Armed Humanitarian Intervention

Humanitarian intervention is a use of military force to address extraordinary suffering of people, such as genocide or similar, large-scale violation of basic of human rights, where people’s suffering results from their own government’s actions or failures to act.  These interventions are also called “armed interventions,” or “armed humanitarian interventions,” or “humanitarian wars. They are interventions to protect, defend, or rescue other people from gross abuse attributable to their own government.  The armed intervention is conducted without the consent of the offending nation. Those intervening militarily are one or more states, or international organizations.

The need to consider and understand the many issues involved in humanitarian interventions have been borne home by the fact that these interventions has become more complex and more common since the 1980s, and because of the consequences of non-intervention, such as in the Rwandan genocide of 1994, in which nearly one million people were killed in less than three months.  Humanitarian interventions raise many complex, inter-related issues of international law, international relations, political philosophy, and ethics.

This article considers moral issues of whether or when humanitarian intervention is justified, using just war theory as a framework. Section One addresses general characterizations of humanitarian interventions and commonly discussed cases, as well as some definitional or terminological issues. Section Two examines the question: What humanitarian emergencies rise to a level at which intervention is appropriate? Section Three presents just war theory as a common framework for justifying humanitarian interventions.    Section Four considers some other, related issues that may support or challenge armed interventions: international law, state sovereignty, the selectivity problem, political realism, post-colonialist and feminist critiques, and pacifism.

Table of Contents

  1. What is a Humanitarian Intervention?
  2. The Threshold Condition for Intervention
  3. Justifying Intervention: Just War Theory
    1. Justifying the Recourse to War (jus ad bellum) and Interventions
      1. Just Cause
      2. Right Intention and Right Authority
      3. Likelihood of Success, Last Resort, and Proportionality
    2. Justifying Conduct in War (jus in bello) and Justice after War (jus post bellum)
    3. Some Implications of Justifying Humanitarian Intervention
  4. Other Issues and Challenges
    1. International Law and Ethics
    2. State Sovereignty and Intervention
    3. The Problem of Selectivity
    4. Political Realism
    5. Post-Colonialism and Feminism
    6. Pacifism
  5. References and Further Reading

1. What is a Humanitarian Intervention?

The term ‘humanitarian intervention’ came into common use during the 1990s to describe the use of military force by states or international organizations in response to genocides, “ethnic cleansing,” and other horrors suffered by peoples at the hands of their own governments.  But cases of armed interventions are not new.  Several times during the nineteenth century European powers intervened militarily in various provinces of the Ottoman Empire to protect Christian enclaves from massacre or oppression (Bass). Following World War II there were many military interventions sometimes dubiously described as ‘humanitarian’, including by the United States in Latin America and France’s 1979 use of military force in its former colony, the Central African Republic.  Other cases remain notable foci of scholarly discussion:  India’s 1971 military intervention in East Pakistan, now Bangladesh; Vietnam’s 1979 intervention into Cambodia; and in the same year, Tanzania’s intervention into Uganda.  Later cases include uses of military force to protect Iraqi Kurds, and interventions in Somalia, Haiti, Liberia, and Sierra Leone, among many others.  The 1994 genocide in Rwanda focused attention on the consequences of failing to intgervening, because external military force was not deployed to prevent the killing of nearly 1 million people in just three months of violence.

Philosophic attention to humanitarian interventions is not new.  The seventeenth century jurist, Hugo Grotius, is credited with originating the modern conception of armed humanitarian intervention.  In his classic work of 1646, The Law of War and Peace, he includes an entire chapter, “On Undertaking War on Behalf of Others,” and writes:

If a tyrant … practices atrocities towards his subjects, which no just man can approve, the right of human social connection is not cut off in such a case …. It would not follow that others may not take up arms for them.

Some argue that the earlier “just war” tradition’s appeals to natural law, in effect, permitted humanitarian interventions.   Classic theorists like St. Augustine, Thomas Aquinas, and Vitoria saw a just war as aimed at the justice of punishing wrongdoing by other political leaders, which, some argue, would permit intervening against governments’ mistreating their own people (Johnson).  In the nineteenth century John Stuart Mill appealed to the importance of communal self-determination in providing consequentialist arguments limiting armed interventions.  In the early 21st century, Michael Walzer entertained armed interventions as justified responses to acts “that shock the moral conscience of mankind” (Just and Unjust Wars, 107).

A humanitarian intervention is a form of foreign interventionism using military force.  Consider this paradigm characterization of humanitarian interventions as:

the threat or use of force across state borders by a state (or group of states) aimed at preventing or ending widespread and grave violations of the fundamental human rights of individuals others than its own citizens, without the permission of the state within whose territory force is applied. (Holzgrefe, 18)

Humanitarian interventions are distinguished from other forms of interfering with another state’s activities, such as humanitarian aid, sanctions of various kinds, altering of diplomatic relationships, monitoring arms treaties or elections of human rights practices, and peace-keeping.  A humanitarian intervention does not require the consent of the target state: it is a form of coercion.  The government is deemed culpable in the suffering of others that is to be prevented or ended.  Those suffering and the target of the rescue effort are not nationals of the intervening states:  humanitarian interventions are, as Nicholas Wheeler puts it, about “saving strangers.”  Definitions are typically neutral as to whether the intervention is unilateral or multi-lateral and as to whether it is authorized (for example, by the United Nations) or unauthorized.  Finally, the interveners’ purpose is rescue, defense, or protection of those who are suffering due to their own government’s actions or failures. The purpose is not conquest, territorial control, support of insurrectionist or secessionist movements, regime change, or constitutional change of government.

Humanitarian intervention vary in terms of motivations of a state in using military force.  Some stricter definitions require a purity or primacy of intention in the use of armed force:  militarily addressing the suffering of others for reasons of national interest, then, by definition, are not humanitarian interventions.  Other definitions attend more to the effects of intervening than to motivations.  These definitional disputes involve evaluating actions on behalf of others.  The issue, then, may be more a matter of how much normative work is to be done by definition rather than by a separable ethical judgment of the actions themselves.  A deontologist like Kant or Aquinas, for example, might maintain that genuine instances of a morally worthy act require a purely humanitarian intention, while a utilitarian like Mill might insist that the motive matters not at all to what the act is or to the act’s morality, but only to our judgment of the actor. Such definitional issues also intersect with doctrines of political realism as explanation of states’ behavior (In IEP, see “Political Realism” and “Interventionism” (sec 3b).).  If all state action is explained by national self-interest, typically understood in terms of national security, military or economic power, or material well-being, then, all states’ actions are necessarily motivated by self-interest, actions motivated solely or primarily by humanitarian considerations are precluded, and there are, by these stricter definitions, no genuine examples of humanitarian interventions (see IV.d below).

Another terminological consideration is reflected in the work of the 2001 International Commission on Intervention and State Sovereignty (ICISS), The Responsibility to Protect.  The Report title is a preferred term because it avoids militarizing what is a humanitarian action and it avoids the connoted approval of military action by labeling it ‘humanitarian’ (sec. 1.39-1.41).  Indeed, these semantic concerns are grounded ultimately in re-conceiving state sovereignty not as a right not to be transgressed by outsiders, but as a duty to protect the people of a state and, if needed, people of other states (sec. 1.35).  Many differences of definition about what constitutes a humanitarian intervention reflect varying views about the normative merits and justifications for using force to address the suffering of others at the hands of their own government.

2. The Threshold Condition for Intervention

Even proponents of humanitarian intervention advocate very limited circumstances where such uses of military force are justifiable.  In particular, proponents attempt to specify minimum, threshold conditions in terms of the severity, scale, and kinds of human suffering necessary (but not sufficient) to justify intervention.  For example, seeing interventions as rescues, Michael Walzer specifies situations of “massive violations of human rights” where “what is at stake is the bare survival or the minimal liberty” of a people (Just and Unjust Wars, 101).  The ICISS Report, The Responsibility to Protect, specifies a threshold condition in terms of “large scale loss of life, with genocidal intent or not,” or “large scale ‘ethnic cleansing’, … whether carried out by killing, forced expulsion, acts of terror or rape” (sec 4.19).  In a similar vein, Nicholas Wheeler speaks of supreme humanitarian emergencies, where there are “extraordinary acts of killing and brutality” beyond the “abuse of human rights that tragically occurs on a daily basis” and that are of a magnitude and severity that “the only hope of saving lives depends on outsiders coming to the rescue” (34).  Common among specifications of threshold conditions are requirements that the most basic of human rights are being violated, that the human suffering is widespread and systematic, and that the government bears some culpability for what is happening to its people.  Interventions, then, are justifiable only to address the most egregious violations; the threshold conditions in the target state must be those that, as Walzer put it, “shock the conscience of mankind.”

Specifications of threshold conditions raise several issues.  A specification of the conditions of suffering will be inherently vague. How many rights violations or how many horrors or how extraordinary must the violations be in order to satisfy the threshold condition for armed intervention?  A second issue involves the invoked notion of basic human rights.  It is commonly held in Western ethical literature that all human rights are equally important (See “Human Rights” in IEP).  Attention to violations of basic human rights, however, presupposes a hierarchy of such rights for all humans. Allen Buchanan, for example, includes significant civil and political rights as well as “the right to resources for subsistence” in a list of basic human rights (Justice, 129); in The Law of Peoples, John Rawls identifies “a special class of urgent rights” that includes ethnic groups’ right to “security from mass murder and genocide” (79).   Some have argued that negative rights (for example, not to be tortured, not to be raped, not to be killed) are more basic and more important than positive rights (for example, to basic welfare requirements of food, clothing, shelter), though, following Henry Shue’s analysis in Basic Rights (Princeton, 1980), not all accept such a distinction or hierarchy.  There are disagreements about the extent to which basic human rights are the rights of individuals or may include rights of collectives, or “group rights,” such as rights to collective self-determination, group survival, and cultural integrity.  International human rights law introduces yet other hierarchies which may be relevant. By international treaty the right not to be tortured is uniquely absolute; only a few human rights are not to be derogated even if the nation’s survival is at stake, while during declared public emergencies a state can set aside other human rights (International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights, Article 4.1-4.2); and the legal obligations of states to respect civil and political rights are much stronger than for social, economic, or cultural rights (cf. International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights, Article 2, and International Covenant on Social, Economic, and Cultural Rights, Article 2).

Government culpability must satisfy certain threshold conditions.  Human suffering and rights violations, even when widespread and systematic, may be perpetrated by the government itself, as, for example, during the Holocaust in Nazi Germany; the late 1970s “killing fields” of Cambodia’s Khmer Rouge regime; or 1990s “ethnic cleansings” conducted by the Bosnian Serbs in the former Yugoslavia.  Or government may be complicit, indirectly fostering human rights violations by providing funding, arms, or logistical support to private militias, by coordinating attacks on people through control of the communication infrastructure, or by inciting action through propaganda and other forms of media control. This was the case in the Rwandan genocide of 1994 and during the violent campaigns by the janjaweed in Darfur, Sudan, beginning about 2004.  Or state involvement may be more akin to negligence, incompetence, or inability to govern. In inept or failed states, the government does not maintain effective control of territory and people. This often leads to  widespread violations of human rights by non-state actors. Somalia was a “failed state” in 1990.  In much of the country, people lived in fear of armed militias while the central government could not assert effective control.   The United States intervened militarily. The government culpability necessary to satisfy threshold conditions can range from perpetrator to failed state.  Furthermore, situations often mask or complicate whether threshold conditions are satisfied.  Widespread and systemic human suffering often occurs amidst or accompanying domestic insurrections, counter-insurgency campaigns, revolutions, liberation efforts, partition or secession battles, or civil wars, for example.  In Darfur, the government of the Sudan claims to have been conducting a counter-insurgency campaign; the Bosnian War can be seen as part of a secession or partition battle; the Rwandan genocide occurred in the context of a civil war and struggle for power in the country.  The challenges here are both epistemic and conceptual. Satisfying threshold conditions of suffering may depend on the specific domestic contexts in which people and government find themselves.

Though most discussions of humanitarian interventions specify threshold conditions in terms of human rights violations, other kinds of characterizations of the relevant human suffering are used by others.  There are justificatory implications for these kinds of differences.  A characterization in terms of human rights readily suggests deontological justifications for armed interventions.   For any genuine right, others are bound by correlative duties.  Even if the primary correlative duty for human rights falls on a national government, some argue that the correlative duties of others include obligations to respect, protect, and enforce human rights whenever the primary duty-holder fails to do so (these are sometimes called “default duties”).  Thus, armed interventions are justified partially as discharging (default) duties correlated with the human rights that are being violated in the target state.  On the other hand, some see armed interventions as aimed at reducing human suffering, regardless of whether there are violations of specific human rights.  As mentioned above, the ICISS Report specifies “large scale loss of life” or “large scale ‘ethnic cleansing’.”  Such a characterization of threshold conditions suggests a direct consequentialism at work.  Some feminists have argued that social oppression of women constitutes threshold conditions for forceful interventions (Cudd).  Uses of armed force, of course, have costs for human suffering, too.  The idea is that sometimes the use of deadly force is justifiable to save lives and reduce total human suffering.

Another development relevant to interventions is the concept of human security.  The notion of multi-faceted security, then, applies not only to states (as in “national security”), but also to people.  The concept of human security is defined broadly both in terms of causes and kinds of human suffering.  For example, the ICISS Report, The Responsibility to Protect, describes the security of people as

their physical safety, their economic and social well-being, respect for their dignity and worth as human beings, and the protection of their human rights and fundamental freedoms. (sec. 2.21)

Furthermore, valuing human security requires addressing “threats to life, health, livelihood, personal safety and human dignity” without regard to the sources of these threats, whether governmental, man-made, or natural.  The United Nations Development Program has adopted a similarly broad definition.  With respect to threshold conditions for humanitarian interventions, using the broad concept of human security has some advantages.  It eliminates the need to establish target state culpability for its peoples’ suffering; and, in fact, often some government action or inaction at least partially explains even famines, and  the effects of droughts or earthquakes.  Determining whether threshold conditions are satisfied is also simpler without the need to apply specific legal or moral categories such as basic human rights or genocide.  Furthermore, it is argued, the concept calls attention to preventing humanitarian emergencies from emerging, instead of focusing so much on armed interventions as reactions to emergencies.  But the breadth and scope of the concept also is challenging for use as a threshold condition for humanitarian interventions.  Virtually any kind of widespread, systematic suffering or threat to people becomes a security issue possibly addressed by an armed intervention: many situations around the world thereby satisfy a requisite condition for justifiable intervention.  The concept’s breadth erases or postpones justifying priorities, both by states trying to address their own peoples’ needs and by states or organizations readying to rescue those not secure under their own governments.  As a threshold condition, the breadth of the concept of human security only make more common problems with properly selecting which of many humanitarian emergencies warrant others’ use of armed force to alleviate human suffering (see IV. C. below).  For these and other reasons, the concept of human security is not often invoked in articulating threshold conditions for interventions.

3. Justifying Intervention: Just War Theory

The satisfaction of specified threshold conditions and state culpability requirements are only necessary conditions for morally justifying humanitarian interventions.  There is a paradoxical quality in using deadly force to prevent or end violence against others.  How can it be that war is warranted in the name of saving lives? A common response employs the “domestic analogy,” seeing states as analogous to persons.  As matter of morality and legality, individuals have rights of defense that permit using deadly force as proportionate response to unavoidable, imminent threats to our own lives or to the lives of others, whether the endangered people are kin, akin, or strangers.  By analogy, then, states have not only rights of self-defense if attacked, but rights to use deadly force in defense of others.  A second analogy also sees states as persons.  Given that individuals, in some circumstances, ought to perform beneficent acts such as “interposing to protect the defenseless against ill usage” and “saving a fellow-creature’s life,” to use John Stuart Mill’s phrasing, so states sometimes are right to rescue others being poorly treated under their own government.  More direct arguments see a connection between taking universal human rights seriously and acting rightly with deadly force when this force is necessary to defend or protect those rights.  Direct consequentialist arguments appeal to the morality of preventing extraordinary suffering when possible, that is, if and when there is opportunity and capability that is not more costly in its effects on human lives than not acting with deadly force.  Thus, there need not be inconsistency or paradox in saving lives by using armed force, at least in some grave circumstances.

Discussions of whether humanitarian interventions are justified take seriously both the moral pull of extreme humanitarian emergencies that “shock the conscience of mankind” and a moral reticence about using deadly force even to save lives. Regardless of the kind of moral theory employed – direct or indirect utilitarianism, natural law principles, or correlative duties of human rights, for example – justifying an armed intervention involves addressing a host of questions:  Who or what has the authority to intervene? Is an intervention likely to succeed, or be worth the costs, on balance?  Are there not non-military measures available to address the human suffering?  What exactly is the purpose of the military action and how are armed forces to conduct themselves in defending, protecting, or rescuing others from their own government?  Such questions are, in fact, paralleled in the structure of just war theory, or jus bellum, and its traditional duality:  jus ad bellum, or the conditions requisite for justifiably going to war, and jus in bello, the principles governing proper conduct of war.  Just war theory—especially jus ad bellum—is the framework for making moral decisions about humanitarian interventions.  For example, in Saving Strangers, Nicholas Wheeler says “requirements that an intervention must meet… are derived from the Just War tradition” (33-34).  The 2001 ICISS Report, The Responsibility to Protect, summarizes “criteria for military intervention… under the following six headings:  right authority, just cause, right intention, last resort, proportional means and reasonable prospects” (sec. 4.15-4.16ff.).  Michael Walzer defends interventions in his classic work, Just and Unjust Wars, and again prominently in the Preface to the Third Edition of that book.  Many critics challenge the suitability, adaptations, and implications of just war theory for humanitarian interventions. So, proponents, opponents, and cautionary discussants employ just war theory in exploring the moral merits of humanitarian interventions.

There are additional reasons for relying on the jus bellum framework.  Humanitarian interventions resemble wars, are even sometimes referred to as “humanitarian wars.”  Military force is used in another nation’s territory in order to rescue, protect, or defend people.  The most basic moral question of modern just war theory is delineating what states are permitted to do through the use of military force to those outside their borders and for achieving what aims or purposes.  Second, the classic just war tradition includes attention to what are now called humanitarian interventions, at least as far as the cause and purpose of such military action.  Morally justifying humanitarian interventions, then, is often explored by interpreting, applying or adapting the standards for judging whether going to war is justified; receiving the most attention are issues of just cause and right authority for interventions.  Other major facets of just war theory and its tradition – jus in bello, and jus post bellum – are also employed, though less prominently, as there has been much less philosophic attention to the conduct of interventions or what follows the use of armed force to rescue, protect, or defend others.

a. Justifying the Recourse to War (jus ad bellum) and Interventions

The jus ad bellum framework of just war theory identifies about a half dozen considerations relevant to justifying the recourse to war.  All the ad bellum requirements must be satisfied for war to be justified.  So, the use of armed force for humanitarian purposes is justified only if all six ad bellum requirements are satisfied.  Three of these considerations – last resort, likelihood of success, and proportionality – are consequentialist requirements.  Proportionality, for example, requires that the benefits of military action are not overshadowed by the inevitable costs, destruction, and other negative effects.  Likelihood of success involves estimating the consequences of waging war, specifically, the probability that the war’s aims will be accomplished.  Last resort captures the idea that war is worth its effects only if non-military means are not available for success: recourse to war is justifiable only if alternative, pacific courses of action will not achieve the morally acceptable aims of war (tied to a “just cause”).  The other three jus ad bellum considerations – just cause, right authority, right intention – appear to be deontological, rooted in natural law, for example, human rights, or other normative, non-consequentialist principles.  Pivotal among jus ad bellum considerations is the notion of “just cause” for war.  Adapting the jus bellum framework to humanitarian interventions brings a mixture of deontological and consequentialist reasoning to the issues, with the satisfactions of threshold conditions – a “just cause” – being central to justifying the use of armed force to address human suffering.

i. Just Cause

In the just war tradition, just cause has long been among the basic considerations in determining whether the recourse to military force is justified.  St. Thomas Aquinas’s famous first articulation prominently includes “just cause” as a requirement, as do virtually all subsequent contributors to the tradition.  The idea is that certain circumstances rightly prompt and contribute significantly to a justification for a war.  Furthermore, the just war tradition, just war theory, and international law today acknowledge that armed attack by another justifies going to war: wars of reactive self-defense clearly satisfy the “just cause” requirement.  As applied to humanitarian interventions, then, the issue is whether a “just cause” includes defense of others, or as many state it, whether threshold conditions for intervention are a “just cause” for a state or states using armed force to rescue, protect, or defend other people.

Supporters of justifiable interventions call attention to features of the just war tradition.  As noted  in sec. I, Hugo Grotius explicitly acknowledges that a government’s subjects suffering atrocities permits others “take up arms for them.”  A dominant theme of the classic just war tradition is that punishable wrongs are a just cause for war, even if the intervening party has not been wronged.  James Turner Johnson, for example, suggests that traditional just war theory is not based on a presumption against war, but on a presumption against injustice:  a just war is not only a justified war, it is a war waged for justice.  The interpretative contention, then, is that only in the early 21st century has just war thinking come to be so restrictive about “just cause” as to allow only for wars of self-defense.

Aside from interpretations of the just war tradition, a number of fundamental issues are at stake in debates about the substantive content of the “just cause” requirement as it pertains to humanitarian interventions.  One matter deals with the kind of moral foundations presupposed for just war theory itself. Some appeal to transnational ethical norms about rights or duties, whether expressed as universal natural law principles about rights of defense or duties correlated with universal human rights.  So, sometimes also coupled with the “domestic analogy” between persons and states described above, the ethical arguments turn on whether there is a natural law duty to rescue or render aid, a (default) duty to enforce human rights, or a transnational right to defend others conjoined to the uncontroversial self-defense right of states.  Discussions often challenge the adequacy of the analogies: states seem much unlike individuals when it comes to ethical norms.  Also, legal positivists, especially, find the appeal to natural law more than suspect, and positive international law is explicit only about states’ right to self-defense (see section IV.A. below).  Others discuss the “just cause” requirement by invoking different conceptions of the world community.  At one extreme, the world community is inter-national, a community of nations or sovereign states relating to one another by mutual agreement with one another; an opposing conception thinks of a global ethical order of trans-national norms about people (that is, human rights).  In effect, some of the debate is couched in broad issues of how state-centered or people-centered the world ethical order is to be.

ii. Right Intention and Right Authority

Intention, or purpose, and authority have both been basic considerations in determining whether the recourse to military force is justified.  Aquinas’s first articulation of just war theory includes right intention and “right authority” as requirements.  Matters of intention, or purpose, have since not always been accorded independent status.  For example, Grotius does not list intention as a separate requirement for justly going to war, and later versions of just war theory often seem to conflate “right intention” and “just cause.” In the application of just war theory to humanitarian interventions, however, the “right intention” requirement figures prominently in many discussions.  As noted in sec. I, the issue emerges as a matter of definition, and some maintain purity of motive is essential to being a humanitarian intervention.  Others note that the classic just war tradition mostly excludes certain aims or purposes for going to war – “not out of greed or cruelty, but for the sake of peace, to restrain the evildoers and assist the good,” writes Aquinas.  So, the classic “right intention” requirement, it is argued, allows for a plurality of motives for waging war so long as excluded are such aims as conquest, territory, control of natural resources, and vengeance.  When applied to humanitarian interventions, then, use of military force satisfies the “right intention” requirement if, among a plurality of motives, a primary purpose is addressing the widespread and systematic human suffering (Wheeler, 37-40).

The classic just war tradition emphasizes issues about the locus of authority to deploy military force.  Modern just war theory typically presumes that states are the proper right authority.   The advent of non-state war-makers – terrorist organizations, liberation movements, insurgencies, and insurrections, for example – raises interesting questions for this jus ad bellum issue.  In applying the just war theory framework to humanitarian interventions, however, the “right authority” requirement is prominently discussed, often in the context of international law and institutions.  Under the United Nations Charter, except for wars of reactive self-defense, a state is explicitly permitted to employ military force against another only with Security Council authorization to “preserve international peace and security” (see IV.A. below).  For this and other reasons much discussion is devoted to whether interventions are justifiable when unauthorized by the United Nations (and thus, illegal).

There also are some ethical dimensions to “right authority” questions about humanitarian interventions.  In as much as impartiality is an ethical norm, there may be a strong presumption for only centrally authorized or multi-lateral interventions being justifiable.  In as much as speed of response to a supreme humanitarian emergency saves more lives and a single state can be more decisive, there is support for permitting unilateral and unauthorized interventions.  In as much as there are moral objections to the current, restrictive international law of force, states’ or international organizations’ unauthorized interventions may have some moral merit as a way of reforming the law or as a justified cost of promoting basic justice or protecting basic human rights.  In as much as the quality of the intervention is affected by characteristics of the intervening party – suitable military capability, quality command and control infrastructures, experience, a good human rights record – perhaps only certain states or organizations satisfy the “right authority” requirement for justifiable humanitarian interventions.

iii. Likelihood of Success, Last Resort, and Proportionality

Three additional jus ad bellum requirements also must be satisfied for a war to be justified.  As applied to justifying an armed intervention, then, using military force to address a humanitarian emergency must be likely to succeed.  As in just war theory, the principle of likely success presupposes a sufficiently clear understanding of “just cause” and “right intention.”  For humanitarian interventions, then, success is at least preventing or stopping the widespread violence and suffering that constitutes “just cause” and defines the purpose of the incursion.  If such success is not likely, then the intervention is not justified.  Aside from the inherent vagueness of the standard, estimating the likelihood of a successful intervention is complicated, a function of at least two general factors (among others): the military capabilities and effectiveness of the intervener, and the capabilities of the target state or other forces involved in the violence that constitutes “just cause.”  The latter can be further complicated by the need to estimate secondary effects: for example, whether an armed intervention may invoke target state allies’ military mobilization and responses, with looming possibilities of a larger conflict.  As even proponents of intervention admit, some interventions will not succeed and “some human beings simply cannot be rescued except at an unacceptable cost” (International Commission, sec. 4.41).  It also follows that inequality of military power among states is normatively significant.  A humanitarian intervention is not likely to succeed against large, powerful states, like China or Russia, while success is more likely for emergencies occurring in smaller, weaker nations; furthermore, large, militarily powerful states are more likely to be successful interveners than smaller, weaker nations or organizations.  Thus, inequalities of states’ military power create inequalities of immunity and vulnerability to justifiable armed interventions; and power differentials create inequalities of moral right, responsibility, or duty to intervene in response to human suffering around the world.

The last resort requirement expresses the general idea that war is worth its deadly, destructive effects only if every non-military alternative will not work to achieve the same ends  (that is, what counts as success, which is linked to “just cause” and “right intention”).  Though the general idea is more than plausible, specifying the “last resort” requirement precisely is controversial because one can almost always argue that not all non-military avenues have failed: more diplomacy or negotiation almost always seems possible.  Indeed, on a literal construal of the requirement, no war ever satisfies this jus ad bellum requirement.  On the other hand, in law and morality, reactive wars of self-defense are justified, even though non-military means of resolution, in fact, are not attempted after an armed attack occurs.  So, justifying a war as a last resort depends on at least two features of the specific situation: time, or urgency of action, and likelihood that non-military measures would succeed.

Supreme humanitarian emergencies often exhibit urgency akin to that of a state facing a surprise attack or invasion: if lives are to be saved and people to be rescued, there is not time for peaceful pressure, coercion, diplomacy, negotiation, sanctions, or boycotts to work effectively.  The Rwandan genocide of 1994 vividly illustrated this sort of urgency.  Aside from temporal considerations, intervening as a last resort involves assessing the likelihood of any non-military means being effective, but not necessarily actually implementing or trying all those means.  This leads to typically counterfactual formulations of the “last resort” requirement, as illustrated by the ICISS Report, The Responsibility to Protect.

[Last Resort] … does not necessarily mean that every [non-military] option must literally have been tried and failed…. But it does mean that there must be reasonable grounds for believing that … if the measure had been attempted it would not have succeeded. (sec. 4.37)

This way of proceeding points to a second temporal feature of war as last resort.  Some opponents of intervention bemoan the lack of infrastructure, for example, that would enrich and support effective, non-military means of defending and protecting basic human rights.  The idea is that more could have been done to prevent horrors and to be ready to react non-militarily when emergencies do emerge.  An issue here, then, is the time framework for constructing possible means of addressing the emergency.  A circumscribed last resort principle requires assessing the effectiveness of those means available at the time of the emergency, however rich or limited they may be.  A broader last resort principle seems to deny armed force is a last resort if more could have been done in the past to enrich the availability of effective non-military means today.  This broader construal, however, seems to conflate a call to build better prevention mechanisms with assessing military and non-military options available when supreme humanitarian emergencies actually occur and decisions have to be made.

The jus ad bellum proportionality requirement is often labeled “(macro-)proportionality,” to distinguish it from the in bello proportionality, or (micro-)proportionality principle.  The ad bellum principle addresses the general concern that the deaths, destruction, and other negative effects of war must be balanced by its benefits (that is, success).  In considering war’s effects the proportionality principle precludes excessive partiality.  So, a war’s effects on everyone are to be counted – civilians and combatants, whether friend or foe or neutrals civilians.  All death, injury, and destruction are to be considered, and relevant effects must not be limited to one’s own national interest and do include the international community.  This breadth of considerations brings to the fore difficult matters of the commensurablity of values and, as for any consequentialist argument, epistemic challenges related to the causal impacts of action.  Yet some rough estimates of wars’ costs and benefits can be and have been plausibly made.  But a few thousand armed soldiers quickly deployed to Rwanda in April, 1994, would likely have saved many, many lives, whereas militarily stopping the suffering of Chechnyans or Tibetans would very likely bring exorbitant costs in death and destruction.  In other cases the benefits of an armed intervention includes rescues of suffering peoples, a cost might be significant eroding of the stability and order of a system of states on the planet.  The idea is that vigilante justice by state militaries has costs to the international system’s order, stability, and peace, costs that are not balanced adequately by the reduced suffering of people in a particular nation or region.  Michael Walzer, like other just war theorists, concludes that the proportionality requirement “… is a gross truth, and while it will do some work in [some] cases …, it isn’t going to make for useful discriminations in the greater number of cases” (Arguing 90).   Contributing to the challenges for the proportionality requirements are controversies about its structure: for example, whether an adequate macro-proportionality requires minimizing the bad effects, maximizing the net benefits, or minimizing the balance of benefits over bad effects.  Applied to justifying armed interventions, then, the macro-proportionality requirement speaks to a central concern, but cannot reliably discriminate finely among many humanitarian emergencies that arise.

b. Justifying Conduct in War (jus in bellum) and Justice after War (jus post bellum)

The general idea of proportionality is one that links the traditional division of just war theory into jus ad bellum and jus in bello principles.  The latter just war requirements govern how a war is to be conducted:  proportional means are to be used, and non-combatants are to be distinguished from combatants in waging war.  Given the just war theory framework for justifying humanitarian interventions, these in bello considerations are relevant and applicable to uses of military force to address humanitarian emergencies.  If an armed intervention is be a (fully) just war, then, the rules of engagement (ROEs) need to reflect both in bello principles. These principles raise many issues for just war theory and some challenging ones for the morality of interventions.

The in bello micro-proportionality requirement governs military operations during a war.  The general idea is to minimize the armed force used, and destruction caused, in order to attain a militarily necessary objective.  But unlike the ad bellum the macro-proportionality requirement, in assessing the effects of a military operation, it matters much who benefits or suffers.  First, combatant and non-combatants are to be distinguished.  This is the in bello principle of discrimination.  As Michael Walzer expresses it, the general idea is that wars are waged between combatants: non-combatants “are not currently engaged in the business of war” and thereby are “outside the permissible range of warfare” and carry an “immunity from attack” very much unlike combatants.  Though being more specific about the distinguishing criteria or about the permissibility of some non-combatant casualties (that is, as “collateral damage”) is controversial and complicated (See much of Walzer’s Just and Unjust Wars, for example), in estimating the consequences of a military operation in war, one is to count much more any ill effects on non-combatants: who suffers matters much.  Second, in war and interventions it is permissible to count more the costs to one’s own forces than losses to opposing combatants.  The notion of “force protection” becomes morally acceptable, at least within some limits: the conduct of the war is justifiable even if operations distribute risks more to opponents’ forces than to one’s own forces, provided there are “no more casualties than necessary inflicted on the other side.” But third, those force protection limits for intervening forces can become problematic. As illustrated by the Kosovo intervention of the 1990s, high altitude bombing effectively reduces the interveners’ losses while also increasing the costs to non-combatants on the ground.  How much “collateral damage” to non-combatants (and non-military property) is morally permissible in order to reduce risks to one’s own forces?  How much death and damage to opponents’ military force is not excessive and is morally permissible in order to achieve humanitarian ends?

The traditional in bello requirements of just war theory leads to challenges for this approach to the morality of humanitarian interventions.  George Lucas, for example, argues that “the use of military force in humanitarian cases is far closer to the use of force in domestic law enforcement” than it is to waging war.  Interveners are there to protect and defend, akin to the mission of a police force.  Seeing this more constabulary role of intervening forces entails that “international military ‘police-like’ forces (like actual police forces) must incur considerable additional risk, even from suspected guilty parties,” while, like domestic police forces, “refrain from excessive collateral damage, … the deliberate targeting of non-combatants, … [and] engaging in violation of the law.”  These are “far more stringent restrictions in certain respects than traditional jus in bello” requirements.  Indeed, these stringent restrictions apply even if interventions are seen as “saving strangers” and the mission seen as a rescue.  Thus, Lucas concludes, “the attempt to assimilate or subsume humanitarian uses of military force under traditional just war criteria fails.”  Interventions “are sufficiently unique as to demand their own form of justification, … jus in pace, or jus in intervention,” and specific, substantive requirements for interventions are proposed in a structure parallel to the traditional just war framework of jus ad bellum and jus in bello principles.

A third major facet of just war theory, jus post bellum – literally “after war” – is also sometimes a framework for examining the morality of humanitarian interventions. The 18th century work of Immanuel Kant, in Perpetual Peace and elsewhere, is often credited with originating the notion of jus post bellum, though Vitoria and Suarez both earlier distinguish this facet of just war theory.  The roots of the notion are embedded in the classic “right intention” requirement that the aim of justifiable war is to be peace.  How one ends a war – even a just one – affects whether peace will follow, for how long, and the structure of the peace that will or should be.  For example, is a just end of war establishment of the status quo ante bellum, which is perhaps plausible for wars of self-defense against an invasion? Or ought a war end by establishing “peace with justice?” And what might such justice require – unconditional surrender, reparations, repatriations, disarmament, punishment of perpetrators, structural adjustments in the distributions of land or wealth, establishment of democracy, restorations of relationships?  In international law and among just war theorists, this third major component of just war theory has received comparatively little attention. (One important exception is the work of Brian Orend.) Jus post bellum issues are important to the morality of humanitarian interventions. As C.A.J. Coady cautions, considering interventions requires specifying not only from what it is people are to be rescued, but also for what it is that they are rescued (in Chatterjee & Scheid, 291).

Jus post bellum considerations lead to tensions and challenges for thinking about the purposes and morality of humanitarian interventions.  For example, given the nature of supreme humanitarian emergencies, stopping the violence leaves a great need for extremely difficult reconciliation processes, a facet of rebuilding a functioning social order.  In addition, to prevent recurring violence the root causes may need to be identified and addressed, which likely involves major changes in a society’s basic structure and institutions.  Perhaps justice requires some punitive action towards perpetrators and accomplices, whether heads of state, government officials, or local militia leaders and private citizens.  Arrests, war crimes trials, truth commissions, and the like may be warranted for what is sometimes called “transitional justice.”  A concern is that seeking retributive justice can counter needs for reconciliation and matters of restorative justice, as can redistributions of wealth, land or political power to address root causes of the violence (Govier, Orend).  The ICISS Report, The Responsibility to Protect, identifies such issues as elements of “the responsibility to rebuild.”  A long-term aim of genuine peace, then, generates complex questions of how such peace relates to other important aims, such as justice.

These kinds of post bellum considerations effectively broaden and perhaps challenge just war thinking about the morality of humanitarian interventions.  For example, if the ad bellum success requirement is more than rescuing, defending, or protecting victims, but also includes justice (retributive, distributive, restorative) or rebuilding, then the challenges of success are much greater, the likelihood of success is much less, the capabilities for success (including political will) are rarely available.  It would follow that virtually no interventions are justifiable by just war standards:  more often many more people will be beyond rescue than what follows from narrower understandings of what a successful intervention entails.  Second, these broadening, post bellum considerations challenge the very conception of interventions as rescues, as “saving strangers.”  It makes interventions perhaps more akin to a police action, with attention to arrest and enforcement, or more like a mission to establish peace with justice, or more like a complex, long-term humanitarian aid program of which one significant dimension is the use of armed force.  On the other hand, one can look at the responsibility to rebuild or seek justice post bellum as a distinct phase following the humanitarian intervention proper.  A fully just use of military force – even seen as rescue, protection, or defense – may require that some organization or states address post bellum issues and rebuilding once the violence is ended, but those needs need not be addressed by the interveners themselves.  Just war thinking then requires that interveners use military force with consideration of post bellum requirements, but the post-intervention missions need not be the action of the rescuer themselves.  Some such distribution of responsibilities may be, for example, what is envisioned by the ICISS Report, The Responsibility to Protect.

c. Some Implications of Justifying Humanitarian Intervention

Just war theory, in its entirety, articulates appropriately high standards for morally judging war and for justifying humanitarian interventions.   Even the ad bellum standards more frequently addressed are not all easily satisfied (a point sometimes insufficiently appreciated due to the excessive focus on threshold conditions, or “just cause”).  There are some significant implications of the just war framework for assessing the moral justifications for humanitarian interventions.  There are, for example, daunting epistemic issues in establishing that threshold conditions are satisfied or in assessing the complex consequences of an intervention.  The latter is only aggravated by the near certainty of unintended consequences for military campaigns and by the frequent situation of estimating effects of using armed force in foreign lands and cultures.  As already noted, given the inequalities of military capability among states that affect interveners’ likelihood of success, just war thinking leaves some nations much more vulnerable to interventions for mistreating their own people, while other states can violate human rights with impunity from others’ use of military force to stop the violence.  The same inequalities of capability result in an unequal distribution of the right or responsibility to intervene militarily on humanitarian grounds, with all the attendant costs of such interventions.

There is a basic deontic category issue in exploring the moral merits of humanitarian interventions via just war theory.  Is a justified war a matter of a right, responsibility, or duty?  And what kind of right or duty is signaled by establishing that a war is justified?  Parallel questions then apply to justified humanitarian interventions:  are they a matter of a right to use armed force, or a responsibility or duty of some kind?  What kind of right or duty, then?  Addressing such questions from a just war framework intersects with varying conceptions or analogies employed in discussing interventions.  For example, one might consider interventions in defense of others as a right associated with rights of self-defense.  Associated with individuals’ right of self-defense is a right to use deadly force in defense of others.  In parallel fashion, then, associated with states’ right to wage wars of self-defense would be a right to use military force in defense of others.  Such a right of defense – of self or of others – is one that the right-holder chooses whether to exercise or not: just as there is no duty to fight in self-defense, then, there is no duty to use deadly force in defense of others.  Humanitarian interventions, then, are a matter of moral right, not duty or obligation; and they are what are called liberty-rights or discretionary rights of intervention.  In as much as jus ad bellum principles identify when there is such a right to wage war, then they can be used to identify when there is a moral right to intervene militarily for humanitarian purposes.

In contrast, armed interventions are often portrayed in ways suggesting there is a duty to use military force to address humanitarian emergencies.  A common conception is the notion of interventions as rescuing others.  The “rescue” metaphor suggests using military force is an imperfect duty of individual beneficence or charity, of rendering aid to strangers facing life-threatening situations, or what are sometimes called “Good Samaritan” duties.   Such imperfect duties are not correlated with others having a right to be rescued, and wide discretion is accorded the obligated as to when, where, and how to discharge the duty.  As we have seen, though, the “Good Samaritan” analogy may be a strained one, at best:  states or international organizations’ interventions are not relevantly or sufficiently akin to that of “saving strangers” as if a tragic accident had befallen them.  It has also been suggested that interveners are more akin to a police force, which suggests that justified interventions are discharging a duty to protect and defend others in grave danger.  A humanitarian intervention, it would seem, is justified under conditions analogous to those for domestically dispatching S.W.A.T. teams.  A challenge for either of these conceptions of interventions – as rescue or as constabulary – is a dissonance between a moral duty to use military force for humanitarian purposes and the kind of moral justification for waging war the jus ad bellum principles provide.  Does just war theory establish a moral duty to wage war?  If not, how can jus ad bellum principles ever support a duty to intervene militarily? To speak of a moral duty to wage war is today not obviously plausible.  The notion of a duty to wage war may be consistent with some classic contributors to the just war tradition, such as Aquinas. Late 20th century theorists, like Michael Walzer, argue that sometimes there is a duty literally to combat evil.  But the idea that just war theory establishes duties to wage some wars is controversial and defended by some for only quite unusual circumstances, of which, of course, a supreme humanitarian emergency may be one.  As some have argued, jus bellum can establish at most the moral permissibility or right of intervening; additional considerations are needed to establish humanitarian interventions as morally obligatory.

Other proponents of humanitarian interventions argue for a duty to intervene based on taking human rights seriously, as a duty correlated with people’s basic human rights not to be tortured or killed arbitrarily.  The general idea is that, as moral claim-rights held by all, human rights entail everyone has a duty to protect and promote the human rights of everyone else (See IEP article, “Human Rights,” sec 3).   One form of the argument is that, as a matter of international law, practice, and practicality, these correlative obligations fall largely upon national governments and international organizations (for example, the United Nations).  Others argue more forcefully that the logic of basic human rights establishes correlative duties to respect, protect, and defend.  In Basic Rights (Princeton, 1980), Henry Shue famously argues that a basic right such as the right not be killed arbitrarily entails not only duties not to kill, but duties to protect or enforce the right: a negative right such as the right not to be killed arbitrarily requires positive action by others (as do positive rights to subsistence).  Furthermore, Shue argues later, if and when the primary holder of the correlative duties (that is, the state) fails to meet its obligations, then the duty to protect and defend human rights defaults to others.  Thus, humanitarian interventions are justifiable as discharging a (default) duty to protect and defend basic human rights not being respected by the target state.  At least in its conclusion, the ICISS Report, The Responsibility to Protect, advances a similar view about interventions.  Another, related argument to support a duty to intervene derives from theories of global distributive justice.  For example, Allen Buchanan argues that a natural duty of justice obligates all to do what we can “to help create structures that provide all persons with access to just institutions, … where this means primarily institutions that protect human rights” (Justice, 85ff.).  Arguments appealing to rights and correlativity relations are not uncontroversial.  For those who distinguish positive and negative rights, for example, the correlative duty for a right to life is simply and only not to kill.  Thus, so long as a state or international organization is not the perpetrator of atrocities against its own people, it would seem that correlative obligations have been satisfied without coming close to establishing military intervention as a duty.  An issue in the background is what one takes to be the model for understanding human rights and the extent to which duties of respect and protection correlate with those rights and for whom or what.

4. Other Issues and Challenges

Just war theory has been the most prominent framework for philosophic discussion of the morality of humanitarian interventions.  Other relevant approaches include attention to international law and its ethical implications and an issue central to political philosophy, the concept of state sovereignty.  Among the most powerful and prominent objections to interventions are those based on state sovereignty and on what is called “the selectivity problem.”  Some alternative frameworks for considering humanitarian interventions are actually challenges to just war theory itself.  Political realisms deny the applicability of moral norms to state behavior, including uses of military force.  Pacifism typically denies the premise of just war theory, namely, that some wars are morally justifiable, even if waged for humanitarian purposes.

a. International Law and Ethics

Much discussion of humanitarian interventions involves legal issues under the Charter of the United Nations, the central and paramount text of the international law of force.  Philosophers of law have accorded relatively little attention to international law.  Questions about the legality of interventions, however, exhibit significant philosophic and ethical dimensions, even setting aside here many matters of analytic jurisprudence and whether international law constitutes a genuine legal system, whether there is such a thing as international law at all (See IEP article, “Philosophy of Law”).  Attending to the international law of force and human rights involves issues of interpretation, sources of law, ethics of acting illegally and reform, as well as the extent to which states or people ought to be at the center of the system.

At the center of the international law about interventions are explicit provisions of the United Nations Charter and human rights treaties.  Proclaiming “the sovereign equality of all states,” the Charter permits states to use armed force only in self-defense, prohibits states’  “threat or use of force against the territorial integrity or political independence of any state,” prohibits intervening “in matters which are essentially within the domestic jurisdiction of any state,” and allows the Security Council to authorize uses of armed force only if domestic strife or brutalities also constitute “threats to international peace and security”  (Articles 2.1, 51,  2.4, 2.7, and 39, respectively).  The text seems unequivocally clear:  unauthorized humanitarian interventions are illegal.  And since humanitarian emergencies typically do not threaten international peace and security, the text permits authorizing few, if any, interventions.  Furthermore, the nine core human rights treaties and the 1948 Universal Declaration of Human Rights explicitly require only that each state respect, protect, and enforce the provisions listed, such as rights to life.  The 1948 Genocide Convention requires that signatories “prevent and punish” the “crime of genocide,” but the only explicitly permissible means is via “the competent organs of the United Nations.”  The 1998 International Criminal Court statute (called the “Rome statute”) makes its authority largely dependent upon and only complementary to individual states’ enforcements.  Human rights, for example, may be transnational norms, but international law makes the respect, defense, and protection of those rights almost exclusively a domestic matter for each state.  So, to promote international peace and security, inter-state uses of armed force are severely limited by law, even when domestic violence against people may be widespread and systematic.

There are ethical dimensions to the system of international law as it relates to interventions. The United Nations Charter has been accepted by consent of all and each members of the United Nations – virtually every state on the planet.  State consent is among the established procedures for creating international law and consent creates compliance obligations for states.  Legal positivists hold that there are (ethical) obligations to obey laws enacted according to established procedures (See IEP article, “Legal Positivism”).  So, for positivists, it follows that states and international organizations ought to obey the law and therefore ought not conduct unauthorized humanitarian interventions.  Though each state ought to respect, protect, and enforce human rights, relevant international law texts do not provide a legal basis for unauthorized or for authorizing interventions, even as a way to stop a state’s violating its own treaty obligations by mistreating its own people.   Legal positivists maintain that there are legal and moral obligations not to interfere militarily with the domestic affairs of states, even in the face of a humanitarian emergency.

Challenges to this line of reasoning take several forms.  First, some legal scholars quite carefully parse the specific Charter texts in ways consistent with humanitarian interventions being permitted.  For example, Article 2(4) does not prohibit all uses of military force, but only those aimed at the independence or territory of another state.  Legally permissible, then, would be any humanitarian interventions having neither those aims nor those effects.  Disagreements about interpretation raise philosophic issues about how best or properly to interpret legal texts.  Some dispute such textual parsing as ignoring the original intent of the language.  Others deny that original intent is probative, granting a more significant role for contemporary attitudes, beliefs, and norms about interventions, or appealing to a political morality implicit in legal texts and their interpretive history.  A second area of disagreement about legalities attends to considerations of non-textual sources of law, or what is called “customary international law.”  Analogous to common law in domestic legal systems, general state practice accepted as law is evidence of a rule of customary international law (Article 38(I), Statute of the International Court of Justice).  Some argue that long-standing state practice has established a customary right of humanitarian intervention; others deny this claim of fact about state practice, or assert that the written law of the Charter supersedes any putative customary rule.  In effect, there is much controversy about what H. L. A. Hart famously has called “a rule of recognition” for the system of international law, especially customary law.  One final issue deals with the ethics of acting illegally.  At the heart of creating customary law about interventions is establishing a state practice of intervening.  This requires that states begin creating a custom by acting in ways neither required nor permitted by international law at the time: legality is created over time only by a process initially requiring illegal actions.  Given sufficient moral grounds for reforms to permit humanitarian interventions, then, a moral argument can be made for illegally intervening now to address emergencies and thereby contribute to reforming international law.  Unauthorized humanitarian interventions then can be seen as a kind of international civil disobedience by states or international organizations.

b. State Sovereignty and Intervention

State sovereignty is a major issue for humanitarian interventions, whether as source of opposition or of significant challenge for proponents.  For centuries the general idea has been that a sovereign state has supreme authority over its territory, its people, and its relation with other states; and so, other states or organizations are not to interfere with exercises of that supreme authority.  Matters of sovereignty have been central to political philosophy, international relations, international law, and the institutions and practices constitutive of the modern world order.  Prima facie humanitarian interventions challenge state sovereignty and the international system of non-interference in states’ domestic authority.  The literature is vast, the issues complex, the notion of sovereignty contentious and controversial to the core.

The 16th century French thinker, Jean Bodin, in his Six Books of the Commonwealth (1576), is credited with coining the term ‘sovereignty’ to denote a state’s supremacy of authority within a territory and population.  Subsequent political philosophers, like Locke, Hobbes, Rousseau, and the utilitarians, have focused much on the source, locus, and limits of sovereignty within a state, while merely acknowledging an accompanying externally directed authority to make war, peace, alliances, and treaties with other powers.  The idea of sovereignty as independence from others’ interference is tied originally to the 1648 Treaty (or Peace) of Westphalia and develops into a strong principle of non-interference during the 19th century.  Simply stated, then, state sovereignty involves supremacy and independence of authority with respect to internal matters and with respect to relationships with other powers, including the absence of non-consensual interference by other sovereign states or other organizations.  The “Westphalian system” is an order of mutually independent states excluded from interfering in one another’s domestic affairs.

Whether authority is seen as effective control or as a right, the merits of sovereignty as independence are mixed.  For example, state sovereignty can express and protect a people’s collective right of self-determination in matters political, social, and cultural.  A plurality of independent sovereign states accords appropriate diversities among peoples of the earth; a system of non-interference promotes an international stability and order.  The sovereignty of states is sometimes portrayed as akin to that of individual persons, coupling autonomy rights over their own life, independence from external control, and mutual, reciprocal duties not to interfere with others.  Also, state sovereignty is long embedded in international law.  As mentioned above, the United Nations Charter, for example, asserts the equality, independence, and freedom from external interventions in states’ domestic affairs.  In contrast, it is argued, taken too far, sovereignty precludes any international law at all, since supremacy and independence is reduced by any transnational legal rules limiting war or breach of treaties, for example.  Similar reasoning leads to concerns that sovereignty precludes appeals to transnational moral norms, such as, for example, natural law duties or universal human rights.  Some argue that state sovereignty is not limited by, but literally constituted by international law:  there is no sovereignty outside the legal system that constructs it and, thus, the contours of state authority change as the content of international law changes.  For example, current international law prohibiting torture, genocide, or disregard for basic human rights effectively redefines the scope of authority accorded states: such acts are not expressions of sovereignty, but abuses.

An often neglected line of argument shows that states themselves express their sovereignty sometimes in order to limit the scope of their own sovereignty – what S.I. Benn long ago called “auto-limitation.”   Robert Keohane makes the same point:  “…[S]overeignty is quite consistent with specific restraints.  Indeed, a key attribute of sovereignty is the ability to enter into international agreements that constrain a state’s legal freedom of action” (in Holzgrefe, 283-284).  On almost any account, state sovereignty includes the right to enter into treaties, just as personal autonomy rights can be expressed by making promises or signing contracts that obligate, bind, and limit future actions.  If states have freely chosen to sign human rights treaties, for example, or the Genocide Convention, or the United Nations Charter, then, through that expression of their sovereign authority, they have limited what is within their authority later, for example, committing genocide, waging aggressive war, disregarding the outcomes of established procedures or processes.  Then states involved in humanitarian emergencies are abusing, not exercising the sovereign authority they chose to limit.  Though more controversial and problematic, such “auto-limitation” may also apply to outcomes of procedures yet to be implemented.  So, for example, since provisions of the Charter allow for humanitarian interventions by Security Council authorization, any member state’s sovereignty is not violated by duly authorized outsiders using armed force to rescue, defend, or protect that state’s people from abuse.

Discussions of humanitarian intervention have led to alternative ways of thinking about state sovereignty.  One line of thinking makes sovereignty of a state conditional and contingent (Holder, 89-96).  A state has genuine sovereignty only if it meets minimal moral requirements, such as effective control in maintaining order and security, or avoiding egregious mistreatment of its people, or, less minimally, reflects the political will of the people themselves.  So, failed or grossly abusive states, for example, have no sovereignty and, thus, an otherwise justified humanitarian intervention does not violate the target state’s sovereignty. Robert Keohane has proposed that sovereignty rights need to be seen as separable, so that a state, based on certain criteria, retains some kinds of authority while losing others.  Sovereignty rights can be “unbundled”  and they admit of gradations.  So, exclusion of external control over territory may be an authority lost by a state, but that same state may continue to have some limited domestic authority at the same time.  Third, is a proposal to see sovereignty as states’ responsibility, a kind of duty to protect all people’s human rights.  As described in The Responsibility to Protect, states failing to protect their own citizens’ rights temporarily forfeit sovereignty rights, others’ duties of non-interference are suspended, and then other states or organizations assume the responsibility to protect persons by intervening, perhaps even militarily.  That sovereignty includes domestic duties to respect and protect peoples’ rights is a feature of classic social contract theories of state authority, such as by Locke, Kant, or even Hobbes.  The proposal, though, controversially maintains that each state’s sovereignty includes a responsibility to protect not only the rights of its citizens, but the rights of aliens in other lands, a responsibility of “saving strangers.”  These alternative approaches all depart from the letter of international law about qualifying for state sovereignty.  They are an extension of a greater emphasis on human rights as transnational moral norms.  Alternative, normative understandings of the modern state show that, under certain conditions, humanitarian interventions are not violations of sovereignty at all.

c. The Problem of Selectivity

Among the most common objections to humanitarian interventions is “the vexed issue of selectivity.”  The concern is that states or international organizations choose to intervene militarily in only some humanitarian emergencies: only some sufferings are selected for forceful action by outsiders.  Some critics, such as Noam Chomsky (The New Military Humanism, 1999), see selectivity as undermining any and all moral merit to military interventions to protect basic human rights.  If humanitarianism is the issue, why intervene here and not there?  How does it come about that armed interventions take place in one crisis but not in another?  How can it be morally acceptable that, though there are many emergencies warranting others’ forceful response, only some situations are selected for armed interventions and only some people’s basic human rights are defended by others’ military force?

The objection is sometimes seen in terms of ethical consistency:  among all those situations where a humanitarian intervention is morally justifiable, in only some of those cases is an intervention conducted.  It would appear that like cases are not being treated alike.  The implicit appeal is to the universalizability of genuine moral judgments. But a lack of clarity or precision often cloaks the objection.  Sufficient sufferings by people – threshold conditions – are only one feature of similarity between cases, and appeals to similarities of sufferings do not alone make the compared cases morally justified.  There are other necessary conditions to justifying an intervention (for example, likelihood of success) and sometimes those are not met in the cases being compared.  The selectivity problem arises only when one or more situations satisfy all the requirements for justifying uses of armed force.  Second, interventions being morally justified is not inconsistent with only some interventions taking place.  If being morally justified means there is a right to intervene, then, as with most rights, the right-holder can choose whether to exercise the right or not, whether to actually intervene or not.  If being morally justified means there is an imperfect duty to rescue, then, as an imperfect duty, the obligated parties can choose when and where to discharge the duty.  Third, understood as ethical inconsistency, selectivity seems hardly sufficient reason to reject all humanitarian interventions as unjustified.  The moral flaw of inconsistency does not require doing nothing: because one cannot or does not do everything morally justified on similar grounds, it does not follow one ought not ever do what is morally right.

A second version of the objection points to the substantive criteria by which interventions are selectively conducted, and there is something right about this form of the objection.  It is problematic if, among an array of justifiable interventions, states select only some situations for intervening based on morally suspect criteria, such as regional bias or media attention (what is called “the CNN effect”).  For example, in the 1990s military force was employed in the Balkans for humanitarian purposes, but not in Rwanda.  Assuming both situations warranted intervention, the issue, then, is not only ethical inconsistency, but suspicions about the ethical acceptability of the substantive criteria for selective action.  So, for example, if there is moral right to intervene, is it not morally problematic if the right-holder chooses whether to intervene based on the race or region of those people suffering? If there is even an imperfect duty to intervene, is it not morally problematic to select those to be rescued based on whether they are European or Christian, or based on the extent and kind of media coverage provided?  This version of the selectivity problem has merit in calling for diligence, discipline, and care in choosing how to exercise rights or discharge duties.  It is not clear this version of the selectivity problem is sufficient reason to oppose all humanitarian interventions, unless the reliance on morally suspect criteria is pervasive or even unavoidable.  And that leads to a third and the strongest version of the selectivity problem for humanitarian interventions.

The claim is that states selectively intervene based on national self-interest, not based on humanitarian need or warrant.  Though seldom distinguished by critics of interventions, a weaker version of the objection is that, among morally justified interventions, states choose to intervene in those situations that serve their national interest.  A kind of national prudence supervenes on the array of morally permissible interventions.  It is not obvious that this is problematic for states any more than it is for individuals who invoke principles of prudence to choose among morally permissible possibilities.  And it does not seem sufficient to reject humanitarian interventions as unjustified, even if, in fact, all states do combine moral and prudential consideration in selecting sites for intervention.  A stronger version of the objection, however, reflects concerns about imperialistic ambitions or hegemonies of intervening parties.  One can see this objection as a skepticism about what genuinely drives states’ decision about whether to intervene or not.  The selectivity objection, then, is not so much concerned about moral flaws or inconsistency, but relies on the inescapable role of national self interest in deciding whether to intervene.  Seen this way, the objection reflects political realism as an alternative framework for considering the international arena, including states and humanitarian interventions.

d. Political Realism

Political realism takes many forms, none of which support independent ethical norms as relevant to international relations, including states’ uses of armed force or war (See IEP article, “Political Realism”).  Strong forms of descriptive realism maintain that all state action is in pursuit of national self-interest, typically understood in terms of national security, military or economic power, or material well-being.  If all states’ actions are, in fact, motivated by self-interest, then state actions motivated solely or primarily by humanitarian considerations are not possible or morally justifiable.  Such a strong form of descriptive political realism, however, is a dubious empirical generalization about international relations and about the scope and stability of what constitutes national interest.  There are examples of states’ cooperating, of states sometimes acting on moral grounds, of states sometimes acting contrary to their national interest, or of states changing what constitutes their national interest (Buchanan and Golove, 873-874).  Prescriptive political realism maintains that states should pursue their own national interests in the international arena: it advocates a norm of prudence, of pursuing self-interest, but not of morality, as properly governing state behavior.  According to realisms, then, uses of armed force in defense of others’ human rights sometimes occur because it is in the national interest of the interveners.  An example might be an intervention conducted in a bordering state, due to the national security interests threatened by having an inept or failed state as neighbor (for example, refugees and interruptions of oil or water supplies).  The justifications for intervening, if any, are not moral principles, but appeals to promoting the intervener’s national interests, which is, the realist maintains, the way states do or should act.

Political realists’ amoralism about states’ actions typically correlates with a model of the international arena as analogous to Hobbes’s state of nature (See IEP article, “Social Contract Theory” and “Thomas Hobbes: Moral and Political Philosophy”):

  • There is no global power, no supreme power to enforce cooperation and peace;
  • there is relative equality of power among states;
  • each state should pursue its self-interest, by any feasible means, including by anticipatory domination of other states when possible;
  • and there is no morality applicable amidst pervasive mutual assurance problems.

In contrast, supporters of just war theory, universal human rights, and morally justified humanitarian interventions typically see the international arena as more analogous to Locke’s state of nature (See IEP article “John Locke: Political Philosophy”).  There exist transnational moral norms (for example, of human rights, justice) that bind states and organizations in their relations to one another, including perhaps an international analogue to the Lockean executive right to punish and enforce those transnational norms, even by use of armed force.  Though the proposed content of the transnational moral principles may vary, the relevance and applicability of moral principles opposes realists’ amoralism about international relations.  Political realisms and defenders of morally justified wars or humanitarian interventions reflect fundamentally different conceptions of world order.

e. Post-Colonialism and Feminism

Post-colonialism’s attention to issues of power, representations in discourse, perspective, and history provides an alternative approach to issues of war and humanitarian interventions.  For example, the selectivity issue (IV.C. above) is seen as about abuse of power, and about the discourse of rights, law, and “just war” masking imperialistic ambitions or hegemonies of intervening parties.  Examples of abuse abound, it is argued, from the days of the Cold War to later incursions in the Middle East and Afghanistan (Gregory).  The moral universalism of human rights and other concepts employed as intervention threshold conditions (II. above) are not neutral, with their emphasis on the individual, on negative civil rights, and on the rule of law.  The discourse of just war thinking looks at uses of military force from the perspective of those deciding whether to wage war, not from the perspective of those against whom the war is waged or those who are suffering.  Intervening parties, it is argued, are former colonial powers with lingering imperialist ambitions and those to be protected are former subjects of these imperialist ambitions.  Given the asymmetries of power in the world, colonialism and imperialism continue in the way in which dominating powers structure and influence the lives of those around the world, so much so that there are nearly insurmountable obstacles for the subaltern speaking and being heard (Spivak).  Post colonialist approaches call for skepticism, at least, about moral justifications for war or armed humanitarian interventions; and they call for involving diverse, alternative voices and thinking in response to human suffering.

Feminist thinking about humanitarian interventions includes challenges to the substance and implications of employing the “just war” framework.  The questions posed by this approach “risk androcentric or sexist bias” and commonly proposed rules about just interventions “remain gendered in concealed ways” (Cudd, 360, 363).   One challenge is to explore the ethics of care as an alternative approach (for example, Held).  More direct challenges to the just war framework consider whether threshold conditions, such as genocide or crimes against humanity, incorporate rape and sexual atrocities that victimize women in particular (for example, Card), or whether oppression of women satisfies “just cause” requirements for using military force (Cudd, 369-370).  Another concern is that proportionality requirements include among the effects of interventions consequences for enhancing or diminishing “women’s rights and power” and for the relational autonomy of individuals as that concept has been developed in other feminist work in ethics (Cudd, 366).  The suggestions often include a call for more attention to non-military, preventive action to address human rights issues, including traditional gender roles and hierarchies.

f. Pacifism

A final consideration is another source of challenge to humanitarian interventions: pacifism. Just war theory’s attempt to delineate some wars as morally justified is between political realism’s denial that morality applies to state behavior and pacifism’s rejection of all war, killing, or violence by states.  Among the many varieties of pacifism, relevant to questions about humanitarian interventions is absolute anti-war pacifism, and, in this context, what is often called “just war pacifism.”  Using typical just war requirements – jus ad bellum and jus in bello – it is argued that no war has or even can satisfy all jus bellum standards, including, it would follow, wars fought for humanitarian purposes.  In effect, just war pacifism opposes all wars by applying rigorously and strictly all the standard requirements for a war to be justified.

Arguments for just war pacifism typically focus on a few jus bellum requirements: proportionality considerations, in bello discrimination as providing immunity for non-combatants, and the idea of war only as a last resort.  Calling attention to the undeniable destructive consequences of war and use of military force, just war pacifists deny that the benefits do or can sufficiently outweigh the costs.  Proportionality requirements are interpreted and applied in ways that they are not or can never be satisfied, even by uses of military force for humanitarian purposes.  The argument depends on complex causal estimations and calculations about which certainty or reliability is dubious. Just war pacifism sees macro-proportionality as capable of much more justificatory work than it is accorded by many just war theorists.  The argument is more effectively employed with respect to micro-proportionality and the in bello discrimination principle.  Warring parties cannot avoid what is euphemistically called “collateral damage” — the death of non-combatants and and destruction of non-military property – despite the features of contemporary warfare, with its “smart bombs,” drones, and technological targeting controls.  Just war pacifism rightly attends to this feature.  The pacificists’ argue that even with modern technology, levels of collateral damage remain too high to be morally justifiable.  Morally acceptable standards are not and cannot be satisfied; thus, even if all ad bellum standards are met, no war is a just war.  The difficulty with the argument is establishing precise levels of morally acceptable death and destruction for non-combatants, whether seen as unintended consequences or not.  Of course, if no “collateral damage” is morally permissible, then it would seem that no war, no humanitarian intervention, could be a truly just war.  Finally, just war pacifism demands that war be a last resort and argues that always there are or can be non-military alternatives.  These arguments typically turn on how to construe the last resort requirement.  As mentioned above, a literal reading of the idea excludes most wars or interventions as unjust; and an expansive, counterfactual construal of the requirement makes no wars just, but tends to conflate advocacy for better preventive infrastructure and strategies with justifying responses to developing events.  Just war pacifism, like any absolute, unconditional opposition to war and use of military force, must somehow negotiate a troubling moral path whereby innocent persons will not be rescued because of a superior principle prohibiting the use of armed force, even for humanitarian purposes to stop widespread, systematic human suffering.

5. References and Further Reading

  • Bass, Gary J. Freedom’s Battle: The Origins of Humanitarian Intervention. New York: Random House, 2008.
    • An easily readable rendition of modern cases of interventions in order to show that “all of the major themes of today’s heated debates about humanitarian intervention … were voiced throughout the nineteenth century.”
  • Buchanan, Allen.  Justice, Legitimacy, and Self-Determination: Moral Foundations for International Law.  Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004.
    • A significant contribution to a number of issues and discussions, albeit challenging in its sophistication and conclusions rooted in a Kantian approach to moral theory.
  • Buchanan, Allen, and David Golove.  “Philosophy of International Law,” in The Oxford Handbook of Jurisprudence & Philosophy of Law. Ed. Jules Coleman and Scott Shapiro.  Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2002. 868-934.
    • A defense and description of normative philosophy of international law, including attention to political realism, legal positivism, transnational distributive justice,  human rights, secession, and humanitarian intervention (but not including just war theory).
  • Card, Claudia.  “The Paradox of Genocidal Rape Aimed at Forced Pregnancy.” The Southern Journal of Philosophy 46 (2008): 176-189.
  • Chatterjee, Dee K., and Don E. Scheid, eds.  Ethics and Foreign Intervention. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • A collection of contributions to conceptual and normative issue of humanitarian intervention, the merits and limits of the “just war” approach, law and secession, and critiques of interventionism.  Especially recommended are the contributions by essays by Hoffmann, Brown, Lucas, and Coady.
  • Cudd, Ann E.  “Truly humanitarian intervention: considering just causes and methods in a feminist cosmopolitan frame.”  Journal of Global Ethics 9 (2013): 359-375.
  • Fletcher, George P., and Jens D. Ohlin.  Defending Humanity:  When Force is Justified and Why.  New York: Oxford University Press, 2008.
  • Govier, Trudy. “War’s Aftermath: The Challenge of Reconciliation.” War: Essays in Political Philosophy. Ed. Larry May.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008. 229-248.
  • Gregory, Derek. The Colonial Present: Afghanistan, Palestine, Iraq. Wiley-Blackwell, 2004.
  • Held, Virginia.  “Military Intervention and the Ethics of Care.” The Southern Journal of Philosophy 46 (2008): 1-20.
  • Hoffman, Stanley.  The Ethics and Politics of Humanitarian Intervention.  Notre Dame: University of Notre Dame Press, 1997.
  • Holder, Cindy. “Responding to Humanitarian Crises.”  War: Essays in Political Philosophy. Ed. Larry May.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008. 85-104.
  • Holzgrefe, J. L., and Robert O. Keohane, eds. Humanitarian Intervention: Ethical, Legal, and Political Dilemmas.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
    • A collection of contributions, including an excellent survey of philosophic issues in the humanitarian intervention debate by Holzgrefe.  Other contributors address issues of international law, global ethics, and state sovereignty.
  • International Commission on Intervention and State Sovereignty (ICISS).  The Responsibility to Protect: Report of the International Commission, and Supplementary Volume to the Report.  Ottawa: International Development  Research Centre, 2001.
    • The Report is a pithy summary of major issues, of a defense of interventions in terms of “just war” principles, and with attention to institutional and legalities related to the UN. The supplementary volume includes experts’ background essays on history and major issues (for example, “State Sovereignty,” “Prevention”), presentations of numerous cases, and extensive bibliographies organized by facets of the debates and controversies about humanitarian interventions.
  • Johnson, James Turner.  Morality and Contemporary Warfare. New Haven: Yale University Press, 1999.
    • A historically informed approach to the just war tradition and the theory’s suitability for today’s world.  Chapter 3 is devoted to “the question of intervention.”
  • Jokic, Alexander, ed.  Humanitarian Intervention: Moral and Philosophical Issues.  Toronto: Broadview Press, 2003.
    • A collection of conference papers; especially recommended are contributions by Ellis, Wilkins, Pogge, and Buchanan.
  • Lang, Anthony F., ed.  Just Intervention.  Washington, D.C.: Georgetown University Press, 2003.
    • Especially relevant are contributions by Nardin, Chesterman, Weiss, and Cook.
  • Lee, Steven P. Ethics and War: An Introduction.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012.
    • A comprehensive, sophisticated introduction to “just war” theory which includes advocating a “human rights paradigm” to address interventions and questions of state sovereignty.
  • Lucas, Jr., George R.  Perspectives on Humanitarian Military Intervention.  Berkeley: University of California Press, 2001.
  • Nardin, Terry, and Melissa S. Williams, eds.  Humanitarian Intervention.  NOMOS XLVII. New York: New York University Press, 2006.
  • Orend, Brian.  The Morality of War. Second edition.  Toronto: Broadview Press, 2013.
    • Written by one of the major contributors to contemporary just war theory, including extensive attention to jus post bellum issues.
  • Orford, Anne.  Reading Humanitarian Intervention.  Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003.
  • Rawls, John.  The Law of Peoples. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1999.
    • This work is prominent in discussions of a host of issues in global ethics and international law.  An extension of his landmark social contract argument in A Theory of Justice (1971), in the context of a contractarian theory of international society and law, this work briefly addresses human rights, just wars, and interventions.
  • Smith, Michael.  “Humanitarian Intervention: An Overview of the Ethical Issues.”  Ethics and International Affairs 12 (1998): 63-79.
  • Spivak, Gayatri Chakravorty.“Can the Subaltern Speak?” Marxism and the Interpretation of Culture. Ed. C. Nelson and L. Grossberg.  University of Illinoise Press, 1988. 271-313.
  • Teson, Fernando R. Humanitarian Intervention: An Inquiry into Law and Morality. Third edition. Ardsley, NJ: Transnational Publishers, 2005.
    • Written by an international law professor, this volume develops a philosophic and legal defense of interventions from a decidedly liberal, Kantian perspective.
  • Walzer, Michael.  Just and Unjust Wars: A Moral Argument with Historical Examples.  Third edition.  New York: Basic Books, 1977, 2000.
    • Now in a fourth edition, this volume has become the classic, early 21st century discussion of “Just War” theory in its entirety. Chapter 6 is devoted to interventions and the Preface to the Third Edition succinctly outlines major issues for morally justifying humanitarian interventions.
  • Walzer, Michael.  Arguing about War. New Haven: Yale University Press, 2004.
    • A collection of essays addressing developing issues in just war theory, including humanitarian interventions (see especially selection 5, “The Politics of Rescue”).
  • Wheeler, Nicholas J. Saving Strangers: Humanitarian Intervention in International Society.  Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000.
    • Discussions of the most prominently discussed cases of the last half century, to explore “how different theories of international society lead to different conceptions of the legitimacy of humanitarian intervention.”


Author Information

Robert Hoag
Berea College
U. S. A.