Identity Theory

Identity theory is a family of views on the relationship between mind and body. Type Identity theories hold that at least some types (or kinds, or classes) of mental states are, as a matter of contingent fact, literally identical with some types (or kinds, or classes) of brain states. The earliest advocates of Type Identity—U.T. Place, Herbert Feigl, and J.J.C. Smart, respectively—each proposed their own version of the theory in the late 1950s to early 60s. But it was not until David Armstrong made the radical claim that all mental states (including intentional ones) are identical with physical states, that philosophers of mind divided themselves into camps over the issue.

Over the years, numerous objections have been levied against Type Identity, ranging from epistemological complaints to charges of Leibniz’s Law violations to Hilary Putnam’s famous pronouncement that mental states are in fact capable of being “multiply realized.” Defenders of Type Identity have come up with two basic strategies in response to Putnam’s claim: they restrict type identity claims to particular species or structures, or else they extend such claims to allow for the possiblity of disjunctive physical kinds. To this day, debate concerning the validity of these strategies—and the truth of Mind-Brain Type Identity—rages in the philosophical literature.

Table of Contents

  1. Early Versions of the Theory
  2. Traditional Objections
  3. Type vs. Token Identity
  4. Multiple Realizability
  5. Attempts at Salvaging Type Identity
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Early Versions of the Theory

Place accepted the Logical Behaviorists’ dispositional analysis of cognitive and volitional concepts. With respect to those mental concepts “clustering around the notions of consciousness, experience, sensation, and mental imagery,” however, he held that no behavioristic account (even in terms of unfulfilled dispositions to behave) would suffice. Seeking an alternative to the classic dualist position, according to which mental states possess an ontology distinct from the physiological states with which they are thought to be correlated, Place claimed that sensations and the like might very well be processes in the brain—despite the fact that statements about the former cannot be logically analyzed into statements about the latter. Drawing an analogy with such scientifically verifiable (and obviously contingent) statements as “Lightning is a motion of electric charges,” Place cited potential explanatory power as the reason for hypothesizing consciousness-brain state relations in terms of identity rather than mere correlation. This still left the problem of explaining introspective reports in terms of brain processes, since these reports (for example, of a green after-image) typically make reference to entities which do not fit with the physicalist picture (there is nothing green in the brain, for example). To solve this problem, Place called attention to the “phenomenological fallacy“—the mistaken assumption that one’s introspective observations report “the actual state of affairs in some mysterious internal environment.” All that the Mind-Brain Identity theorist need do to adequately explain a subject’s introspective observation, according to Place, is show that the brain process causing the subject to describe his experience in this particular way is the kind of process which normally occurs when there is actually something in the environment corresponding to his description.

At least in the beginning, J.J.C. Smart followed U.T. Place in applying the Identity Theory only to those mental concepts considered resistant to behaviorist treatment, notably sensations. Because of the proposed identification of sensations with states of the central nervous system, this limited version of Mind-Brain Type Identity also became known as Central-State Materialism. Smart’s main concern was the analysis of sensation-reports (e.g. “I see a green after-image”) into what he described, following Gilbert Ryle, as “topic-neutral” language (roughly, “There is something going on which is like what is going on when I have my eyes open, am awake, and there is something green illuminated in front of me”). Where Smart diverged from Place was in the explanation he gave for adopting the thesis that sensations are processes in the brain. According to Smart (1959), “there is no conceivable experiment which could decide between materialism and epiphenomenalism” (where the latter is understood as a species of dualism); the statement “sensations are brain processes,” therefore, is not a straight-out scientific hypothesis, but should be adopted on other grounds. Occam’s razor is cited in support of the claim that, even if the brain-process theory and dualism are equally consistent with the (empirical) facts, the former has an edge in virtue of its simplicity and explanatory utility.

Occam’s razor also plays a role in the version of Mind-Brain Type Identity developed by Feigl (in fact, Smart claimed to have been influenced by Feigl as well as by Place). On the epiphenomenalist picture, in addition to the normal physical laws of cause and effect there are psychophysical laws positing mental effects which do not by themselves function as causes for any observable behavior. In Feigl’s view, such “nomological danglers” have no place in a respectable ontology; thus, epiphenomenalism (again considered as a species of dualism) should be rejected in favor of an alternative, monistic theory of mind-body relations. Feigl’s suggestion was to interpret the empirically ascertainable correlations between phenomenal experiences (“raw feels,” see Consciousness and Qualia) and neurophysiological processes in terms of contingent identity: although the terms we use to identify them have different senses, their referents are one and the same—namely, the immediately experienced qualities themselves. Besides eliminating dangling causal laws, Feigl’s picture is intended to simplify our conception of the world: “instead of conceiving of two realms, we have only one reality which is represented in two different conceptual systems.”

In a number of early papers, and then at length in his 1968 book, A Materialist Theory of the Mind, Armstrong worked out a version of Mind-Brain Type Identity which starts from a somewhat different place than the others. Adopting straight away the scientific view that humans are nothing more than physico-chemical mechanisms, he declared that the task for philosophy is to work out an account of the mind which is compatible with this view. Already the seeds were sown for an Identity Theory which covers all of our mental concepts, not merely those which fit but awkwardly on the Behaviorist picture. Armstrong actually gave credit to the Behaviorists for logically connecting internal mental states with external behavior; where they went wrong, he argued, was in identifying the two realms. His own suggestion was that it makes a lot more sense to define the mental not as behavior, but rather as the inner causes of behavior. Thus, “we reach the conception of a mental state as a state of the person apt for producing certain ranges of behavior.” Armstrong’s answer to the remaining empirical question—what in fact is the intrinsic nature of these (mental) causes?—was that they are physical states of the central nervous system. The fact that Smart himself now holds that all mental states are brain states (of course, the reverse need not be true), testifies to the influence of Armstrong’s theory.

Besides the so-called “translation” versions of Mind-Brain Type Identity advanced by Place, Smart, and Armstrong, according to which our mental concepts are first supposed to be translated into topic-neutral language, and the related version put forward by Feigl, there are also “disappearance” (or “replacement”) versions. As initially outlined by Paul Feyerabend (1963), this kind of Identity Theory actually favors doing away with our present mental concepts. The primary motivation for such a radical proposal is as follows: logically representing the identity relation between mental states and physical states by means of biconditional “bridge laws” (e.g., something is a pain if and only if it’s a c-fiber excitation) not only implies that mental states have physical features; “it also seems to imply (if read from the right to the left) that some physical events…have non-physical features.” In order to avoid this apparent dualism of properties, Feyerabend stressed the incompatibility of our mental concepts with empirical discoveries (including projected ones), and proposed a redefinition of our existent mental terms. Different philosophers took this proposal to imply different things. Some advocated a wholesale scrapping of our ordinary language descriptions of mental states, such that, down the road, people might develop a whole new (and vastly more accurate) vocabulary to describe their own and others’ states of mind. This begs the question, of course, what such a new-and-improved vocabulary would look like. Others took a more theoretical/conservative line, arguing that our familiar ways of describing mental states could in principle be replaced by some very different (and again, vastly more accurate) set of terms and concepts, but that these new terms and concepts would not—at least not necessarily—be expected to become part of ordinary language. Responding to Feyerabend, a number of philosophers expressed concern about the appropriateness of classifying disappearance versions as theories of Mind-Brain Type Identity. But Richard Rorty (1965) answered this concern, arguing that there is nothing wrong with claiming that “what people now call ‘sensations’ are (identical with) certain brain processes.” In his Postscript to “The ‘Mental’ and the ‘Physical’,” Feigl (1967) confessed an attraction to this version of the Identity Theory, and over the years Smart has moved in the same direction.

2. Traditional Objections

A number of objections to Mind-Brain Type Identity, some a great deal stronger than others, began circulating soon after the publication of Smart’s 1959 article. Perhaps the weakest were those of the epistemological variety. It has been claimed, for example, that because people have had (and still do have) knowledge of specific mental states while remaining ignorant as to the physical states with which they are correlated, the former could not possibly be identical with the latter. The obvious response to this type of objection is to call attention to the contingent nature of the proposed identities—of course we have different conceptions of mental states and their correlated brain states, or no conception of the latter at all, but that is just because (as Feigl made perfectly clear) the language we use to describe them have different meanings. The contingency of mind-brain identity relations also serves to answer the objection that since presently accepted correlations may very well be empirically invalidated in the future, mental states and brain states should not be viewed as identical.

A more serious objection to Mind-Brain Type Identity, one that to this day has not been satisfactorily resolved, concerns various non-intensional properties of mental states (on the one hand), and physical states (on the other). After-images, for example, may be green or purple in color, but nobody could reasonably claim that states of the brain are green or purple. And conversely, while brain states may be spatially located with a fair degree of accuracy, it has traditionally been assumed that mental states are non-spatial. The problem generated by examples such as these is that they appear to constitute violations of Leibniz’s Law, which states that if A is identical with B, then A and B must be indiscernible in the sense of having in common all of their (non-intensional) properties. We have already seen how Place chose to respond to this type of objection, at least insofar as it concerns conscious experiences—that is, by invoking the so-called “phenomenological fallacy.” Smart’s response was to reiterate the point that mental terms and physical terms have different meanings, while adding the somewhat ambiguous remark that neither do they have the same logic. Lastly, Smart claimed that if his hypothesis about sensations being brain processes turns out to be correct, “we may easily adopt a convention…whereby it would make sense to talk of an experience in terms appropriate to physical processes” (the similarity to Feyerabend’s disappearance version of Mind-Brain Type Identity should be apparent here). As for apparent discrepancies going in the other direction (e.g., the spatiality of brain states vs. the non-spatiality of mental states), Thomas Nagel in 1965 proposed a means of sidestepping any objections by redefining the candidates for identity: “if the two sides of the identity are not a sensation and a brain process but my having a certain sensation or thought and my body’s being in a certain physical state, then they will both be going on in the same place—namely, wherever I (and my body) happen to be.” Suffice to say, opponents of Mind-Brain Type Identity found Nagel’s suggestion unappealing.

The last traditional objection we shall look at concerns the phenomenon of “first-person authority”; that is, the apparent incorrigibility of introspective reports of thoughts and sensations. If I report the occurrence of a pain in my leg, then (the story goes) I must have a pain in my leg. Since the same cannot be said for reports of brain processes, which are always open to question, it might look like we have here another violation of Leibniz’s Law. But the real import of this discrepancy concerns the purported correlations between mental states and brain states. What are we to make of cases in which the report of a brain scientist contradicts the introspective report, say, of someone claiming to be in pain? Is the brain scientist always wrong? Smart’s initial response to Kurt Baier, who asked this question in a 1962 article, was to deny the likelihood that such a state of affairs would ever come about. But he also put forward another suggestion, namely, that “not even sincere reports of immediate experience can be absolutely incorrigible.” A lot of weight falls on the word “absolutely” here, for if the incorrigibility of introspective reports is qualified too strongly, then, as C.V. Borst noted in 1970, “it is somewhat difficult to see how the required psycho-physical correlations could ever be set up at all.”

3. Type vs. Token Identity

Something here needs to be said about the difference between Type Identity and Token Identity, as this difference gets manifested in the ontological commitments implicit in various Mind-Brain Identity theses. Nagel was one of the first to distinguish between “general” and “particular” identities in the context of the mind-body problem; this distinction was picked up by Charles Taylor, who wrote in 1967 that “the failure of [general] correlations…would still allow us to look for particular identities, holding not between, say, a yellow after-image and a certain type of brain process in general, but between a particular occurrence of this yellow after-image and a particular occurrence of a brain process.” In contemporary parlance: when asking whether mental things are the same as physical things, or distinct from them, one must be clear as to whether the question applies to concrete particulars (e.g., individual instances of pain occurring in particular subjects at particular times) or to the kind (of state or event) under which such concrete particulars fall.

Token Identity theories hold that every concrete particular falling under a mental kind can be identified with some physical (perhaps neurophysiological) happening or other: instances of pain, for example, are taken to be not only instances of a mental state (e.g., pain), but instances of some physical state as well (say, c-fiber excitation). Token Identity is weaker than Type Identity, which goes so far as to claim that mental kinds themselves are physical kinds. As Jerry Fodor pointed out in 1974, Token Identity is entailed by, but does not entail, Type Identity. The former is entailed by the latter because if mental kinds themselves are physical kinds, then each individual instance of a mental kind will also be an individual instance of a physical kind. The former does not entail the latter, however, because even if a concrete particular falls under both a mental kind and a physical kind, this contingent fact “does not guarantee the identity of the kinds whose instantiation constitutes the concrete particulars.”

So the Identity Theory, taken as a theory of types rather than tokens, must make some claim to the effect that mental states such as pain (and not just individual instances of pain) are contingently identical with—and therefore theoretically reducible to—physical states such as c-fiber excitation. Depending on the desired strength and scope of mind-brain identity, however, there are various ways of refining this claim.

4. Multiple Realizability

In “The Nature of Mental States,” (1967) Hilary Putnam introduced what is widely considered the most damaging objection to theories of Mind-Brain Type Identity—indeed, the objection which effectively retired such theories from their privileged position in modern debates concerning the relationship between mind and body.

Putnam’s argument can be paraphrased as follows: (1) according to the Mind-Brain Type Identity theorist (at least post-Armstrong), for every mental state there is a unique physical-chemical state of the brain such that a life-form can be in that mental state if and only if it is in that physical state. (2) It seems quite plausible to hold, as an empirical hypothesis, that physically possible life-forms can be in the same mental state without having brains in the same unique physical-chemical state. (3) Therefore, it is highly unlikely that the Mind-Brain Type Identity theorist is correct.

In support of the second premise above—the so-called “multiple realizability” hypothesis—Putnam raised the following point: we have good reason to suppose that somewhere in the universe—perhaps on earth, perhaps only in scientific theory (or fiction)—there is a physically possible life-form capable of being in mental state X (e.g., capable of feeling pain) without being in physical-chemical brain state Y (that is, without being in the same physical-chemical brain state correlated with pain in mammals). To follow just one line of thought (advanced by Ned Block and Jerry Fodor in 1972), assuming that the Darwinian doctrine of evolutionary convergence applies to psychology as well as behavior, “psychological similarities across species may often reflect convergent environmental selection rather than underlying physiological similarities.” Other empirically verifiable phenomena, such as the plasticity of the brain, also lend support to Putnam’s argument against Type Identity. It is important to note, however, that Token Identity theories are fully consistent with the multiple realizability of mental states.

5. Attempts at Salvaging Type Identity

Since the publication of Putnam’s paper, a number of philosophers have tried to save Mind-Brain Type Identity from the philosophical scrapheap by making it fit somehow with the claim that the same mental states are capable of being realized in a wide variety of life-forms and physical structures. Two strategies in particular warrant examination here.

In a 1969 review of “The Nature of Mental States,” David Lewis attacked Putnam for targeting his argument against a straw man. According to Lewis, “a reasonable brain-state theorist would anticipate that pain might well be one brain state in the case of men, and some other brain (or non-brain) state in the case of mollusks. It might even be one brain state in the case of Putnam, another in the case of Lewis.” But it is not so clear (in fact it is doubtful) that Lewis’ appeal to “tacit relativity to context” will succeed in rendering Type Identity compatible with the multiple realizability of mental states. Although Putnam does not consider the possibility of species-specific multiple realization resulting from such phenomena as injury compensation, congenital defects, mutation, developmental plasticity, and, theoretically, prosthetic brain surgery, neither does he say anything to rule them out. And this is not surprising. As early as 1960, Identity theorists such as Stephen Pepper were acknowledging the existence of species (even system)-specific multiple realizability due to emergencies, accidents, injuries, and the like: “it is not…necessary that the [psychophysical] correlation should be restricted to areas of strict localization. One area of the brain could take over the function of another area of the brain that has been injured.” Admittedly, some of the phenomena listed above tell against Lewis’ objection more than others; nevertheless, prima facie there seems no good reason to deny the possibility of species-specific multiple realization.

In a desperate attempt at invalidating the conclusion of Putnam’s argument, the brain-state theorist can undoubtedly come up with additional restrictions to impose upon the first premise, e.g., with respect to time. This is the strategy of David Braddon-Mitchell and Frank Jackson, who wrote in a 1996 book that “there is…a better way to respond to the multiple realizability point [than to advocate token identity]. It is to retain a type-type mind-brain identity theory, but allow that the identities between mental types and brain types may—indeed, most likely will—need to be restricted. Identity statements need to include an explicit temporal restriction.” Mental states such as pain may not be identical with, say, c-fiber excitation in humans (because of species-specific multiple realization), but—the story goes—they could very well be identical with c-fiber excitation in humans at time T. The danger in such an approach, besides its ad hoc nature, is that the type physicalist basis from which the Identity Theorist begins starts slipping into something closer to token physicalism (recall that concrete particulars are individual instances occurring in particular subjects at particular times). At the very least, Mind-Brain Type Identity will wind up so weak as to be inadequate as an account of the nature of the mental.

Another popular strategy for preserving Type Identity in the face of multiple realization is to allow for the existence of disjunctive physical kinds. By defining types of physical states in terms of disjunctions of two or more physical “realizers,” the correlation of one such realizer with a particular (type) mental state is sufficient. The search for species- or system-specific identities is thereby rendered unnecessary, as mental states such as pain could eventually be identified with the (potentially infinite) disjunctive physical state of, say, c-fiber excitation (in humans), d-fiber excitation (in mollusks), and e-network state (in a robot). In “The Nature of Mental States,” Putnam dismisses the disjunctive strategy out of hand, without saying why he thinks the physical-chemical brain states to be posited in identity claims must be uniquely specifiable. Fodor (in 1974) and Jaegwon Kim (1992), both former students of Putnam, tried coming to his rescue by producing independent arguments which purport to show that disjunctions of physical realizers cannot themselves be kinds. Whereas Fodor concluded that “reductionism… flies in the face of the facts,” however, Kim concluded that psychology is open to sundering “by being multiply locally reduced.”

Even if disjunctive physical kinds are allowed, it may be argued that the strategy in question still cannot save Type Identity from considerations of multiple realizability. Assume that all of the possible physical realizers for some mental state M are represented by the ideal, perhaps infinite, disjunctive physical state P; then it could never be the case that a physically possible life-form is in M and not in P. Nevertheless, we have good reason to think that some physically possible life-form could be in P without being in M—maybe P in that life-form realizes some other mental state. As Block and Fodor have argued, “it seems plausible that practically any type of physical state could realize any type of psychological state in some physical system or other.” The doctrine of “neurological equipotentiality” advanced by renowned physiological psychologist Karl Lashley, according to which given neural structures underlie a whole slew of psychological functions depending upon the character of the activities engaged in, bears out this hypothesis. The obvious way for the committed Identity theorist to deal with this problem—by placing disjunctions of potentially infinite length on either side of a biconditional sign—would render largely uninformative any so-called “identity” claim. Just how uninformative depends on the size of the disjunctions (the more disjuncts, the less informative). Infinitely long disjunctions would render the identity claim completely uninformative. The only thing an Identity Theory of this kind could tell us is that at least one of the mental disjuncts is capable of being realized by at least one of the physical disjuncts. Physicalism would survive, but barely, and in a distinctly non-reductive form.

Recently, however, Ronald Endicott has presented compelling considerations which tell against the above argument. There, physical states are taken in isolation of their context. But it is only if the context is varied that Block and Fodor’s remark will come out true. Otherwise, mental states would not be determined by physical states, a situation which contradicts the widely accepted (in contemporary philosophy of mind) “supervenience principle”: no mental difference without a physical difference. A defender of disjunctive physical kinds can thus claim that M is identical with some ideal disjunction of complex physical properties like “C1 & P1,” whose disjuncts are conjunctions of all the physical states (Ps) plus their contexts (Cs) which give rise to M. So while “some physically possible life-form could be in P without being in M,” no physically possible life-form could be in C1 & P1 without being in M. Whether Endicott’s considerations constitute a sufficient defense of the disjunctive strategy is still open to debate. But one thing is clear—in the face of numerous and weighty objections, Mind-Brain Type Identity (in one form or another) remains viable as a theory of mind-body relations.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, D.M. (1968). A Materialist Theory of the Mind, London, Routledge.
  • Baier, Kurt (1962). Pains. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 40 (May): 1-23.
  • Block, Ned & Fodor, Jerry A. (1972). “What psychological states are not.” Philosophical Review 81 (April):159-81
  • Borst, Clive V. (ed.) (1970). The Mind/Brain Identity Theory. Macmillan.
  • Braddon-Mitchell, D. and Jackson, F. (1996). Philosophy of Mind and Cognition, Oxford, Blackwell.
  • Endicott, Ronald P. (1993). “Species-specific properties and more narrow reductive strategies.” Erkenntnis 38 (3):303-21.
  • Feigl, H. (1958). “The ‘Mental’ and the ‘”Physical’,” in Feigl, H., Scriven, M. and Maxwell, G. (eds.) Concepts, Theories and the Mind-Body Problem, Minneapolis, Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science, Vol. 2, reprinted with a Postscript in Feigl 1967.
  • Feigl, H. (1967). The “Mental” and the “Physical,” The Essay and a Postscript, Minneapolis, University of Minnesota Press.
  • Feyerabend, Paul K. (1963). “Comment: Mental Events and the Brain.” Journal of Philosophy 60 (11):295-296.
  • Fodor, Jerry A. (1974). “Special sciences.” Synthese 28:97-115.
  • Kim, Jaegwon (1992). “Multiple realization and the metaphysics of reduction.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 52 (1):1-26.
  • Lewis, D. (1966). “An Argument for the Identity Theory,” Journal of Philosophy, 63, 17-25.
  • Lewis, D. (1969). “Review of Art, Mind, and ReligionJournal of Philosophy 66, 23-35.
  • Lewis, D. (1970). “How to Define Theoretical Terms,” Journal of Philosophy, 67, 427-446.
  • Lewis, D. (1972). “Psychophysical and Theoretical Identifications,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 50, 249-258.
  • Nagel, Thomas (1965). “Physicalism.” Philosophical Review 74 (July):339-56.
  • Place, U.T. (1956). “Is Consciousness a Brain Process?,” British Journal of Psychology, 47, 44-50,
  • Place, U.T. (1960). “Materialism as a Scientific Hypothesis,” Philosophical Review, 69, 101-104.
  • Place, U.T. (1967). “Comments on Putnam’s “Psychological Predicates”’. In Capitan, W.H. and Merrill, D.D. (eds) Art, Mind and Religion, Pittsburgh, Pittsburgh University Press.
  • Place, U.T. (1988). “Thirty Years on–Is Consciousness still a Brain Process?,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 66, 208-219.
  • Putnam, Hilary (1967). “The Nature of Mental States,” In W.H. Capitan & D.D. Merrill (eds.), Art, Mind, and Religion. Pittsburgh University Press.
  • Rorty, Richard (1965). “Mind-body identity, privacy, and categories,” Review of Metaphysics 19 (September): 24-54.
  • Ryle, G. (1949). The Concept of Mind, London, Hutchinson.
  • Smart, J.J.C. (1959). “Sensations and Brain Processes,” Philosophical Review, 68, 141-156.
  • Taylor, C. (1967). “Mind-body identity, a side issue?” Philosophical Review 76 (April):201-13.

Author Information

Steven Schneider
Harvard University
U. S. A.