Humility Regarding Intrinsic Properties

The Humility Thesis is a persistent thesis in contemporary metaphysics. It is known by a variety of names, including, but not limited to, Humility, Intrinsic Humility, Kantian Humility, Kantian Physicalism, Intrinsic Ignorance, Categorical Ignorance, Irremediable Ignorance, and Noumenalism. According to the thesis, we human beings, and any knowers that share our general ways of knowing, are irremediably ignorant of a certain class of properties that are intrinsic to material entities. It is thus important to note that the term ‘humility’ is unrelated to humility in morality, but rather refers to the Humility theorist’s concession that our epistemic capabilities have certain limits and that therefore certain fundamental features of the world are beyond our epistemic capabilities. According to many Humility theorists, our knowledge of the world does not extend beyond the causal, dispositional, and structural properties of things. However, things have an underlying nature that is beyond these knowable properties: these are the sort of properties that are intrinsic to the nature of things, and which ground their existence and the causal-cum-structural features that we can know about. If any such properties exist, they do not fall within any class of knowable properties, and so it follows that human beings are unable to acquire any knowledge of them.

There are at least six questions regarding the Humility Thesis: (a) What exactly is the relevant class of properties? (b) Do such properties really exist? (c) Why are we incapable of knowing of them? (d) Is it true that we are incapable of knowing of them? (e) Even if we are incapable of knowing them, is this claim true only about our general ways of knowing things, with certain idiosyncratic exceptions? (f) How can this thesis be applied to other areas of philosophy and the history of ideas? This article explores some responses to these questions.

Table of Contents

  1. The Properties Concerned
    1. Terminological Variety
    2. The Existence and Characteristics of the Properties Concerned: An Elementary Introduction
        1. The Relational Argument
        2. The Argument from Abstractness
        3. The Modal Argument
    3. Extending the Humility Thesis
  2. The Scope of the Missing Knowledge
  3. A Brief History of the Humility Thesis
    1. Religious and Philosophical Mysticism
    2. Hume
    3. Kant
    4. Russell
    5. Armstrong
    6. Contemporary Metaphysics
  4. Arguments for Humility
    1. The Receptivity Argument
    2. The Argument from Our Semantic Structure
      1. Global Response-Dependence
      2. Ramseyan Humility
    3. The Multiple Realisability Argument
  5. Arguments against Humility
    1. The Objection from Reference-Fixing
    2. The Objection from Vacantness
    3. The Objection from Overkill
  6. Alternative Metaphysical Frameworks
    1. Ontological Minimalism: Appealing to Phenomenalism, Dynamism, or Dispositionalism
    2. Physics and Scientific Eliminativism
    3. Rationalist Categoricalism
  7. The Humility Thesis and Russellian Monism
    1. Constitution: from Intrinsic Properties to Qualia
    2. Introspection: from Qualia to Intrinsic Properties
  8. The Humility Thesis and Physicalism
  9. Conclusion
  10. References and Further Reading

1. The Properties Concerned

To begin with, the question of immediate concern in regard to the Humility Thesis is the nature of the relevant class(es) of properties. Any subsequent discussion is impossible without a proper characterisation of the subject matter under discussion. Furthermore, in order to understand the nature of these properties, a rough idea of why some philosophers believe in their existence also is required, for this helps us to understand the role these properties play in the ontological frameworks of those who believe in their existence.

a. Terminological Variety

 There is great terminological variety in the literature on Humility. Different authors discuss different properties: intrinsic properties (Langton 1998), categorical properties (Blackburn 1990; Smith & Stoljar 1998), fundamental properties (Lewis 2009; Jackson 1998), and so on. Very roughly, for our current purposes, the three mentioned kinds of properties can be understood as follows:

Intrinsic properties: Properties that objects have of themselves, independently of their relations with other things (for example, my having a brain).

Categorical properties: Properties that are qualitative, and not causal or dispositional‑namely, not the properties merely regarding how things causally behave or are disposed to causally behave (for example, shape and size).

Fundamental properties: Properties that are perfectly basic in the sense of not being constituted by anything else. (Contemporary physics tells us that mass, charge, spin, and the like are so far the most fundamental properties we know of, but it is an open question as to whether current physics has reached the most fundamental level of reality and whether it could ever reach it.)

Some authors also use the term ‘quiddities’ (Schaffer 2005; Chalmers 2012), which is taken from scholastic philosophy. The term historically stood for properties that made the object ‘what it is’, and was often used interchangeably with ‘essence’. In the contemporary literature on the Humility Thesis, it roughly means:

Quiddities: Some properties—typically intrinsic properties, categorical properties, or fundamental properties—that individuate the objects that hold them, and which ground the causal, dispositional, and structural properties of those objects.

At first glance, looking at the above characterisations of properties, the claim that the Humility Thesis concerns them may seem confusing to some non-specialists. For the list above gave examples of intrinsic properties and of categorical properties, and clearly we have knowledge of these examples. Furthermore, it may seem possible that properties like mass, charge, and spin are indeed fundamental as current physics understands them, and it at least seems conceivable that physics may uncover more fundamental levels of reality in the future and thus eventually reach the most fundamental level. A Humility theorist will answer that we are not irremediably ignorant of all conceivable intrinsic, categorical, or fundamental properties but only of a particular class of them. For example, Langton distinguishes between comparatively intrinsic properties from absolutely intrinsic properties: comparatively intrinsic properties are constituted by causal, dispositional properties, or by structural properties, whereas absolutely intrinsic properties are not so constituted. And her thesis concerns absolutely intrinsic properties, not comparatively intrinsic properties (Langton 1998, pp. 60-62). When Lewis discusses our ignorance of fundamental properties, he explicitly states that in his own view fundamental properties are intrinsic and not structural or dispositional (Lewis 2009, p. 204, 220-221n13) (though he also thinks that Humility spreads to structural properties—see Section 1c for discussion).

With this in mind, despite the terminological variety, one possible way to understand the literature is that the main contemporary authors are in fact concerned with roughly the same set of properties (Chan 2017, pp. 81-86). That is, what these authors describe is often the same set of properties under different descriptions. More specifically, when authors discuss our ignorance of properties which they may describe as intrinsic, categorical, or fundamental, the relevant properties are most often properties that belong to all three families, not only some of them—even though our ignorance of these properties may spread to non-members of the families when they constitute them (see Section 1c for further discussion). Henceforth, for the sake of simplicity, this article will only use the term ‘intrinsic properties’, unless the discussion is about an author who is discussing some other kind of property. But the reader should be aware that the intrinsic properties concerned are of a specific narrower class.

b. The Existence and Characteristics of the Properties Concerned: An Elementary Introduction

A further question is whether and why we should believe in the existence of the relevant intrinsic properties. Answering this question also allows us to understand the role that these properties have in the ontological frameworks of those who believe in their existence. This question concerns the debate between categoricalism (or categorialism) and dispositionalism in the metaphysics of properties. The categorialist believes that all fundamental properties are categorical properties, the latter of which are equivalent to the kind of intrinsic properties discussed in this article (see Section 1a). By contrast, the dispositionalist believes that all fundamental properties are dispositional properties, without there being any categorical properties that are more fundamental. This section surveys some common, elementary motivations for categoricalism.

Importantly, the reader should be aware that the full scope of this debate is impossible to encompass within this article, and thus the survey below is only elementary and thus includes only three common and simple arguments. There are some further, often more technically sophisticated arguments, for and against the existence of categorical properties, some of which are influential in the literature (see the article on ‘properties’).

The three surveyed arguments are interrelated. Many philosophers believe that the most fundamental physical properties discovered by science, such as mass, charge, and spin, are dispositional properties: the measure of an object’s mass is a measure of how the object is disposed to behave in certain ways (such as those observed in experiments). The three arguments are, then, all attempts to show that dispositional properties lack self-sufficiency and cannot exist in their own right, and thereby require some further ontological grounds – which the categorialist takes to be categorical properties. Note, though, that there are also some categorialists who do not posit categorical properties as something further to and distinct from causal, dispositional, and structural properties. Rather, they take the latter properties to be property roles which have to be filled in by realiser properties, in this case categorical properties (Lewis 2009).

i. The Relational Argument

Causal and dispositional properties appear to be relational. Specifically, when we say that an object possesses certain causal and dispositional properties, we are either describing (1) the way that the object responds to and interacts with other objects, or (2) the way that the object transforms into its future counterparts. Both (1) and (2) are relational because they concern the relation between the object and other objects or its future counterparts. The problem is whether an object can merely possess such relational properties. Some philosophers do not think so. For them, such objects would be a mere collection of relations, with nothing standing in the relevant relations. This means that there are brute relations without relata; and this seems implausible to them (Armstrong 1968, p. 282; Jackson 1998, p. 24; compare Lewis 1986, p. x). Hence, they argue, objects involved in relations must have some nature of their own that is independent of their relations to other objects, in order for them, or the relevant nature, to be the adequate relata. The candidate nature that many philosophers have in mind for what could exist independently is categorical properties. It is important to note, though, that some dispositionalists believe that dispositions could be intrinsic and non-relational, and thus reject this argument (Borghini & Williams 2008; Ellis 2014). There are also philosophers who accept the existence of brute relations (Ladyman & Ross 2007).

ii. The Argument from Abstractness

The causal and dispositional properties we find in science are often considered geometrical and mathematical, and hence overly abstract. On the one hand, Enlightenment physics is arguably all about the measure of extension and motion of physical objects: extension is ultimately about the geometry of an object’s space-occupation, and motion is ultimately the change in an object’s location in space. On the other hand, contemporary physics is (almost) exhausted by mathematical variables and equations which reflect the magnitudes of measurements. These geometrical properties and mathematical properties have seemed too abstract to many philosophers. For these philosophers, the physical universe should be something more concrete: there should be something more qualitative and robust that can, to use Blackburn’s phrase, ‘fill in’ the space and the equations (Blackburn 1990, p. 62). If this were not the case, these philosophers argue, there will be nothing that distinguishes the relevant geometrical and quantitative properties from empty space or empty variables that lack actual content (for examples of the empty space argument, see Armstrong 1961, pp. 185-187; Blackburn 1990, pp. 62-63; Langton 1998, pp.165-166; for examples of the empty variable argument, see Eddington 1929, pp. 250-259; Montero 2015, p. 217; Chalmers 1996, pp. 302-304). In this case too, the candidate that these philosophers have in mind to ‘fill in’ the space and the equations is categorical properties. It is important to note, though, that some structuralist philosophers and scientists believe that the world is fundamentally a mathematical structure, and would presumably find this argument unappealing (Heisenberg 1958/2000; Tegmark 2007; cf. Ladyman & Ross 2007).

iii. The Modal Argument

Causal and dispositional properties appear to be grounded in counterfactual affairs. Specifically, it appears that objects could robustly possess their causal and dispositional properties, even when those properties do not manifest themselves in virtue of the relevant behaviours. Consider the mass of a physical object. We may regard it as a dispositional property whose manifestations are inertia and gravitational attraction. Intuitively speaking, it seems that even when a physical object exhibits no behaviours related to inertia and gravitational attraction, it could nonetheless possess its mass. The question that arises is the following: what is the nature of such a non-manifest mass? One natural response is that its existence is grounded in the following counterfactual: in some near possible worlds where the manifest conditions of the dispositional property are met, and in which the manifest behaviours are found, the dispositional property manifests itself. But some philosophers find it very awkward and unsatisfactory that something actual is grounded in non-actual, otherworld affairs (see, for example, Blackburn 1990, pp. 64-65; Armstrong 1997, p. 79). A more satisfactory response, for some such philosophers, is that dispositional properties are grounded in some further properties which are robustly located in the actual world. Again, the candidate that many philosophers have in mind is categorical properties (but see Holton 1999; Handfield 2005; Borghini & Williams 2008).

c. Extending the Humility Thesis

Before continuing, it is worth noting that our irremediable ignorance of the above narrow class of intrinsic properties may entail our irremediable ignorance of some further properties. Lewis, for example, holds a view that he calls ‘Spreading Humility’ (2009, p. 214). He argues that almost all structural properties supervene on fundamental properties, and since we cannot know the supervenience bases of these structural properties, we cannot have perfect knowledge of them either. That is, most properties that we are ignorant of are not fundamental properties. Lewis concludes that we are irremediably ignorant of all qualitative properties, regardless of whether they are fundamental or structural, at least under ‘a more demanding sense’ of knowledge (Lewis 2009, p. 214) (for further discussion, see Section 2). Of course, the Spreading Humility view requires a point of departure before the ‘spreading’ takes place. In other words, the basic Humility Thesis, which concerns a narrower class of properties, must first be established before one can argue that any ‘spreading’ is possible.

2. The Scope of the Missing Knowledge

Throughout the history of philosophy, it has never been easy to posit irremediable ignorance of something. For the relevant theorists seem to know the fact that such things exist and their relations to the known world, as in the case of unknowable intrinsic properties (see Section 1). Specifically, to say that there is a part of the world of which we are ignorant, we at least have to say that the relevant things exist. Furthermore, we only say that the relevant things exist because they bear certain relations to the known parts of the world, and thus help to explain the nature of the latter. But this knowledge appears inconsistent with the alleged irremediable ignorance of such things—this problem traces back to Friedrich Heinrich Jacobi’s famous objection to Kant’s idea of unknowable things in themselves (for the latter, see Section 3c) (Jacobi 1787/2000, pp. 173-175; see also Strawson 1966, pp. 41-42). What adds to this complexity is that some Humility theorists go on and debate the metaphysical nature of the unknowable intrinsic properties, such as whether they are physical or fundamentally mental (see Sections 7a and 8). In order to avoid the above inconsistency, the Humility Thesis should be carefully framed. That is, the scope of our ignorance of intrinsic properties should be made precise.

There is at least one influential idea among contemporary Humility theorists: that the Humility Thesis concerns knowledge-which, to use Tom McClelland’s (2012) term (Pettit 1998; Lewis 2009; Locke 2009; McClelland 2012). More precisely, under Humility we are unable to identify a particular intrinsic property: when facing, say, a basic dispositional property D, we would not be able to tell which precise intrinsic property grounds it. For we are unable to distinguish the multiple possibilities in which different intrinsic properties do the grounding, and to tell which possibility is actual. For example, if there are two possible intrinsic properties I1 and I2 that could do the job, we would not be able to tell any difference and thereby identify the one that actually grounds D. This idea is based upon the multiple realisability argument for Humility, which is discussed in detail in Section 4c. By contrast, the sort of intrinsic knowledge discussed in the previous paragraph concerns only the characterisation, not the identification of intrinsic properties, and is thus not the target of Humility Thesis under this understanding.

Nonetheless, while the knowledge-which understanding of Humility may offer the required precision, it is definitely not conclusive. Firstly, it leads to some objections to Humility which seek to show that the relevant knowledge-which, and so the knowledge-which understanding, are trivial (see Sections 5a and 5b). Secondly, many Humility theorists believe that intrinsic properties possess some unknowable qualitative natures apart from their very exact identities (Russell 1927a/1992; Heil 2004). It remains unclear whether the knowledge-which understanding can fully capture the kind of Humility they have in mind (for further discussion, see Section 5b). Note that such unknowable qualitative natures are especially important to those Humility theorists who want to argue that certain intrinsic properties constitute human consciousness (see Sections 3d and 7) or other mysterious things (see Section 3a). Thirdly, the Humility theorists Rae Langton and Christopher Robichaud (2010, pp. 175-176) hold an even more ambitious version of the Humility Thesis. They argue that we cannot even know of the metaphysical nature of intrinsic properties, such as whether or not they are fundamentally mental. Thus, they dismiss the knowledge-which understanding as too restricted and conservative (for further discussion, see Section 8).

In sum, the scope of Humility remains controversial, even among its advocates, and has led to certain criticisms. In the following discussion, a number of problems surrounding the scope of Humility is explored.

3. A Brief History of the Humility Thesis

Like many philosophical ideas, the Humility Thesis has been independently developed by many thinkers from different traditions over the course of history. This section briefly explores some representative snapshots of its history.

a. Religious and Philosophical Mysticism

Ever since ancient times, the Humility Thesis and similar theories have played an important role in religious and mystical thought. However, most of the relevant thinkers did not fully embrace the kind of ignorance described by the Humility Thesis: they believed that such an epistemic limit is only found in our ordinary perceptual and scientific knowledge, but that it can be overcome by certain meditative or mystical knowledge.

A certain form of Hindu mysticism is paradigmatic of this line of thought. According to the view, there is an ultimate reality of the universe which is called the Brahman. The Brahman has a variety of understandings within Hinduism, but a common line of understanding, found for example in the Upanishads, takes it as the single immutable ground and the highest principle of all beings. The Brahman is out of reach of our ordinary sensory knowledge. However, since we, like all other beings in the universe, are ultimately grounded in and identical to the Brahman, certain extraordinary meditative experiences—specifically the kind in which we introspect the inner, fundamental nature of our own self—allow us to grasp it (Flood 1996, pp. 84-85; Mahony 1998, pp. 114-121).

Arguably, the Brahman may be somewhat analogous to the unknowable intrinsic properties described by the Humility Thesis, for both are possibly the fundamental and non-dynamic nature of things which is out of reach of our ordinary knowledge. Moreover, as we shall see, the idea that we can know our own intrinsic properties via introspection of our own consciousness has been independently developed by many philosophers, including a number of those working in the analytic tradition (see Sections 3d and 7). Of course, despite the possible similarities between the Brahman and intrinsic properties, their important differences should not be ignored: the former is unique and singular, and is also described by Hindu mystics as the cause of everything, rather than being non-causal. Furthermore, as mentioned above, Hindu understandings of the Brahman are diverse, and the aforementioned understanding is only one of them (see Deutsch 1969, pp. 27-45; see also the article on ‘Advaita Vedanta’).

There are certain Western theologies and philosophical mysticisms that resemble the above line of Hindu thought, such as those concerning the divine inner nature of the universe (for example, Schleiermacher 1799/1988) and the Schopenhauerian Will (Schopenhauer 1818/1966). Precisely, according to these views, the ultimate nature of the universe, whatever it is, is also out of reach of our ordinary knowledge, but it can be known via some sort of introspection. Of course, the ultimate nature concerned may or may not be intrinsic, non-relational, non-causal, non-dynamic, and so on; this often depends on one’s interpretation. Nonetheless, there seems to remain some similarities with the Humility Thesis.

b. Hume

 18th century Scottish philosopher David Hume is a notable advocate of the Humility Thesis in the Enlightenment period. Even though Hume is not a Humility theorist per se because he is sceptical of the existence of external objects—namely, objects that are mind-independent—let alone their intrinsic properties (T 1.4.2), he does take the Humility Thesis to be a necessary consequence of the early modern materialistic theory of matter, which he therefore rejects due to the emptiness of the resultant ontological framework (T 1.4.4).

Hume’s argument is roughly as follows. Early modern materialism takes properties like sounds, colours, heat, and cold to be subjective qualities which should be attributed to the human subject’s sensations, rather than to the external material objects themselves. This leaves material objects with only two kinds of basic properties: extension and solidity. Other measurable properties like motion, gravity, and cohesion, for Hume, are only about changes in the two kinds of basic properties. However, extension and solidity cannot be ‘possest of a real, continu’d, and independent existence’ (T This is because extension requires simple and indivisible space-occupiers, but the theory of early modern materialism offers no such things (T Solidity ultimately concerns relations between multiple objects rather than the intrinsic nature of a single object: it is about how an object is impenetrable by another object (T Hume concludes that under early modern materialism we are in fact unable to form a robust idea of material objects.

c. Kant

Like Hume, 18th century German philosopher Immanuel Kant is another notable advocate of the Humility Thesis in the Enlightenment period. He makes the famous distinction between phenomena and things-in-themselves in his transcendental idealism. The idea of transcendental idealism is very roughly that all laws of nature, including metaphysical laws, physical laws, and special science laws are, in fact, cognitive laws that rational human agents are necessarily subject to. Since things-in-themselves, which are the mind-independent side of things, must not be attributed any such subjective cognitive features, their nature must be unknowable to us (CPR A246/B303). We can only know of things as they appear to us subjectively as phenomena, under our cognitive laws such as space, time, and causality (CPR A42/B59).

It is important to note that Kant intends transcendental idealism to be a response to some philosophical problems put forward by his contemporaries, and that these philosophical problems are often not the concerns of contemporary Humility theorists. Examples include the subject-object problem and the mind-independent external reality problem put forward by Hume and Berkeley (CPR B274). Furthermore, it is also worth noting that Kant’s views have a variety of interpretations, for interpreting his views is never an easy task—his transcendental idealism is no exception (see the article on ‘Kant’). However, if the nature of things-in-themselves, being free from extrinsic relations to us the perceivers and other extrinsic relations we attribute to them (for example, spatiotemporal relations with other things), can be considered as the intrinsic properties of things, then transcendental idealism entails the Humility Thesis. In addition, no matter what the correct interpretation of Kant really is, Kant as he is commonly understood plays a significant and representative role in the history of the Humility Thesis from his time until now. Unlike Hume, who takes the Humility Thesis to be a reason for doubting the metaphysical theories that imply it, Kant takes the Humility Thesis to be true of the world—even though his German idealist successors like Fichte and Hegel tend to reject this latter part of his philosophy.

Finally, it is noteworthy that one of the most important texts in the contemporary literature on the Humility Thesis, Langton’s book Kantian Humility: Our Ignorance of Things in Themselves (1998), is an interpretation of Kant. In the book, Langton develops and defends the view that Kant’s Humility Thesis could be understood in terms of a more conventional metaphysics of properties, independently of Kant’s transcendental idealism. Specifically, she argues that Kantian ignorance of things-in-themselves should be understood as ignorance of intrinsic properties. The book and the arguments within are discussed in Sections 3f and 4a.

d. Russell

The pioneer of the Humility Thesis in analytic philosophy is one of the founding fathers of the tradition, Bertrand Russell. Historical studies of Russell’s philosophy show that Russell kept on revising his views, and hence, like many of his ideas, his Humility Thesis only reflects his views during a certain period of his very long life (Tully 2003; Wishon 2015). Russell’s version of the Humility Thesis is found in and popularised by his book, Analysis of Matter (1927). Like the Hindu mystic mentioned above, Russell is best described as a partial Humility theorist, for he also believes that some of those intrinsic properties which are unknowable by scientific means constitute our phenomenal experiences, and can thereby be known through introspecting such experiences.

Russell proposes a theory of the philosophy of mind which he calls psycho-cerebral parallelism. According to the theory, (1) physical properties are ‘causally dominant’, and (2) mental experiences are a part of the physical world and are ‘determined by the physical character of their stimuli’ (Russell 1927a/1992, p. 391). Despite this, our physical science has its limits. Its aim is only ‘to discover what we may call the causal skeleton of the world’ (p. 391, emphasis added); it cannot tell us the intrinsic character of matter. Nevertheless, some such intrinsic character can be known in our mental experiences because those experiences are one such character. As Russell remarks in a work published in the same year as The Analysis of Matter, ‘we now realise that we know nothing of the intrinsic quality of physical phenomena except when they happen to be sensations’ (1927b, p. 154, emphasis added).

Russell’s view that scientifically unknowable intrinsic properties constitute what we now describe as qualia is an influential solution to the hard problem of consciousness in the philosophy of mind, known today as ‘Russellian monism’. Before the mid-1990s, this view had already attracted some followers (see, for example, Maxwell 1978; Lockwood 1989, 1992) and sympathisers (see, for example, Feigl 1967), but it was often overshadowed by the dominant physicalist theories of mind (like the identity theory and functionalism). This situation ended with the publication of Chalmers’s book The Conscious Mind (1996), which has effectively promoted Russellian monism to a more general audience. Further discussion of contemporary Russellian monism is in Section 7.

e. Armstrong

Among the next generation of analytic philosophers after Russell, members of the Australian materialist school developed an interest in the problem of Humility as they inquired into the nature of material entities (Armstrong 1961, 1968; Smart 1963; Mackie 1973); and among them, David Armstrong is a representative advocate of the Humility Thesis (Armstrong 1961, 1968). Armstrong begins with the assumption that physical objects are different from empty space, and then investigates what sort of intrinsic properties of physical objects make the difference between them and empty space (1961, p. 185). He then makes use of an argument which, by his own acknowledgement, largely resembles Hume’s (Armstrong 1968, p. 282; see the argument in Section 3b) to conclude that no posited properties in the physicist’s theory can make the difference between physical objects and empty space. Unlike Hume, who is sceptical of the existence of physical objects, however, Armstrong is not a sceptic and thus believes that what makes the difference must be some properties additional to the physicist’s list of properties. What follows is that these properties must not be within the scope of current physics, and thus we have no knowledge of them.

It is important to note, though, that Armstrong accepts the Humility Thesis rather reluctantly. Accepting the Humility Thesis follows from his theory, and he sees this as a difficulty facing his theory of the nature of physical objects. He says he has no solution to this difficulty (1961, p. 190, 1968, p. 283). Hence, despite his belief that intrinsic properties are currently unknown, Armstrong does not go as far as to accept the now popular full-blown version of the Humility Thesis according to which intrinsic properties must be in principle unknowable (1961, pp. 189-190).

f. Contemporary Metaphysics

Here is a sketch of how the debate has panned out in the more recent literature. For a few decades, the Humility Thesis was often an epistemic complaint made by dispositionalists towards categoricalism, such as the version of the view offered by Lewis (1986). For these philosophers, who take it that all fundamental properties are dispositional, the idea of there being more fundamental intrinsic properties implies that we are irremediably ignorant of the relevant properties. They argue that we should not posit the existence of things we cannot ever know about. Therefore, we should not posit the existence of intrinsic properties (see, for example, Shoemaker 1980, pp. 116-117; Swoyer 1982, pp. 204-205; Ellis & Lierse 1994).

Since the 1990s, there was a trend among categorialists to respond positively to the problem of Humility: it has become their mainstream view that while the existence of intrinsic properties is necessary for the existence of matter, we cannot ever know about them. Blackburn’s short article (1990) is a pioneer of this trend; it inspired Langton’s book Kantian Humility: Our Ignorance of Things in Themselves (1998), from which the term ‘Humility’ originated (Langton acknowledges this in her 2015, p. 106). While the book is meant to be an interpretation of Kant, Langton defends the view that Kant’s Humility Thesis could be understood independently of—and perhaps even incompatible with—his transcendental idealism (Langton 1998, p. 143n7, 2004, p. 129). In addition, Langton argues that the thesis is very relevant to contemporary analytic metaphysics. While her interpretation of Kant is controversial and is often called ‘Langton’s Kant’, the interpretation is often considered as an independent thesis, and has attracted many sympathisers and engendered many discussions in the metaphysics of properties. Examples include discussions of Jackson’s (1998) ‘Kantian physicalism’, Lewis’s (2009) ‘Ramseyan Humility’, and Philip Pettit’s (1998) ‘noumenalism’. As Lewis remarks, ‘my interest is not in whether the thesis of Humility, as she conceives it, is Kantian, but rather in whether it is true’ (Lewis 2009, p. 203)—and he thinks that it is true.

4. Arguments for Humility

Some historically significant arguments for Humility were surveyed above; this section offers an introduction to the most influential arguments for Humility in the contemporary literature. While the arguments will be discussed in turn, it is important to note that the arguments are often taken to be interrelated. Furthermore, some influential authors, as discussed below, use some combination of these and do not advocate the view that such combined arguments could work if disassembled into separate arguments.

a. The Receptivity Argument

The receptivity argument is perhaps the most famous argument for Humility (see, for example, Russell 1912/1978; Langton 1998; Jackson 1998; Pettit 1998). Langton (1998) offers a particularly detailed formulation of it. The argument begins with the assumption that we know about things only though receptivity, in which the relevant things causally affect us (or our experimental instruments) and thus allow us to form adequate representations of them. For instance, Langton remarks that ‘human knowledge depends on sensibility, and sensibility is receptive: we can have knowledge of an object only in so far as it affects us’ (Langton 1998, p. 125). An upshot of this assumption is that we could have knowledge of whatever directly or indirectly affects us (p. 126). In light of this, since things affect us in virtue of their causal and dispositional properties, we can know of these properties.

However, the proponents of the receptivity argument continue, such a condition of knowledge would also impose an epistemic limitation on us: we will be unable to know of things that cannot possibly affect us. While things causally affect us in virtue of their causal and dispositional properties, as long as their intrinsic properties are another class of properties, there is a question as to whether we can know them. To answer this question, we must determine the nature of the relationship between things’ causal and dispositional properties and their intrinsic properties, and whether such a relationship allows for knowledge of intrinsic properties in virtue of the relevant causal and dispositional properties. If this is not the case, we need to determine whether this leads to an insurmountable limit on our knowledge. Jackson, for example, believes that the receptivity argument in the above form is incomplete. He argues that we may have knowledge of intrinsic properties—or, in his work, fundamental properties—via the causal and dispositional properties they bear, and that the receptivity argument in the above form can be completed by supplementing it with the multiple realisability argument (Jackson 1998, p. 23). This is discussed in detail in Section 4c.

For Langton, knowledge of intrinsic properties is impossible because causal and dispositional properties are irreducible to intrinsic properties in the sense that any of the former does not supervene on any of the latter (Langton 1998, p. 109). Nonetheless, the irreducibility thesis does not spell an end to this discussion. On the one hand, Langton elsewhere points out that the receptivity argument still works if there are instead necessary connections between the relevant properties—as long as they remain different properties (Langton & Robichaud 2010, p. 173). On the other hand, James Van Cleve worries that Langton’s argument from irreducibility is nevertheless incomplete, for a non-reductive relationship alone does not imply the impossibility of intrinsic knowledge (Van Cleve 2002, pp. 225-226). In sum, regardless of whether Langton’s irreducibility thesis is correct, there are some further questions as to whether or not we are receptive to intrinsic properties.

b. The Argument from Our Semantic Structure

The second argument for Humility appeals to the ways in which the terms and concepts in our language are structured (see, for example, Blackburn 1990; Pettit 1998; Lewis 2009). Depending on particular formulations of the argument, the language concerned could be the language of our scientific theories or all human languages. Nonetheless, all versions of this argument share the common argumentative strategy according to which all terms and/or concepts found in the relevant language(s) capture only causal properties, dispositional properties, and structural properties but not intrinsic properties. The idea is that if our knowledge of the world is formulated by the language(s) concerned, then there will be no knowledge of intrinsic properties.

i. Global Response-Dependence

One version of this argument is developed by Pettit (1998). Note that his commitment to a Humility Thesis under the name of ‘noumenalism’ is also a reply to Michael Smith and Daniel Stoljar’s (1998) argument that his view implies noumenalism. In response to the argument, Pettit accepts noumenalism as an implication of his view (Pettit 1998, p. 130).

Pettit advocates a thesis called global response-dependence (GRD), which he considers to be an a priori truth about the nature of all terms and concepts in our language. According to GRD, all terms and concepts in our language are either (1) defined ostensively by the ways that their referents are disposed to causally impact on normal or ideal subjects in normal or ideal circumstances, or (2) are defined by other terms and concepts which eventually trace back to those of the former kind (Pettit 1998, p. 113-114). If this is so, then it follows that all terms and concepts are in effect defined dispositionally with reference to their referents’ patterns of causal behaviours.  If there are any non-dispositional properties that ground the dispositions, then, as Pettit remarks, ‘we do not know them in their essence; we do not know which properties they are’ (pp. 121-122).

Of course, there is a question as to whether GRD is an attractive thesis. It is controversial, and its validity is an independent open question that goes beyond the scope of this article. In Pettit’s case, he commits himself to an epistemology (Pettit 1998, p. 113) that is very similar to Langton’s receptivity thesis that is discussed in Section 4a.

ii. Ramseyan Humility

The most famous version of the argument from our semantic structure is developed by Lewis (2009), even though Blackburn offers an earlier rough sketch of the argument which appeals to the Lewisian semantic theory (Blackburn 1990, p. 63), and Pettit anticipates that such a theory would imply the Humility Thesis just as his GRD does (Pettit 1998, p. 128). The argument is based on the Ramsey-Lewis method of defining theoretical terms in scientific theories, which Lewis develops in his early article ‘How to define theoretical terms’ (1970), and which is in turn inspired by Frank Ramsey—this is why Lewis calls his version of the Humility Thesis ‘Ramseyan Humility’.

Lewis is a scientific realist. He asks us to suppose that there is a final scientific theory T about the natural world. In his view, theory T, like all other scientific theories, consists of O-terms and T-terms. O-terms are the terms that are used in our older and ordinary language, which is outside theory T; T-terms are theoretical terms that are specifically defined in theory T. Each T-term has to be defined holistically in relation with other T-terms by O-terms. The relevant relations include nomological and locational roles in theory T (Lewis 2009, p. 207). Some such nomological and locational roles named by T-terms would be played by fundamental properties, while Lewis assumes that none of these properties will be named by O-terms. He writes, ‘The fundamental properties mentioned in T will be named by T-terms. I assume that no fundamental properties are named in O-language, except as occupants of roles’ (p. 206). Although Lewis in his 2009 article does not make it clear why he assumes so, in his other work (1972) he argues that the use of O-terms is to name and define nomological and locational relations.

With the assumption that the roles played by intrinsic properties are identified solely by relational means, Lewis makes the following argument. While theory T is uniquely realised by a particular set of fundamental properties in the actual world, theory T is incapable of identifying such properties, namely individuating the exact fundamental properties that realise it. This is because, for theory T, fundamental properties are mere occupants of the T-term roles defined by O-terms (Lewis 2009, p. 215), which are, in turn, all about their nomological and locational roles. But then theory T is unable to tell exactly which fundamental property occupies a particular role (p. 215)—as Lewis remarks, “To be the ground of a disposition is to occupy a role, but it is one thing to know that a role is occupied, another thing to know what occupies it” (p. 204). Lewis has much more to say about his argument in relation to the multiple realisability argument, which he takes to be another indispensable core part of his argument, and which will be discussed in detail in section 4c.

Before we go on to the multiple realisability argument, there is again the further question as to why we should accept the underlying semantic theory of the argument—in this case the Ramsey-Lewis model of scientific theories. Indeed, some critics of Lewis’s Ramseyan Humility target the conceptual or scientific plausibility of the semantic theory (Ladyman & Ross 2007; Leuenberger 2010). Rather than a defence of an independent thesis, Lewis’s 2009 article seems to be an attempt to develop the Ramseyan Humility Thesis as a consequence of his systematic philosophy, which he has been developing for decades. In any case, taking into account the influence of the Lewisian systematic philosophy in contemporary analytic philosophy, its entailment of the Humility Thesis is of considerable philosophical significance.

c. The Multiple Realisability Argument

The multiple realisability argument is a particularly popular argument for Humility, and is endorsed by a number of Humility theorists regardless of whether they also offer independent arguments for Humility (see, for example, Lewis 2009; Jackson 1998; Yates 2018; see also Russell 1927a/1992, p. 390; Maxwell 1978, p. 399; Pettit 1998, p. 117). The basic idea is that the causal, dispositional, and structural properties of things with which we are familiar are roles. We can at best know that such roles have some intrinsic properties as their realisers, but we have no idea which intrinsic properties actually do the realizing job. For these roles can also be realised by some alternative possible sets of intrinsic properties, and we cannot distinguish the relevant possibilities from the actual ones.

As mentioned above, some authors such as Jackson and Lewis believe that their receptivity arguments or arguments from our semantic structure are themselves incomplete and have to be supplemented with the multiple realisability argument. For example, Jackson believes that our receptive knowledge is multiply realisable by different sets of fundamental properties (Jackson 1998; see also Section 4a); and Lewis believes that our final scientific theory is multiply realisable by different sets of fundamental properties (Lewis 2009; see also Section 4b). Multiple realisability is for them the reason why we cannot possibly know of intrinsic properties via our receptive knowledge or via the final scientific theory. Here we see that the multiple realisability argument is often considered as an indispensable component of more complex arguments.

Whereas certain formulations of the multiple realisability argument appeal to metaphysical possibilities (Lewis 2009), Jonathan Schaffer—a critic of the argument—argues that epistemic possibilities alone suffice to make the argument work, since its aim is to determine the nature of our knowledge (Schaffer 2005, p. 19). Hence, the argument cannot be blocked by positing a metaphysically necessary link between intrinsic properties and their roles that eliminates the metaphysical possibilities suggested by the proponents of the argument.

Lewis and Jackson offer detailed discussion of how some forms of multiple realisation are possible. Three corresponding versions of the multiple realisability argument are briefly surveyed in turn below.

The permutation argument is offered by Lewis (2009). It begins with the assumption that the laws of nature are contingent (p. 209). Lewis argues that a scenario in which the realisers of two actual dispositional roles are swapped will not change anything else, including the nomological roles they play and the locations they occupy. Hence, a permutation of realisers is another possible realisation of our scientific theory. Since our science cannot distinguish between the actual realisation of nomological roles and its permutations, we do not know which properties it consists of.

The replacement argument is also offered by Lewis (2009). Unlike the permutation argument, this argument does not appeal to an exchange of roles. Instead, it begins with the assumption that the realisers of dispositions are replaceable by what Lewis calls idlers and aliens. Idlers are among the fundamental properties within the actual world, but they play no nomological role; and aliens are fundamental properties that only exist in nonactual possible worlds (p. 205). Multiple realisability then follows. Again, Lewis argues that replacing the realisers of the actual nomological roles with idlers and aliens will not change anything else; what we have is simply other possible realisations of our scientific theory. And again, since our science cannot distinguish between the actual realisation of nomological roles and its replacements, we do not know which properties realise these roles in the actual world.

The succession argument is offered by Jackson (1998). The argument appeals to the possibility of there being two distinct fundamental properties realizing the same nomological role in our science in succession (Jackson 1998, pp. 23-24). For Jackson, it is impossible for our science to distinguish whether or not this possibility is actualised—specifically, it is impossible for our science to distinguish whether the nomological role is actually realised by one or two properties. This reveals that we do not know which property actually plays the nomological role.

5. Arguments against Humility

We have seen above some influential arguments for Humility in the literature. In what follows, the main arguments against the thesis will be surveyed.

a. The Objection from Reference-Fixing

An immediate objection considered by Pettit and Lewis in their defence of Humility is the objection from reference-fixing (Pettit 1998, p. 122; Lewis 2009, p. 216; but see Whittle 2006, pp. 470-472). The idea is that we can refer to an intrinsic property as the bearer of a dispositional property, and thereby identify it and know of it. For example, when asked what the bearer of dispositional property D is and whether we have knowledge of it, we may respond in the following way: ‘The bearer of D is whatever bears D; and we know that it bears D.’

Unsurprisingly, Pettit and Lewis are not convinced. Pettit responds, ‘under this picture it is no surprise that we are represented as knowing those very properties, not in their essence, but only their effects’ (Pettit 1998, p. 122). Lewis, on the other hand, dismisses the objection as ‘cheating’ (Lewis 2009, p. 216). Consider the answer concerning the bearer of dispositional property D above. On Lewis’s view, while that answer is undoubtedly true, we simply have no idea which particular proposition is expressed by the answer. Some of the relevant issues are discussed in Section 2.

Ann Whittle, an advocate of the objection from reference-fixing, argues that Humility theorists like Lewis set an unreasonably high bar for the condition of identification (Whittle 2006, pp. 470-472; but see Locke 2009, p. 228). For it seems that, in the case of our ordinary knowledge, we typically identify things in virtue of their effects and connections to us. For example, when we have knowledge of the historical figure Napoleon, we identify him via the great things he has done and the spatiotemporal connections he has with us.  By contrast, it is difficult for our knowledge to single out a particular person across possible worlds as Lewis’s condition requires us to, for someone else might have done the same things as Napoleon did. And if we allow for knowledge about Napoleon according to our ordinary conditions of identification, there seems to be no reason for not allowing for knowledge of intrinsic properties under the same consideration.

b. The Objection from Vacantness

The objection from vacantness is developed by Whittle (2006, pp. 473-477; but see Locke 2009, p. 228). This objection specifically targets Humility theorists like Lewis and Armstrong. According to Whittle, Lewis and Armstrong have the background belief that fundamental intrinsic properties are simple and basic to the extent that they are featureless in themselves, with the only exception of their bare identities. With this in mind, the only interesting nature of these properties is their being bearers of causal, dispositional, or structural properties, and nothing else. If this is so, we are actually not going to miss out on anything even if we grant the Humility Thesis to be true. Lewis’s and Armstrong’s Humility theses, then, at best imply that we would be ignorant of the bare identities of intrinsic properties. Hence, ‘there is no reason to regard it as anything more than a rather esoteric, minimal epistemic limitation’ (p. 477).

While Whittle’s charge of esotericism is debatable, it is noteworthy that her interpretation of Lewis’s and Armstrong’s metaphysical frameworks is shared by some other philosophers (Chalmers 2012, p. 349; Stoljar 2014, p. 26)—Chalmers, for example, calls them a ‘thin quiddity picture’ (Chalmers 2012, pp. 349). Nonetheless, it is also important to note that, as these philosophers point out, there are some alternative versions of the Humility Thesis which count as ‘thick quiddity pictures’, and according to which intrinsic properties have substantial qualities (for example, Russell 1927a/1992; Heil 2004).

c. The Objection from Overkill

The Humility Thesis is an attempt to draw a very specific limit to our knowledge: its aim is to show that knowledge of intrinsic properties is impossible, despite the fact that other knowledge remains possible. Specifically, if we can know of intrinsic properties, then the thesis fails; but by contrast, if the purported ignorance goes too far and applies equally to our ordinary knowledge, then the resultant scepticism would render the thesis trivial and implausible. For one thing, if we are ignorant of everything, then it would be very surprising that knowledge of intrinsic properties is an exception. For another, scepticism seems to be an unacceptable conclusion which should be avoided.

The objection from overkill, then, is that the specific boundary cannot be achieved: the claim is that there are no good arguments that favour the Humility Thesis but exclude scepticism of some other kind; a possible further claim is that there is no way to avoid this wider scepticism without rendering the Humility Thesis weak or erroneous (Van Cleve 2002; Schaffer 2005; Whittle 2006; Cowling 2010; cf. Langton 2004; but see Locke 2009). For example, Van Cleve argues that Langton’s argument from receptivity and irreducibility is too strong and must have something wrong with it. For if Hume is correct that causal laws are not necessary, then nothing necessitates their effects on us – namely, these effects are irreducible to the relevant things. But if we follow Langton’s argument, then such irreducibility means that we know nothing (Van Cleve 2002, pp. 229-234). Schaffer argues that Lewis’s appeal to the distinction between appearance and reality, and the multiple realisability of appearance, is shared by external world sceptics (Schaffer 2005, p. 20). In addition, Schaffer argues that the standard responses to external world scepticism such as abductionism, contextualism, deductionism, and direct realism apply equally to the Humility Thesis (pp. 21-23).

In response, a possible counter-strategy would be to argue that standard responses to scepticism do not apply to the Humility Thesis (Locke 2009). For example, Dustin Locke argues that when we do abductions, we identify the distinguishing features of competing hypotheses, and thereby pick out the best hypothesis among them. But the different intrinsic realisations of our knowledge considered by the multiple realisation argument exhibit no such distinguishing features (Locke 2009, pp. 232-233).

6. Alternative Metaphysical Frameworks

Rather than offering straightforward arguments against Humility, some critics of Humility instead develop alternative metaphysical frameworks to the Humility Thesis and the kind of categoricalism that underlies it (see Section 1b). These alternative frameworks, if true, undercut the possibility of there being unknowable intrinsic properties. In what follows, some such metaphysical frameworks are surveyed.

a. Ontological Minimalism: Appealing to Phenomenalism, Dynamism, or Dispositionalism

Philosophers have a very long tradition of avoiding ontological commitments to unobservables and unknowables, such as substance, substratum, Kantian things in themselves, the intrinsic nature of things, and the divine ground and mover of everything. Among these philosophers, phenomenalists and idealists have taken the perhaps most extreme measure: with a few exceptions, anything beyond immediate mental phenomena is eliminated (Berkeley 1710/1988; Hume 1739/1978; Mill 1865/1996; Clifford 1875/2011; Mach 1897/1984). Among such approaches to ontology, a phenomenalism that rejects matter is indeed Hume’s response to the Humility problem: he is altogether sceptical about the existence of matter, together with its unknowable intrinsic nature (Hume 1739/1978; see Section 3b). In other words, while Hume agrees that if matter exists then we are ignorant of its intrinsic nature, he does not believe there is such a thing in the world for us to be ignorant of.

Although many other philosophers regard phenomenalism and idealism as far too radical, the ontological minimalist attitude is nonetheless available to philosophers with a more realist and naturalist stance. The idea is that if the dynamics of things—their motions, forces, dynamic processes, relational features, and so forth—are their only scientifically accessible features, then we should attribute to them only such features and no further mysterious features. Moreover, we should identify these former features as their sole natures. This minimalist dynamist line of thought is not uncommonly found in the thoughts of the modern scientific naturalists—philosophers and scientists alike (see, for example, Diderot 1770/1979; d’Holbach 1770/1820, Pt. I, Ch. 2; Faraday 1844; Nietzsche 1887/2006, Ch. 1.3; Schlick 1925b/1985, Pt. III.A; see also a discussion of Michael Faraday’s dynamism and its contemporary significance in Langton & Robichaud 2010, pp. 171-173).

The most prominent incarnation of dynamism in contemporary metaphysics is dispositionalism—the idea that all fundamental properties are dispositional properties (see Section 1b). Contemporary dispositionalists have independently discovered the ontological minimalist attitude in their debates with their rivals, the categorialists, who believe that all fundamental properties are intrinsic, categorical properties. The interesting fact here is that the mainstream dispositionalists and categorialists in contemporary metaphysics actually share an agreement regarding Humility: many from both sides agree that if intrinsic properties of the kind described by categoricalism exist, then we are irremediably ignorant of them (Shoemaker 1980, pp. 116-117; Swoyer 1982, pp. 204-205; Ellis & Lierse 1994, p. 32; Hawthorne 2001, pp. 368-369; Black 2000, pp. 92-95; Bird 2005, p. 453; Ney 2007, pp. 53-56; see also Whittle 2006, pp. 485-490 for a related argument). However, whereas the categorialists concede such an ignorance, the dispositionalists argue that we should not believe in the existence of something we simply cannot know about. Put simply, much like the categorialists, the dispositionalists too agree that categoricalism implies the Humility Thesis, but they take this as good reason for rejecting categoricalism.

There are at least two issues here related to a dispositionalism that grounds such an ontological minimalist attitude. The first issue can be considered in light of Lewis’s question: ‘Why should I want to block [the Humility argument]? Why is Humility “ominous”? Whoever promised me that I was capable in principle of knowing everything’ (Lewis 2009, p. 211)? The minimalist dispositionalists need some epistemic principle to justify their minimalist attitude. Some of them appeal to some more a priori epistemic principles according to which we should not posit anything that cannot contribute to our knowledge (Shoemaker 1980, pp. 116-117; Swoyer 1982, pp. 204-205; Black 2000, pp. 92-95; Bird 2005, p. 453). Others hold a more scientific attitude according to which our ontological posits should not go beyond science, together with the assumption that all properties mentioned in science are dispositional (Hawthorne 2001, pp. 368-369; cf. Ellis & Lierse 1994, p. 32; Ney 2007, pp. 53-56).

The second issue is that the status of the ontological minimalist argument is one of the many questions in the debate between categoricalism and dispositionalism. Hence, it seems that the argument must be considered alongside other arguments—such as the ones mentioned in Section 1b—when choosing between the two views.

b. Physics and Scientific Eliminativism

The renowned physicist Werner Heisenberg took Humility to be a consequence of the atomistic theories of the kind defended by the Ancient Greek philosopher Democritus—such theories cannot possibly offer a more fundamental description of the atom than those of the atoms’ motions and arrangements (Heisenberg 1958/2000, pp. 34-35). However, like many other early- to mid-20th century scientists and philosophers (for example, Whitehead 1925/1967; Schlick 1925a/1979), Heisenberg argued that such a conception of matter is already old-fashioned and incompatible with contemporary physics. On his view, quantum mechanics has provided us with a novel metaphysical worldview: the ‘thing in itself’ of a particle is a mathematical structure (Heisenberg 1958/2000, p. 51; but see Eddington 1929).

In contemporary metaphysics, the idea that quantum mechanics leads to a scientific eliminativism about intrinsic properties is defended by James Ladyman and Don Ross (2007). Specifically, Ladyman and Ross argue their ontic structural realism (OSR) is a theoretical framework that is better than categoricalism and the Humility Thesis—including Langton’s, Lewis’s, and Jackson’s versions (Ladyman & Ross 2007, p. 127n53)—and should thus simply replace them. OSR is the view that the relational structure of the world is ontologically fundamental, and is not one that consists of individuals with intrinsic properties. Identity and individuality of objects, on their view, depend only on the relational structure.

OSR is developed from an analysis of empirical science, especially quantum physics where quantum particles are found not to have exact space-time locations. On Ladyman and Ross’s view, quantum particles and field theory should be given a non-individualistic interpretation in which concepts of individual objects should be eliminated (p. 140). We come to have our ordinary concepts of individual objects only because of the distinguishability or discernibility of things, not due to their objective individuality (p. 134). With this in mind, Ladyman and Ross argue that the standard assumptions in metaphysics are all challenged by OSR. They list assumptions as follows:

(i) There are individuals in space-time whose existence is independent of each other. Facts about the identity and diversity of these individuals are determined independently of their relations to each other.

(ii) Each has some properties that are intrinsic to it.

(iii) The relations between individuals other than their spatio-temporal relations supervene on the intrinsic properties of the relata (Humean supervenience).

(iv) The Principle of the Identity of Indiscernibles] is true, so there are some properties (perhaps including spatio-temporal properties) that distinguish each thing from every other thing, and the identity and individuality of physical objects can be accounted for in purely qualitative terms. (Ladyman & Ross 2007, p. 151)

Unsurprisingly, for Ladyman and Ross, Lewis and Jackson are merely some traditional metaphysicians who assume the existence of individuals with intrinsic natures, but ‘our best physics puts severe pressure on such a view’ (Ladyman & Ross 2007, p. 154).

In sum, scientific eliminativists, much like the ontological minimalists discussed in Section 6a, refuse to posit the existence of unknowable intrinsic properties. However, they do not do so only because of ontological parsimony; rather, they believe that categoricalism and the Humility Thesis are attached to some old-fashioned, prescientific worldview, and that our best science has turned out to offer a different, more advanced worldview which simply makes no such commitments. The key is replacement rather than curtailment. It is important to note that Ladyman and Ross’s OSR and their scientific eliminativism are both philosophical interpretations of physics rather than part of the physical theories themselves, and it remains open to debate whether these interpretations are the best ones (compare Eddington 1929; Chalmers 1996).

c. Rationalist categoricalism

Different from the previous two metaphysical frameworks, the third alternative metaphysical framework to the Humility Thesis is a variant rather than a denial of categoricalism. This view might be called a ‘rationalist categoricalism’, following J. L. Mackie’s use of the term ‘rationalist view’ to describe a particular response to Humility, though he rejects the view (Mackie 1973, p. 149). According to this view, intrinsic properties not only exist but could, against the Humility Thesis, also be properly described by our best physical theories or their successors (Smart 1963; Ney 2015; Hiddleston 2019).

Let us suppose that our current physical theories are final and that some of these theories have reached the most fundamental level possible. The rationalist categorialist argues that what the physicist calls fundamental properties, such as mass and charge, are attributed to objects as their intrinsic properties, not as dispositional properties. There is of course no doubt that, as pointed out by the proponents of the receptivity argument for Humility, we always discover the properties of an object in experiments and observations, which means that we measure these properties via their causal effects. Nonetheless, while the properties are measured and defined causally in terms of the relevant dispositions, they could in themselves be intrinsic and categorical properties. For the properties should not be identified with the means of measurements, but rather should be understood as something revealed by them.

Mackie, though not a friend of rationalist categoricalism, nicely illustrates the rationalist categorialist’s interpretation of the relation between mass and its relevant dispositions—which are, presumably, the active gravitational force, the passive gravitational force, and inertia—in the following passage:

Someone who takes what I have called a rationalist view will treat mass as a property which an object has in itself, which is inevitably a distinct existence from most of the force-acceleration combinations which would reveal it, and yet whose presence entails all the conditionals connecting resultant force with acceleration. (Mackie 1973, p. 149)

And in response to the receptivity argument for Humility, J. J. C. Smart, a sympathiser of rationalist categoricalism, argues that the Humility theorist commits herself to verificationism of some kind:

We could explore the possibility of giving a theory of length, mass, and so on, as absolute and not relational.… We do indeed test propositions about length relationally, but that to go on to say that length is purely relational is to be unduly verificationist about meaning. (Smart 1963, p. 74)

Unlike mainstream categoricalism and dispositionalism, rationalist categoricalism remains a minority view, but it has nonetheless attracted some serious sympathisers (Smart 1963; Ney 2015; Hiddleston 2019).

7. The Humility Thesis and Russellian Monism

As was mentioned in the discussion of Russell’s view on Humility in Section 3d, Russell developed a peculiar mind/body theory which is now called Russellian monism (for another pioneer of Russellian monism, see Eddington 1929), and this view has recently gained a wide amount of traction and followers in the philosophy of mind. The current version of the view is typically framed as a solution to the hard problem of consciousness. According to the problem, our consciousness has a particular kind of feature, namely qualia, which seems to persistently resists any physical explanations (Chalmers 1995; see also the article on ‘The hard problem of consciousness’). Qualia are the ‘subjective feels’, ‘phenomenal qualities’, or ‘what it is like’ for a conscious subject to have certain experiences. Russellian monism, then, is the view that those unknowable intrinsic properties described by the Humility Thesis play a role in the constitution of our qualia.

Apart from its own significance in the philosophy of mind, Russellian monism also has a complex relationship with the Humility Thesis. For, on the one hand, it is developed from the Humility Thesis, for it makes use of the unknowable intrinsic properties described by the Humility Thesis to account for qualia. On the other hand, it is sometimes considered and developed as a response to the Humility Thesis, for it leads to the possibility that we may know certain intrinsic properties as we introspect our own qualia.

In what follows, some ontological issues surrounding the constitution of qualia by intrinsic properties are surveyed. Following that there is a survey of the epistemic issues surrounding the introspective knowledge of intrinsic properties.

a. Constitution: from Intrinsic Properties to Qualia

To begin with, there is a question as to why someone would be attracted to the view that unknowable intrinsic properties play a role in the constitution of our qualia. It traces back to the reason why many philosophers think that the hard problem of consciousness is particularly hard to solve. For these philosophers, qualia seem intrinsic and non-causal—it is conceivable that two people might have different qualia, but still exhibit the exactly same neurophysiological and behavioural responses—and thus the standard physical properties which seem causal cannot possibly account for qualia (Levine 1983, 2001; Chalmers 1995; 1996, 2003; Kim 2005; Goff 2017; Leibniz 1714/1989; Russell 1927b). But if intrinsic properties of the kind described by the Humility Thesis are likewise intrinsic and non-causal, then it seems that they can be a part of a good explanation of qualia (Russell 1927b; Goff 2017). Furthermore, the use of intrinsic properties in explaining qualia—unlike most other alternatives to classical physicalism, such as substance dualism—avoids positing idiosyncratic entities which appear to be in conflict with a unified, elegant, and scientifically respectable ontological framework (Chalmers 1996, pp. 151-153; Heil 2004, pp. 239-240; Seager 2009, p. 208; Stoljar 2014, p. 19; Goff 2017).

Russellian monists disagree on what intrinsic properties have to be like in order for these properties to be the constituents of qualia. This leads to the variety of versions of Russellian monism, and there are at least four such major versions: (1) Russellian neutral monism, (2) Russellian panpsychism, (3) Russellian panprotopsychism, and (4) Russellian physicalism. (1) Russellian neutral monism is endorsed by Russell. According to this view, intrinsic properties are neither physical nor mental, but rather are neutral properties that are neutral between the two (Russell 1921/1922; Heil 2004). (2) For the Russellian panpsychist, intrinsic properties that constitute our qualia must themselves also be qualia, albeit being smaller in scale. Since such intrinsic properties are presumably found in fundamental physical entities such as electrons, up quarks, down quarks, gluons, and strings, the Russellian panpsychist also accepts that such entities possess qualia. This thus leads to a commitment to panpsychism, the view that mental properties are ubiquitous (Seager 2009). (3) Russellian panprotopsychism is a view similar to Russellian panpsychism, but it denies that the intrinsic properties that constitute qualia must also be some kind of qualia. Rather, it takes these microscale properties to be ‘proto-qualia’, which are similar in nature to qualia (compare Chalmers 1996, 2015). (4) Finally, for the Russellian physicalist, intrinsic properties should be counted as physical due to their being possessed by physical entities like electrons. Russellian physicalists also disagree with Russellian panpsychists and Russellian panprotopsychists that the raw materials of qualia must themselves be qualia or be similar to qualia, and so distance themselves from panpsychism and panprotopsychism (Stoljar 2001; Montero 2015; see also Section 8). Due to the recent popularity of Russellian monism, the above views are all ongoing research programs. Some readers may see the striking similarity between Russellian panpsychism and some ancient and pre-modern panpsychistic views mentioned in Section 3a. So perhaps surprisingly, the Humility Thesis provides room for panpsychistic views to persist.

Nonetheless, the use of the Humility Thesis and the relevant intrinsic properties in accounting for qualia leads to a list of related discussions. Firstly, philosophers disagree on whether it is really a good explanation of qualia. For one thing, it is questionable whether an explanation that appeals to an unknowable explanans could do any real explanatory work (Majeed 2013, pp. 267-268). Some Russellian monists, in response, argue that our theory of mind should not only aim at explanatory success according to scientific standards, but should also aim at truth (Goff 2017). For another, intrinsic properties may seem to be an adequate and attractive explanans only under the intuitive assumption that qualia are intrinsic and non-causal, but not everyone agrees that consciousness studies should hold onto such intuitive assumptions. And if such assumptions are revisable, then it might be less obvious that intrinsic properties are the adequate explanans of qualia (Chan & Latham 2019; compare Churchland 1996). Of course, there is an old debate in the philosophy of mind as to whether or not our intuitive assumptions concerning qualia are accurate—and whether or not they are accurate enough to support non-naturalistic theories of mind (Levine 1983, pp. 360-361; Chalmers 1997, 2018; contra Churchland 1988, 1996; Dennett 1991, pp. 68-70).

Secondly, if it is the case that the intrinsic properties of physical entities constitute qualia, then the relevant intrinsic properties are supposedly those of fundamental physical entities such as electrons, up quarks, down quarks, gluons, and strings, or those that play the roles of basic physical properties such as mass and charge. But this leads to the question—which is often called ‘the combination problem’—as to how such microphysical intrinsic properties can ever combine into our qualia, which appear to be macro-scale entities (Hohwy 2005; Goff 2006; Majeed 2013; Chalmers 2017; Chan 2020b). In response, Goff (2017) makes use of Humility, and thereby argues that the bonding of intrinsic properties is likewise beyond our grasp. Other sympathisers of Russellian monism argue that all theoretical frameworks in philosophy of mind need further development: Russellian monism is no exception, and thus should not be expected to be capable of accounting for every detail of how our mind works (Stoljar 2001, p. 275; Alter & Nagasawa 2012, pp. 90-92; Montero 2015, pp. 221-222).

Thirdly, there seems to be a gap between intrinsic properties and causal and dispositional properties in the Humility Thesis: the intrinsic properties are making no substantive contribution to the causal makeup of the world apart from grounding it. For many, the use of the Humility Thesis in explaining qualia means that the gap is inherent in the mind/body relation in Russellian monism—namely, the qualia constituted by the intrinsic properties will not be the causes of our cognitive activities and bodily behaviours. This, in turn, means that Russellian monism ultimately collapses into epiphenomenalism (Braddon-Mitchell & Jackson 2007, p. 141; Howell 2015; Robinson 2018; compare Chan 2020a). For most contemporary philosophers of mind, the epiphenomenalist idea that our phenomenal consciousness possesses no causal profile and cannot cause our cognitive activities and bodily behaviours is very implausible. If these philosophers are correct, and if Russellian monism makes the same commitment, then it is equally implausible. In response, some sympathisers of Russellian monism argue that there is a more intimate relationship between intrinsic properties and causal and dispositional properties, and that this relationship makes intrinsic properties causally relevant or efficacious (Chalmers 1996, pp. 153-154; Seager 2009, pp. 217-218, Alter & Coleman 2020).

b. Introspection: from Qualia to Intrinsic Properties

Russellian monism also allows for a possible response to Humility which traces back to ancient religious and philosophical mysticism: the idea that if intrinsic properties constitute our qualia, then we may know of the former via introspection of the latter. The idea is taken seriously by a number of prominent Humility theorists (Blackburn 1990, p. 65; Lewis 2009, pp. 217-218; Langton & Robichaud 2010, pp. 174-175), and is also discussed by some Russellian monists (Russell 1927b; Maxwell 1978, p. 395; Heil 2004, p. 227; Rosenberg 2004; Strawson 2006).

There are currently two major proposals regarding how the introspection of intrinsic properties may work. The first might be called a Schopenhauerian-Russellian identity thesis. The thesis is developed by Russell and its form can be found earlier in Arthur Schopenhauer’s work:

We now realise that we know nothing of the intrinsic quality of physical phenomena except when they happen to be sensations. (Russell 1927b, p. 154, emphasis added)

We ourselves are the thing-in-itself. Consequently, a way from within stands open to us as to that real inner nature of things to which we cannot penetrate from without. (Schopenhauer 1818/1966, p. 195, original emphasis)

What Russell and Schopenhauer seem to be saying is that certain mental experiences and certain intrinsic properties (or, in Schopenhauer’s case, Kantian things in themselves) are the same thing, and that the former are a part of us of which we can obviously know. Hence, since we are capable of knowing the former, then we are automatically capable of knowing the latter.

Another proposal, the identification thesis, is formulated by Lewis. Lewis ultimately rejects it because he finds it incompatible with materialism, though he nonetheless takes it, when combined with Russellian panpsychism, as a possible reply to the Humility Thesis (Lewis 1995, p. 142; 2009, p. 217; for discussion, see Majeed 2017). The thesis concerns the nature of our experience of qualia: as we experience a quale, we will be able to identify it, to the extent that its essence—something it has and nothing else does—will be revealed to us (1995, p. 142). While Lewis believes that the thesis is ‘uncommonly demanding’ (1995, p. 141), he also believes that it is an obvious part of our folk psychology and is thus deserving of serious assessment (but see Stoljar 2009):

Why do I think it must be part of the folk theory of qualia? Because so many philosophers find it so very obvious. I think it seems obvious because it is built into folk psychology. Others will think it gets built into folk psychology because it is so obvious; but either way, the obviousness and the folk-psychological status go together. (Lewis 1995, p. 142)

Humility theorists typically dismiss introspective knowledge of intrinsic properties by doubting Russellian monism (Blackburn 1990, p. 65; Langton & Robichaud 2010, p. 175) or by emphasizing their sympathies to standard physicalism in the philosophy of mind (Lewis 2009, p. 217). Nonetheless, some further surrounding issues have been raised. The first might be called a reversed combination problem (see the discussion on the combination problem in Section 7a). The problem is that even if the Schopenhauerian-Russellian identity thesis or the identification thesis is correct, this only means that we can thereby know some aggregates of fundamental, intrinsic properties—for a quale is supposedly constituted by a large sum of fundamental, intrinsic properties, not a single fundamental, intrinsic property (Majeed 2017, p. 84). Just as we cannot know of fundamental physical particles just by knowing of a cup they constitute, it is likewise not obvious that we can know of fundamental, intrinsic properties via knowing the qualia they constitute. Hence, it is not obvious that the two epistemic theses offer any real solution to Humility, unless we consider a quale as an intrinsic property which is itself a target of the Humility Thesis.

The second issue is related to the alleged similarity between Russellian monism and epiphenomenalism. For many, epiphenomenalism is committed to what Chalmers calls the paradox of phenomenal judgement: if epiphenomenalism is true—if qualia are causally inefficacious—then our judgments concerning qualia cannot be caused by qualia, and thus cannot be considered as tracking them (Chalmers 1996, p. 177). Since, as discussed in Section 7a, Russellian monism appears to share some of crucial theoretical features of epiphenomenalism, certain critics of Russellian monism thereby argue that Russellian monism faces the same paradox as epiphenomenalism does (Hawthorne 2001, pp. 371-372; Smart 2004, p. 48; Braddon-Mitchell & Jackson 2007, p. 141; Chan 2020a). If this is correct, then Russellian monism cannot even allow for knowledge of qualia—including Russellian monism itself—let alone that of intrinsic properties. It is, however, noteworthy that some sympathisers of epiphenomenalism argue that epiphenomenalism can actually account for knowledge of qualia (Chalmers 1996, pp. 196-209).

8. The Humility Thesis and Physicalism

 Physicalism is the view that everything in the actual world is physical. Despite the fact that a number of prominent Humility theorists are also famous physicalists (Armstrong 1968; Jackson 1998; Lewis 2009)—Jackson even calls his version of the Humility Thesis ‘Kantian physicalism’ (Jackson 1998, p. 23)—questions have been raised as to whether the Humility Thesis and physicalism are really compatible. Specifically, the questions are of two kinds. The first concerns whether or not we are in a position to know that an unknowable property is physical; the second concerns whether or not there could be an unknowable intrinsic property that is physical.

The first question is raised by Sam Cowling (2010, p. 662), a critic of the Humility Thesis, as a part of his formulation of the objection from overkill (see Section 5c). On his view, if the Humility Thesis is true, then systematic metaphysics is impossible. For we cannot judge whether our world is a physical one or one of Berkeleyian idealism in which all things are ultimately ideas in God’s mind. In fact, Langton and Robichaud (2010, pp. 175-176) positively hold such a radical version of the Humility Thesis.

In response to Cowling, Tom McClelland (2012) argues that the kind of knowledge he discusses is not really what the Humility Thesis concerns. Specifically, on McClelland’s view, the Humility Thesis concerns only our knowledge-which of intrinsic properties, which concerns only the distinctive features that make the property differ from any other (pp. 68-69). In light of this, the knowledge that intrinsic properties are physical does not concern the distinctive features of these intrinsic properties, and it is thus compatible with the Humility Thesis. Of course, as discussed in Section 2, even if McClelland is correct, there remains a question as to whether all important versions of the Humility Thesis concern only knowledge-which, and whether those other versions would nonetheless lead to the problem raised by Cowling—we have at least seen that Langton and Robichaud dismiss the knowledge-which version of the Humility Thesis defended by McClelland.

More philosophers raise the second question concerning the compatibility between the Humility Thesis and physicalism, namely whether or not there could be an unknowable intrinsic property that is physical (Foster 1993; Langton 1998, pp. 207-208, Braddon-Mitchell & Jackson 2007, p. 141; Ney 2007). These philosophers define the physical as whatever is posited by physics, but if the Humility Thesis is true, intrinsic properties are necessarily out of reach of physics, and thereby by definition cannot possibly be counted as physical.

In response, Stoljar (2001) and Barbara Montero (2015) argue that the physicalist should accept some alternative conceptions of physicalism (and the physical) which could accommodate the Humility Thesis. They thus both advocate some top-down conceptions of physicalism (compare Maxwell 1978; Chalmers 2015; for a survey, see Chan 2020b). These top-down conceptions first recognise some things as physical—which are, in Stoljar’s case, paradigmatic physical objects like tables and chairs (Stoljar 2015; for an earlier influential formulation of this conception of physicalism, see also Jackson 1998, pp. 6-8), and in Montero’s case, the referents of physical theories (Montero 2015, p. 217)—and then recognise whatever plays a part in their constitution as physical. In light of this, since intrinsic properties play a part in the constitution of physical objects, they could thereby be counted as physical. Nonetheless, there is a famous problem facing these top-down conceptions of physicalism which is recognised by both proponents (Jackson 1998, p. 7; Stoljar 2001, p. 257n10) and critics (Langton & Robichaud 2010, p. 175; Braddon-Mitchell & Jackson 2007, p. 33). The problem is that if panpsychism, pantheism, idealism, and the like are correct, then things such as the electron’s consciousness and God play a part in the constitution of physical objects, and they should thereby be counted as physical. But it appears that any conception of physicalism (or the physical) that counts such things as physical should not really be considered as physicalism. In response, Stoljar argues that one might supplement constraints to his conception of physicalism to overcome this weakness (Stoljar 2001, p. 257n10).

9. Conclusion

In a frequently cited and discussed article on Humility, Ann Whittle remarks, ‘Perhaps surprisingly, a number of philosophers from disparate backgrounds have felt compelled to deny that we have any [intrinsic] knowledge’ (Whittle 2006, p. 461). This is certainly true. A number of questions surrounding the Humility Thesis were listed in the introductory section, but no matter what one’s answers to these questions are and whether one is convinced by the Humility Thesis or not, as we have seen the Humility Thesis has always explicitly or tacitly played a salient role in the history of ideas, in analytic metaphysics, in the philosophy of science, and even in the philosophy of mind. Particularly, the Humility Thesis is at least important in the following respects: that the thesis and some similar theories are plausibly utilised in the formulations of a number of religious and philosophical mysticisms in history; that the thesis has inspired many historically important thinkers such as Hume, Russell, and perhaps Kant and Schleiermacher; that the thesis is a key concern in the contemporary philosophy of properties; that the thesis implies an understanding of what scientific knowledge is about; and that the thesis is the basis of Russellian monism and some ancient and contemporary versions of panpsychism. Understanding the Humility Thesis thus provides us with a better insight into how a number of important philosophical frameworks and discussions were developed and framed. This will be useful to their inquirers, proponents, and critics alike.

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Author Information

Lok-Chi Chan
National Taiwan University