Human Dignity

The mercurial concept of human dignity features in ethical, legal, and political discourse as a foundational commitment to human value or human status.  The source of that value, or the nature of that status, are contested.  The normative implications of the concept are also contested, and there are two partially, or even wholly, different deontic conceptions of human dignity implying virtue-based obligations on the one hand, and justice-based rights and principles on the other.  Added to this, the different practical and philosophical presuppositions of law, ethics, and politics mean that definitive adjudication between different meanings is frustrated by disciplinary incommensurabilities.

What follows is an analysis of human dignity’s uses in law, ethics, and politics, and a critical description of the functions and tensions generated by human dignity within these fields. Crucial conceptual and methodological questions arise from the outset regarding whether human dignity can be reconstructed as one concept or must be treated as several concepts. It is argued here that a focal concept of human dignity can be reconstructed and that this concept provides the most illuminating perspective from which to view human dignity’s range of conceptions and uses.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. Conceptual Background
  3. Themes
    1. Law
    2. Ethics
      1. General
      2. Philosophical Anthropology
      3. Tensions
    3. Politics
  4. Conceptual Analysis
    1. The Conceptual Features of Human Dignity
    2. The Credibility of an Interstitial Concept
    3. The Implications of an Interstitial Concept
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Introduction

There are a number of competing conceptions of human dignity taking their meaning from the cosmological, anthropological, or political context in which human dignity is used. Human dignity can denote the special elevation of the human species, the special potentiality associated with rational humanity, or the basic entitlements of each individual.  There are, by extension, dramatically different normative uses to which the concept can be put. It is connected, variously, to ideas of sanctity, autonomy, personhood, flourishing, and self-respect, and human dignity produces, at different times, strict prohibitions and empowerment of the individual. It can also, potentially, be used to express the core commitments of liberal political philosophy as well as precisely those duty-based obligations to self and others that communitarian philosophers consider to be systematically neglected by liberal political philosophy.

As a consequence of these antagonistic currents of thought, philosophical analysis of human dignity cannot be separated from wider debates in moral, political, and legal philosophy. Nor can a certain level of selective reconstruction be avoided. The genealogy of the concept has been traced, tendentiously, through the whole history of Western, and sometimes non-Western, philosophical thought; such genealogies are not always illuminating at a conceptual level. More specifically, it is a desideratum of philosophical analysis of human dignity that the concept can be shown to have sufficient clarity to make a useful contribution to modern philosophical debate. This article therefore locates human dignity within a range of debates and suggests—using one important reconstruction of the concept—that human dignity represents a claim about human status that is intended to have a unifying effect on our ethical, legal and political practices.

We begin with an extended methodological and conceptual exploration, asking what should be taken as primary in examining human dignity. Noting a particularly close relationship between contemporary uses of human dignity, international law, and human rights, this connection is treated as focal without assuming that it is definitive of the concept (for related but alternative starting points see Debes 2009; Waldron 2013; Donnelly 2015).

2. Conceptual Background

The use of human dignity in public international law is a marker for understanding the moral, legal and political discourse of human dignity. A characteristic expression is found in the Preamble of the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights (1966) whose rights “derive from the inherent dignity of the human person” and whose animating principle is “recognition of the inherent dignity and of the equal and inalienable rights of all members of the human family [as] the foundation of freedom, justice and peace in the world.” This assertion and others like it form a common reference point in contemporary literature on human dignity. Importantly, this ‘inherent dignity’ represents a potential bridge between a number of different ideas and ideals, namely freedom, justice and peace.

In fact, it is this potential to bridge different fields of regulation—human rights, bioethics, humanitarian law, equality law and others—that we might take to be the most important function of human dignity in international law. We will refer to an interstitial concept of human dignity (IHD). This concept, arising from discourses and practices of international law, has a strong relationship with equality, liberty, and the basic status of the individual. And, crucially, it implies an interstitial or conjunctive function across our normative systems. It is where law, ethics, and politics meet and are practically and critically interrelated. It is where domestic, regional, and international regulation find a common principle. It is where positive law and morality become difficult to distinguish. And it is where specific norms and general principles are linked. By extension, this concept of human dignity is the concept we should treat as the foundation of human rights because any reconstruction of the complex menu of human rights in international law has to take account of their wide-ranging implications for legal, moral and political governance. Put another way, one necessary condition for a defensible, foundational account of human rights is that their foundational principle must have an interstitial function straddling these fields of normative practice.

Note that this does not capture, and is potentially in tension with, many existing linguistic and normative practices related to human dignity. For instance, discussion of ‘dignitarian harms’ relevant to healthcare law, or local prohibitions on degrading work, might well invoke the language of human dignity without intending any implications for other normative systems. They imply nothing about politics or about law more generally. These linguistic and normative manifestations of human dignity should be considered in their own terms and are returned to in what follows. But the question of why there are tensions between these uses and the IHD is a revealing line of enquiry in itself. It concerns genealogical changes in the concept but also, and more importantly, the ways in which norms and principles are shaped and conditioned within the different practices of law, ethics and politics. To be sure, an interstitial concept is treated here as the best vantage point for all the competing claims. But this is not to insist it is the only intelligible concept. What follows is a description of an IHD’s form, content, and normative uses and an initial comparison with competing characterizations.

First, the idea of form allows us to distinguish the IHD from other uses of ‘dignity.’ Human dignity in international law is associated with a cluster of closely related, but distinguishable, formal characteristics. Human dignity connotes universality (ascription to every human person), inalienability (it is a non-contingent implication of one’s status as human), unconditionality (a property requiring no performance or maintenance), and overridingness (having priority in normative disputes). These immediately assist in distinguishing an IHD concept from a behavioral description of dignity which would not be inalienable, a virtue ethical reading which would either not include ascription to every human person or would be contingent, or a healthcare ethics reading which might not insist on the overridingness of human dignity. Note that these formal criteria are not treated as necessary conditions for human dignity but are, rather, claims commonly associated with human dignity in international law. They assist, amongst other things, in distinguishing human dignity from dignity simpliciter with its associations with behavior and comportment. They also situate the IHD close to certain currents of Kantianism and deontology without assuming that Kant’s work is definitive of the concept.

Second, content encompasses the ‘what’ and the ‘who’ of human dignity. Invocation of human dignity invites us to ask what underlying conception of humanity is at work. The discourse of the ‘human person,’ often associated with human dignity in international law, captures the mixture of formal personhood and embodiment or vulnerability. The conjunction of human and person also produces potentially competing conceptual and ontological commitments, and we can draw a distinction between normative and taxonomical humanity in our discourse of human dignity (Donnelly 2015). Further complexity arises from strong species-based claims or discussions of transhumanism that are focused on potential changes in the ontology of humanity. Undoubtedly human dignity is associated with species claims but it is also intelligible to rely upon more formal claims about the characteristics of agents or persons in analysis of human dignity. Related to these questions of ascription, the ontological and normative commitments involved in a human dignity claim (the question of what) are varied. Human dignity could concern capacities, could include the direct requirement to exercise capacities, and might also concern a teleology for humanity (that is, the ontology of human dignity). Human dignity will—at least in the use of concern here—be closely linked to notions of autonomy, personhood and free will (that is, the correlates of human dignity). Related to this is a contrast (concerning what we might call the metaphysics of human dignity) between human dignity considered broadly as a property or as something arising relationally through recognition or respect.

Third, normative use concerns characteristic normative implications and normative functions. This has been usefully expressed as a distinction between empowerment and constraint (Beyleveld and Brownsword 2001). The IHD is commonly associated with empowerment through human rights. This is distinguishable from the constraint function commonly found in bioethics and healthcare ethics, often a peremptory ban on certain kinds of uses of human beings. It is less clear how the IHD functions regarding another common distinction, that between horizontal application (between individuals) and vertical application (between the state and individual). International human rights law predominantly concerns vertical application, but the IHD, particularly given its linking of law, morality and politics does not preclude (and may imply) horizontal application. We may also note at this point a common distinction between human dignity as status and value. This turns, in part, on what response is required in the light of human dignity: status demands respect but also rights, duties and privileges; the existence of a value potentially requires fostering or enhancement. Only the former rights, duties and privileges are likely to be treated as having systemic application (being justiciable or enforceable), at least within liberal political systems that refuse to enforce moral conduct. As a consequence, the normative use of any IHD concept is undoubtedly conditioned by liberal assumptions concerning the proper scope of legislation. Nonetheless there are many instances of enforcement of more perfectionist or self-regarding conceptions of human dignity (for instance in the prohibition of ‘dwarf tossing’).

The last point reveals the most important tension in the general philosophical study of human dignity, namely the seeming co-existence of the interstitial concept characteristic of international law on the one hand and a perfectionist, virtue or purely self-regarding concept on the other. The assumption made here, that the latter perfectionist claims are non-focal or non-standard, is contentious (for the opposing view see Hennette-Vauchez 2011). Nevertheless this would appear to make the best sense of the majority of post-World War Two literature and thinking. Indeed the important post-war legal instruments themselves represent an interstitial process or moment, and the reconfiguration of the international legal order was the seedbed in which a certain idea of human dignity was given international expression. Far from being an accident of drafting or the contingencies of finding consensus, the (re)assertion of a notion of human dignity can be seen as the intention to transcend the boundaries of the legal, moral and political. Accordingly, while the following analysis does point to some historically contingent aspects of the use of human dignity, this is less important than the fact that the drafting of the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948) [UDHR] took place when the foundations of the international legal and political order were undergoing massive upheaval and when the need for a unifying moral principle was acute. We begin with law as the normative system within which the putative interstitial concept arose.

3. Themes

a. Law

There is no doubt that an IHD concept finds its most important expression in post-World War Two international law and constitutional instruments (the Universal Declaration of Human Rights, the Twin Covenants, and others). As such, the nature and function of human dignity in law could be assumed to be clear and well documented. This is the case at the level of doctrinal analysis of human dignity, and there is important jurisprudence arising in particular from the European Court of Human Rights and from constitutions including those of Germany, South Africa and Hungary. The sum of this jurisprudential thought is a mixture of general thinking about the foundation of constitutional rights alongside specific focus on the prohibition of degradation and objectification. This however points to two areas of deeper complexity, one hermeneutical and one concerning the conditioning effects of legal systems. First, different jurisdictions and institutions have given such radically different functions to human dignity that it is not always clear that one concept, the IHD, is at work. Indeed more substantive and perfectionist notions are often in evidence in national legal settings. Second, the IHD seems an ideal candidate for a kind of Grundnorm or secondary rule in law: a norm giving validity to legal systems as a whole or a principle governing the application of all norms within a system. However, this is difficult to defend as anything other than a loose generalization. In principled terms, legal systems treat justice as their foundational norm and this means that consistency, rather than moral defensibility, guides adjudication. And, in practice, it is not at all clear how human dignity can or should function as a ‘higher’ norm. There is, in other words, something of a mismatch between the putative function of the concept and its actual potential.

The nature and content of international law can partially explain such tensions. The prominent place of human dignity in international human rights instruments, as the foundation of those rights, has given human dignity enormous symbolic and heuristic significance. The foundational significance of human dignity is frequently assumed to extend beyond international human rights law to the international legal system as a whole. Where there are tensions between different fields of international law, or emerging practices in international law, human dignity is an important tool for focusing on the normative forces at work, in particular the significance of the individual as transcending the boundaries of state authority and as justifying state authority. It is fair to say that at this level human dignity is of enormous symbolic importance though human dignity is not, in itself, an enforceable norm of international law (the exception to this is in international humanitarian law’s Common Article 3, a prohibition on “outrages upon personal dignity”).

At the regional and domestic levels the normative implications of human dignity become more precise. While the European Court of Human Rights takes from international law the assumption that human dignity is foundational, it has operationalized it within its jurisprudence as an interpretive tool generally, and with particular reference to the idea of “torture, inhuman or degrading treatment.” This association between human dignity and the worst forms of degradation and objectification is shared with international humanitarian law and with German constitutional thinking. It is also the focus of the US constitutional deployment of human dignity as an interpretive tool in Eighth Amendment jurisprudence (concerning “cruel and unusual punishment”). The merit of this association with degradation is to give human dignity a clearer normative implication: the absolute impermissibility of certain kinds of gross mistreatment of the individual. Conversely, it is difficult to reconcile this restrictive, prohibitive reading with the assumption that human dignity is broad and foundational.

This relates, in turn, to a tension between human dignity operationalized as a specific norm (or in some instances a right) and a more general principle in law. Consider, for instance, Article 23 of the Universal Declaration of Human Rights (1948) (“everyone who works has the right to just and favourable remuneration ensuring for himself and his family an existence worthy of human dignity”). Here human dignity is neither a principle nor clearly foundational of the right it is associated with (or any other right); instead, it is a telos or standard. That standard is, potentially, related to material sufficiency or to flourishing and could be seen, to that extent, to have an aspiration to being interstitial. Nevertheless it is (in fact) rare for human dignity to be enforced as a standard and is (in principle) unclear how this would amount to normative or conceptual unification of law, ethics and politics. It is possible that some instances of human dignity as a right or as a telos appear to have clear interstitial implications but nonetheless represent a different concept from the IHD because both their content and their normative implications differ (see Waldron 2013).

The kind of complexities and possibilities that arise from human dignity being in law a right, standard or telos as well as a principle, value or status, gives rise to an underlying uncertainty as to whether law contains a single concept, a number of conceptions or simply a confusion of several ideas. There are a number of proposed normative and conceptual solutions to this tension, though it is not obvious how we might adjudicate between them. First, we can assume that human dignity necessarily has a dual status as norm (a more or less prohibitive norm) and as principle (predominantly symbolic and heuristic) (Alexy 2009). Second, we can assume that law has a number of different conceptions at work, conceptions that are either incommensurable (McCrudden 2008) or loosely linked by family resemblance (Neal 2012). Third, we can assume that law now has two very different concepts at work, one ancient and honor-based and the second closer to the IHD. We give this last option closer attention.

While many domestic or constitutional uses of human dignity are closely related to autonomy, privacy and the protection of agency, there is no doubt that (human) dignity has also been used to impose limitations on acts that can be seen as voluntarily diminishing an individual’s own human dignity or violating duties to themselves. In the broadest terms, then, there is a tension between a permissive reading of human dignity that protects autonomous individual agency from state intrusion, and a conservative reading that allows law to protect individuals from themselves. (This partially resembles Beyleveld and Brownsword’s contrast between the empowerment and constraint conceptions of human dignity.) These kinds of tensions are explored by Stephanie Hennette-Vauchez (2011), who insists on the coexistence of a human dignity principle, which is in essence a principle of equality, and an older (ancient) notion which is closer to a hierarchical notion of honor and permits the enforcement of certain norms related to self-respect. The form, content, and normative implications of these two ideas are clearly very different. While the idea of respect is morally important, it is difficult to reconcile the enforcement of respect with the assumptions we would treat as definitive of liberal legal systems, namely formal equality and division between public and private obligations. As such the honorific manifestations of human dignity are distinct from the liberal concept of human dignity; they are only rarely treated as enforceable (through personality law or public morality provisions) and lack the universal or inalienable characteristics of the IHD. They are nevertheless an irreducible part of contemporary law.

In sum, international law is a source of much of our thinking about human dignity, and in particular it gives credence to the idea of an IHD concept that can link different fields of legislation and different jurisdictions. At the same time, international and domestic legal institutions exercise a conditioning force on the discourse of human dignity. The implications of this are two-fold. First, as argued by James Griffin, human dignity acts as the foundation of human rights and gives rise to a large range of rights related to personhood and agency; nevertheless, the menu of human rights potentially generated by human dignity must be reduced or rationalized given the equal importance of legal institutions in national legal systems as a source of settled norms and practices (Griffin 2008). Second, legal systems require normative precision, and positive law invoking human dignity often appears to fall short of that precision; this has meant that jurists have favored conceptualizing and operationalizing human dignity through an association with degradation (Kaufmann et al, 2011). As Beitz insists, these implications raise related questions:

human dignity seem to apply (differently) at two distinct levels of thought about human rights—as a feature of a public system of norms and as a more specific value that explains why certain ways of treating people are (almost?) always impermissible. If there could be a theory of human dignity, one of its desiderata would be to show what (if anything) these senses of human dignity have in common and how they hang together (if they do). (2013, 283)

Beitz’s own analysis retains a certain kind of bifurcation between prohibitive and empowering conceptions of human dignity (2013, 289–290), suggesting resilient problems in making sense of human dignity’s place in law. Does the overridingness of human dignity have, in legal systems, to be conditioned by the normal institutional limits on legal norms and principles or does it retain its (extra-legal) moral force? And what role does philosophical anthropology play in our ethical and legal thinking, and should this inform what we take to be enforceable in law? This is a question of what we hold to be distinctively human and how, if at all, this should inform our thinking about law. A philosophical anthropology, along with related moral commitments, may demand or prevent perfectionist readings of human dignity which, in turn, has implications for any putative interstitial concept.

b. Ethics

i. General

Those concerns with philosophical anthropology form a point of departure for reflection on ethics. For example, animal ethics concerns sometimes explicitly, but always at least implicitly, questions about the value of human beings in contrast to nonhuman animals. Answers to such questions will typically concern whether human beings have standing over animals, or whether human beings have an inner significance that animal beings lack. These two questions are ambiguous and the relation between them is far from clear. Supported by tradition which has overshadowed much of our understanding of human dignity, the first question can be variously understood as the elevation of the human species, human dominion over nature, humanity as imago dei, or as the special worth of humanity relative to all other natural phenomena. In other words, human dignity as elevation rather than human dignity as human inner significance (compare Sensen, 2011). The second question, by contrast, leaves open the possibility that human beings and nonhuman animals have potentially incommensurable significances (Korsgaard, 2013; Nussbaum, 2006; Balzer, Rippe and Schaber, 2000; Kaldewaij, 2013). Each of these presumptions has a questionable relationship with an IHD.

Starting from the idea that human beings have a distinctive significance, at least two possibilities flow: the existence of duties of dignity that address its bearer, and duties of dignity that address others. Some philosophical theories deny a distinctive significance for human (and nonhuman) beings as such, but emphasize the contractual basis of our norms or argue that what matters morally is sentience (compare Gauthier, 1987; Singer, 2001). By contrast, philosophical views on human dignity emphasize that there is a distinctive significance to human beings and that this entails certain stringent ethical norms. Note that claiming a distinctive significance for human beings does not necessarily amount to prioritizing human beings over animals. (Claiming that human beings should be prioritized over animals would of course entail that human beings have a distinctive significance.) Indeed claims that both human nature and animal nature have their own distinctive significance can be interpreted both in terms of elevation and in terms of inner significance. When animal and human interests clash, one could try to compromise the interests of one to satisfy the same or even a different interest for the other, in line with or even as a matter of respect to their different dignities.

That being said, the claim of human significance has often found expression in philosophies that elevate human beings over animals. It should be noted that the very idea of a relative standing of human beings over nonhuman animals and nature does not entail that human beings should be protected for that dignity (Sensen, 2011). Rather, the relative elevation of a human being is conceived in terms of his distinctive human capacities that, given some teleological or religious background assumptions, entail for him a duty to exercise these. These capacities are, in turn, typically understood to be exercised by acting morally, that is, to act in line with a morality that concerns what one does to oneself, to other humans, or to God. It is these teleological or religious assumptions that generally benefit humans over animals. It has been argued that this view of humanity was central to Western traditional views of dignity including those of the ancients, medieval Christians, Renaissance and early Modern thinkers.

Within these moral schemes the question of what we should do to a human being is not (fully) decided by recognizing their dignity (as elevation), whereas the individual’s own duty to comply with that scheme is the main normative implication of the set of capacities that ground his dignity. He has initial dignity as subject to such a moral scheme, in particular by virtue of his capacity and correlated duty to live up to it. As such, his dignity may not entail any or all duties that others have to him, such as to respect or even support him. What we are to do to him depends on the content of the moral duty that we have as a result of our dignity grounding capacities, duties which are conceptualized in terms of cosmic principles or divine commands. That is to say, we are to respect each other not for our relative standing, our initial dignity, but given that and insofar as non-interference or support for beings that happen to have this standing is required by cosmic or divine principle. This principle specifies what we should value in the individual. As such, it specifies a type of dignity that comes closer to the inner significance view, which in turn may be, but does not necessarily require, an expression in terms of schemas that advance ideas of human elevation.

It is the inner significance view, not the human elevation view, that fits more easily within the formal features of the IHD. The normative significance view has found expressions in at least three ways: as a status (Habermas, 2010; Waldron and Dan-Cohen, 2012), a value (Rosen, 2012; Sulmasy, 2007) or a principle (Düwell, 2014). As a status, human dignity gives human beings a set of duties and rights. A value, by contrast, sets human dignity as something to sustain or promote. As a principle, human dignity sets a fundamental standard for action. These three types of specifications are featured in broader philosophical anthropologies that explain who has it and what should be protected in them—as well as entail implications for policy and law with regard to it. In other words, whether we treat human dignity as a value, status or principle will depend in large measure on the background assumptions—anthropological and/or cosmological—that we take to form the background of a claim about human dignity.

ii. Philosophical Anthropology

All three claims—status, value and principle—can be interpreted in terms of the formal features of the IHD (universal, unconditional, inalienable and overriding). At the same time, some views on the significance of humanity may deny one of these features, and this will affect the content and normative use of such a view of the significance of humanity considerably. In these respects, attempts to reconstruct non-Western traditional views on dignity should be especially sensitive not only to distinctions between status, value and principle, but particularly to the formal as well as substantive specifications of the significance of humanity in these traditions (Donnelly, 2009). It has been argued, for example, that the normatively relevant notion of humanity in, for example, Confucian tradition should be understood in terms of dignity’s achievement through virtuous conduct, rather than in terms that make it independent of one’s character and conduct (Luo, 2014). This would touch on the issue of universality, unconditionality, alienability and overridingness. In Confucian tradition, dignity (qua ‘worth’) can be seen as a universal human potential that we may fail to cultivate: it is therefore universal but not unconditional; it can also be self-alienated and overridden.

It has been argued also that in certain Islamic traditions, Man has a God-given status as vicegerent on earth (Mozaffari, no date; Kamali, 2002; Maroth, 2014). This status may demand some respect, but how he is to be treated depends largely on what God has specified by law. If God demands—as some traditions seem to imply—respect for human individuals as a matter of their good deeds, piety or their living by the Book, then this would raise questions about consistency with the unconditionality and inalienability of an IHD. A further significantly different tradition, Hinduism, is sometimes interpreted to operate with a concept of dignity that a human individual shares because and insofar as his soul cannot be distinguished from the universe (Braarvig, 2014). On the one hand, this implies the significance of human individuals. On the other hand, given differentiations in the world of appearances we can distinguish degrees of dignity not only between individuals, but also between classes—which one can enter only through birth—specified by the presence of the universal whole in them. The possibility of rebirth in a higher caste—conditional on loyalty to the caste system or on pure chance—renders consistent this universal notion of dignity with the social one.

On top of these possible alternatives to an IHD at the formal level, it is also crucial to note the possibility of different accounts of the IHD in which these formal features may have different and incompatible contents, if not opposing implications for normative use. The differences concern not only questions about the nature of the subject of human dignity—a species, humanity or the human person—but also what is significant in him. Further differences emerge from answers to other questions: are we to grant him rights and impose on him duties; are we to value him, non-interfere and support him to perfect himself; are we to respect him?

iii. Tensions

This mixture of concerns and foci—different background assumptions in terms of cosmology and anthropology, different assumptions in terms of normative functioning of human dignity as statue, principle, and value—gives rise to an expansive field of enquiry. Even if we were to consider how the IHD may or may not be present in ethical accounts of human dignity, this would have to encompass the two substantial fields of normative ethics and applied ethics and would require careful analysis of how and why further links between politics, ethics and law are issues. For present purposes we narrow our concerns to applied ethics.

Applied ethics can be understood by reference to ethical problems that arise from concrete practices. These practices emerge or have their existence in society and as such require attention by politics and law—not only by philosophical ethics. What we typically see is that the ethical issue is addressed in terms of norms or principles accepted in the practice, and that politics or law let this happen and regulate only in their own terms—quite independent of an explicit assessment in terms of IHD, let alone in terms of a coherent integration of philosophical ethics, politics, law, empirical knowledge and practical constraints (compare Düwell, 2012).

‘Dignity’ has different usages in different applied ethical practices, and in some it has none (Beyleveld and Brownsword, 2001; Nordenfelt, 2004; Sulmasy, 2013). For example, in the life sciences dignity is used to legitimize a patient’s right to informed consent, to set constraints on her choices. Further, it is used to constrain her choice options, such as deciding when to die. It is also used to characterize the way a patient deals with and adapts to his condition, the way a patient is treated, and to emphasize the effects of his condition or of the actions of others on his identity. It is used to emphasize the value a person attaches to himself, the extent to which he respects himself (Dillon, 2013). Dignity is the central term in assessing technological developments for their application to human life (Human dignity and bioethics: essays commissioned by the President’s Council on Bioethics, 2008). Dignity is also used to argue against abortion, against the pre-natal experimentation on early human life. It has been argued by some that all human life should be protected as a matter of dignity, whereas others emphasize protection of human life only if it will develop a personality. In this context, it especially interesting to note that in debates on pre-natal enhancement, the notion of dignity is appealed to in defense of respecting the human species as such (Bostrom, 2005; Habermas, 2005). Here human dignity is said to be threatened by attempts to bring to life human beings enhanced in certain ways, such as enhanced to be more competent in certain abilities that are valued by parents or society. Here the worry not only concerns the dignity of the enhanced individual, whether it is violated or enhanced, but also the dignity of humanity as such: whether humanity is compromised by these interferences. It also concerns the dignity of non-enhanced human beings, whether it is threatened by the increased capacity of enhanced beings. Not all of these usages express the same concept, let alone an IHD. Those that do may give only partial expression to competing versions of an IHD. Often, however, we see that problems are addressed without explicit recourse to an IHD, let alone via an integral assessment in terms of the philosophical commitments that come with such an IHD. It would make a significant difference if these discourses were orientated towards coherence with an IHD.

c. Politics

Already in discussion of applied ethics certain of the constraining and conservative uses of human dignity are in evidence. A ‘dignitarian alliance’ of conservative thinkers and activists has deployed a notion of dignity close to that of sanctity in order to oppose or constrain reproductive and biotechnological innovations (Brownsword 2003). Political discourse of the twentieth century also, by contrast, witnessed radical and liberation-focused discourses of human dignity. While the division between human dignity as empowerment and as constraint helps to partially map this contrast, this section draws a more general divide between power-focused conceptions of politics as opposed to principle-focused conceptions of politics. Principled accounts can in turn be divided between those who make ethics (and potentially human dignity) central to politics, and those who might accommodate other interstitial principles like justice or the rule of law.

In those accounts that make ethics clearly foundational to politics, human dignity could be conceived as a regulative idea, providing the trajectory of politics but not necessarily central to its practice. Slightly differently, human dignity could be treated as providing a conception of good politics and implying practical side-constraint within political systems. More directly, human dignity might be identified with the good, which would give human dignity a more clearly normative and perhaps perfectionist role (Boylan 2004). Efforts to synthesize aspects of pluralism with such accounts of the good have informed a capabilities approach intended to encompass both a substantial conception of the individual and the protections of agency and individuality characteristic of liberal thought. This itself is often expressed in the language of human dignity (Nussbaum 2006, Claassen 2014). This interpretation of human dignity in terms of capability based flourishing has been reviewed and critically reinterpreted by reference to a different idea of dignity, that of dignity as a basic principle that demands recognition of the generic features of human agency as a matter of basic rights (Gewirth 1992). Far from being unrelated to the perfectionist notion of dignity, this latter notion of dignity functions as an underlying principle that may help us identify relevant from irrelevant human capabilities as well as to rank them so as to prevent or settle clashes between them (Düwell 2009, Claassen and Düwell 2012). Such a take on capabilities would imply that possibilities for certain forms of flourishing should be protected as a matter of dignity, indeed the same kind of dignity that demands respect for freedom and well-being as basic features of agency. One further upshot of this approach would be that those things to be secured or provided might, in view of this principle, differ between persons as well as between contexts. That is to say, to protect a capability for one agent may require different or more resources than protecting it in someone else (Boylan 2004). Also, when possibilities of securing agency are scarce in a community, priority should be given to capabilities at the core of agency. It might be that this represents a manifestation of the IHD concept in that the idea is intended to have application across different systems and also be extended to other, new forms of moral and political challenges.

In contrast, those positions that give the right priority over the good place rights and a plurality of reasonable conceptions of the good at the center of just institutional design. Such a ‘community of rights’ is quite directly committed to an interstitial notion of human dignity cashed-out as both basic human rights and systems for preserving freedom and welfare across all normative systems (Gewirth 1998). Rawls’s position (2009) in contrast faces the challenge of reconciling commitment to human dignity with treating justice as a primary institutional virtue. Rawls’s two principles of justice—while expressed in the language of basic rights and institutional virtues—could intelligibly be taken as an expression of a politics based on human dignity. However, this should give rise to important hermeneutical and conceptual hesitations. First, little is added to our understanding of Rawls’s work by associating it with human dignity, and conversely the distinctive conceptual characteristics of human dignity are immediately lost in more general debates about liberal political theory. Second, in Rawls’s later work where “decent non-liberal” societies are insulated from criticism and intervention from liberal states, we might say that Rawls concedes that non-liberal states—states that would clearly not accept an IHD principle as foundational—are nonetheless morally and politically justified (2001). By extension, the links between liberal political theory and human dignity are enormously complex, and can be conditioned by the demands of realism or non-ideal theory. With that in mind we turn to more practice-based and power-focused links.

The concept of human dignity as it appeared in post-war international law was undoubtedly intended to mark a decisive political, not just legal, turning-point. The concept is closely associated with the commitment “never again”—that never again should there be atrocities of the kind in the Second World War—and we could see human dignity as a predominantly political idea focused on the impermissibility of widespread and systematic attacks on civilian populations and by extension fundamental limitations on states’ sovereignty. In this sense there is credibility to an interstitial reading of human dignity that links international law, politics and morality in supporting a more individual-focused, less state-focused account of international relations. This, in turn, strengthens a link between human dignity and (moral and institutional) cosmopolitanism given that the value of individuals transcends state boundaries.

Conversely, this—interstitial and cosmopolitan—reading of human dignity has important limitations. First, the interstitial understanding of human dignity could be assumed to be, at heart, an ideological reading of human rights discourse: it is the rhetoric of human rights that links international law and politics rather than any systemic or philosophically defensible normative framework related to dignity. Second, the cosmopolitan understanding of human dignity faces the general vulnerability of all cosmopolitan philosophies (the priority of local and natural attachments in our moral thinking) and a specific attack via the problem of statelessness. That is, unless human dignity rests on or implies a ‘right to have rights,’ any political and legal discourse of human dignity will be inadequate in comparison to the systematic and concrete protections offered to citizens by constitutions and constitutional rights. We return to the right to have rights later by way of a more general analysis of social theory.

Certain historical and sociological trends are important for understanding human dignity and its role in politics. The first and most obvious is a shift from hierarchical societies to more democratic societies and with this an emphasis on the equal status and rights of individuals. A clash between the notions of dignity as aristocratic bearing and dignity as fundamental status is a characteristic of debates concerning the French Revolution. The ‘dignity of Man’ as emblematic of political emancipatory projects finds its first major expression during this revolutionary period, and it allowed the articulation of new emancipatory projects as in Wollstonecraft’s appeal to the equal dignity of men and women ([1792]1982). The post-World War Two invocation of human dignity undoubtedly shares basic humanistic, enlightenment, and liberal assumptions with these currents of eighteenth and nineteenth century thought, though by the twentieth century the idea of the ‘dignity of Man’ was being opposed not directly by defenders of the Ancien Régime but by Marxist and communitarian critics of liberalism. What unites these latter positions is concern about the insensitivity of human dignity relative to pressing political problems including colonialism and minority rights, along with more fundamental concerns about the emptiness of the concept relative to collective interests that cannot be disaggregated into individual interests.

Sociological shifts are also crucial in understanding the competing functions of human dignity in political discourse. The characteristics of modernity, as charted by both Weber and Durkheim, involve changes in the conception of the individual (including for Durkheim the creation of an ‘ethic’ or ‘religion’ of humanity), changes in the concept of politics, and changes in the political significance of human dignity. On the one hand, the more technocratic and bureaucratic nature of politics was held to have yielded a demystifying, but also dangerously dehumanizing, relationship between the individual and political power. In the light of that and related concerns, Margalit (2009) and others use human dignity to stress the importance of retaining dignity qua self-respect within political and social practices. By the same token, Honneth’s work on the political conditions of recognition (1996) entwines respect with the basic conditions of individual and group identity. On the other hand, liberal institutions that intended to preserve the basic status of the individual have been held to be inadequate to maintain the conditions of the possibility of ethical life. This has meant direct attacks on ‘liberal’ practices, including human rights, by communitarian theorists.

It is against this background that a different style of political theorizing about human dignity can be found in the second half of the twentieth century. Hannah Arendt’s Aristotle-inspired political theory emphasizes the importance of recognition in a political community and of strong constitutional rights with an equation between human dignity and the right to have rights (Arendt 1958). Arendt offers an influential internal critique of politico-legal understandings of human dignity. Broadly, Arendt is unsympathetic to any potential interstitial concept (given her views on the basic conditions of politics) and to generalizations about the rights of Man (given her writings on the emptiness of this notion, particularly with regard to the status of refugees). In contrast she stresses the basic importance of citizenship as a condition of protecting the basic status of the individual. There are nevertheless resources in Arendt’s work that are clearly sympathetic to human dignity and human rights as more expansive commitments, and human dignity could be seen as the best expression of that view of human dignity as opposition to atrocity and defensive of human status and human plurality (Menke 2014).

In the light of these competing currents of thought, and the complexities of the concept itself, human dignity does not map neatly onto the division between empowerment and constraint or between the priority of the good and the priority of the right. The IHD, to the extent that it is a recognizable component of political thinking, might be assumed to be closer to conceptions of politics focused on the rule of law rather than a substantive conception of the good. Understood as interstitial concepts, human dignity and the rule of law are intended precisely to express the importance of links between politics and law and the co-regulation of the two. The rule of law is important not only as an expression of self-restraint in politics but also as a necessary condition of a permissive politics of human agency, choice and self-creation. This might be otherwise expressed in terms of a defense of the public-private divide. It could be expressed in more sociological terms as a defense of functional differentiation, the coexistence of different social systems that an individual can move between. Or this might be linked to a libertarian defense of minimalism in the power of the state. The unifying idea here is that human dignity is a principle with significance for political, legal and moral systems and which preserves, one way or another, the freedom and self-creation of the individual. It has been the recurrent theme of communitarian critics of liberalism and human rights that such permissiveness undermines the self-constitution of the individual within a polity. Middle ground could, potentially, be found in the capabilities approach or in an Arendtean stress on the right to have rights.

4. Conceptual Analysis

a. The Conceptual Features of Human Dignity

It is desirable, but no simple task, to begin to draw more general conclusions about human dignity as a concept and as a component of normative debate. It is worth briefly contrasting how we might approach the analysis of human dignity with that of human rights. Discussion of human rights features settled debates concerning their moral or political justification, an appropriate theory of rights, and human rights’ tailoring to practice. Analysis of human dignity, in contrast, lacks such clearly defined parameters because it is plausible that there are competing concepts of human dignity and not just competing conceptions. That is, it is not simply that in academic debate different aspects of a single concept can be given special emphasis or that there are competing justificatory strategies for the same, shared, idea. Rather, ‘human dignity’ might encompass historically different, and antagonistic, ideas. For this reason, meta-studies of the uses of human dignity have difficulty yielding definitive analysis of the concept’s presuppositions and functions, or have mapped a number of functions that are difficult to cohere (Nordenfeld 2004; Sulmasy 2013). Bonding the many functions of human dignity may be possible, at best, only through performative analysis (O’Malley 2011) or family resemblance analysis (Neal 2012), but these involve abandoning a single idea of human dignity in favor of describing various local uses.

b. The Credibility of an Interstitial Concept

In contrast, we would argue that the three normative fields of law, morality and politics together offer at least the possibility of a distinctive, focal concept. The idea of the absolute status of every individual can intelligibly be held to frame our normative practices. Indeed, the magnitude of this commitment is such that it would have to be manifest in all of our social practices. Clearly, however, this is not without problems. Any conceivable defense of an IHD concept—one that, by definition, sits between and links different normative practices—faces the immediate problem of the conditioning assumptions of those disciplines and practices (including the local practices and settled dispositions and attitudes of those working within the fields). This can be treated as a three-fold problem. The validity of any legal norm is conditional on political will (the problem of the primacy of the political); the moral justification of the idea still requires further explanation and justification (the problem of the foundations of morality); and the legal notion itself will be conditioned by a legal system so that it can be consistently operationalized within the system (the problem of the demands of justice or the normative closure of law). These three problems are pressing problems for any IHD claim precisely because the concept must claim to transcend these conditioning aspects of our normative practices.

However, it can be argued that the possibility of an interstitial concept nevertheless has support within the fields. For example, the idea of a rule of law is intended to unify different fields of legal and political regulation (through demanding their consonance with good law consistent with human agency), and for that reason a number of theorists closely associate human dignity and the rule of law (Waldron 2008; Fuller 1964). Beyond this, human dignity might well inspire more productive and precise regulatory practices, be they related to global, social or procedural justice. If the rule of law is the minimal demand that there be a good match between regulation and agency, wider ‘projects’ conjoining law, ethics, and politics can be meaningfully expressed in the language of human dignity given its unifying function. Put more modestly, the idea of politics as an anomic practice is difficult to defend—after all, law and politics stand in a relation of productive co-constitution with politics making law and legal systems revising the content of that law and regulating political practices themselves—and our best reconstructions of the foundations of political practices and institutions are likely to involve commitment to the kinds of formal assumptions associated with human dignity (Rawls 2009; Habermas 2010). And moral theories can enforce duties which in turn generate institutional designs and procedural mechanisms intended to protect human dignity and render it immanent in social systems (Gewirth 1998). In sum the three problems associated with an IHD claim are not uniformly accepted and should not be treated as a refutation of interstitial claims in general or an IHD concept specifically.

Above all, a connection between human rights and human dignity gives critical force to human dignity and indicates precisely why the predominant concept of human dignity should be assumed to be an interstitial one. Conceptualizing human dignity as foundational is sometimes construed as bonding the existing body of human rights law with a moral claim that guarantees their force as moral, not just positive, rights. The most plausible explanation of such a guarantee is through deontological theory granting supreme moral importance to the individual and immunizing them from consequentialist determinations of the common good that would potentially sacrifice their rights and their status. Beyond this, the precise account of justification, rights, and practice is open to debate, but human dignity is the foremost expression of the deontological commitments sketched here. Even in this sketch it is clear that the normative fields of law, ethics, and politics are not intended to be absolutely divided but rather guided and judged by their consistency with the protection of human rights. It is this claim that lies at the heart of an interstitial concept of human dignity (and much else besides in international law). It remains to draw out the implications of this.

c. The Implications of an Interstitial Concept

Assuming that an IHD concept—sitting between normative fields, linking these fields, and conditioning them—is intelligible, then its implications are considerable. Let us assume that the commitments contained in such a concept are as follows. Human dignity is treated as having the formal features identified (universality, overridingness, and so forth); it has the characteristic content of human dignity claims (a species claim or a claim about human dignity being relational or a property); and it encompasses commitment to a distinctive normative use (for example, empowerment of the individual, expressed in terms of claim rights, that holds at least between the individual and all political institutions). The sum of this commitment would be as follows. In all interactions between state and individual, claim rights (expressible as human rights) can and should be exercised by all human persons, and the exercise of those rights would not be conditioned by any jurisdictional boundaries. This amounts to having significance in all possible interactions between the collective and the individual. It will imply that there is no interaction between individuals that is not at least potentially normatively governed by human dignity. And it implies that any special demands about normative priorities made by law, ethics or politics would be justified only to the extent that they were consistent with, or directly conditioned by, the overarching commitment to human dignity. This concept is, then, enormously demanding insofar as its fulfillment would not be discharged on the basis of respecting a single norm (be it a Grundnorm or an anti-atrocity norm) but would, rather, demand an ongoing commitment to subject every executive and administrative decision to scrutiny on the basis of its consonance with the content and implications of human dignity particularly as this is expressed through human rights.

What conceptual and practical problems does this imply? The actual enforceability of human dignity itself as a norm or right is potentially unclear here, and the idea of human dignity’s overridingness sits uneasily with many common legal, political and moral assumptions. For related reasons it is not clear if human dignity should be a named, explicit norm within a constitution. It would be impracticable (indeed perhaps senseless) to have a norm that trumped all other norms; human dignity cannot be assumed to function in a normative vacuum. And the function of an interstitial concept is to link and justify different normative fields, not to directly govern them through one explicit Grundnorm. In fact, having concrete implications for these fields demands a more complete explication of the concept in terms of human rights which themselves require clear institutional arrangements. What human dignity amounts to is an expression of the foundations of any and all of our normative practices and the demand that human rights and human dignity have a constitutive and not just regulative role in our social institutions and practices. Nevertheless, this is a demand for a far more substantial explication of human rights, institutions, and good—that is, human dignity preserving—interaction between law, morality and politics in practice.

If, despite such challenges, we accept this IHD reading, we should reject a number of other readings of human dignity as peripheral or incoherent. Common uses of human dignity in healthcare and medical ethics that treat human dignity as one amongst many ‘middle-level principles,’ or bioethical readings that treat human dignity as synonymous with sanctity, would be non-standard readings on these assumptions and intelligible only as idiosyncratic local uses. Common criticisms of human dignity as vacuous or empty (because human dignity apparently collapses into notions of autonomy) would be rejected as incoherent because they fail to distinguish an IHD from either idiosyncratic local uses or from irrelevant non-interstitial uses. There would remain, however, an important but complex line of enquiry concerning how human dignity and self-regarding duties should be thought to interact. On the one hand, the IHD concept has been detached from the perfectionist Stoic tradition invoking species norms which determine whether individuals are ‘fully human.’ On the other hand the typical form, content, and normative implications of the IHD need not exclude the possibility of self-regarding duties arising from respecting one’s own status as human person.

5. Conclusion

The foregoing analysis stressed the problems of using human dignity in philosophical and ethical thought. The concept itself is opaque, and one important modern usage faces the problem of aspiring to be interstitial within and between normative fields that are themselves resistant to the very idea of such interstitial concepts. Nevertheless, there are good reasons why such a far-reaching concept should be primary in our thinking, and for this reason human dignity is likely to remain a component of normative discourse despite its problematic characteristics.

6. References and Further Reading

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  • Sulmasy, D. P. (2007) ‘Human dignity and human worth’, in Perspectives on human dignity: A conversation. Springer, pp. 9–18. Available at:
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  • Waldron, J. (2008) ‘The Concept and the Rule of Law’, Georgia Law Review, 43(1), pp. 1–62.
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Author Information

Stephen Riley
Utrecht University


Gerhard Bos
Utrecht University