Humean Arguments from Evil against Theism
Arguments from evil are arguments against Theism, which is broadly construed as the view that there is a supremely powerful, knowledgeable, and good creator of the universe. Arguments from evil attempt to show that there is a problem with Theism. Some arguments depend on it being known that Theism is false, but some arguments from evil also try to show that Theism is known to be probably false, or unreasonable, or that there is strong evidence against it. Arguments from evil are part of the project of criticizing religions, and because religions offer comprehensive worldviews, arguments from evil are also part of the project of evaluating which comprehensive worldviews are true or false.
Humean arguments from evil take their argumentative strategy from Philo’s argument from evil in part XI of Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. Philo’s argumentative strategy is distinctive in that it is fundamentally explanatory in nature. Philo takes as his data for explanation the good and evil we know about. He asks which hypothesis about a creator best explains that data. He argues that the good and evil we know about is not best explained by Theism but some rival hypothesis to Theism. In this way, the good and evil we know about provides a reason for rejecting Theism.
This article surveys Humean arguments from evil. It begins by explaining Philo’s original argument from evil as well as some potential drawbacks of that argument. Then it turns to more fully explaining the distinctive features of Humean arguments from evil in comparison to other arguments from evil. It highlights three features in particular: they appeal to facts about good and evil, they are comparative, and they are abductive. The remainder of the article articulates a modern, prototypical Humean argument inspired by the work of Paul Draper. It explains the idea that the good and evil we know about is better explained by a rival to Theism called the “Hypothesis of Indifference,” roughly, the hypothesis that there is no creator who cares about the world one way or the other. It then shows how to strengthen Humean arguments from evil by providing additional support for the rival hypothesis to Theism. Finally, it examines four prominent objections to Humean arguments.
This article focuses on Humean arguments that try to show that Theism is known to be false, or probably false, or unreasonable to believe. These kinds of Humean arguments are ambitious, as they try to draw an overall conclusion about Theism itself. But there can also be more modest Humean arguments that try to show that some evidence favors a rival to Theism without necessarily drawing any overall conclusions about Theism itself. This article focuses on ambitious Humean arguments rather than these modest Humean arguments mostly because ambitious Humean arguments are the ones contemporary philosophers have focused on. But it is important to keep in mind that Humean arguments from evil—like arguments from evil more generally—come in different shapes and sizes and may have different strengths and weaknesses.
Table of Contents
- Philo’s Argument from Evil
- Distinctive Features of Humean Arguments
- Modern Humean Arguments
- Strengthening Humean Arguments
- Criticisms of Humean Arguments
- References and Further Reading
Natural theology is the attempt to provide arguments for the existence of God by only appealing to natural facts—that is, facts that are not (purportedly) revealed or otherwise supernatural. Three of the traditional arguments for the existence of God—the ontological argument, the cosmological argument, and the teleological argument—belong to the project of natural theology. Conversely, natural atheology is the attempt to provide arguments against the existence of God by appealing to natural (non-supernatural, non-revealed) facts as well.
Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion is a classic work of natural atheology. In the dialogue, the interlocutors assume that there is a creator (or creators) of the world; they advance arguments about the nature or character of this creator. Most of the dialogue—parts II-VIII—discusses design arguments for the existence of God whereas later parts—parts X-XI—discuss arguments from evil. In the dialogue, Philo offers a variety of critiques of prototypical theistic ideas. (Because it is controversial whether Philo speaks for Hume—and if so, where—this article attributes the reasoning to Philo.)
In section X, the interlocutors discuss what is called a “logical” or “incompatibility” argument from evil. They begin by describing various facts about good and evil they have observed. For instance, many people experience pleasure in life; but oftentimes they also experience great pain; the strong prey upon the weak; people use their imaginations not just for relaxation but to create new fears and anxieties; and so forth. They consider whether those facts are logically inconsistent with the existence of a creator with infinite power, wisdom, and goodness. Ultimately Philo does not think it would be reasonable to infer the existence of such a creator from those facts; but he does concede that they are logically consistent with the existence of such a creator (X:35; XI.4, 12). But Philo’s concession is not his last word on the subject.
In section XI, Philo constructs a different argument from evil. Philo begins by articulating additional claims about good and evil he takes himself to know. Most of these additional claims consist in causes of suffering that seem to be unnecessary—for example, variations in weather cause suffering, yet seem to serve no purpose; pain teaches animals and people how to act, but it seems that pleasure would be just as effective at motivating people to act; and so forth. Given these claims, Philo considers what we can reasonably infer about the creator (or creators) of the universe. He considers four potential hypotheses:
- The creator(s) of the universe are supremely good.
- The creator(s) of the universe are supremely malicious.
- The creator(s) of the universe have some mixture of both goodness and malice.
- The creator(s) of the universe have neither goodness nor malice.
In evaluating these hypotheses, Philo uses a Humean principle of reasoning that “like effects have like causes.” In other words, the only kinds of features it is reasonable to infer from an effect to its cause(s) are features that would be similar between the two. (He uses this principle throughout the Dialogue; see also II.7, II.8, II.14, II.17, V.1, VI.1.) Using this principle, he argues that of these hypotheses the fourth is “by far the most probable” (XI.15). He rejects the first and the second because the causes of the universe would be too dissimilar to the universe itself. The world is mixed, containing both good and evil. Thus, one cannot infer that the cause of the world contains no evil—as the first hypothesis suggests—or contains no good—as the second hypothesis suggests. Those causes are too dissimilar. He also rejects the third hypothesis. He assumes that if the universe had some mixture of goodness and malice this would be because some of the creators of the universe would be good and some of the creators of the universe would be malicious. And, he assumes, the universe would then be like a battlefield between them. But the regularity of the world suggests the universe is not a battlefield between dueling creators. Having ruled out the first three hypotheses, the most probable hypothesis must be the fourth. As Philo himself says of this hypothesis, using language that is graphic both now and then (XI.13):
The whole [of the universe] presents nothing but the idea of a blind nature, impregnated by a great vivifying principle, and pouring forth from her lap, without discernment or parental care, her maimed and abortive children.
Philo’s conclusion has both a weak and a strong interpretation. In the strong interpretation, Philo is concluding that we can reasonably believe something about the nature of the creator(s), namely, that they are indifferent. In a weak interpretation, Philo is concluding that of these four hypotheses, the fourth is the most probable—but it may not be sufficiently probable to reasonably believe. Either way, the most reasonable hypothesis is that the creator has neither goodness nor malice.
At first blush, it might not be obvious how Philo’s conclusion provides a reason for rejecting Theism. In fact, it might look like Philo is just concerned to undermine an argument from our knowledge of good and evil to Theism. And, one might point out, undermining an argument for a conclusion is not the same thing as providing a reason for rejecting that conclusion. To see how Philo’s conclusion provides a reason for rejecting Theism, notice two things. First, Philo is not merely claiming something purely negative, like that some argument for Theism fails. Rather, he is also claiming something positive, namely, that the fourth hypothesis—where the creator has neither goodness nor malice—is the most reasonable of the four considered, given our knowledge of good and evil. Second, that hypothesis is inconsistent with Theism, which maintains (at the very least) that God is supremely good. Since the most reasonable thing to believe, given that data, is inconsistent with Theism, then that data provides a reason for rejecting Theism. In this way, Philo is not simply undermining an argument for Theism; he is also providing a reason for rejecting Theism.
Philo’s specific argument has received a mixed reaction both historically and in the early 21st century. From a contemporary perspective, there are at least two drawbacks to Philo’s specific argument. First, Philo and his interlocutors assume that there is a creator (or creators) of the universe. Thus, they only consider hypotheses that imply that there is a creator (or creators) of the universe. But many contemporary naturalists and atheists do not assume that there is any creator at all. From a contemporary perspective, it would be better to consider a wider range of hypotheses, including some that do not imply that there is a creator. Second, when evaluating hypotheses, Philo uses Hume’s principles of reasoning that “like causes have like effects.” But many contemporary philosophers reject such principles. Insofar as Philo’s reasoning assumes Hume’s own principles of reasoning, it will exhibit the various problems philosophers have identified for Hume’s principles of reasoning.
But even if Philo’s specific argument suffers from drawbacks, his argumentative strategy is both distinctive and significant. Thus, one might mount an argument that shares several of the distinctive features of his argumentative strategy without committing oneself to the specific details of Philo’s own argument. Toward the end of the 20th and beginning of the 21st century, Paul Draper did exactly that, constructing arguments against Theism that utilize Philo’s argumentative strategy while relying on a more modern epistemology. It is natural to call these arguments Humean arguments since their strategy originates in a dialogue written by Hume—even if modern defenses of them vary from Hume’s original epistemology. The next section describes in more detail several of the distinctive features of Philo’s argumentative strategy.
First, many arguments from evil focus exclusively on facts about evil. Some arguments focus on our inability to see reasons that would justify God’s permission of those evils (Martin (1978), Rowe (1979)). Other arguments focus on the horrific nature of such evils (Adams (1999)). By contrast, Humean arguments from evil focus on facts about both good and evil. The focus on both good and evil is appropriate and significant.
The focus on good and evil is appropriate because, if God exists, God cares about preventing evil but also bringing about what is good. The focus on good and evil is significant because it provides a richer set of data with which to reason about the existence of God. For it is conceivable that facts about evil provide some evidence against the existence of God, but facts about good provide even stronger evidence for the existence of God, thereby offsetting that evidence. Or, alternatively, it is conceivable that facts about evil provide little to no evidence against the existence of God, but facts about good and evil together provide strong evidence against the existence of God. By focusing on both good and evil, Humean arguments provide a richer set of data to reason about the moral character of a purported creator.
Second, Humean arguments compare Theism to some rival hypothesis that is inconsistent with Theism. Normally, the rival hypothesis is more specific than the denial of Theism. For instance, Philo’s argument considered rival hypotheses to Theism that are fairly specific. And we can distinguish between different Humean arguments on the basis of the different rival hypotheses they use.
There is an important advantage of using a specific rival hypothesis to Theism. The simplest rival to Theism is the denial of Theism. But consider all of the views that are inconsistent with Theism. That set includes various forms of naturalism, but also pantheism, panentheism, non-theistic idealisms, various forms of pagan religions, and perhaps others yet. So, the denial of Theism is logically equivalent to the disjunction of these various theories. But it is not at all obvious what a disjunction of these various theories will predict. By contrast, it is normally more obvious what a more specific, rival hypothesis to Theism predicts. Thus, by focusing on a more specific rival hypothesis to Theism, it is easier to compare Theism to that rival.
Third, Humean arguments are best understood abductively. They compare to what degree a specific rival to Theism better explains, or otherwise predicts, some data. Even Philo’s own argument could be understood abductively: the hypothesis that there is a supremely good creator does not explain the good and evil Philo observes because the creator proposed by that hypothesis is not similar to the good and evil he observes. To be clear, Humean arguments need not claim that the rival actually provides the best explanation of those facts. Rather, their claim is more modest, but with real bite: a rival to theism does a better job of explaining some facts about good and evil.
Some Humean arguments may stop here with a comparison between Theism and a specific rival hypothesis. But many Humean arguments are more ambitious than that: they try to provide a reason for rejecting Theism. This feature of such Humean arguments deserves further clarification. Sometimes abductive reasoning is characterized as “inference to the best explanation.” In a specific inference to the best explanation, one infers that some hypothesis is true because it is part of the best explanation of some data. Such Humean arguments need not be understood as inference to the best explanation in this sense. Though it is not as catchy, some Humean arguments could be understood as “inference away from a worse explanation.” Some body of data gives us reason to reject Theism because some hypothesis other than Theism does a better job of explaining that data and that hypothesis is inconsistent with Theism. Notice that a specific rival to Theism can do a better job of explaining that data even if some other hypothesis does an even better job yet.
Lastly, Humean arguments are evidential arguments from evil, not logical arguments from evil. More specifically, Humean arguments do not claim that some known facts are logically inconsistent with Theism. Rather, they claim that some known facts are strong evidence against Theism. Logical arguments from evil have an important methodological feature. If some known fact is logically inconsistent with Theism, then it does not matter what evidence people muster for Theism—we already know that Theism is false. By contrast, evidential arguments may need to be evidentially shored up. Even if the arguments are successful in providing strong evidence against Theism, it may be that there is also strong evidence in favor of Theism as well. This difference between evidential arguments and logical arguments is relevant in section 4 which indicates how to strengthen Humean arguments.
This section explains a modern, prototypical Humean argument. The author who has done the most to develop Humean arguments is Paul Draper. The argument in this section is inspired by Paul Draper’s work without being an interpretation of any specific argument Draper has given. Humean arguments compare Theism to some specific rival to Theism; and different Humean arguments may use different specific rivals to compare to Theism. Consequently, it is important to begin by clarifying what specific rival is used to generate Humean arguments.
This article uses the term Hypothesis of Indifference. The Hypothesis of Indifference is the claim that it is not the case that the nature or condition of life on earth is the result of a creator (or creators) who cares positively or negatively about that life. The Hypothesis of Indifference is a natural hypothesis to focus on for several reasons. First, it is inconsistent with Theism, but is more specific than just the denial of Theism. Second, it does not imply that there is a creator. Third, it is consistent with metaphysical naturalism, the view that there are no supernatural facts. These last two reasons are important to a modern audience—many people believe that there is no creator of the universe, and many philosophers accept metaphysical naturalism.
The central claim of this Humean argument is this: the Hypothesis of Indifference does a much better job predicting the good and evil we know about than Theism does. This article refers to this claim as Central Claim. Central Claim does not claim that the Hypothesis of Indifference perfectly predicts the good and evil we know about. It does not even claim that the Hypothesis of Indifference is the best explanation of the good and evil we know about. Rather, it claims that in comparison to Theism, the Hypothesis of Indifference does a much better job of predicting the good and evil we know about.
The comparison in Central Claim is an antecedent comparison. That is, it compares what the Hypothesis of Indifference and Theism predict about good and evil antecedent of our actual knowledge of that good and evil. We are to set aside, or bracket, our actual knowledge of good and evil and ask to what degree each hypothesis—the Hypothesis of Indifference, Theism—predicts what we know.
This procedure of antecedent comparison is not unique to Humean arguments. It is frequently used in the sciences. A classic example of the same procedure is the retrograde movement of Mars. Using the naked eye, Mars seems to move “backwards” through the sky. Some astronomers argued that the retrograde motion of Mars was better explained by heliocentrism than geocentrism. But in making their arguments, they first set aside what they already knew about the retrograde motion of Mars. Rather, they asked to what degree each hypothesis would predict the retrograde motion of Mars before considering whether Mars exhibits retrograde motion.
There are different strategies one might use to defend Central Claim. One strategy appeals to what is normally called our background knowledge. This is knowledge we already have “in the background.” Such knowledge is frequently relied upon when we are evaluating claims about evidence, prediction, explanation, and the like. For instance, suppose I hear a loud repeating shrieking noise from my kitchen. I will immediately take that as evidence that there is smoke in my kitchen and go to investigate. However, when I take that noise as evidence of smoke in my kitchen, I rely upon a huge range of knowledge that is in the background, such as: loud repeating shrieking noises do not happen at random; that noise is not caused by a person or pet; there is a smoke detector in my kitchen; smoke detectors are designed to emit loud noises in the presence of smoke; and so on. I rely on this background knowledge—implicitly or explicitly—when I take that noise as evidence of smoke in my kitchen. For instance, if I lacked all of that background knowledge, it is very unlikely I would immediately take that noise as evidence of smoke in my kitchen.
One strategy for defending Central Claim relies upon our background knowledge. The basic strategy has four parts. First, one argues that our background knowledge supports certain kinds of predictions about good and evil. Second, one argues that those predictions are, to a certain degree, accurate. Third, one argues that the Hypothesis of Indifference does not interfere with or undermine those predictions. Finally, one argues that Theism interferes with or undermines those predictions, producing more inaccurate predictions. The end result, then, is that the combination of the Hypothesis of Indifference with our background knowledge does a better job of predicting the data of good and evil than the combination of Theism with our background knowledge.
This strategy can be implemented in various ways. One way of implementing it appeals to our background knowledge of the biological role or function of pleasure and pain (Draper (1989)). Specifically, our background knowledge predicts that pleasure and pain will play certain adaptive roles or functions for organisms. And when we consider the pleasure and pain we know about, we find that it frequently plays those kinds of roles. For instance, warm sunlight on the skin is pleasant, but also releases an important vitamin (vitamin D); rotten food normally produces an unpleasant odor; extreme temperatures that are bad for the body are also painful to experience for extended durations; and so forth. So, our background knowledge makes certain predictions about the biological role or function of pleasure and pain, and those predictions are fairly accurate.
The Hypothesis of Indifference does not interfere with, or undermine, those predictions as it does not imply the existence of a creator who has moral reasons for deviating from the biological role of pleasure and pain. By contrast, Theism does interfere with, and undermine, those predictions. For pleasure is a good and pain a bad. Thus, given Theism, one might expect pleasure and pain to play moral or religious roles or functions. The exact nature of those moral or religious roles might be open to debate. But they might include things like the righteous receiving happiness or perhaps good people getting the pleasure they deserve. Similarly, given Theism, one might expect pain to not play certain biological roles if it does not simultaneously play moral or religious roles. For instance, given Theism, one might not expect organisms that are not moral agents to undergo intense physical pain (regardless of whether that pain serves a biological role). In this way, Theism may interfere with the fairly accurate predictions from our background information. Thus, the combination of the Hypothesis of Indifference and our background knowledge does a better job of predicting some of our knowledge of good and evil—namely, the distribution of pleasure and pain—than the combination of Theism and our background knowledge.
A second strategy for defending Central Claim utilizes a thought experiment (compare Hume Dialogue, XI.4, Dougherty and Draper (2013), Morriston (2014)). Imagine two alien creatures who are of roughly human intelligence and skill. One of them accepts Theism, and the other accepts the Hypothesis of Indifference. But neither of them knows anything about the condition of life on earth. They first make predictions about the nature and quality of life on earth, then they learn about the accuracy of their predictions. One might argue that the alien who accepts the Hypothesis of Indifference will do a much better job predicting the good and evil on earth than the alien who accepts Theism. But as it goes for the aliens so it goes for us: the Hypothesis of Indifference does a much better job of predicting the good and evil we know about than Theism does
The alien who accepts Theism might be surprised as it learns about the actual good and evil of life on earth. For the alien’s acceptance of Theism gives it reason to expect a better overall balance of good and evil than we know about. By contrast, the alien who accepts the Hypothesis of Indifference might not be surprised by the good and evil that we know about because the Hypothesis of Indifference does not imply the existence of a creator with a moral reason for influencing the good and evil the earth has. So the alien’s acceptance of the Hypothesis of Indifference does not give it a reason for anticipating any particular distribution of good and evil. Thus, the alien accepting the Hypothesis of Indifference might not be surprised to discover the specific good and evil it does in fact know about.
Recall that Central Claim involves an antecedent comparison—it compares to what degree two hypotheses predict some data antecedent of our actual knowledge of that data. This thought experiment models the idea of an antecedent comparison by having the aliens not actually know the relevant data of good and evil. Their ignorance of the good and evil models our “bracketing” of our own knowledge.
Having considered some defenses of Central Claim, we can now formulate some Humean arguments that use Central Claim as a premise. One Humean argument goes like this:
Central Claim: the Hypothesis of Indifference does a much better job predicting the good and evil we know about than Theism does.
Therefore, the good and evil we know about is evidence favoring the Hypothesis of Indifference over Theism.
This argument is valid. But the inference of this argument is modest on two fronts. First, evidence comes in degrees, from weak evidence to overwhelming evidence. The conclusion of this argument merely states that the good and evil we know about is evidence favoring one hypothesis over another without specifying the strength of that evidence. Second, this conclusion is consistent with a wide range of views about what is reasonable for us to believe. The conclusion is consistent with views like: it is reasonable to believe Theism; it is reasonable to believe the Hypothesis of Indifference; it is not reasonable to believe or disbelieve either. To be sure, this argument still asserts Central Claim; and as we see in section V, a number of authors have objected to Central Claim and arguments for it. But the conclusion drawn from Central Claim is quite modest. Perhaps for these reasons, defenders of Humean arguments from Philo to the present have tended to defend Humean arguments with more ambitious conclusions.
Consider the following simple Humean argument against Theism:
Central Claim: the Hypothesis of Indifference does a much better job predicting the good and evil we know about than Theism does.
Therefore, Theism is probably false.
This argument does not draw a conclusion comparing Theism to some rival. Rather, it draws a conclusion about Theism itself. In this way it is more ambitious than the argument just considered. What makes this Humean argument a simple Humean argument is that it only has one premise—Central Claim. However, this argument is not valid, and there are several reasons for thinking it is not very strong. The next section explains what those reasons are and how to strengthen Humean arguments by adding additional premises to produce a better (and arguably valid) argument.
Suppose that Central Claim is true. Then a rival hypothesis (Hypothesis of Indifference) to a hypothesis (Theism) does a much better job predicting some data (what we know about good and evil). However, that fact on its own might not make it reasonable to believe the rival hypothesis (Hypothesis of Indifference) or disbelieve the relevant hypothesis (Theism). For the rival hypothesis might have other problems such as being ad hoc or not predicting other data (compare Plantinga (1996)).
An analogy will be useful in explaining these points. Suppose I come home to find that one of the glass windows on the back door of my home has been broken. These facts are “data” that I want to explain. One hypothesis is that the kids next door were playing and accidentally broke the glass with a ball (Accident Hypothesis). A rival hypothesis is that a burglar broke into my home by breaking the glass (Burglar Hypothesis). Now the Burglar Hypothesis better predicts the data. If the burglar is going to break into my home, an effective way to do that is to break the glass on the door to thereby unlock the door. By contrast, the Accident Hypothesis does a worse job predicting the data. Even if the kids were playing, the ball might not hit my door. And even if the ball did hit the door, it might not hit the glass with enough force to break it. So, in this case, the rival hypothesis (Burglar Hypothesis) to a hypothesis (Accident Hypothesis) does a much better job predicting some data (the broken glass on my back door). Does it thereby follow that it is reasonable for me to believe the rival hypothesis (Burglar Hypothesis) or it is unreasonable for me to believe the hypothesis (Accident Hypothesis)?
No, or at least, not yet. First, the Burglar Hypothesis is much less simple than the Accident Hypothesis. I already know that there are kids next door who like to play outside. I do not already know that there is a burglar who wants to break into my home. So the Burglar Hypothesis is committed to the existence of more things than I already know about. That makes the Burglar Hypothesis less ontologically simple. Second, the Burglar Hypothesis might not predict as well other data that I know. Suppose, for instance, there is a baseball rolling around inside my home, and nothing has been stolen. The Accident Hypothesis does a much better job predicting this data than the Burglar Hypothesis. So even if the Burglar Hypothesis better predicts some data, on its own, that would not make it reasonable for me to believe The Burglar Hypothesis or make it reasonable to disbelieve the Accident Hypothesis.
Returning to Humean arguments, suppose Central Claim is true so that a rival to Theism, specifically the Hypothesis of Indifference, better predicts the good and evil we know about. It may not yet follow that it is reasonable to believe the Hypothesis of Indifference or disbelieve Theism. For it may be that the rival is much less simple than Theism. Or it may be that the rival to Theism does a much worse job predicting other data that we know about.
To strengthen Humean arguments, additional premises can be added (compare Dougherty and Draper (2013), Perrine and Wykstra (2014), Morriston (2014)). For instance, an additional premise might be Simplicity Claim: the Hypothesis of Indifference is just as simple, if not more so, than Theism. Another premise might be Not-Counterbalanced Claim: there is no body of data we know about that Theism does a much better job predicting than the Hypothesis of Indifference. The strengthened argument looks like this:
Central Claim: the Hypothesis of Indifference does a much better job predicting the good and evil we know about than Theism does.
Simplicity Claim: the Hypothesis of Indifference is just as simple, if not more so, than Theism.
Not-Counterbalanced Claim: there is no body of data we know about that Theism does a much better job predicting than the Hypothesis of Indifference.
Therefore, Theism is false.
This argument is a stronger argument than the simple one-premise argument from the previous section. Arguably, it is valid. (Whether it is valid depends partly on the relationship between issues like simplicity and probability; but see Dougherty and Draper (2013: 69) for an argument that it is valid.)
Premises like Simplicity Claim and Not-Counterbalanced Claim are not always defended in discussion of arguments from evil. But they can be defended by pressing into service other work in the philosophy of religion. For instance, natural theologians try to provide evidence for the existence of God by appealing to facts we know about. Critics argue that such evidence does not support Theism or, perhaps, supports Theism only to a limited degree. These exchanges are relevant to evaluating Not-Counterbalanced Claim. To be sure, Humean arguments compare Theism to some rival. So other work in philosophy of religion might not straightforwardly apply if it does not consider a rival to Theism or considers a different rival than the one used in the relevant Humean argument.
These additional premises strengthened Humean arguments because Humean arguments are not logical or incompatibility arguments. That is, they do not claim that the good and evil we know about is logically inconsistent with Theism. Rather, they are abductive arguments. They claim that what we know about good and evil is evidence against Theism because some rival to Theism better predicts or explains it. But in evaluating how well a hypothesis explains some data, it is oftentimes important to also consider further facts about the hypothesis—such as how simple it is or if it is also known to be false or otherwise problematic.
Lastly, some might think that the relation between simple and strengthened Humean arguments is just a matter of whether we have considered some evidence against Theism or all relevant evidence for or against Theism. But considering some evidence versus all the evidence are just two different tasks, and the first task can be done without consideration of the second. However, the relation between simple and strengthened Humean arguments is a little more complex than that for certain methodological reasons.
Each of the premises of a strengthened Humean argument involves a comparison of Theism with a specific rival to Theism. But the specific choice of the rival might make it easier to defend some of the comparisons while simultaneously making it harder to defend other comparisons. For instance, the Hypothesis of Indifference does not posit any entity that has the ability or desire to influence life on earth. Some defenders of Central Claim might use that feature to argue that the Hypothesis of Indifference has better predictive fit than Theism with regard to the good and evil we know about. But exactly because the Hypothesis of Indifference does not posit any entity that has the ability or desire to influence life on earth, it may have worse predictive fit when it comes to the fine-tuning of the universe, the existence of life at all, the existence of conscious organisms, the existence of moral agents, and other potential evidence. So picking the Hypothesis of Indifference might make it easier to defend some premises of a strengthened Humean argument (perhaps Central Claim) while also making it harder to defend other premises of a strengthened Humean argument (perhaps Not-Counterbalanced Claim).
As such, the relationship between a simple and strengthened Humean argument is more complex. It is not simply a matter of considering one potential pool of evidence and then considering a larger pool of evidence. Rather, the choice of a specific rival to Theism is relevant to an evaluation of both simple and strengthened Humean arguments. Some specific rivals might make it easier to defend a simple Humean argument while also making it harder to defend a strengthened Humean argument (or vice versa). Defenders of Humean arguments have to carefully choose a specific rival that balances simplicity and predictive strength to challenge Theism.
Like all philosophical arguments, Humean arguments have received their fair share of criticisms. This section describes a handful of criticisms and potential responses to those criticisms. These criticisms are all criticisms of Central Claim (or premises like it). Consequently, these objections could be lodged against simple Humean arguments and strengthened Humen arguments—as well as the “modest” Humean argument mentioned at the end of section III. (For a discussion of historical responses to Hume’s writing on religion, see Pyle (2006: chapter 5).)
Some authors object to the biological role argument for Central Claim (Plantinga (1996), Dougherty and Draper (2013)). Consider the wide range of pleasure and pain we know about. For instance, I get pleasure out of reading a gripping novel, listening to a well-crafted musical album, or tasting the subtle flavors of a well-balanced curry. Likewise, consider the pain of self-sacrifice, the displeasure of a hard workout, or the frustration of seeing a coworker still fail to fill in standardized forms correctly. The objection goes that these pleasures and pains do not seem to serve any biological roles.
Defenders of Humean arguments might respond in two ways. First, they might distinguish between the pleasure and pain of humans and of non-human animals. It might be that the pleasure and pain in non-human animals is much more likely to play a biological role than the pleasure and pain in humans. Thus, overall, pleasure and pain are more likely to play a biological role. Second, they might point out that Central Claim does not imply that the Hypothesis of Indifference does a good job explaining pleasure and pain. Rather, it implies that the Hypothesis of Indifference does a much better job than Theism. Thus, from the mere fact that some pleasures and pains do not seem to serve any biological roles it would not follow that Theism does a better job of predicting pleasure and pain than the Hypothesis of Indifference.
Humean arguments maintain that what we know about good and evil is better predicted or explained by some rival to Theism than by Theism itself. In a simple understanding, what we know about good and evil includes claims like: it is bad that stray cats starve in the winter. However, some critics argue that the best explanation of the existence of good and evil is Theism itself. That is, they might argue that a purely naturalistic world, devoid of any supernatural reality, does a much worse job predicting the existence of good and evil than a claim like Theism. The argument here is abductive: there might not be any contradiction in claiming that the world is purely naturalistic and that there is good and evil. Nonetheless, a purely naturalistic hypothesis does a much worse job predicting or explaining good and evil than Theism. Thus, these critics argue, premises like Central Claim are false, since Theism does a much better job of explaining the existence of good and evil than naturalistic alternatives to Theism (see Lauinger (2014) for an example of this criticism).
Note that this objection only applies to certain kinds of Humean arguments. Specifically, it only applies to Humean arguments that implicitly or explicitly assume a rival to Theism that is a purely naturalistic hypothesis. However, not all rivals to Theism need be a purely naturalistic hypothesis. For instance, some of the rivals that Philo considered are not purely naturalistic. Nonetheless, many contemporary authors do accept a purely naturalistic worldview and would compare that worldview with a Theistic one.
In response, defenders of Humean arguments might defend metaethical naturalism. According to metaethical naturalism, normative facts, including facts about good and evil, are natural facts. Defenders of Humean arguments might argue that given metaethical naturalism, a purely naturalistic worldview does predict, to a high degree, normative facts. Determining whether this response succeeds, though, would require a foray into complex issues in metaethics.
Many philosophers and ordinary people assume that if Theism is true, then God has certain obligations to us. For instance, God is obligated to not bring about evil for us for absolutely no reason at all. These obligations might be based in God’s nature or some independent order. Either way, God is required to treat us in certain ways. The idea that if Theism is true, then God has certain obligations to us is a key idea in defending arguments from evil, including Humean arguments from evil. For instance, one of the defenses of Central Claim from above said that Theists might be surprised at the distribution of good and evil we know about. They might be surprised because they expect God to prevent that evil, since God has an obligation to prevent it, and that being all-powerful, God could prevent it. In this way, defenses of Central Claim (and premises like it) may implicitly assume that if Theism is true, then God has certain obligations to us.
However, some philosophers reject the claim that God has certain obligations to us (Adams (2013), Murphy (2017)). In these views, God might have a justifying reason to prevent evils and harms to us; but God does not have requiring reasons of the sort generated by obligations. There are different arguments for these views, and they are normally quite complex. But the arguments normally articulate a conception of God in which God is not a moral agent in the same way an average human person is a moral agent. But if God is not required to prevent evils and harms for us, God is closer to Hume’s “indifferent creator.” Just as an indifferent creator may, if they so desire, improve the lives of humans and animals, so too God may, if God so desires, improve the lives of humans and animals. But neither God nor the indifferent creator must do so.
Defenders of Humean arguments may respond to these arguments by simply criticizing these conceptions of God. Defenders of Humean arguments might argue that those conceptions are false or subtly incoherent. Alternatively, they might argue that those conceptions of God make it more difficult to challenge premises like Not-Counterbalanced Claim. For if God only has justifying reasons for treating us in certain ways, there might be a wide range of potential ways God would allow the world to be. But if there is a wide range of potential ways God would allow the world to be, then Theism does not make very specific predictions about how the world is. In this way, critics of Humean arguments may make it easier to challenge a premise like Central Claim but at the cost of making it harder to challenge a premise like Not-Counterbalanced Claim.
Perhaps some of the most persistent critics of Humean arguments are skeptical theists (van Inwagen (1991), Bergmann (2009), Perrine and Wykstra (2014), Perrine (2019)). While there are many forms of skeptical theism, a unifying idea is that even if God were to exist, we should be skeptical of our ability to predict what the universe is like—including what the universe is like regarding good and evil. Skeptical theists develop and apply these ideas to a wide range of arguments against Theism, including Humean arguments.
Skeptical theistic critiques of Humean arguments can be quite complex. Here the critiques are simplified into two parts that form a simple modus tollens structure. The first part is to argue that there are certain claims that we cannot reasonably disbelieve or otherwise reasonably rule out. (In other words, we should be skeptical of their truth.) The second part is to argue that if we are reasonable in believing Central Claim (or something like it), then it is reasonable for us to disbelieve those claims. Since it is not reasonable for us to believe those claims, it follows that we are not reasonable in believing Central Claim (or something like it).
For the first part, consider a claim like this:
Limitation. God is unable to create a world with a better balance of good and evil without sacrificing other morally significant goods.
Skeptical theists argue that it is not reasonable for us to believe that Limitation is false; rather, we should be skeptical of its truth or falsity. One might argue that it is reasonable for us to believe that Limitation is false because it is hard for us to identify the relevant morally significant goods. But skeptical theists argue that this is a poor reason for disbelieving Limitation since God is likely to have created the world with many morally significant goods that are obscure to us. One might argue that it is reasonable for us to believe that Limitation is false because it is easy for us to imagine or conceive of a world in which it is false. But skeptical theists argue that this is a poor reason for disbelieving Limitation because conceivability is an unreliable guide to possibility when it comes to such complex claims like Limitation. In general, skeptical theists argue that our grasp of the goods and evils there are, as well as how they are connected, is too poor for us to reasonably disbelieve something like Limitation. In this way, they are skeptical of our access to all of the reasons God might have that are relevant to the permission of evil.
The second part of the skeptical theist’s critique is that if it is not reasonable for us to believe Limitation is false, then it is not reasonable for us to believe Central Claim is true. This part of the skeptical theist’s critique may seem surprising. Central Claim is a comparison between two hypotheses. Limitation is not comparative. Nonetheless, skeptical theists think they are importantly related. To see how they might relate, an analogy might be useful.
Suppose Keith is a caring doctor. How likely is it that Keith will cut a patient with a scalpel? At first blush, it might seem that it is extremely unlikely. Caring doctors do not cut people with scalpels! But on second thought, it is natural to think that whether Keith will cut a patient with a scalpel depends upon the kinds of reasons Keith has. If Keith has no compelling medical reason to do so, then given that Keith is a caring doctor, it is extremely unlikely Keith will cut a patient with a scalpel. But if Keith does have a compelling reason—he is performing surgery or a biopsy, for instance—then even if Keith is a caring doctor, it is extremely likely he will cut a patient with a scalpel. Now suppose someone claims that Keith will not cut a patient with a scalpel. That person is committed to a further claim: that Keith lacks a compelling medical reason to cut the patient with a scalpel. After all, even a caring doctor will cut a patient with a scalpel if there is a compelling medical reason to do so.
There are several arguments one can give for Central Claim. But most of them utilize a simple idea: if Theism is true, there is a God who has reason for preventing the suffering and evil we know about, but if the Hypothesis of Indifference is true, there is no creator with such reasons. But, skeptical theists claim, God might have reasons for permitting suffering and evil if by doing so God can achieve other morally significant goods. Thus, to claim that God would prevent the suffering and evil we know about assumes that God could create a world with a better balance of good and evil without sacrificing other morally significant goods. (Compare: to claim that Keith, the kindly doctor, would not cut a patient with a scalpel assumes that Keith lacks a compelling medical reason to cut the patient with a scalpel.) Thus, if it is reasonable for us to believe Central Claim, it must also be reasonable for us to disbelieve:
Limitation: God is unable to a create a world with a better balance of good and evil without sacrificing other morally significant goods.
After all, God might create a world with this balance of good and evil if it were necessary for other morally significant goods. But at this point, the first part of the skeptical theistic critique is relevant. For the skeptical theist claims that it is not reasonable for us to disbelieve Limitation. To do that, we would have to have a better understanding of the relationship between goods and evils than we do. Since it is not reasonable for us to reject Limitation, it is not reasonable for us to accept Central Claim.
As indicated earlier, the skeptical theist’s critique is quite complex. Nonetheless, some defenders of Humean arguments think that the criticism fails because the reasons skeptical theists give for doubting Central Claim can be offset or cancelled out. The defenders of Humean arguments reason by parity here. Suppose that the skeptical theist is right and that, for all we know, God could not have created a better balance of good and evil without sacrificing other morally significant goods. And suppose that the skeptical theist is right that this gives us a reason for doubting Central Claim. Well, that skepticism cuts both ways. For all we know, God could have created a better balance of good and evil without sacrificing other morally significant goods. By parity, that gives us a reason for accepting Central Claim. Thus, the skepticism of skeptical theism gives us both a reason to doubt Central Claim and a reason for accepting Central Claim. These reasons offset or cancel each other out. But once we set aside these offsetting reasons, we are still left with strong reasons for accepting Central Claim—namely, the reasons given by the arguments of section II. So, the skeptical theist’s critique does not ultimately succeed.
- Adams, Marilyn McCord. (1999). Horrendous Evils and the Goodness of God. Cornell University Press.
Develops and responds to an argument from evil based on horrendous evils.
- Adams, Marilyn McCord. (2013). “Ignorance, Instrumentality, Compensation, and the Problem of Evil.” Sophia. 52: 7-26.
Argues that God does not have obligations to us to prevent evil.
- Bergmann, Michael. (2009). “Skeptical Theism and the Problem of Evil.” In Thomas Flint and Michael Rea, eds., The Oxford Handbook of Philosophical Theology. Oxford University Press.
A general introduction to skeptical theism that also briefly criticizes Humean arguments.
- David Hume, Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, part XI.
The original presentation of a Humean argument.
- Dougherty, Trent and Paul Draper. (2013). “Explanation and the Problem of Evil.” In Justin McBrayer and Daniel Howard-Snyder, eds., The Blackwell Companion to the Problem of Evil. Blackwell Publishing.
A debate on Humean arguments.
- Draper, Paul. (1989). “Pain and Pleasure: An Evidential Problem for Theists.” Nous. 23: 331-350
A classic modern presentation of a Humean argument.
- Draper, Paul. (2013). “The Limitation of Pure Skeptical Theism.” Res Philosophica. 90.1: 97-111.
A defense of Humean arguments from skeptical theistic critiques.
- Draper, Paul. (2017). “Evil and the God of Abraham, Anselm, and Murphy.” Religious Studies. 53: 564-72.
A defense of Humean arguments from the criticism that God lacks obligations to us.
- Lauinger, William. (2014). “The Neutralization of Draper-Style Evidential Arguments from Evil.” Faith and Philosophy. 31.3: 303-324.
A critique of Humean arguments that good and evil better fit with Theism than naturalism.
- Martin, Michael. (1978). “Is Evil Evidence Against the Existence of God?” Mind. 87.347: 429-432.
A brief argument that our inability to see God’s reasons for permitting suffering is evidence against Theism.
- Morriston, Wes. (2014). “Skeptical Demonism: A Failed Response to a Humean Challenge.” In Trent Dougherty and Justin McBrayer, eds., Skeptical Theism. Oxford University Press.
A defense of a Humean argument from Skeptical Theism.
- Murphy, Mark. (2017). God’s Own Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
A criticism of Humean arguments from the claim that God lacks obligations to us.
- O’Connor, David. (2001). Hume on Religion. Routledge Press, chapter 9.
A modern discussion of Philo’s argument from evil that discusses the weak and strong interpretations.
- Perrine, Timothy and Stephen Wykstra. (2014). “Skeptical Theism, Abductive Atheology, and Theory Versioning.” In Trent Dougherty and Justin McBrayer, eds., Skeptical Theism. Oxford University Press.
A skeptical theistic critique of Humean arguments, focusing on the methodology of the arguments.
- Perrine, Timothy. (2019). “Skeptical Theism and Morriston’s Humean Argument from Evil.” Sophia. 58: 115-135.
A skeptical theistic critique of Humean arguments that defends them from the offsetting objection.
- Pitson, Tony. (2008). “The Miseries of Life: Hume and the Problem of Evil.” Hume Studies. 34.1: 89-114.
A historical discussion of Hume’s views on the relation between the problem of evil and natural theology and atheology.
- Plantinga, Alvin. (1996). “On Being Evidentially Challenged.” In Daniel Howard-Snyder, ed., The Evidential Argument From Evil. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
An argument that Humean arguments need to be strengthened to be cogent.
- Pyle, Andrew. (2006). Hume’s Dialogue Concerning Natural Religion. Continuum.
A modern commentary on Hume’s Dialogue that provides a discussion of its historical place and reception.
- Van Inwagen, Peter. (1991 ). “The Problem of Evil, the Problem of Air, and the Problem of Silence.” Reprinted in Daniel Howard-Snyder, ed., The Evidential Argument From Evil. Bloomington, IN: Indiana University Press.
An earlier skeptical theistic critique of Humean arguments.
U. S. A.