unveil the variety of motions responsible for physical phenomena, such as the motion of the stars, the change of seasons, the presence of heat and color, and the power of gravity. All of these natural phenomena are explained, just as geometric figures are, in terms of bodies in motion. Important differences between geometry and physics surface in Hobbes’s De Corpore. In the first case, Hobbes uses a compositive method in geometry. Starting with definitions of lines and points, Hobbes derives a number of conclusions about the world of geometric figures. In his physics, on the other hand, Hobbes starts by resolving senses and the phenomena provided by them. There is also a second distinction that concerns the truth or falsity of claims made in each science. According to Hobbes, geometry operates within the realm of truth because it is grounded on primary principles, or definitions, that are known as true because they have been accepted as true. The principles of physics, on the other hand, are hypothetical because they are not agreed upon initially, but are discovered through observation. The difference in the demonstrable nature of physics and geometry is ultimately based upon their contrasting methodologies.

3. Philosophy of Human Nature

The second part of Hobbes’s trilogy, which investigates human bodies, follows physics, which studies natural bodies. The point of transition between physics and the study of human nature is found in what may be called Hobbes’s “philosophy of mind” or “psychology.” Moral philosophy is a part of physics because the motion of material bodies on our sense organs, which is the subject matter of physics, causes a variety of motions in the human mind. While moral philosophy is technically a part of physics, it may also be seen as the starting point for political philosophy insofar as it lays down the foundational ethical principles from which social conclusions are derived. Hobbes’s scientific methodology is apparent in the political argument of Leviathan. Following the method of resolution, Hobbes resolves the commonwealth into its fundamental “parts,” i.e. humans, and further resolves humans into their “parts,” i.e., motions of the mind. Hobbes’s political argument in Leviathan, then, begins with his views on the nature of the mind and human psychology. After studying human individuals in isolation, he reconstructs the commonwealth by placing them in a state of nature, an abstract condition prior to the formation of political society. By analyzing the behavior, or “motions,” of humans in this controlled environment, Hobbes believes he has discovered the causes of commonwealths. At the same time that Hobbes uses the compositive method to intellectually reconstruct the commonwealth, he also tries to demonstrate his political conclusions following the paradigm of geometry by defining fundamental features of human nature and then drawing conclusions on the basis of these. It should be noted that Hobbes is not always consistent or rigorous in applying a scientific method to political matters. In the Introduction to Leviathan, for example, Hobbes claims that self-inspection is the primary method for understanding his political ideas. In this case, the foundational principles of his political science are not derived from physics, but are known simply by reflecting on one’s experiences. In addition, Hobbes claimed that the second part of his trilogy, De Cive, was published first because it relied on its own empirical principles. Furthermore, in Leviathan, especially the early chapters, Hobbes uses many rhetorical devices in getting his point across, rather than following a strict pattern of deriving conclusions from definitions and fundamental principles. Such devices probably indicate that Hobbes was aiming at a wider readership with this work, with possible political implications.

a. Hobbes’s Moral Philosophy

Hobbes’s masterpiece in political philosophy begins with a study of human individuals and the “motions” of their “parts.” In the early chapters of Leviathan, Hobbes advocates a mechanistic and materialist psychology. He claims that the motions of external physical objects on sense organs cause a variety of mental experiences in the mind, which Hobbes refers to as “fancies” or “appearances”; such mental phenomena ultimately cause human behavior. As Hobbes sees it, the movement of external objects lead to the production of mental motions called “endeavours,” which are of two types: appetites and aversions. An appetite is an endeavour that causes an individual to seek out a particular object. An aversion, on the other hand, is an endeavor that causes one to avoid an object. For Hobbes, individuals naturally have an appetite for the “good,” which he defines simply as the object of one’s appetite. In other words, if a person desires an object, that object is “good” for that person. When deciding how to act in a particular situation, humans must “deliberate” by weighing appetites and aversions. Individuals will necessarily choose the act that apparently produces the greatest good for the individual concerned. Deliberation, therefore, is not as much a matter of choice as it is the result of a mechanical process.

b. The State of Nature

Hobbes’s psychological observations in the early chapters of Leviathan are about human individuals, not community members. Following the compositive aspect of his methodology, Hobbes “combines” individuals in a state of nature, a state prior to the formation of the commonwealth. In the “natural condition of mankind,” humans are equal, despite minor differences in strength and mental acuity. Hobbes’s notion of equality is peculiar in that it refers to the equal ability to kill or conquer one another, but quite consistent with his notion of power. This equality, Hobbes says, naturally leads to conflict among individuals for three reasons: competition, distrust, and glory. In the first case, if two individuals desire a scarce commodity, they will compete for the commodity and necessarily become enemies. In their efforts to acquire desired objects, each person tries to “destroy or subdue” the other. On account of the constant fear produced in the state of nature, Hobbes believes, it is reasonable to distrust others and use preemptive strikes against one’s enemies. Hobbes also considers humans to be naturally vainglorious and so seek to dominate others and demand their respect. The natural condition of mankind, according to Hobbes, is a state of war in which life is “solitary, poor, nasty, brutish, and short” because individuals are in a “war of all against all” (L 186). In such a state, Hobbes contends that individuals have a “natural right” to do whatever they believe is necessary to preserve their lives. In other words, individuals in the state of nature are not constrained by moral or legal obligations as neither could exist prior to the establishment of a commonwealth. In the state of nature “nothing can be Unjust’ since the ‘notions of Right and Wrong, Justice and Injustice have there no place” (L 188). Human liberty, for Hobbes, is simply the freedom of bodily action and is not limited by any moral or legal notions. A person is free, in other words, when not physically confined or imprisoned. Because the state of nature is a state of continuous and comprehensive war, Hobbes claims it is necessary and rational for individuals to seek peace to satisfy their desires, including the natural desire for self-preservation. The human power of reason, Hobbes says, reveal the “laws of nature” that enable humans to establish a state of peace and escape the horrors of the state of nature.

4. Science of Politics

The geometric method is nowhere more apparent in Hobbes’s political philosophy than in his treatment of the laws of nature. Definitions are provided and a series of conclusions are drawn in rapid fashion; there is a deep logical consistency to its prudential outcomes. Hobbes begins by defining laws of nature as rational precepts that lead individuals toward a state of peace. The first law of nature is that every person should seek peace with others, unless others are not willing to cooperate, in which case one may use the “helps of war.” This law of nature has two parts to it. In the first part, it encourages a state of peace by instructing individuals to satisfy their desire for self-preservation. Yet, because peaceful coexistence requires reciprocity, if only one party seeks peace, it is unlikely it will be established. For this reason, there is a second part to the first law of nature; that is, if others are not interested in settling the conflict, one must resort to violent action to secure one’s survival. Humans, as we have seen, have a natural right to determine what is necessary for their own individual survival. The existence of this natural right often promotes a state of war, so peace requires that individuals renounce or transfer this right in part or in whole. From the first law of nature, then, Hobbes derives a second law according to which individuals must lay down their natural rights universally and concurrently in order to obtain peace. A natural right is relinquished either by transferring a right to a specific recipient or by renouncing the right entirely. In order to escape the war of all against all, Hobbes claims, a common power must be established by a mutual transference of right to protect the individuals not only from foreign invaders, but also from each other. Yet, since the object of one’s voluntary actions is some good to oneself, a person can never abandon or transfer their right to self-preservation. The purpose of establishing a common power is to escape from the condition of war, a condition that seriously threatens each person’s conservation, which is one’s highest good. Thus, a person cannot give up the natural right to self-preservation or to the means of self-preservation. According to the second law of nature, then, we must transfer those rights whose exercise contributes to civil conflict. This leads to the third law of nature stating that individuals must abide by any covenants consented to freely. For a common power to perform the task for which it is erected, it is necessary that individuals follow through on their mutual agreements. In Leviathan, Hobbes deduces sixteen more laws of nature, all of which aim at maintaining the state of peace established by the erection of a common power. These laws provide a code of moral behavior by prohibiting socially destructive behavior or attitudes, such as drunkenness or ingratitude. The political consequence of the laws of nature is the institution of a political body that makes possible a state of peace. Hobbes claims the sovereign power may reside in one person or an assembly, so that a singular type of government is not required to maintain the peace. It is necessary, however, for the sovereign power to possess certain rights to fulfill the task for which it was established. In a manner similar to the deduction of the laws of nature, Hobbes derives the rights and powers of sovereignty. In this derivation, Hobbes deduces those rights that are necessary for maintaining peace. To give one example, the sovereign power has the right not to be dissolved by its subjects Hobbes derives eleven other rights; if any of the rights are granted away, Hobbes asserts, the commonwealth will revert to a state of war. The rights, briefly put, entail a defense of political absolutism. According to the basic tenets of Hobbes’s political absolutism, the sovereign power enacts and enforces all laws, determines when to make war and peace, controls the military, judges all doctrines and opinions, decides all controversies between citizens, chooses its own counselors and ministers, and cannot be legitimately resisted, except in rare instances (that is, when it cannot guarantee the peace and security of its subjects—that is, it loses “the power of the sword”). The “science of politics,” as presented in Hobbes’s political works, offers a solution to the specific problems he addressed in his historical works. The essence of his solution is “political absolutism,” according to which the sovereign is the final arbiter on all matters ethical, religious, and political. One of the “diseases of a commonwealth,” Hobbes says, is the opinion that “every private man is Judge of Good and Evil actions” (L 365). In the state of nature, as we have seen, individuals possess the natural right to determine what is good for themselves, i.e., what is necessary for their own conservation. As long as individuals make such determinations, Hobbes believes, there will be a state of war. In established commonwealths, religious doctrines are often responsible for civil conflict, especially in those cases where God’s law and civil law seem to be in opposition. Hobbes’s solution to the problem of conflicting religious and political powers begins by a free and unanimous consent to irrevocable place both powers under the control of the civil sovereign. Furthermore, Hobbes provides an extended interpretation of Biblical passages in part III and IV of Leviathan with the goal of showing that God’s word supports, or is consistent with, his philosophy. If the civil sovereign accepts and enforces Hobbes’s interpretation of the Holy Scriptures, it is argued, then the possibility of conflicting duties on the basis of religion will vanish. For this reason, Hobbes’s science of politics concludes that the sovereign power must be in charge of all doctrines and opinions in the commonwealth. If everyone accepts his political conclusions, Hobbes claims, then disagreement over political and religious matters would come to an end and peace would be firmly established in a commonwealth.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

References to Behemoth (B) are taken from The English Works of Thomas Hobbes of Malmesbury, ed. Sir William Molesworth, London: John Bohn, 1841, Vol. 6.

References to Leviathan (L) are taken from Leviathan, ed. C.B. Macpherson, Harmondsworth: Penguin Publishers, 1968.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Finn, S.J. (2007) Hobbes: A Guide for the Perplexed. London: Continuum Press.
  • Herbert, G. (1989), Thomas Hobbes: The Unity of Scientific and Moral Wisdom. Vancouver: University of British Columbia Press.
  • Kraynack, R. History and Modernity in the Thought of Thomas Hobbes. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
  • Lloyd, S.A. (1992), Ideals as Interests in Hobbes’s Leviathan: The Power of Mind over Matter. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Peters, R. (1956), Hobbes. Harmondsworth: Penguin Books.
  • Sommerville, J.P. (1992), Thomas Hobbes: Political Ideas in Historical Context. London: MacMillan.
  • Sorell, T. (1986), Hobbes. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.

Author Information

Stephen Finn
United States Military Academy
U. S. A.