If I think about a piano, something in my thought picks out a piano. If I talk about cigars, something in my speech refers to cigars. This feature of thoughts and words, whereby they pick out, refer to, or are about things, is intentionality. In a word, intentionality is aboutness.

Many mental states exhibit intentionality. If I believe that the weather is rainy today, this belief of mine is about today’s weather—that it is rainy. Desires are similarly directed at, or about things: if I desire a mosquito to buzz off, my desire is directed at the mosquito, and the possibility that it depart. Imaginings seem to be directed at particular imaginary scenarios, while regrets are directed at events or objects in the past, as are memories. And perceptions seem to be, similarly, directed at or about the objects we perceptually encounter in our environment. We call mental states that are directed at things in this way ‘intentional states’.

The major role played by intentionality in affairs of the mind led Brentano (1884) to regard intentionality as “the mark of the mental”; a necessary and sufficient condition for mentality. But some non-mental phenomena seem to display intentionality too—pictures, signposts, and words, for example. Nevertheless, the intentionality of these phenomena seems to be derived from the intentionality of the mind that produces them. A sound is only a word if it has been conferred with meaning by the intentions of a speaker or perhaps a community of speakers; while a painting, however abstract, seems only to have a subject matter insofar as its painter intends it to. Whether or not all mental phenomena are intentional, then, it certainly seems to be the case that all intentional phenomena are mental in origin.

The root of the word ‘intentionality’ reflects the notion that it expresses, deriving from the Latin intentio, meaning ‘directed at’. Intentionality has been studied since antiquity and has generated numerous debates that can be broadly categorized into three areas that are discussed in the following sections:

Section 1 concerns the intentional relation: the relation between intentional states and their objects. Here we aim to answer the question “What determines why any given intentional state is about one thing and not another?” For example, what makes a thought about a sheep about that sheep? Does the thought look like the sheep? Or does it perhaps have a causal origin in an encounter with the sheep?

Section 2 explores the nature of the objects of intentional states. Are these objects independent of us, or somehow constituted by the nature of our minds? Do they have to exist, or can we have thoughts about non-existent objects like The Grinch?

Section 3 explores the nature of intentional states themselves. For example, are intentional states essentially rational states, such that only rational creatures can have them? Or might intentional states be necessarily conscious states? And is it possible to give a naturalized theory of intentionality that appeals only to facts describable in the natural sciences?

This article explores these questions, and the dominant theories that have been designed to answer them.

Table of Contents

  1. The Intentional Relation
    1. Formal Theories of Intentionality
    2. Problems for Forms, and the Causal Alternative
  2. Intentional Objects
    1. Intentional Inexistence
    2. Thinking About Things that Do Not Exist
    3. Direct versus Indirect Intentionality
  3. Intentional States
    1. Intentionality and Reason
    2. Intentionality and Intensionality
    3. Intentionality and Consciousness
    4. Naturalizing Intentionality
  4. References and Further Reading

1. The Intentional Relation

If I am thinking about horses, what is it about my thought that makes it about horses and not, say, sheep? That is, in what relation do intentional states stand to their objects? This is the question “What is the intentional relation?” There have been many answers proposed to this question, and a broad division can be discerned in the history of philosophy between what can be called ‘formal’ and ‘causal’ theories.

a. Formal Theories of Intentionality

One answer to the question is that mental states refer to the things they do because of the intrinsic features of those mental states. The earliest version of this theory is based on Plato’s theory of forms. Plato held that apart from the matter (hyle) they are composed of, all things have another aspect, which he called their ‘form’ (morphê). All horses, for example, although individually made of different material, have something in common – and this is their form. The exact meaning of Plato’s ‘form’ is a controversial issue. On one reading, two things have the same form or are ‘conformal’ if they share the same shape; on a broader interpretation, two things are conformal if there is a one-to-one mapping between the essential features of the two—as there is between a building and an architect’s blueprint for the building. Plato held that when we think about an object, we have the form of the object in our mind, so that our thought literally shares the form of the object. Aristotle further developed this theory, arguing that in perception (sensu) the form of an object perceived is transmitted from the object to the mind of the perceiver. In the Middle Ages Thomas Aquinas defended and elaborated Aristotle’s theory, and in the Early Modern period the theory finds an heir in the work of the ‘British Empiricists’ Locke and Hume. Locke and Hume argued that ‘ideas’, which they considered to be the fundamental components of thought, refer to their objects because they are images of those objects, impressed on the mind through the action of the perceptual faculties.

Although images or shapes may play a role in thought, it is generally accepted that they cannot provide a complete account of intentionality. The relation between an image and its object is a relation of resemblance. But this presents a difficulty that was first raised against the formal theory by Ockham in the Middle Ages (King, 2007). The problem is that the relation of resemblance is ambiguous in a way that the intentional relation cannot be. An image of a man walking up a hill also resembles a man walking backwards down a hill (Wittgenstein, 1953), whereas a thought about a man walking up a hill is not also a thought about a man walking backwards down a hill. Similarly, while an image of Mahatma Gandhi resembles Mahatma Gandhi, it also resembles everyone who resembles Mahatma Gandhi (Goodman, 1976). Thoughts about Mahatma Gandhi on the other hand, are not thoughts about anyone who looks like Mahatma Gandhi.

An alternative formal model that seems to avoid this problem appeals to descriptions (Frege 1892, Russell 1912). This view holds that if I am thinking about something, then I must have in mind a description that uniquely identifies that thing. Descriptions seem to avoid the problem of ambiguity faced by images. There may be many people who resemble Mahatma Gandhi, but probably only one person that satisfies the description ‘the Indian Nationalist leader assassinated on the 30th of January 1948’. Since the ‘descriptivist’ account takes concepts to refer to their objects by describing them, so that the features of a concept somehow correspond to the features of its object, the descriptivist theory is arguably also a formal theory of intentionality.

In addition to answering the question why an intentional state refers to one object and not another, the formal approach is also helpful in explaining how thinkers understand what it is they are thinking about. One thing that we seem to be able to do when we have mental states that are directed at particular things objects is to reflect upon different aspects of those objects, reason about them, describe them, and even make reliable predictions about them. For example, if I understand what horses are, and what sheep are, I ought to be in a position to tell you about their differences, and perhaps make good predictions about their behavior. If intentional states are conformal with their objects, we have some explanation for how such understanding is possible, since the form of the object the intentional state is directed at should be available to me if I reflect upon my own thoughts.

And we have another reason still for expecting that thoughts have a formal component. Frege (1892) observed that we can have multiple thoughts about the same thing, without realizing that we are thinking of the same thing in each case. The Ancient Greeks believed that Hesperus and Phosphorus (two Greek names for Venus) were two different stars in the sky, one of which appeared in the morning, while the other appeared in the evening. As a result they believed that Hesperus rises in the evening while simultaneously believing that Phosphorus does not. Of course Hesperus and Phosphorus, as it turns out, are the same object – the planet Venus, which rises both in the morning and in the evening. And so the Ancient Greeks had two contradictory beliefs about Venus, without realizing that both beliefs were about the same thing. The upshot is that it is possible for us to have distinct concepts that pick out the same thing without our knowing.

Frege proposed as an explanation that our concepts must vary in more ways than in what they refer to. They also vary, he proposed, in what he called their ‘sense’, so that two concepts could refer to the same object while differing in sense. He described the sense as the ‘mode of presentation’ of the object that a concept picks out. It would appear that by ‘mode of presentation’ he meant something like a description of the object. So, while the reference of someone’s hesperus and phosphorus concepts might be the same, the sense of hesperus might be ‘the star that appears in the evening’, while the sense of phosphorus could be ‘the star that appears in the morning’. Since it is perfectly rational to suppose that the object that satisfies the description ‘the star that appears in the morning’ might not be the same as the object that satisfies the description ‘the star that appears in the evening’, we now have an explanation for how one could have two concepts that pick out the same thing without knowing.

Supposing that the intentional relation is one of conformality, then, allows us to explain i) why a thought refers to what it does, (ii) how we can have introspective knowledge of the things we think about, and (iii) how two or more of our concepts could pick out the same thing without our knowing. But there are problems facing the formal approach, which have lead many to look for alternatives.

b. Problems for Forms, and the Causal Alternative

The formal theory of intentionality faces two major objections.

The first objection, sometimes called ‘the problem of ignorance and error’, is that the descriptions we have at our disposal of the objects we think about might be insufficient to uniquely identify those objects. Putnam (1975) articulated this objection using a now famous thought-experiment. Suppose that you are thinking of water. If the descriptive theory is right, for example, you must have at your disposal a description that uniquely distinguishes water from all other things. For most of us – chemists aside – such a description will amount to something like ‘the clear drinkable liquid in the rivers, lakes, and taps around here’. But suppose, suggests Putnam, that there is another planet far away from here, which looks to its inhabitants just like Earth looks to us. On that planet, let’s call it Twin-Earth, there is a clear drinkable liquid that the inhabitants of the planet refer to (coincidentally) as ‘water’, but that is in fact a different chemical substance; rather than H2O, it has a different chemical composition—let’s call it XYZ. If this were true, we should expect that the description most people here on Earth are in a position to give of what we call ‘water’ will be just the same as the description the inhabitants of the other planet give of what they call ‘water’. But, by hypothesis, when we think about water we are thinking of the substance on our planet, H2O, and when they think of what they call ‘water’, they are thinking of a different thing—XYZ. As a result, it would seem that descriptions are not sufficient to explain what we are thinking of, since a member of either of these groups will give the same description for what they call ‘water’, even though their thoughts pick out different substances. This is the ‘ignorance’ part of the problem—we often don’t have enough descriptive knowledge of the things we think about to uniquely identify those things. The ‘error’ part is that it often turns out to be the case that our beliefs about the things we think about are false. For example, many people believe tomatoes are vegetables not fruit; and as a result, the description they will give of ‘tomato’ will include the claim that tomatoes are vegetables. If these people are indeed thinking of tomatoes, so the argument goes, it cannot be as a result of their being in possession of a description that picks out tomatoes, since no tomato truly falls under the description ‘fruit’.

The second difficulty for the formal accounts, specifically directed at the descriptive account, is that descriptions do not identify the essential nature of the things they pick out, whereas many words and concepts do (Searle 1958, Kripke 1980). The description someone might offer of Hesperus could be ‘the brightest celestial object in the evening sky’. But it is perfectly coherent to suppose that Hesperus could have existed without having been visible in the evening. It could have drifted into a different orbital pattern, or have been occluded by a belt of asteroids, and therefore never have been visible in the evening. This description does not, therefore, capture an essential feature of Hesperus. The term ‘Hesperus’ in our thoughts, on the other hand, does pick out an essential feature of Hesperus—being Hesperus. That this is an important difference can be seen when we realize that concepts and descriptions seem to behave differently in thoughts about counterfactual possibilities—or, alternative ways the world could have turned out. For example, the thought ‘Hesperus could have failed to have been the brightest celestial object in the evening sky’, is clearly true—this could have been the case had it drifted into a different orbital pattern. But the thought ‘Hesperus could have failed to have been Hesperus’, is not true: there is no way the world could have turned out such that Hesperus could have failed to have been itself. The name ‘Hesperus’ therefore identifies the essence of Hesperus—what it couldn’t fail to be; but the description does not. So now we have a further reason for thinking that concepts are not cognitively equivalent to descriptions—since they behave differently in thoughts about counterfactual possibility.

As an alternative to descriptions, images, or forms of any sort, Putnam (1975) and Kripke (1980) propose a ‘causal’ model of intentionality. On this alternative model, our concepts do not have intrinsic formal features that determine what they refer to. Rather, a concept picks out the thing that originally caused it to occur in the mind of a thinker, or the thing it is causally related to in the mind-independent world. On this view, if I have a concept that picks out horses, this concept must have initially been caused to occur in me by a physical encounter with horses. If I have a concept that picks out water, the concept must have been caused to occur in me by a causal interaction with water. And if I have a concept that picks out Hesperus, this concept must have a causal origin in my apprehension of Hesperus, perhaps by seeing it in the sky.

We can see how the causal theory can be used to address the two major objections to the formal theory. Firstly, on the causal account, the ‘water’ thoughts of those on Earth can be distinguished from the ‘water’ thoughts of those on Twin-Earth: the substance Earthlings are causally interacting with when they have ‘water’ thoughts is H2O, while the substance that Twin-Earthlings are causally interacting with is XYZ—explaining why the thoughts of each thinker refer to different things, even though the descriptions they might offer of those things are identical. Similarly, I can causally interact with water, or tomatoes, even if I have false beliefs about these things, so the causal model allows that the descriptions I might offer of the things I think about can be false. The causal model therefore seems to handle the problem of ignorance and error. Secondly, if we reject that my hesperus concept is cognitively equivalent to a description, the worry that the description fails to identify the essence of the object simply doesn’t arise. The causal model therefore also seems to handle the problem concerning reference to essential properties (sometimes called the ‘modal problem’).

However, the causal model has trouble explaining some of the things the formal model was designed to explain (see last paragraph of Section 1a above). Firstly, the causal model has trouble explaining (ii), how we can reflect on the objects of our thoughts, and say something about them. If concepts have no formal component that somehow describes their objects this becomes mysterious. The causal model also fails to explain (iii), how we can have multiple thoughts about the same thing without realizing. While formal models can explain this by holding that different concepts can be cognitively equivalent to different descriptions of the same thing, the causal model has trouble explaining this. Since the thoughts of an Ancient Greek about hesperus, and the thoughts of an Ancient Greek about phosphorus have a causal origin in the same object, namely Venus, the causal relation that stands between these concepts and their object is identical in each case; as a result, there ought to be no difference between the concepts on the causal model.

The formal and causal models therefore each provide good explanations for one set of phenomena, but run into trouble in explaining another.

Perhaps the best account of the intentional relation will be one that draws on aspects of both theories—something that so-called ‘two-dimensional’ accounts of intentionality aim to do (Chalmers 1996, 2006, Lewis 1997, Jackson 1998). On this approach, although it is necessary to know what environment a thinker is causally connected to in order to know what her thoughts refer to, this need not rule out that her concepts also have a formal component. The trick is to find a formal component that does not run into the problems raised by the causal theorist. To deal with the problem of error, for example, it has been proposed that the formal component of a concept might be a description of the appearance of the object the concept refers to (Searle 1983). Although I can be wrong that the things my tomato concept picks out are vegetables, it would seem that I cannot be mistaken that they are apparently red shiny edible objects—since I cannot be wrong about how the world appears to me. Such content would therefore avoid the problem of error—these descriptions couldn’t turn out to be false. To deal with the problem of ignorance, where my descriptive knowledge fails to uniquely determine which thing I am thinking of, it has been proposed to write the causal origin of my experience into the formal component. So, my concept water might be cognitively equivalent not just to ‘the apparently clear drinkable liquid in the lakes and rivers’, which fails to distinguish the water on Earth from the water on Twin-Earth, but to ‘the stuff causing my current experiences of an apparently drinkable liquid in the lakes and rivers’ (Searle 1983). This description, it would seem, does indeed distinguish water from Twin-Earth water, since only water is the causal source of my experiences (because I am on Earth, not Twin-Earth). And to get descriptions to behave the same way as concepts in thoughts about counterfactual possibility, it has been proposed to include the specification ‘actual’ in the descriptive content of a concept (Davies and Humberstone 1980). Although it is true that ‘the brightest celestial object in the evening sky could have failed to have been Hesperus’, it seems not to be true that ‘the actual thing that is the brightest celestial object in the evening sky could have failed to have been Hesperus’. By including ‘actual’ in the description, we can therefore get the description to behave in the same way as the concept in counterfactual thoughts. In sum, the descriptive content of a concept like water would be something like ‘the actual stuff causing my experience of an apparently clearly drinkable liquid in the lakes and rivers’. Such content, it is hoped, can account for the phenomena formal models explain without running into the difficulties faced by earlier formal accounts. Whether these modifications really succeed in handling the problems raised by the causal theorist is, however, a topic of ongoing controversy (see Soames 2001, 2005 and Recanati 2013 for recent defenses of the causal approach; see Chalmers 2006 for a defense of the two-dimensional approach, and an advanced overview of the debate).

2. Intentional Objects

Having seen some of the layout of the debate about what determines the object of any intentional state, we can now consider issues that arise when we consider the objects themselves. Do they all have something in common that makes them appropriate as objects of intentional states? Might there be non-existent intentional objects? Do our thoughts connect directly with these objects or only indirectly, via our senses?

a. Intentional Inexistence

Franz Brentano has been mentioned already in this article, in part because his work set the tone for much of the debate over intentionality in the 20th century. One of his claims was that the objects of intentional states have a special type of existence, which he called ‘intentional inexistence’. Whether he meant by that a special sort of existence ‘in’ the intentional, or that intentional objects do not exist, is debated. Supposing that intentionality is always directed at objects that do not exist, however, is particularly problematic, and we’ll look at the difficulties it raises in the next section. So first I’ll explore the possibility that Brentano supposed that intentional objects have a special sort of existence as objects of intentional states.

This idea had a particularly strong influence on the work of Edmund Husserl, who founded a branch of philosophy of mind known as phenomenology, which he conceived of as the study of experience. Husserl emphasizes that the objects of thought have a particular character insofar as they are objects of thought. First, they have to be related to other concepts and ideas in the mind of the thinker in a coherent way, a feature he refers to as their ‘noematic’ character. If our ideas of the objects we encounter in experience conflict too severely with the constraints that our understanding of how the world works, those ideas will disintegrate (something he calls ‘noematic explosion’). Visual illusions present a good example of this. If we are presented with an object that appears to be a cube sitting on a flat surface, we will approach the object with certain expectations, for example that if we turn our heads to one side we will see the side of the cube now out of view, if we grab a hold of it our grasp will be resisted, and so on. If the object turns out to be an image painted in such a way that it only appears as a cube from a certain angle, when we discover this by trying to pick it up, for example, the idea we are working with of the object will disintegrate. It is in this sense that Husserl at least took the objects of thought to have a special sort of existence as objects of thought (Føllesdal 1992, Mooney 2010).

Husserl (1900) proposed that we can study the nature of the constraints that the character of our mind places on the possible objects of thought through a method he calls ‘phenomenological reduction’, which involves uncovering the conditions of our awareness of objects through reflection on the nature of experience. The approach inherits a great deal from Kant’s transcendental idealism, since in both cases we are required to recognize that the nature of our minds may impose a very specific character on objects as we encounter them in experience – a character that we should not be tempted to assume is imposed on our experience by facts about the external world. The idea that the nature of our minds imposes constraints on the way we experience the world is in fact a claim that is increasingly widely accepted, and phenomenology has become an area of particular interest for the emerging field of cognitive science (see for example Varela, Thompson and Rosch 1991).

b. Thinking About Things that Do Not Exist

The second possible interpretation of Brentano’s claim – that intentional objects do not exist – is particularly problematic. Whether or not all objects of thought are non-existent, it certainly seems that many are, including those that are obviously fictitious (The Grinch, Sherlock Holmes) or likely non-existent even if many people believe in them (Faeries, Hell). But deep puzzles arise when we consider what it means to say something about a non-existent object. Can we, for example, coherently state that Santa Claus has flying reindeer? If he does not exist, how can it be true that he has flying reindeer?  Can we indeed even coherently state that Santa Claus does not exist? If he does, our statement is false. But if he does not exist, then it seems that our claim is not about anything – and hence apparently meaningless. Another way of putting the puzzle involves definite descriptions. It seems reasonable to say the following:

(1)     The fairy king does not exist

But upon further consideration 1) is quite puzzling, because the appearance of the definite article ‘the’ in that statement seems to presuppose that there is such a thing as the fairy king to which we refer.

Russell proposed a famous solution to this puzzle. It involves first analyzing definite descriptions to show how we can use these to express claims about things that do not exist, and second to show that most terms that we use to make negative existential claims are actually definite descriptions in disguise. The first move is accomplished by Russell’s analysis of the logical structure of definite descriptions. He takes definite descriptions to have the logical form ‘a unique thing that has the properties F and G’. So, the definite description ‘the fairy king’ in 1) on Russell’s reading is logically equivalent to the description ‘a unique thing that is both a king and a fairy’. Notably, this eliminates the term ‘the’ from the description, and with it the presupposition that there is a fairy king. And rather than being meaningless, the claim that such a thing does not exist is true, if no unique thing exists that is both a king and a fairy:

(2)     There is no unique thing that is a king and a fairy

And, of course, false if there is a unique thing that is a king and a fairy. The second step of Russell’s solution is to hold that most referring terms in ordinary language are actually disguised definite descriptions. The term ‘Santa Claus’ on this view is actually a sort of shorthand for a description, perhaps ‘the man with the flying reindeer’. And this description is in turn to be analyzed as Russell proposes, so that the claim ‘Santa Claus does not exist’ in fact amounts to the denial that a unique individual that has the properties of being a man and having flying reindeer exists. And that seems to be perfectly coherent.

Are there any terms, in language or thought, on this account, that are not descriptions? Russell’s view is that the simplest terms in thought, out of which definite descriptions are composed, are not descriptions but singular terms, whose meaning is simply the object they refer to. These are demonstrative terms like ‘that’ and ‘this’, and our concepts of sensible properties like colors, sounds and smells. The meaning of these terms are fixed by what Russell called ‘acquaintance’ – they are conferred with meaning as a result of a direct interaction between the thinker and thing referred to, for example when we point at a color and simply think to ourselves ‘that’. These terms are only meaningful if in fact there are objects in the world to which they refer. Notice that on this view the second interpretation of Brentano’s claim – that in general the objects of thought do not exist – will become impossible to maintain. Since the descriptions that can pick out non-existent objects are composed of terms that are only meaningful if they refer to existing things, the objects of at least singular terms must exist for the view to make any sense.

c. Direct versus Indirect Intentionality

Even supposing that many objects of thought do exist, a further question arises as to whether the objects that we encounter in experience are products of our minds, or mind-independent objects. The view that the objects of experience are mind-dependent can be motivated by two complementary considerations. First, it seems reasonable to suppose that two different persons’ experiences in the same environment can be different. A color-blind person and a person with perfect color vision might have visually very different experiences in the same environment. Conversely, it seems that one person’s experiences in two very different environments could be the same. When I look at an oasis in the desert, I have a visual experience that might seem to be identical to the experience I have when faced with a mirage, even though these two environments are very different.

These considerations have lead many to argue that our experiences – even those of ordinary objects – are mediated by what have been called ‘sense data’. According to the sense-data theorist, what we immediately experience are not mind-independent objects, but sense-data that are produced at least partly by our minds. This allows us to explain the two puzzles considered above. If what we encounter in experience are sense data and not mind-independent objects, then two people could have very different experiences in the same mind-independent environment, and correlatively, one person could have two indistinguishable experiences in two very different mind-independent environments. Note that these sense-data may correspond very closely to the way things stand in the mind-independent world around us, so the view need not imply that our interactions with the world should be dysfunctional.

This ‘indirect’ theory of perception, however, raises worries about our knowledge of the world. When we say of the ketchup before us that it is red, are we saying this about the ketchup, or about the sense-data that we experience as a result of looking at the ketchup? If we really only experience the sense-data, this would suggest that most of the beliefs we have about the world around us are false. We believe our intentional states are directed at mind-independent objects, but the indirect theory suggests that they are not. We believe we’ve seen red ketchup, but this theory suggests that in fact we’ve only seen sense-data of red ketchup. And if we only have experience of sense-data produced by our minds, this seems to imply that we have never really had any direct experience with the world. It suggests that we’ve never seen waterfalls, smelled flowers, or heard the voices of our friends, but have only experienced sense-data of these things.

An early reply to these concerns involves jettisoning the indirect-theory of perception, and adopting the view that there are no sense-data or any other kind of representations mediating our experiences of the objects around us – a view sometimes called ‘naive realism’, and associated with Moore (1903). But on this approach, explanations of hallucinations or variations between different individuals’ experiences of the same objects are strained. An interesting middle ground is known as disjunctivism (Hinton 1967, Snowdon 1981, McDowell 1994, Martin 2002). The disjunctivist holds that the argument for the indirect theory of perception based on hallucinations is fallacious. Although the experiences of the oasis and the mirage might well be indistinguishable for the subject of the experience, this need not imply that the experiences are really the same. Rather, since one experience is the product of an encounter with an oasis, and the other is not, there is a difference between the experiences—it is just one that the subject is unable to identify. As a result, the disjunctivist holds that when we have veridical experiences, we have direct encounters with objects in the world, and when we have hallucinations, what we experience are sense-data produced by our mind. The disjunctivist view, then, at least allows us to see that we might not be forced into the indirect theory of perception by the existence of hallucinations.

3. Intentional States

So far we have looked at the question what determines the object of any given intentional state, and the question what is the nature of the objects of intentional states. What we have not examined is whether there are broad conditions for a state to count as intentional in the first place. Are only rational creatures capable of intentional states? Are intentional states essentially conscious states? Can we provide an account of intentional states in natural terms?

a. Intentionality and Reason

The centrality of reason to the intentional is an important strand in Kant’s famous Critique of Pure Reason (1787), and has informed an influential line of thinking taken up in the work of Sellars (1956), Strawson (1959) and Brandom (1996). Kant argues that in the apprehension of any object, an individual must have a range of concepts at her disposal that she can use to rationally assess the nature of the object apprehended. In order to apprehend a material object, for example, a thinker must understand what causation is. If she does not understand what causation is, she will not understand that if the material object were to be pushed, it would move. Or if it were picked up and thrown against a wall, it would not go straight through the wall or disappear, but would be caused by the solidity of the wall to bounce backward.  Without having the capacity to understand any of these issues, Kant argued, it would not be true to say that an individual apprehends the material object.

The appeal to the necessity of reason for concept-possession often goes hand in hand with the claim that our intentional states are all interdependent. Since I cannot have the concept material object, without the concept cause, then the two concepts depend on one another—and this may be the case for all our concepts, leading to a view known as ‘concept holism’. This raises a puzzle, however, that many think undermines the view. The concern is that if our concepts are interdependent in this way, then if any of my concepts change, all the others change with it. If for example I can only grasp the concept horse if I have the concept animal, then if my animal concept changes in some way, my horse concept will change along with it. If we couple this with the observation that our beliefs about the world are almost constantly being updated, as our day to day experience progresses, then the worry arises that we could literally never have the same thought twice. Any time my beliefs about the world change they will change at least one of my concepts, and if all of my concepts are interdependent, then whenever any of my beliefs change, they will all change. As a result, although it might seem to me that I had thoughts about horses both yesterday and today, this would not be true since the concept that occurred in my thoughts yesterday would not be the same concept as occurred in my thoughts today. Some who think this is an intolerable result adopt the view known as ‘concept atomism’, which holds that our concepts do not stand in essential relations to one another, but only to the external objects they refer to (Fodor and Lepore 1992). Atomism, however, seems to be committed to the claim that I could possess the concept horse without knowing what an animal is, and to the holist that seems as intolerable as concept holism seems to the atomist.

b. Intentionality and Intensionality

Another feature of intentional states that is sometimes thought to be essential is what is called ‘intensionality’ (with an ‘s’). This is the phenomenon whereby the objects of thought are presented to a thinker from a certain point of view—what Frege called a ‘mode of presentation’. We already encountered one of the puzzles that motivate this idea above discussing Frege’s puzzle, where the answer to the question why two concepts can be co-referential without a thinker knowing is proposed to be the fact that a thinker’s concepts pick out an object under a particular mode of presentation.

The potentially essential connection between intentionality and intensionality can be seen when we try to describe someone’s intentional states without bearing in mind their point of view. Recall the beliefs that Lois Lane has about Superman. Lois Lane believes she loves Superman, but does not believe she loves her colleague Clark Kent, not knowing that Superman is Clark Kent. 1) seems like a true description of Lois Lane’s belief about Superman:

(1)     Lois Lane believes that she loves Superman

If (1) is true, however, and Superman is Clark Kent, then we might expect that we would state exactly the same thing if we substitute the name ‘Clark Kent’ for the name ‘Superman’ in (1). That would give us (2):

(2)     Lois Lane believes that she loves Clark Kent

To many, however, it seems that there is something wrong with (2). If Superman walks into the room in his Clark Kent disguise, Lois will not light up as she does when he walks in without the disguise. If Lois is told that Clark Kent is in trouble, she will not infer that the man she loves in is in trouble. A natural explanation for these facts is that the belief reported in (1) is not the same as the belief reported in (2). Since our reports about the beliefs of others may be false if we do not take into consideration the mode of presentation under which the objects of those beliefs are thought of by the holder of the belief, it seems like intensionality may be an essential feature of intentional states.

Another phenomenon that seems to tie intentionality to intensionality is shown in the fact that we cannot infer from the fact that someone has a belief about x, that x exists. This is unusual, since for most cases of predication (ascription of a property to an object), we can infer from the fact that we have ascribed a property to an object that the object exists. For example, if the claim that the sun is bright is true, it would seem to follow that there must be such a thing as the sun. That is, predication ordinarily permits existential generalization: if a property is truly predicated of an object, then some object with that property exists (Fa → ∃xFx). However, from the fact that I believe the sun is bright, it does not follow that there is such a thing as the sun. After all, I might just as easily believe, as Kant did, that phlogiston is the cause of combustion, but as we know, there is no such thing as phlogiston. If we combine these two claims we get a third claim: that neither the assertion nor the denial of a report of an intentional state entails that the proposition the intentional state is about is true or false. For example, we could truly assert that Kant believed that phlogiston causes combustion, but this does not entail that it is true that phlogiston causes combustion.

Chisholm (1956) thought that an intentional state is any state whose description has these three features: failure to preserve truth given the inter-substitution of co-referring terms (such as ‘Superman’ for ‘Clark Kent’), failure to allow existential generalization entailment (the existence of the intentional object), and failure to entail the truth of the object proposition (such as the belief ascribed to the thinker).

However, these criteria do not seem to hold up for all intentional states. While it does not follow from the fact that Kant believes phlogiston causes combustion that there is such a thing as phlogiston, or that it is true that phlogiston causes combustion, these things would seem to follow if it we held that Kant knew that phlogiston causes combustion. That is, it does not seem possible to have knowledge of things that do not exist, or of propositions that are not true, so if someone knows Fa, then an object with the property F must exist, and if someone knows that p, then p must be true. Knowledge ascriptions therefore do not satisfy the second and third conditions proposed by Chisholm, and yet they are surely intentional states. And perceptual states, which also seem to be intentional states, do not obviously satisfy any of the conditions. You cannot perceive something that does not exist, and you cannot perceive that p is the case if p is not the case, and additionally it is possible to intersubstitute co-referring terms in descriptions of perceptions. If it is true that Jimi Hendrix saw Bob Dylan at Woodstock, then it is true that Jimi Hendrix saw Robert Zimmerman at Woodstock, because Bob Dylan is Robert Zimmerman. Hendrix might not have believed that he saw Robert Zimmerman, or have known that he saw Robert Zimmerman, but nevertheless, if he saw Bob Dylan, he saw Robert Zimmerman. And perceptual states also seem quite clearly to be intentional states.

There is surely an important connection between intentionality and intensionality, then, but how it works in detail is clearly more complex than Chisholm thought.

c. Intentionality and Consciousness

A state of a creature is a conscious state if there is something it is like for the creature to be in that state. There is something it feels like for a person to have their hand pressed onto a hot grill, but there is not anything it feels like for a cheese sandwich to be pressed onto a hot grill. Do these conscious states have an essential connection to intentionality? Might intentionality depend on consciousness, or vice versa?

Some views take conscious states to be a kind of intentional state—thus holding that consciousness depends on intentionality. There are good prima facie grounds for holding this view. It is not obvious how I could be conscious of a horse being before me without my conscious state being directed at, or about, the horse. The idea that conscious states are a species of intentional state can be teased out in various ways. We might say that conscious content is simply intentional content that is available for rational evaluation, so that if I am conscious that it is raining, I have a mental state about the rain that I can reflect upon (Dennett 1991). Or we could say that conscious states always represent the world as being in such-and-such a way, so that if I am conscious that it is raining, I have a mental state that represents the world as being rainy right now (Tye 1995). Or, that conscious states are states that are naturally selected to indicate to a subject that her environment is in such and such a way, and again therefore intentional (Dretske 1995).

However the view that there are ‘raw feels’ in our conscious experience that do not say anything at all about the world also has considerable pull. For example, you might think that when you’re conscious of the warmth of the sun on your face you can indeed reflect upon the fact and judge that it is sunny where you are, but that the warm feeling itself does not tell you that it is sunny. On this view there are two things here, the warm feeling, and the subsequent judgment ‘it is sunny’, which although formed on the basis of the feeling is nevertheless distinct from it (Ryle 1949, Sellars 1956, Peacocke 1983). On this view, conscious states are not intentional in themselves, since they do not in themselves represent the world as being in any particular way, even if they can be used to make judgments about the world.

On the other hand, we might think the dependence runs the other way: that intentional states depend on consciousness. We might suppose that it is hard to make sense of the claim that we could have mental states about the world without the world feeling any way at all to us. Searle (1983), for example, thinks that our notion of the mind essentially involves the notion of consciousness, so he denies that there could be essentially unconscious mental states. To deal with the case of beliefs or desires that I am not currently consciously entertaining, he argues that these must at least have the potential to become conscious in order to be properly understood as mental states.

This dependence claim has its skeptics too, however. The position known as ‘epiphenomenalism’ holds that there is no essential role for consciousness to play in our lives: that consciousness is caused by, but itself plays no causal role in, other mental events. We may happen to have conscious experiences concurrent with some of the events in our lives (such as intentional events), and they may even stand in constant conjunction with those events, but this in itself is not evidence that a creature could not exist that carries out the same activities with no conscious experiences at all. A real life example can get this intuition going. In a phenomenon sometimes called ‘blindsight’, subjects display above chance capacity to discriminate features of their environment while at least reporting that they have no corresponding conscious experience of these features. In one experiment, a subject is shown two drawings of a house, each identical in every respect except that one house is represented as being on fire. When asked, the subjects insist that they can see no difference between the two houses (the house on fire is in the visual region that the subject is having problems with). When pressed on which house they would prefer to live in, however, the subjects show an above chance preference for the house that is not represented as being on fire. Since the subjects seem to have distinct attitudes to the two pictures, hence distinct intentional states directed at each picture, and since there is no apparent variation in conscious experience, some take such cases to motivate the claim that it is possible to have intentional states without any conscious component.

d. Naturalizing Intentionality

Whatever the essence of intentionality might be, a further question that arises is whether we can ‘naturalize’ our account of it. That is to say, whether we can give an account of intentionality that can be exhaustively described in the terms in which the laws of nature are expressed. There is a long tradition of holding that the mind is outside of space and time – that it is an immaterial substance – and on that view, since intentional states are mental states, intentionality could not be naturalized. But particularly in the 20th century, there has been a push to reject the view that the mind is immaterial and to try to account for the mind in terms of natural processes, such as causal relations, natural selection, and any other process that can be explained in terms of the laws of the natural sciences.

The attempt faces various challenges. We have already looked at one, which is that if we take intentional states to depend on consciousness, and we hold that it is not possible to give a naturalized account of consciousness, then it follows that we cannot naturalize intentionality. But there is another particularly tricky puzzle facing the naturalization of intentionality in terms of causal relations. As we saw above (3b) at least some intentional states have the property of intensionality: it does not follow from the fact that I believe p that p is the case, and it does not follow from the fact that I do not believe p that p is not the case. Another way to put this is that our concepts do not always co-vary with the objects they represent. On the one hand we can encounter the objects our concepts refer to without our concepts triggering, for example, when Lois Lane meets Clark Kent and the thought ‘that’s Superman’ fails to occur to her. And conversely our concepts can be triggered when the object they refer to is not about, such as when I see a cow in the night and mistakenly think ‘there’s a horse’. Our concepts, in other words, can trigger when they should not, and can fail to trigger when they should. This is a problem for naturalizing intentionality, because the causal theory of intentionality (1b) is at the heart of attempts to naturalize intentionality, and the causal theory has trouble explaining intensionality. For example, the causal theory holds that a concept refers to whatever causes it to trigger. But if Lois Lane bumps into Clark Kent and her superman concept fails to trigger, this would suggest that Lois Lane’s superman concept does not refer to Clark Kent. And that’s not a good outcome, since Superman is Clark Kent. Similarly, if I see a cow in the night and my horse concept goes off, the causal account implies that my horse concept refers to cows in the night. And that’s no good either.

Dretske (1981) argues that causal relations can in fact exhibit intensionality, so that we can naturalize intentionality. A compass, he argues, indicates the location of the North Pole because the North Pole causes the compass needle to point at it. He takes a compass to be a ‘natural indicator’ of the North Pole, and so to exhibit natural intentionality. But he thinks the compass also exhibits intensionality. In addition to indicating the North Pole, the compass also indicates the location of polar bears, because there are polar bears at the North Pole. However, if the polar bears move south, the compass will not continue to indicate their location. As a result, suggests Dretske, the compass exhibits intensionality: the compass can fail to indicate the location of polar bears, even though the location of polar bears is the North Pole, just as Lois Lane’s superman concept can fail to indicate Clark Kent, even though Clark Kent is Superman. There is a problem with this account, however, because the relationship between the location of polar bears and the North Pole is very different to the relationship between Superman and Clark Kent. The location of the polar bears can fail to be where the North Pole is, but Clark Kent cannot fail to be where Superman is. That is, the kind of failure to trigger that we are concerned to explain is where a concept fails to trigger in response to what is necessarily identical to its reference – not in response to something that merely happens to be co-instantiated with its reference on some occasions.

Another attempt to allow for these cases within a causal theory appeals to the notion of a natural function or telos (Mathen and Levy 1984, Millikan 1984, Dretske 1995, Papineau 1993). If the heart has been selected by evolution to pump blood, then we can say that the natural function of the heart is to pump blood. But functions can malfunction, as we see when the heart stops, thus failing to continue to pump blood. What distinguishes the correct from the incorrect activities of the heart is whether the heart is doing what it was selected for by evolution. The teleological theory of intentionality proposes that this same mechanism distinguishes the correct and incorrect triggers of a concept. When my horse concept tokens in response to my encounter with a cow in the night, it is malfunctioning, because it was selected to alert me to the presence of horses. This account faces several objections, but the clearest is that it rules out the possibility of a creature having thoughts whose mental states did not come into being through natural selection. Although highly unlikely, it is does not seem impossible that a being formally identical to a thinking person could come into existence by chance, through the right freak coincidence of physical events (in one story it involves lightning hitting a swamp and the right chemicals instantaneously bonding to form a molecule-for-molecule match of an adult human (Davidson 1987)). If the teleological theory of intentionality were right, such a being would have no intentional states since its brain states would have no natural history, even though it would be physically and behaviorally indistinguishable from a thinking person. Many see this is as a reductio ad absurdum of the teleological account, since it seems that by hypothesis such a being would be able to perceive, form desires and beliefs about its environment, and so forth.

Another proposal still is that we can distinguish correct from incorrect triggers of a concept in terms of the relationship they stand in to one another: the incorrect triggers of a concept only cause the concept to trigger because the correct triggers do, but the correct triggers don’t trigger the concept because the incorrect ones do (Fodor 1987). To return to the cow in the night example, the proposal is that if horses didn’t cause my horse concept to trigger, cows in the night wouldn’t either: the reason cows in the night cause it to trigger is because horses cause it to trigger, and cows in the night look like horses. But the reverse is not the case: if cows in the night didn’t cause my horse concept to trigger, this needn’t mean that horses wouldn’t. Correct and incorrect triggers can therefore by identified by this ‘asymmetric dependence’ relation they have to one another. When we try to explain why the correct triggers would continue to cause a concept to token even if the incorrect triggers didn’t, however, the proposal becomes less convincing. Returning to the Twin-Earth example, if we travel to Twin-Earth our water concept will be triggered by the watery looking stuff there, presumably falsely. But since Twin-Earth water is by hypothesis ordinarily indistinguishable from Earth water, it seems wrong to say that if Twin-Earth water did not cause our water concept to trigger, Earth water still would. The reason Earth water causes our water concept to trigger, after all, is presumably because it looks, tastes and smells a certain way. But Twin-Earth water looks, tastes and smells exactly the same way, so it is far from clear why we should expect that if Twin-Earth water did not trigger our water concept Earth water still would. Fodor (1998) replies that we should discount Twin-Earth worries because Twin-Earth does not exist. But it is not clear that this helps, since we could surely discover a substance on Earth that we might not be able to distinguish from water, in which case the same worry can be raised without discussing Twin-Earth.

Needless to say there are further arguments made on behalf of these proposals, but as things stand, there is no widely accepted solution to the problem presented by intensionality for naturalizing intentionality.

4. References and Further Reading

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  • Chisholm, R. M. (1956). “Perceiving: a Philosophical Study,” chapter 11, selection in D. Rosenthal (ed.), The Nature of Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990.
  • Davidson, D. (1980). Essays on Events and Actions, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Davidson, D. (1987). “Knowing One’s Own Mind.” In Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association, 60: 441–58.
  • Dennett, D.C (1991). Consciousness Explained. Boston: Little Brown.
  • Dretske, F. (1981). Knowledge and the Flow of Information, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Dretske, F. (1995). Naturalizing the Mind. Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Dreyfus, H.L. (ed.) (1982). Husserl, Intentionality and Cognitive Science, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Evans, G. (1979). “Reference and Contingency.” The Monist, 62, 2 (April, 1979), 161-189.
  • Fodor, J.A. (1975). The Language of Thought, New York: Crowell.
  • Fodor, J.A. (1987). Psychosemantics, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Fodor, J.A. (1998). Concepts: Where Cognitive Science Went Wrong, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Fodor, J. A. and Lepore, E. (1992). Holism: A Shopper’s Guide. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Føllesdal, D. (1982). “Husserl’s notion of Noema,” in H.L. Dreyfus (ed.), The Nature of Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Frege, G. (1892/1952). “On Sense and Reference.” In P. Geach and M. Black (eds.), Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, Oxford: Blackwell, 1952.
  • Goodman, N. (1968). Languages of Art: An Approach to a Theory of Symbols. Indianapolis: The Bobbs-Merrill Company.
  • Haugeland, J. (1981). “Semantic Engines: an Introduction to Mind Design.” In J. Haugeland (ed.), Mind Design, Philosophy, Psychology, Artificial Intelligence, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, 1981.
  • Hinton, J.M., (1967). “Visual Experiences.” Mind, 76: 217–227.
  • Husserl, E. (1900/1970). Logical Investigations, (Engl. Transl. by Findlay, J.N.), London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.
  • Jackson, F. (1998). From Metaphysics to Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kaplan, D. (1979). “Dthat.” In P. French, T. Uehling, and H. Wettstein (eds.), Contemporary Perspectives in the Philosophy of Language, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.
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  • Kim, J. (1993). Mind and Supervenience, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kripke, S. (1972/1980). Naming and Necessity, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Martin, M.G.F. (2002). “The Transparency of Experience.” Mind and Language, 17: 376–425.
  • Mohan, M. & Levy, E. (1984). “Teleology, Error, and the Human Immune System.” Journal of Philosophy 81 (7):351-372.
  • McDowell, J. (1994). Mind and World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • McGinn, C. (1989). Mental Content, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • McGinn, C. (1990). Problems of Consciousness, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Mill, J.S. (1884). A System of Logic, Ratiocinative and Inductive: Being a Connected View of the Principles of Evidence and the Methods of Scientific Investigation, New York: Harper.
  • Millikan, R.G. (1984). Language, Thought and Other Biological Objects, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Mooney, T. (2010). “Understanding and Simple Seeing in Husserl.” Husserl Studies, 26: 19-48.
  • Moore, G.E. (1903). “The Refutation of Idealism.” Mind 12 (1903) 433-53.
  • Papineau, D. (1993). Philosophical Naturalism. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Peacocke, C. (1983). Sense and Content: Experience, Thought and their Relations, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Putnam, H. (1974). “The Meaning of ‘Meaning’,” in H. Putnam, Philosophical Papers, vol. II, Language, Mind and Reality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1975.
  • Recanati, F. (2013). Mental Files. Oxford University Press.
  • Russell, B. (1905/1956). “On Denoting,” in R. Marsh (ed.), Bertrand Russell, Logic and Knowledge, Essays 1901-1950, New York: Capricorn Books, 1956.
  • Russell, B. (1911). The Problems of Philosophy, (New York: Holt).
  • Ryle, G. (1949). The Concept of Mind. Oxford University Press.
  • Searle, J. (1958). “Do Proper Names have Sense?” Mind 67: 166-173.
  • Searle, J. (1983). Intentionality, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Searle, J, (1994). “Intentionality (1),” in Guttenplan, S. (ed.) (1994) A Companion Volume to the Philosophy of Mind, Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Sellars, W. (1956/1997). “Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind.” In Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind: with an Introduction by Richard Rorty and a Study Guide by Robert Brandom, R. Brandom (ed.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Snowdon, P.F., (1981). “Perception, Vision and Causation.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, New Series, 81: 175–92.
  • Soames, S. (2005). Reference and Description: The Case against Two-Dimensionalism. Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Strawson, P. (1959). The Bounds of Sense. Oxford University Press.
  • Tye, M. (1995). Ten Problems of Consciousness, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Varela, F., Thompson, E., and Rosch E., (1991). The Embodied Mind: Cognitive Science and Human Experience, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press.
  • Wittgenstein, L. (1953). Philosophical Investigations. Oxford: Blackwell.


Author Information

Cathal O’Madagain
Ecole Normale Superieure, Paris