Jean Bodin (c. 1529—1596)

bodinThe humanist philosopher and jurist Jean Bodin was one of the most prominent political thinkers of the sixteenth century. His reputation is largely based on his account of sovereignty which he formulated in the Six Books of the Commonwealth. Bodin lived at a time of great upheaval, when France was ravaged by the wars of religion between the Catholics and the Huguenots. He was convinced that peace could be restored only if the sovereign prince was given absolute and indivisible power of the state. Bodin believed that different religions could coexist within the commonwealth. His tolerance in religious matters has often been emphasized. He was also one of the first men to have opposed slavery.

Bodin was extremely erudite, and his works discuss a wide variety of topics, extending from natural philosophy and religion to education, political economy, and historical methodology. Natural philosophy and religion where intimately correlated for Bodin. Furthermore, he sought to reform the judicial system of France, and he formulated one of the earliest versions of the quantitative theory of money. Bodin held a superstitious belief about the existence of angels and demons; his works cover topics such as demonology and witchcraft, and include extensive passages on astrology and numerology.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Career
  2. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History
    1. Methodology for the Study of History
    2. Theory of Climates
  3. The Six Bookes of a Commonweale
    1. Concept of Sovereignty
    2. Definition of Law
    3. Limitations upon the Authority of the Sovereign Prince
    4. Difference between Form of State and Form of Government
    5. The Question of Slavery
  4. Bodin’s Economic Thought
    1. Quantitative Theory of Money
    2. The State’s Finances and the Question of Taxation and Property Rights
  5. Writings Concerning Religion
    1. Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Question of Religious Tolerance
    2. The Question of True Religion and Bodin’s Personal Faith
  6. On Witchcraft
  7. Natural Philosophy
  8. Other Works
    1. Juris universi distributio
    2. Moral Philosophy
    3. Writings on Education
    4. Bodin’s Surviving Correspondence
  9. Influence
  10. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
      1. Modern Editions of Bodin’s works
        1. Collected Works
        2. Individual Works
    2. Secondary Sources
      1. Bibliography
      2. Conference Proceedings and Article Collections

1. Life and Career

Jean Bodin’s last will and testament, dated 7th June 1596, states that he was 66 years old when he died. He was therefore born in either 1529 or 1530, the youngest of seven children, four of whom were girls. Bodin’s father, Guillaume Bodin, was a wealthy merchant and a member of the bourgeoisie of Angers. Very little is known of his mother beyond that her name was Catherine Dutertre and that she died before the year 1561.

Bodin joined the Carmelite brotherhood at an early age. Surviving documents tell us that he was released from his vows a few years later. He is known to have studied, and later, taught law at the University of Toulouse during the 1550s. Bodin was unable to obtain a professorship at the university, and this may have driven him away from Toulouse and academic life. During the 1560s, he worked as an advocate at the Parlement of Paris.

Bodin’s first major work, the Method for the Easy Understanding of History (Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem) was published in 1566, the same year that saw the death of his father. Bodin’s most famous work, the Six Books of the Commonwealth (Six livres de la République) was published ten years later, in 1576. In 1570, Bodin was commissioned by the French King Charles IX for the reformation of forest tenures in Normandy. He was at the very heart of French political power in the 1570s – first during the reign of Charles IX and also, after Charles’ death in 1574, during the reign of his brother, Henri III. In 1576, Bodin lost the favor of King Henri III after he opposed, among other things, the king’s fiscal policies during the States General of Blois where Bodin served as representative for the third estate of Vermandois.

Bodin settled in Laon during the last two decades of his life. He had moved there shortly after marrying the widow of a Laon official, Françoise Trouilliart (or Trouillard) in 1576. Bodin sought employment with the Duke of Alençon, the king’s youngest brother. The duke aspired to marry Queen Elizabeth of England. During one of the duke’s trips to London, Bodin accompanied him. In 1582, Bodin followed Alençon to Antwerp, where Alençon sided with the Low Countries in their revolt against Spain. Bodin was appointed Master of Requests and counselor (maître des requêtes et conseiller) to the duke in 1583. He retired from national politics after Alençon’s sudden death in 1584. Following the death of his brother-in-law, Bodin succeeded him in office as procureur du roi, or Chief Public Prosecutor, for Laon in 1587.

Bodin wrote two notable works toward the end of his life; his Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime (Colloquium heptaplomeres de rerum sublimium arcanis abditis) is an engaging dialogue in favor of religious tolerance. Bodin’s main contribution in the field of natural philosophy, the Theater of Nature (Universae naturae theatrum) was first published in 1596, the same year that Bodin died of the plague. He was given a Catholic burial in the Franciscan church of Laon.

2. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History

Bodin’s Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem (Method for the Easy Comprehension of History) was first published in 1566, and revised in 1572. It is Bodin’s first important work and contains many of the ideas that are developed further in his other key systematic works. Some of them are human history, natural history, and divine history, later elaborated in the République, the Theatrum, and the Colloquium heptaplomeres respectively. Bodin’s purpose in writing the Methodus was to expose the art and method to be used in the study of history. His desire to elaborate a system and to synthesize all existing knowledge is easily detectable in the Methodus.

The first four chapters of the Methodus are largely a discussion concerning methodology. History and its different categories are defined in Chapter One. Chapters II and III discuss the order in which historical accounts are to be read, and the correct order for arranging all material. Chapter IV elucidates the choice of historians; it may be considered as an exposition of Bodin’s method for a critical study of history, that the student of history should move from generalized accounts to more detailed narratives. Reading should begin from the earliest times of recorded history and the reader should naturally progress towards more recent times. In order to obtain a thorough comprehension of the whole, certain other subjects – cosmography, geography, chorography, topography and geometry – are to be associated with the study of history. All material should be critically assessed; the background and training of historians must be taken into account, as well as their qualifications.

In order, then, that the truth of the matter may be gleaned from histories, not only in the choice of individual authors but also in reading them we must remember what Aristotle sagely said, that in reading history it is necessary not to believe too much or disbelieve flatly (…)If we agree to everything in every respect, often we shall take true things for false and blunder seriously in administering the state. But if we have no faith at all in history, we can win no assistance from it. (Bodin 1945, 42)

Of the ten chapters that constitute the Methodus, Chapter Six is by far the lengthiest, covering more than a third of the book, and it may be considered as a blueprint for the République. Chapters VII to IX seek to refute erroneous interpretations of history. Bodin’s first rebuttal concerns the myth, based on a biblical prophecy, of the four monarchies or empires as it was emphasized by many German Protestant theologians. Bodin’s second criticism concerns the idea of a golden age (and the superiority of the ancients in comparison with moderns). Furthermore, Bodin refutes the error of those who claim the independent origin of races. The final chapter of the Methodus contains a bibliography of universal history.

a. Methodology for the Study of History

There are three kinds of history, Bodin writes; divine, natural and human. The Methodus is an investigation into the third type, that is, the study of human actions and of the rules that govern them. Science is not concerned with particulars but with universals. Bodin therefore considers as absurd the attempts of jurisconsults to establish principles of universal jurisprudence from Roman decrees or, more generally, from Roman law, thus giving preference to one legal tradition. Roman law concerns the legislation of one particular state – and the laws of particular states are the subject of civil law—and as such change within a brief period of time. The correct study of law necessitates a different approach, one that was already described by Plato: the correct way to establish law and to govern a state is to bring together and compare the legal framework of all the states that have existed, and compile the very best of them. Together with other so-called legal humanists, like Budé, Alciat, and Connan, Bodin held that the proper understanding of universal law could only be obtained by combining the studies of history and law.

Indeed, in history the best part of universal law lies hidden; and what is of great weight and importance for the best appraisal of legislation – the custom of the peoples, and the beginnings, growth, conditions, changes, and decline of all states – are obtained from it. The chief subject matter of this Method consists of these facts, since no rewards of history are more ample than those usually gathered around the governmental form of states. (Bodin 1945, 8)

Bodin writes that there are four kinds of interpreters of law. The most skilled among them are those who are

 …trained not only by precepts and forensic practice but also in the finest arts and the most stable philosophy, who grasp the nature of justice, not changeable according to the wishes of men, but laid down by eternal law; who determine skillfully the standards of equity; who trace the origins of jurisprudence from ultimate principles; who pass on carefully the knowledge of all antiquity; who, of course, know the power and the dominion of the emperor, the senate, the people, and the magistrates of the Romans; who bring to the interpretation of legislation the discussion of philosophers about laws and state; who know well the Greek and Latin languages, in which the statutes are set forth; who at length circumscribe the entire division of learning within its limits, classify into types, divide into parts, point out with words, and illustrate with examples. (Bodin 1945, 4-6)

b. Theory of Climates

The Theory of Climates is among Bodin’s best-known ideas. Bodin was not the first to discuss the topic; he owes much to classical authors like Livy, Hippocrates, Aristotle and Tacitus, who are referenced by Bodin himself. He also borrows from his contemporaries—especially historians, travelers, and diplomats – like Commines, Machiavelli, Copernicus, and Jean Cardan. Bodin’s observations on climate differed from that of his medieval predecessors, since Bodin was first and foremost interested in the practical implications of a theory: a correct understanding of the laws of the environment must be thought of as the starting point for all policy, laws and institutions (Tooley 1953, 83). Bodin believed that climate and other geographical factors influence, although they do not necessarily determine, the temperament of any given people. Accordingly, the form of state and legislation needs to be adapted to the temperament of the people, and the territory that it occupies.

Three different accounts of the Theory of Climates are found in Bodin’s writings. The earliest version is in Chapter Five of the Methodus. Although this passage contains the general principles of the theory, Bodin does not relate them to contemporary politics. It is in the first chapter of the fifth book of the République that the theory of climates is further amplified, and its relationship to contemporary politics established. Moreover, the Latin translation of the République contains a few notable additions to the theory.

According to Bodin, no one who has written about states has ever considered the question of how to adapt the form of a state to the territory where it is situated (near the sea or the mountains, etc.), or to the natural aptitudes of its people. Bodin holds that, amid the uncertainty and chaos of human history, natural influences provide us with a sure criterion for historical generalization. These stable and unchanging natural influences have a dominant role in molding the personality, physique, and historical character of peoples (Brown 1969, 87-88). This naturalistic approach is, to some extent, obscured by Bodin’s belief in astrology and numerology. Racial peculiarities, the influence of the planets and Pythagorean numbers were all part of Renaissance Platonism. Bodin combined these ideas with geographic determinism that closely followed the theories of Hippocrates and Strabo. (Bodin 1945, xiii)

Ptolemy divided the world into arctic, temperate, and tropic zones. In adopting the Ptolemaic zones Bodin divided earth into areas of thirty degrees from the equator northward. Different peoples have their capabilities and weaknesses. Southern people are contemplative and religious by nature; they are wise but lack in energy. Northern people, on the other hand, are active and large in stature, but lack in sagaciousness. The people of the South are intellectually gifted and thus resemble old men while the Northern people, because of their physical qualities, remind us of youth. Those that live in between these two regions—the men of the temperate zone—lack the excesses of the previous two, while being endowed with their better qualities. They may therefore be described as men in middle life—prudent and therefore gifted to become executives and statesmen. They are the Aristotelian mean between two extremes. The superiority of this third group is stressed by Bodin throughout his writings.

3. The Six Bookes of a Commonweale

Bodin’s most prominent contribution in the field of political philosophy was first published in 1576, and in his own Latin translation a decade later. Significant differences exist between the French and Latin versions of the text. Translations into other languages soon followed: Italian (1588), Spanish (1590), German (1592), and English (1606). The République must be considered, at least partially, as Bodin’s response to the most important political crisis in France during the sixteenth century: the French wars of religion (1562-1598). It was written as a defense of the French monarchy against the so-called Monarchomach writers, among them François Hotman (1524-1590), Theodore Beza (1519-1605) and the author of the Vindiciae contra tyrannos. The Monarchomach writers called for tyrannicide and considered it the role of the magistrates and the Estates General to limit the sovereign power of the ruler, and that this power be initially derived from the people.

Bodin published three different prefaces to the République. The first is an introduction found in all French editions. The second is a prefatory letter in Latin that appears in the French editions from 1578 onwards. The third preface is an introduction to the Latin editions. These three prefaces were an opportunity for Bodin to defend his work against writers who had attacked it. They give us an account of how Bodin’s opinions developed during the years that followed the publication of the République. In 1580, Bodin answered his detractors in a work entitled Apologie de René Herpin pour la République de Jean Bodin. René Herpin was a pseudonym used by Bodin.

The first book of the République discusses the principal ends and aims of the state, its different elements, and the nature and defining marks of sovereign power. In the second book, Bodin discusses different types of states (democracy, aristocracy, and monarchy) and concludes that there cannot exist a mixed state. In Chapter Five, Bodin examines the conditions under which a tyrant, that is, an illegitimate ruler who does not possess sovereign power, may be rightfully killed. A legitimate monarch, on the other hand, may not be resisted by his subjects – even if he should act in a tyrannical manner.

Book Three discusses the different parts of the state: the senate and its role, the role of magistrates and their relationship to sovereign power, and the different degrees of authority among magistrates. Colleges, corporations and universities are also defined and considered. The origin, flourishing and decline of states, and the reasons that influence these changes are the subject of Book Four. Book Five begins with an exposition of the Theory of Climate: laws of the state and the form of government are to be adapted to the nature of each people. Bodin then discusses the climatic variations between the North and South, and how these variations affect the human temperament. The final book of the République opens with the question of cencus and censorship that is, the assessment of each individual’s belongings, and the advantages that can be derived from it. Chapters Two and Three discuss the state’s finances, and the problem of debasement of the coinage. Chapter Four is a comparison of the three forms of state; Bodin argues that royal, or hereditary, (as opposed to elective) monarchy is the best form of state. The Salic law, or law of succession to the throne, is discussed: Bodin holds that the rule of women is against divine, natural, and human law. The Salic law, together with a law forbidding alienation of the public domain, called Agrarian law in the Methodus (Bodin 1945, p. 253), is one of the two fundamental laws, or leges imperii (Fr. loix royales), which impose legal limitations upon the authority of the sovereign prince. Fundamental laws concern the state of the kingdom and are annexed to the crown, and  the sovereign prince therefore cannot detract from them.

The concluding chapter of the République is a discussion concerning the principle of justice in the government of the state. Geometric, arithmetic, and harmonic justice are explained, as well as their relation to the different forms of state. A strong Platonic influence may be detected in the final chapter of the work: a wise ruler establishes harmony within the commonwealth, just as God has established harmony in the universe he has created. Every individual has their proper place and purpose in the commonwealth.

a. Concept of Sovereignty

The République opens with the following definition of a commonwealth: “A Commonweale is a lawfull government of many families, and of that which unto them in common belongeth, with a puissant soveraigntie.” (Bodin 1962, 1) (Fr. “République est un droit gouvernement de plusieurs ménages, et de ce qui leur est commun, avec puissance souveraine.” (Bodin 1583, 1) Lat.“Respublica est familiarum rerumque inter ipsas communium summa potestate ac ratione moderata multitude.” (Bodin 1586, 1)) The meaning of sovereign power is further clarified in Chapter Eight of the first book:

Maiestie or Soveraigntie is the most high, absolute, and perpetuall power over the citisens and subiects in a Commonweale: which the Latins cal Maiestatem, the Greeks akra exousia, kurion arche, and kurion politeuma; the Italians Segnoria, and the Hebrewes tomech shévet, that is to say, The greatest power to command. (Bodin 1962, 84)

Having defined sovereignty, Bodin then defines the meaning of the terms “perpetual” and “absolute”. A person to whom sovereignty is given for a certain period of time, upon the expiration of which they once again become private citizens, cannot be called sovereign. When sovereign power is given to someone for a certain period of time, the person or persons receiving it are but the trustees and custodians of that power, and the sovereign power can be removed from them by the person or persons that are truly sovereign. Sovereignty, therefore, Bodin writes, “is not limited either in power, charge, or time certaine.” Absolute power is the power of overriding ordinary law, and it has no other condition than that which is commanded by the law of God and of nature:

But it behoveth him that is a soveraigne not to be in any sort subiect to the commaund of another … whose office it is to give laws unto his subiects, to abrogat laws unprofitable, and in their stead to establish other: which hee cannot do that is himselfe subiect unto laws, or to others which have commaund over him. And that is it for which the law saith, That the prince is acquitted from the power of the laws[.] (Bodin 1962, 91)

From this and similar passages Bodin derives the first prerogative of a sovereign prince of which he gives the following definition: “Let this be the first and chiefe marke of a soveraigne prince, to bee of power to give laws to all his subiects in generall and to everie one of them in particular … without consent of any other greater, equall, or lesser than himselfe” (Bodin 1962, 159). All other rights and prerogatives of sovereignty are included in the power of making and repealing laws, Bodin writes, and continues, “so that (to speak properly) a man may say, that there is but this only mark of soveraigne power considering that all other the rights thereof are contained in this”. The other prerogatives include declaring war and making peace, hearing appeals in the last instance, instituting and removing the highest officers, imposing taxes on subjects or exempting them, granting pardons and dispensations, determining the name, value, and measure of the coinage, and finally, requiring subjects to swear their loyalty to their sovereign prince.

Sovereignty and its defining marks or attributes are indivisible, and supreme power within the commonwealth must necessarily be concentrated on a single person or group of persons. Bodin argues that the first prerogative of a sovereign ruler is to give law to subjects without the consent of any other individual. It is from this definition that he derives the logical impossibility of dividing sovereignty, as well as the impossibility of the existence of a mixed state: if sovereignty, in other words, the power to give law, within the state were divided, for example,  between the prince, the nobility, and the people, there would exist in the commonwealth not one, but several agents that possess the power to give law. In such a case, Bodin argues, no one can be called a subject, since all have power to make law. Additionally, no one would be able to give laws to others, since law-givers would be forced to receive law from those upon whom they wish to impose laws. The state would, therefore, be popular or democratic. In the revised Latin edition of the République the outcome of divided sovereignty is described as a state of anarchy since no one would be willing to obey laws.

b. Definition of Law

Bodin writes that there is a great difference between law (Lat. lex; Fr. loi) and right (Lat. jus; Fr. droit). Law is the command of a sovereign prince, that makes use of his power, while right implies that which is equitable. A right connotes something with a normative content; law, on the other hand, has no moral content or normative implications. Bodin writes:

We must presuppose that this word Law, without any other addition, signifieth The right command of him or them, which have soveraigne power above others, without exception of person: be it that such commaundement concerne the subiects in generall, or in particular: except him or them which have given the law. Howbeit to speake more properly, A law is the command of a Soveraigne concerning all his subiects in generall: or els concerning generall things, as saith Festus Pompeius, as a privilege concerneth some one, or some few[.] (Bodin 1962, 156)

c. Limitations upon the Authority of the Sovereign Prince

Although the sovereign prince is not bound by civil law—neither by the laws of his predecessors, which have force only as long as their maker is alive, unless ratified by the new ruler, nor by his own laws—he is not free to do as he pleases, for all earthly princes have the obligation to follow the law of God and of nature. Absolute power is power to override ordinary law, but all earthly princes are subject to divine and natural laws, Bodin writes. To contravene the laws of God, “under the greatnesse of whome all monarches of the world ought to beare the yoke, and to bow their heads in all feare and reverence”, and nature mean treason and rebellion.

Contracts with Subjects and with Foreigners

Bodin mentions a few other things – besides the laws of God and of nature – that limit the sovereign prince’s authority. These include the prince’s contracts with his subjects and foreign princes, property rights of the citizens, and constitutional laws (leges imperii) of the realm. Regarding the difference between contracts and laws, Bodin writes that the sovereign prince is subject to the just and reasonable contracts that he has made, and in the observation of which his subjects have an interest, whilst laws obligate all subjects but not the prince. A contract between a sovereign prince and his subjects is mutually binding and it obligates both parties reciprocally. The prince, therefore, has no advantage over the subject on this matter. The prince must honor is contracts for three reasons: 1) Natural equity, which requires that agreements and promises be kept; 2) The prince’s honor and his good faith, since there is “no more detestable crime in a prince, than to bee false of his oath and promise”; and 3) The prince is the guarantor of the conventions and obligations that his subjects have with each other – it is therefore all the more important that the sovereign prince should render justice for his own act.

Fundamental Laws

Two fundamental laws (leges imperii) are discussed in the République. The first one is the Salic law, or the law of succession to the throne. The Salic law guarantees the continuity of the crown, and determines the legitimate successor (see Franklin 1973, Chapter 5). The other fundamental law is the law against alienation of the royal domain, which Bodin calls “Agrarian law” in the Methodus. As Franklin has observed, “The domain was supposed to have been set aside in order to provide a king with a source of annual income normally sufficient to defray the costs of government” (1973, 73). If the domain is alienated, this signifies lesser income to the crown, and possibly increased taxation upon the citizens. Fundamental laws are annexed and united to the crown, and therefore the sovereign ruler cannot infringe them. But should the prince decide to do so, his successor can always annul that which has been done in prejudice of the fundamental laws of the realm.

Inviolability of Private Property

Finally, Bodin derives from both natural law and the Old Testament that the sovereign prince may not take the private property of his subjects without their consent since this would mean violating the law of God and of nature. He writes: “Now then if a soveraigne prince may not remove the bounds which almightie God (of whom he is the living & breathing image) hath prefined unto the everlasting lawes of nature: neither may he take from another man that which is his, without iust cause” (Bodin 1962, 109; 110). The only exception to the rule, the just causes that Bodin refers to in this passage, concern situations where the very existence of the commonwealth is threatened. In such cases, public interest must be preferred over the private, and citizens must give up their private property in order to guarantee the safety and continuing existence of the commonwealth.

The preceding passage is one among many where the sovereign prince is described by Bodin as the “earthly image of God,” “God’s lieutenant for commanding other men,” or the person “to whom God has given power over us”. It is from this principle regarding the inviolability of private property that Bodin derives that new taxes may not be imposed upon citizens without their consent.

d. Difference between Form of State and Form of Government

Bodin holds that sovereignty cannot be divided – it must necessarily reside in one person or group of persons. Having shown that sovereignty is indivisible, Bodin moves on to refute the widely accepted political myth of the Renaissance that the Polybian model of a mixed state was the optimal form of state. Contrary to the opinions of Polybius, Aristotle, and Cicero, Bodin writes that there are only three types of state or commonwealth: monarchy, where sovereignty is vested with one person, aristocracy, where sovereignty is vested with a minority, and democracy, where sovereignty is vested in all of the people or a majority among them. Bodin’s denial of the possibility of dividing sovereignty directly results in the impossibility of a mixed state in the form that most Renaissance political theorists conceived it. It is with the help of historical and modern examples, most notably of Rome and Venice, that Bodin shows that the states that were generally believed to possess a mixed regime were not really so.

Even though Bodin refuses the idea that there be more than three types of commonwealth, he is willing to accept that there is a variety of governments – that is, different ways to govern the state. The way that the state is governed in no way alters its form nor its structure. Discussion concerning the difference between the form of state and government is found in Book Two. Bodin remarks that despite the importance of the question, no one before him has ever addressed it. All monarchies, aristocracies and popular states are either tyrannical, despotic, or legitimate (i.e. royal). These are not different species of commonwealth, Bodin observes, but diverse ways of governing the state. Tyrannical monarchy is one in which the sovereign ruler violates the laws of God, oppresses his subjects and treats their private property as his own. Tyrannical monarchy must not be confused with despotic monarchy, Bodin writes. Despotic, or lordly, monarchy “is that where the prince is become lord of the goods and persons of his subiects, by law of arms and lawfull warre; governing them as the master of a familie doth his slaves.” Bodin holds that there is nothing unfitting in a prince who has defeated his enemies in a just war, and who governs them under the laws of war and the law of nations. Finally, royal or legitimate monarchy is one in which the subjects obey the laws of the sovereign prince, and the prince in his turn obeys the laws of God and of nature; natural liberty and the right to private property are secured to all citizens.

Although most of Bodin’s examples concern monarchy, he writes that “The same difference is also found in the Aristocratique and popular estate: for both the one and the other may be lawful, lordly, and tirannicall, in such sort as I have said” (Bodin 1962, 200). Bodin qualifies as “absurd” and “treasonable” opinions according to which the constitution of France is a mixture of the three types of state—the Parlement representing aristocracy, the Estates General democracy, and the King representing monarchy.

e. The Question of Slavery

The question of slavery is addressed in Book One, Chapter Five of the République. Bodin is recognized today as one of the earliest advocates of the abolition of slavery. For him, slavery was a universal phenomenon in the sense that slaves exist in all parts of the world, and slavery was widely accepted by the droit des gens. Bodin writes that there are difficulties concerning slavery that have never been resolved. He wishes to answer the following question: “Is slavery natural and useful, or contrary to nature?”

Bodin opposes Aristotle’s opinion (Politics 1254a) according to which slavery is something natural – some people are born to govern and command, while it is the role of others to serve and obey. Bodin admits that “there is certain plausibility in the argument that slavery is natural and useful in the commonwealth.” After all, Bodin continues, the institution of slavery has existed in all commonwealths, and in all ages wise and good men have owned slaves. But if we are to consider the question according to commonly received opinions, thus allowing ourselves to be less concerned with philosophical arguments, we will soon understand that slavery is unnatural and contrary to human dignity.

Bodin’s opposition to slavery is manifold. First of all, he considers slavery in most cases to be unnatural, as the following passage attests: “I confesse that servitude is well agreeing unto nature, when a strong man, rich and ignorant, yeeldeth his obedience and service unto a wise, discreet and feeble poore man: but for wise men to serve fools, men of understanding to serve the ignorant, and the good to serve the bad; what can bee more contrarie unto nature?” (Bodin 1962, 34) Secondly, slavery is an affront to religion since the law of God forbids making any man a slave against their good will and consent. Thirdly, slavery is against human dignity, because of the countless indescribable humiliations that slaves have been forced to suffer. According to one interpretation, Bodin’s opposition to slavery must above all be understood within the context of his opinions concerning the commonwealth in that slavery poses a permanent threat to the stability of the state. Bodin relies on a historical narrative to prove that slavery is incompatible with a stable commonwealth (Herrel 1994, 56). Thus, in the following passage, he states:

Wherefore seeing it is proved by the examples of so many worlds of years, so many inconveniences of rebellions, servile warres, conspiracies eversions and changes to have happened unto Commonweals by slaves; so many murthers, cruelties, and detestable villanies to have bene committed upon the persons of slaves by their lords and masters: who can doubt to affirme it to be a thing most pernitious and daungerous to have brought them into a Commonweale; or having cast them off, to receive them againe? (Bodin 1962, 44)

4. Bodin’s Economic Thought

Bodin’s main economic ideas are expressed in two works: initially, in his Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit, first published in 1568, then in a revised second version, in 1578. The Response is an analysis of the reasons for the significant and continuous price rises that afflicted sixteenth century Europe. It is in this work that Bodin is said to have given one of the earliest formulations of the Quantity Theory of Money. In its most elementary form, the Quantity Theory of Money is the affirmation that money supply directly affects price levels. Chapter Two of the sixth book of the République is a lengthy discussion of the possible resources of the state. There is a partial overlap between the two works since Bodin included certain passages of the Response in his République, and then incorporated them again in a revised form into the second edition of the Response.

a. Quantitative Theory of Money

High inflation was rampant in sixteenth century Europe. It began in Spain, and soon spread to its neighboring states. This was mainly due to the increase in the quantity of precious metals, namely silver and gold, that were brought by boat to Europe from the Spanish colonies in the New World. In 1563, the Chambre des Comptes de Paris decided to investigate the reasons for inflation, and the results of the investigation were published in 1566 in a study entitled The Paradoxes of the Seigneur de Malestroit on the Matter of Money. The author of the study was a man called Jean Cherruies “Seigneur de Malestroit”, of whom we know only fairly little. It was these “paradoxes” that Jean Bodin sought to refute in his work.

Malestroit held that the price rises are simply changes in the unit of account that have been occasioned by debasement, and that prices of precious metals have remained constant for three hundred years.

Bodin refuted Malestroit’s analysis on two counts. First, he was able to show that Malestroit’s use of data was incorrect: Malestroit’s central claim to back up his thesis was the unchanging price of velvet since the fourteenth century. Bodin, however, cast doubt on the fact whether velvet was even known in France at such an early period. Secondly, Bodin was able to demonstrate that debasement alone did not explain the reasons for such major and significant price rises; while debasement was one of the factors that had occasioned such inflation, it was far from being the principal cause.

Bodin lists five major factors as contributory causes for such widespread inflation:  (1) The sudden abundance of precious metals, namely silver and gold, throughout Europe; (2) Monopolies; (3) Scarcity, caused by excessive export trade, quasi non-existing import trade, and waste; (4) Fashionable demand by rich people for certain luxury products; and, finally, (5) Debasement.

Of these five causes, Bodin considered the abundance of precious metals to be the most important.

b. The State’s Finances and the Question of Taxation and Property Rights

In Chapter Two of the final book of the République Bodin discusses the question of the commonwealth securing its finances. Seven possible sources of income are listed. These are: (1) Public domain; (2) Profits of conquests; (3) Gifts from friends; (4) Tributes from allies; (5) Profits of trading ventures; (6) Customs on exports and imports; and, finally, (7) Taxes on the subject. Bodin considers the public domain to be the most honest and the most reliable source of income for the commonwealth. He writes that throughout history sovereign princes and their citizens have taken it as a universal rule that the public domain should be holy, inviolable and inalienable. The inalienability of the public domain is of the utmost importance, Bodin writes, in order that “princes should not bee forced to overcharge their subiects with imposts, or to seeke any unlawfull meanes to forfeit their goods”. The seventh method of raising revenue on Bodin’s list is by levying taxes on the subject, but it may be used only when all other measures have failed and the preservation of the commonwealth demands it.

Bodin considers the inalienability of the public domain, together with the Salic law, to be one of the fundamental laws (Lat. leges imperii; Fr. loix royales) of the state. Like many of his contemporaries, Bodin held that the levying of new taxes without consent was a violation of the property rights of the individual, and, as such, contrary to the law of God and nature. He was particularly firm in opposing new taxation without proper consent and sought confirmation for his opinion in French and European history. One of the main differences between a legitimate ruler and an illegitimate one concerns the question of how each treats the private property of their subjects. Property rights are protected by the law of God and of nature, and therefore, violation of the private property of citizens is a violation of the law of God and of nature. A tyrant makes his subjects into his slaves, and treats their private property as if it were his own.

5. Writings Concerning Religion

The 16th and 17th centuries witnessed fierce internal conflict and power struggles at the heart of Christianity. The country most seriously ravaged by the combat between the Catholics and the Huguenots was France. Furthermore, a world of hugely diverse religious beliefs had been recently unveiled beyond the walls of Christendom, and the question of knowing which religion was the true religion (vera religio), or that which God wanted humanity to follow, needed to be addressed. Bodin’s main contributions concerning religion are Démonomanie, Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Universae naturae theatrum. Additionally, the République contains passages that discuss religion and the stability of the state.

a. Colloquium heptaplomeres and the Question of Religious Tolerance

Bodin’s Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime (Colloquium heptaplomeres de rerum sublimium arcanis abditis) is often described as one of the earliest works of comparative religion. It is believed to have been written sometime during the 1580s, although it was circulated in manuscript for nearly three centuries before it was published in its entirety in 1857. The Colloquium is a discussion between seven men of different religions or convictions that have gathered in the home of Coronaeus, a Catholic living in Venice, Italy. The participants are Salomon, a Jew, Octavius, a convert from Catholicism to Islam, Toralba, a natural philosopher, Senamus a skeptic, Fridericus, a Lutheran, and Curtius a Calvinist. The men engage in listening to music, reading, gastronomical delights, and discussions concerning religion.

The Colloquium begins with a story that is told by Octavius. A ship leaves the port of Alexandria as gentle winds blow, but an intensive tempest soon arises. The ship’s captain, terrified by the situation, is forced to drop the anchors, and urges everyone to pray to God. The crewmen, being from many different places and of various confessions, all pray for the one God that they have faith in. The storm calms down eventually and the ship is brought safely to port. When Octavius had finished his story, Coronaeus asked the following question: “Finally, with such a variety of religions represented [on the ship], whose prayers did God heed in bringing the ship safely to port?”

The matter of true religion is discussed in the final three books of the Colloquium heptaplomeres. True religion, Bodin holds, is tolerant of all religions, and accepts different ways to approach God. Leathers Kuntz has observed that “no religion is true whose point of view is not universal, whose expression is not free, whose center does not reflect the intimate harmony of God and nature” (Bodin 2008, xliii). The same opinion is expressed in the Démonomanie and in Bodin’s letter to one Jean Bautru des Matras, an advocate working in Paris. In the latter, Bodin writes that “different opinions concerning religion must not lead you astray, as long as you understand that true religion is nothing else than the turning of a purged soul toward true God”.

b. The Question of True Religion and Bodin’s Personal Faith

Leathers Kuntz has detected three stages in the development of Bodin’s religious thinking. She has argued that Bodin’s religious views became more liberal as he grew older (Bodin 2008, xliii-xliv). In 1559, when he wrote the Discours au Senate et au peuple de Toulouse, Bodin held that people should be brought up publicly in one religion. This he considered as an indispensable element in the cohesiveness of the state. Religious unity should be preserved, and religion should not be debated, since disputations damage religion and cast doubt upon it. When writing the République, Bodin’s main concern was the political stability of the French state. He considered religion to provide for the unity of the state, and as supporting the king’s power. Furthermore, religion strengthened the subjects’ obedience toward their sovereign prince and their respect for the execution of laws. Uniformity of worship must be enforced within the commonwealth when it is possible, but tolerance should become the norm when religious minorities become influential enough to no longer be repressed. The final and most liberal stage of Bodin’s religious opinions becomes most apparent in the Colloquium heptaplomeres, “in which his religious opinions seem to have developed into a kind of theism which leaves each man’s religion, provided he has some, to his own personal conscience” (ibid.).

It is impossible to say anything definitive concerning Bodin’s religious views. We may observe that Bodin’s faith seems less loyal to a particular established church than to a deep sense of honoring God. Bodin’s public religious opinions fluctuated throughout his life. As a consequence, he was accused of many things, including of being a Jew, a Calvinist, a heretical Catholic, and an atheist during his lifetime and after his death. Some scholars have even suggested that there are traces of Nicodemism, or religious dissimulation, in both his works and actions.

Scholars have debated for many years the question of knowing which of the opinions expressed in the Colloquium heptaplomeres should be regarded as Bodin’s personal beliefs. Considering that so many, often contradictory, opinions have been advanced, it may be wise to remark that perhaps “all the speakers represent Bodin’s thinking at one time or another. No one represents his thinking exclusively, but Bodin is sympathetic to some views of each as the dialogue develops. The point seems to be, however, that regardless of Bodin’s approval or disapproval of the religious views represented in the dialogue, he constantly stresses the need for toleration of all religions” (Bodin 2008, xliv). It has also been suggested that Bodin’s opinions and views regarding religious faith are so full of compromise that they ultimately amount to a sort of natural religion. Finally, it has been suggested that Bodin’s writings on the topic of religion “transcended the narrow bounds of confessional religion” (Bodin 1980, 1).

Although Bodin’s understanding of true religion as something profoundly personal, for which no church was required, made him an unorthodox believer in the eyes of many, it seems inconceivable that he should be considered an atheist (Bodin 2008, xxix). In fact, he considered atheism to be extremely dangerous to the commonwealth, as the following passage from the République (4, VII), discussing the difference between atheism and superstition, proves:

 And truely they (in mine opinion) offend much, which thinke that the same punishment is to be appointed for them that make many gods, and them that would have none at all: or that the infinitie of gods admitted, the almightie and everliving God is thereby taken away. For that superstition how great soever it be, doth yet hold men in feare and awe, both of the laws and of the magistrats; as also in mutuall duties and offices one of them towards another: whereas mere Atheisme doth utterly root out of mens minds all the feare of doing evill. (Bodin 1962, 539)

Bodin’s reasons for combating atheism in this passage concern the stability of the state: atheists must not be tolerated in the commonwealth since they hold neither moral nor ethical issues regarding breaking the laws of the state. But Bodin had another reason to detest atheism: atheists are blasphemous because they deny the existence of God.

6. On Witchcraft

Bodin’s De la démonomanie des sorciers (On the Demon-Mania of Witches) was first published in 1580 in French, and soon translated into Latin (1581), German (1581) and Italian (1587). Because of its wide distribution and numerous editions, historians have held it accountable for prosecutions of witches during the years that followed its publication. Many readers have been perplexed by the intolerant character of the Démonomanie. Bodin had a strong belief in the existence of angels and demons, and believed that they served as intermediaries between God and human beings; God intervenes directly in the world through the activity of angels and demons. Demonism, together with atheism and any attempt to manipulate demonic forces through witchcraft or natural magic, was treason against God and to be punished with extreme severity. The principal reason, therefore, to punish someone of witchcraft is “to appease the anger of God, especially if the crime is directly against the majesty of God, as this one is”.

Bodin was given the incentive to write the Démonomanie after he took part in the proceedings against a witch in April 1578. His objective in writing the Démonomanie was to “throw some light on the subject of witches, which seems marvelously strange to everyone and unbelievable to many.” Furthermore, the work was to serve as “a warning to all those who read it, in order to make it clearly known that there are no crimes which are nearly so vile as this one, or which deserve more serious penalties.” Finally, he wished to “respond to those who in printed books try to save witches by every means, so that it seems Satan has inspired them and drawn them to his line in order to publish these fine books” (Bodin 2001, 35-7). Among these “protectors of witches,” as Bodin qualified them, was a German Protestant by the name of Johann Weyer, who considered witches to be delusional and excessively melancholic, and recommended physical healing and religious instruction as a remedy to their condition, rather than corporal or capital punishment. Bodin feared that this might lead judges to consider witches as mentally ill, and, as a consequence, permit them to go without punishment.

The Démonomanie is divided into four books. Book One begins with a set of definitions. Bodin then discusses to what extent men may engage in the occult, and the differences between lawful and unlawful means to accomplish things. He also discusses the powers of witches and their practices: whether witches are able to transform men into beasts, induce or inspire in them illnesses, or perhaps even bring about their death. The final book is a discussion concerning ways to investigate and prosecute witches. Bodin’s severity and his rigorousness in condemning witches and witchcraft is largely based on the contents of the final book of the Démonomanie.

Bodin lists three necessary and indisputable proofs upon which a sentence can be based: (1) Truth of the acknowledged and concrete fact; (2) Testimony of several sound witnesses; and (3) Voluntary confession of the person who is charged and convicted of the crime. Certain other types of evidence, such as public reputation or forced confession, are not regarded by Bodin as indisputable proofs, but simply as “presumptions”, or circumstantial evidence, concerning the guilty nature of the person being charged. Presumptions may serve in the conviction and sentencing of witches in cases where clear proof is lacking.

There are fifteen “detestable crimes” that witches may be guilty of, and even the least of them, Bodin affirms, merits painful death. The death penalty, however, must only be sentenced by a competent judge and based on solid proof that eliminates all possibility of error. In cases where sufficient proof is wanting, where there are neither witnesses, nor confession, nor factual evidence, and where only mere presumptions, even strong ones, exist, Bodin is opposed to a death sentence: “I do not recommend that because of strong presumptions one pass sentence of death – but any other penalty except death…One must be very sure of the truth to impose the death sentence.” Bodin may have considered witchcraft an insult against God, and as such meriting the penalty of death, but he nevertheless believed in the rule of law, as in this other passage where he unequivocally states that “it is better to acquit the guilty than to condemn the innocent” (Bodin 2001, 209-210).

7. Natural Philosophy

The Universae naturae theatrum, which was published in the year of his death in 1596, may be considered as the most systematic exposition of Bodin’s vision of the world. It remains the least studied of his works and has never been translated into English. Bodin himself informs us that the Theatrum was written in 1590. The French translation of the work (Le Théâtre de la nature universelle) was published in 1597.

Ever since the beginning of his career Bodin sought to methodologically study all things, human and divine. He writes:

Of history, that is, the true narration of things, there are three kinds: human, natural, and divine. The first concerns man; the second, nature; the third, the Father of nature. /…/ So it shall come about that from thinking first about ourselves, then about our family, then about our society we are led to examine nature and finally to the true history of Immortal God, that is, to contemplation. (Bodin 1945, 15-16)

The Theatrum is the culmination point of Bodin’s systematic examination of things, and as such it is a deeply religious work. Bodin turns to the study of nature in order to better know God:

And indeed the Theater of Nature is nothing other than the contemplation of those things founded by the immortal God as if a certain tablet were placed under the eyes of every single one so that we may embrace and love the majesty of that very author, his goodness, wisdom, and remarkable care in the greatest matters, in moderate affairs, in matters of the least importance” (Bodin 2008, xxx)

Bodin believed that the French civil wars were occasioned, at least partly, by God’s dissatisfaction – God was punishing the French for their growing irreligious sentiment. The Theatrum has been described as an attack against those arrogant and ungodly philosophers, or naturalists, who wish to explain everything without reference to the creator and father of all things that is God. God is the author of all existing things, and the contemplation of nature brings us closer to Him. Furthermore, contemplating nature makes us love God for the care and goodness that he shows us.

The Theatrum has been written in a pseudo-dialogue form; it is a discussion between an informant, Mystagogus, and his questioner Theorus. The work opens with a short overview of the text, in which Bodin stresses the importance of order for the study of things. This gives him the opportunity to criticize Aristotle, who failed to discuss things in the right order; simpler things must be discussed before more complex ones, and therefore matters of physics should have been discussed after metaphysical things. Arranging all the material that is being considered in a convenient order – simplest notions to be studied first, and difficult ones later – is one of the distinctive characteristics of the Ramist framework of knowledge, as McRae has observed (McRae 1955, 8). McRae considers that, together with the Juris universi distributio, Bodin’s Theatrum “is perhaps the most thoroughly Ramist of any of his works.” Bodin’s two main objectives in the first book of the Theatrum are to prove that there is only one principle in nature, that is, God, and, that it is He who has created this world and He who governs it.

Other topics that Bodin discusses in Book One include matter, form and the causes of things. Furthermore, movement, generation, corruption and growth are considered, as well as things related to them: time and place, void, finitude and infinitude. In Book Two, Bodin examines elements, meteorites, rocks, metals and minerals. Book Three is a discussion on the subjects of the nature of plants and animals. The fourth book contains Bodin’s doctrine concerning soul; angels are also discussed in Book Four. The final book of the Theatrum discusses celestial bodies – their natural movement, the admirable harmony that exists between them, and the structure of the heavens. The final book attests of Bodin’s enmity toward Copernicus’ heliocentric system (Bodin 1596, 554 and especially 574-583); Bodin relies on the writings of Ptolemy, Aristotle, and the Holy Scripture in combating Copernicus. He dismisses Copernicus’ hypothesis concerning the heliocentric system on the grounds that it is “contrary to the evidence of the senses, to the authority of the Scriptures, and incompatible with Aristotelian physics.”

According to a recent interpretation by Blair, Bodin’s objective in writing the Theatrum was first and foremost to combat three impious propositions of ancient philosophy: (1) The eternity of the world; (2) The necessity of the laws of nature; and (3) The mortality of the soul.

Against the Eternity of the World

One solution to the conflict between Aristotelian philosophy of the eternity of the world and the Judeo-Christian account of creation—God has created the world, therefore it is not eternal, had been proposed by Thomas Aquinas. He argued that human reason alone cannot establish whether the world is eternal or not; the problem can be solved only by an appeal to faith and to biblical authority. Bodin’s argument differs from that of Aquinas. Bodin offers a rational demonstration based on “arguments for an all-powerful God, who knows no necessity and has complete free will”. Several scholars have observed that Bodin’s emphasis on divine free will is “characteristic of Christian nominalists like Duns Scotus and of Jewish philosophers like Maimonides” (Blair 1997, 118) The concluding syllogism for the “voluntary first cause” that is God is as follows: “Nothing can be eternal by nature whose first cause is voluntary; but the first cause of the world is voluntary; therefore the world cannot be eternal by nature, since its state and condition depend on the decision and free will of another.” (Blair 1997, 118)

Against Natural Necessity

The second conclusion is drawn from the unlimited freedom of God’s will: not only is it impossible that the world should be eternal, but furthermore it is arranged according to a divine plan. According to Bodin, providential divine governance is twofold: ordinary providence, where laws that govern nature under so-called normal circumstances are chosen by God, and extraordinary providence, where God is able to suspend those laws at will at any time he chooses, in order to intervene in the world (Blair 1997, 120). Bodin offers the following explanation for the existence of apparently useless or evil features of nature. He begins by claiming that everything in creation is good, and evil is simply the absence of good; this same idea is repeated in the Paradoxon. Then he attempts to illustrate, through various examples, that even things that are apparently evil in nature serve a “useful purpose in God’s good and wise plan” (Blair 1997, 122).

Immortality of the Soul

Bodin’s demonstration concerning the immortality of the soul is based on the soul’s intermediate nature: the soul is both corporeal and immortal. Blair defines this particular demonstration as “possibly Bodin’s most noteworthy innovation” and as a “significant departure from the standard or orthodox accounts [concerning the soul]” (Blair 1997, 137; 142). In combating the mortality of the soul, Blair writes, Bodin is reacting against all forms of impious philosophizing: against Averroes for denying the personal immortality of the soul; against Pomponazzi for claiming that philosophy shows the soul to be mortal; and against all those, like Pomponazzi or even Duns Scotus, who deny the rational demonstrability of this central doctrine. But Bodin calls his opponents only “Epicureans,” using the term to designate at first, generally, those who doubt the immortality of the soul, then more specifically those who, barely above the level of brutes, take pleasure and pain as the measure of good and evil and believe in the random distribution of atoms. (Blair 1997, 138)

Bodin’s first argument in favor of the immortality of the soul is based on empirical evidence concerning the ability of the soul to function independently of the body: during ecstatic experiences, as these have been conveyed by many learned men, it has been reported that the soul is able to hear, feel and understand while being temporarily transported outside the living body. Two further demonstrations follow. First, Bodin affirms that extremes are always joined by intermediates; passing from one extreme to another always necessitates passing through a ‘middle’ being and that there exists only two extremes in the world; (1) Form completely separated from matter, meaning angels and demons, and (2) Form entirely concrete, inseparable from matter, except by destruction, that is, natural bodies. Between these two extremes there must necessarily exist some intermediate which joins the two. This intermediate is form separable from matter, or, as Bodin states it, the soul. He concludes: “if therefore the human soul [mens] is separable from the dead body, it follows necessarily that it survives and carries out its actions without the operation of the senses” (Blair 1997, 139). Bodin’s final demonstration is as follows:

Given the extremes, of which one is totally corruptible (natural elements or bodies) and one is totally incorruptible (angels and demons), there must be an intermediate, which is corrupted in one part of itself, but free from corruption in the other; but this is nothing other than man, who participates in both natures: brute elements, plants, stones are far inferior to man in worth and dignity, and since man alone associates with angels and demons, he alone can link the celestial to the terrestrial, superior to inferior, immortal to mortal. (Blair 1997, 139)

Humans participate in both extremes and yet form an entity that is distinct from them. According to the standard view, the corporeal body is connected with the incorporeal soul, but Bodin’s demonstration is not built on this distinction because, for him, the soul is both immortal and corporeal. As Blair has observed, “for Bodin the human hypostasis mediates between form separated from matter (disembodied souls and angels) and form fully embedded in matter (as in all natural bodies), by virtue of its soul, which is corporeal, yet separable from the material body” (Blair 1997, 139-40). The following passage elucidates Bodin’s rather peculiar demonstration:

The body of the soul is not material, but spiritual – yet corporeal nonetheless: “from which it follows that human souls, angels and demons consist of the same corporeal nature, but not of bone, nor of flesh, but of an invisible essence. Like air, or fire, or both, or of a celestial essence, surpassing with its fineness the most subtle bodies: thus, even if we grant it is a spiritual body, it is a body nonetheless.” (Blair 1997, 140)

According to Blair, Bodin constructs a new type of natural philosophy that seeks to combine religion with philosophy, a combination of philosophical research concerning causes with a pious recognition of divine providence and the greatness of God.

Although Bodin often refers to Holy Scripture, he also constantly reminds us of the importance of reason and reasoning – so long as we do not infringe upon the limits of reason. Bodin uses physics to serve religious ends and the fundamental principle behind Bodin’s strategy is the Augustinian precept, later adopted by Aquinas in his synthesis of reason and faith, that truth is one and that there is, indeed, unity of knowledge: a necessary agreement between philosophy and religion exists, and therefore “natural philosophy as a reasoned investigation can never contradict true religion” (Blair 1997, 143).

8. Other Works

a. Juris universi distributio

The Juris universi distributio (Fr. Exposé du droit universel) was first published in 1578, but, as the Dedicatory Epistle of the Methodus informs us, it already existed in manuscript form twelve years earlier. Unlike later editions of the work that were published as books, the first edition of the Distributio was in the form of a poster, measuring approximately 40 by 180 cm, to be hung on the walls of universities.

Bodin’s objective in writing the Juris universi distributio was to arrive at a systematization of universal law. He sought to realize this by the study of history, paired with a comparative method which analyzes the different legal systems that either currently exist or have existed in the past. Bodin uses the same method in his main political works, (République and Methodus), in which comparative public law and its historical study permit Bodin to erect a theory of the state. Bodin is interested in “universal history”, of which his Methodus is an example, in the same way that he is interested in “universal law”, and it seems that the same type of historical and comparative method may be used in discovering them.

According to Bodin, law is divided into two categories: natural (ius naturale) and human (ius humanum). Bodin thus rejects the common threefold division based on the Digest – natural law, law of peoples and civil law –  because he considers dichotomy more convenient. The two principal divisions of human law are ius civile (civil law) and ius gentium (law of peoples). Bodin strongly criticizes law professors, or Romanists, for he writes that they have concentrated almost exclusively on ius civile – particularly the civil law of the Romans – and that, as a consequence, the ius gentium has not been properly studied, and, therefore, has no proper methodology. Bodin’s personal interest lies precisely in the ius gentium because it is concerned with the universal laws that are common to all peoples. The methods of the Romanists are inadequate for the study of ius gentium because the ius civile varies from state to state and no universally valid truths can be derived from it; in this sense it is not even part of legal science. A new critical method is therefore required; a method that is both historical and comparative.

Bodin’s system of universal law is a drastic rupture with the exegetical methods of the Middle Ages. Medieval jurists applied Roman law to their own societies and saw no problem in doing so. It is with the arrival of the so-called humanist scholars, in the sixteenth century, and their use of the methods of classical philology, that the internal coherence and authority of the Corpus juris civilis were challenged.

b. Moral Philosophy

Bodin’s Paradoxon quod nec virtus ulla in mediocritate nec summum hominis bonum in virtutis actione consistere possit (Fr. Paradoxe de Jean Bodin qu’il n’y a pas de vertu en médiocrité ni au milieu de deux vices) was first published in Latin in 1596, although Bodin had completed the text in 1591. Two French translations were later published. Bodin’s own translation dates from 1596, but it remained unpublished until 1598. Bodin’s translation may be considered as a revised version of the Latin text, rather than its simple translation. The Latin edition includes a preface that does not exist in the French version.

The Paradoxon has been written in dialogue form, and is a discussion between a father and a son. During the course of the dialogue, the son repeatedly refers to the authority of Aristotle. His opinions are often refuted by the father, who refers to the writings of Plato and to the Holy Scripture. The term “paradox” in the title refers to the fact that Bodin acknowledges his views to be in contradiction with the moral opinions that were generally accepted in his day – especially concerning the Aristotelian doctrine of the mean.

The work opens with a discussion concerning the question of good and evil and that of divine justice. This is followed by an outline of the basic structure of Bodin’s moral philosophy: God is the sovereign good, or, “that which is the most useful and the most necessary to every imaginable creature”. He is also the source of all other things that are good. Evil is defined as the privation of good – a definition that Bodin traces to St. Augustine. The same definition is found in the Theatrum, where it is used to support the argument that everything in Creation is good – God has not created anything evil (Blair 1997, 122). The good of man and a contented life are discussed, followed by a discussion concerning particular virtues and vices, as well as their origins. Bodin refutes Aristotle’s doctrine of the mean. Discussion concerning moral and intellectual virtues follows. Bodin then examines prudence; he then claims that prudence alone helps us choose between good and evil. The final section discusses wisdom and the love of God. The father affirms that wisdom is found in the fear of offending God. Fear of God is inseparable from love of God – together they form the basis of wisdom.

c. Writings on Education

Bodin wrote or compiled four works where he discusses the education of children: The Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on the Education of Youth in the Commonwealth, Epître à son neveu, Sapientia moralis epitome, and Consilium de institutione principis aut alius nobilioris ingenii. The earliest of them, the Oratio, is a discourse that was given in Toulouse in 1559, and published the same year. The three other works date from a later period; the Epître is a letter written to Bodin’s nephew, dated November 1586, and the Epitome was first published in 1588. Evidence within the Consilia suggests that it was written sometime between 1574 and 1586, although it remained unpublished until 1602.

Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on the Education of Youth in the Commonwealth

Bodin’s Oratio de instituenda in repub. juventute ad senatum populumque tolosatem (Fr. Le discours au sénat et au peuple de Toulouse sur l’éducation à donner aux jeunes gens dans la république) is the most valuable single document that informs us of Bodin’s stay in Toulouse in the 1550’s. Furthermore, it is Bodin’s earliest surviving work on education and contains a detailed portrayal of the humanist ideal that Bodin embraced during this period.

Nothing is more salutary to a city than to have those who shall one day rule the nation be educated according to virtue and science. It is only by providing youth with proper education and intellectual and moral culture that the glory of France, and that of its cities could be preserved. Art and science are the auxiliaries of virtue, and one cannot conceive of living – much less leading a happy life – without them. Bodin urges the people of Toulouse to participate in the movement of the Renaissance. The town is well-known for its faculty of law, and he argues that the study of humanities and belles-lettres should also be appended to the study of law.

In Bodin’s time, the children of Toulouse were either given a public education – in which case they were most often sent to Paris – or taught privately, in domicile. While both systems have their inconveniences, Bodin considers that public schooling must be favored. In order to prevent children from being sent to Paris to be educated, however, a collège must be built in Toulouse and the children of Toulouse should be educated in their own hometown. Bodin proposes that all children – including gifted children belonging to the poorest classes – be sent to public schools where they shall be taught according to the official method.

Epître de Jean Bodin touchant l’institution de ses enfants à son neveu

This short work is Bodin’s response in the form of a letter dated November 9, 1586, to his nephew’s enquiry concerning the education of children. Bodin’s nephew had welcomed a newborn son to his family, and had turned to Bodin for advice on how to give him a proper education. Bodin’s advice came in the form of a description of how he taught his own children when they were three and four years old.

Bodin began by teaching his children the Latin names of things. Having observed that they have a good memory and necessary mental capacities, Bodin asked them to repeat more abstract words, and began informing them about such things as how old the world is (5,534 years), how many planets there are, and the names of these planets. He taught them the names of body parts, what senses we have, the virtues and vices, and so forth. Knowledge of different things was acquired by a continuous daily exercise. Soon after, Bodin had his children interrogate each other, thus allowing himself to retire from this task. The study of Latin grammar soon followed, as well as the study of moral sentences in both French and Latin. The children would then begin the study of arithmetic and geometry. This was followed by the translation of Cicero’s writings from Latin to French.

Sapientia moralis epitome 

The Sapientia moralis epitome was published in Paris in 1588. It consists of 210 moral maxims that have been arranged into groups of seven sentences. Each group is a discussion upon a common topic: youth and education, nature, truth and opinion, virtue, war, liberty, marriage, etc. The majority of the maxims are Bodin’s own formulations of ideas expressed by Ovid, Horace, Juvenale and Lucretius.

Consilium de institutione principis

Bodin’s Consilium de institutione principis was first published in 1602 as part of a compilation entitled Consilia Iohannis Bodini Galli et Fausti Longiani Itali de principe recte instituendo. Although the determination of a precise date seems impossible, evidence within the work suggests that Bodin composed it sometime between 1574 and 1586.

The Consilium is a collection of precepts for the young princes of the Saxon court. The content of the Consilium is in many ways identical to the views that were expressed in the Epître, although the Consilium is more detailed. Young princes are to be taught in small groups, and their eating and sleeping habits are to be observed, so that they remain alert and in good health.

Bodin particularly recommends the study of two texts: Peter Ramus’ Dialectica, and Pibrac du Faur’s Quatrains. The education of the princes is to be completed by the study of law and the art of government. Knowledge of practical matters should be acquired by studying “the state of the republica and its offices and the laws, customs and natures of various peoples.” Knowledge in practical matters is necessary in order to acquire prudence. According to Bodin, only a prudent prince is worthy of his people (Rose 1980, 57-58).

d. Bodin’s Surviving Correspondence

Several letters from Bodin’s personal correspondence have survived to the present day; (for the complete list, see Couzinet 2001, 32-36). Chauviré published a series of letters as an Appendix to his Jean Bodin, auteur de la République. The most important among them are Bodin’s letter, written in Latin, to one Jean Bautru des Matras, as well as Bodin’s account from January 1583, addressed to his brother-in-law, regarding the events that took place in Antwerp when the Duke of Alençon was trying to help the Low Countries in their efforts to drive out the Spanish.

Later, Moreau-Reibel made a discovery in France’s Bibliothèque Nationale, recueil manuscrit 4897 of the library’s fonds français, and published a series of five letters that had been brought together by a certain Philippe Hardouyn. These letters were written between 1589-93. Together they complete our understanding of the possible reasons that made Bodin a ligueur. A sixth letter from this same period is Bodin’s notorious letter of 20 January 1590, in which he explains the reasons that made him a supporter of the Catholic League. A couple of letters from the correspondence between Bodin and Walsingham, dating from 1582, have also survived.

9. Influence

As the work’s numerous editions and translations attest, Bodin’s République was widely read in Europe after its publication, up until the mid-seventeenth century. It was subsequently forgotten, however, and Bodin’s influence during the eighteenth century was only marginal. It was not until the twentieth century that his works, slowly, but decisively, began to interest scholars again. Growing interest in his works has assured Bodin the place he deserves among the most important political thinkers of the sixteenth century. New translations and modern editions of his works have made his ideas accessible to wider audiences.

Among Bodin’s best-known ideas is the Theory of Climate that is currently most often associated with another French philosopher, Montesquieu (1689-1755). Bodin’s comparative and empirical approach in the fields of historical methodology, jurisprudence, and religion represented a break with medieval traditions. He was among the most influential legal philosophers of his time, and his Colloquium heptaplomeres is one of the earliest works of comparative religious studies. Bodin’s ideas concerning religious tolerance and the abolition of slavery found an echo among European writers of both the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries. Although the Colloquium heptaplomeres remained unpublished until the 1840s, scholars were familiar with its ideas due to manuscript copies that circulated in Europe. The numerous editions of his Démonomanie, on the other hand, testify to an interest previously demonstrated toward his ideas regarding witchcraft. Finally, Bodin’s Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit includes one of the earliest formulations of the Quantity Theory of Money.

In political theory, Bodin’s most influential contribution remains his Theory of Sovereignty, and the conceptualization of sovereign power. A majority of scholars have labeled Bodin as an absolutist. For others, he favored a type of constitutionalism. Still others have observed that he shifted from the perceived constitutionalism of his early writings toward a more absolutist theory in the République. His writings were received in various ways in different parts of Europe, and interpretations regarding them were often contradictory – depending on the country. His Theory of Sovereignty was used by royalists and parliamentarians alike to defend their widely differing opinions. In France, for example, his political theory was largely absorbed into the absolutist movement and the doctrine of the divine right of kings that became highly influential soon after Bodin’s death; one needs only to think of Cardinal Richelieu and Louis XIV. For example, Jacques-Bénigne Bossuet (1627-1704), who was tutor to the oldest son of Louis XIV, argued in favor of an absolute hereditary monarchy from Scriptural sources in his Politics Drawn from the Very Words of Holy Scripture (Politique tirée des propres paroles de l’Écriture sainte). Other French writers who incorporated absolutist elements from Bodin’s theory in their own writings are Pierre Grégoire de Toulouse (c. 1540-1597), Charles Loyseau (1566-1627), and Cardin Le Bret (1558-1655).

The term “monarchomachs” (Fr., monarchomaques) denotes the writers – Protestants or Catholics – who opposed the powers of the monarch. The term was first coined by the Scottish jurist and royalist William Barclay (1546-1608) in his De Regno et Regali Potestate (1600). Similar to what Bodin had done in his République, Barclay defended the rights of kings. Giovanni Botero (1544-1617) was one of the earliest writers to have used the expression “reason of state” (Fr., Raison d’état) in his work Della ragion di Stato (1589). Bodin’s political writings may have been one of the sources used by Botero and his followers.

In Germany, Johannes Althusius (1557-1638) adopted Bodin’s theory of sovereignty in his Politica methodice digesta (1603), but argued that the community is always sovereign. In this sense, every commonwealth – no matter what its form may be – is popular. Dutch jurist Hugo Grotius published his renowned De jure belli ac pacis in 1625; Grotius does not conceal his admiration for Bodin, nor for the method used by French writers that consisted of combining the study of history with the study of law.

Bodin’s République was among the works that introduced the idea of legislative sovereignty in England. His considerable influence upon Elizabethan and Jacobean political thought in England, one scholar has observed, was largely due to his precise definition of sovereignty. Among the political writers who defended the powers of the king, Sir Robert Filmer (c. 1588-1653) drew heavily upon Bodin’s writings. One shorter text, in particular, The Necessity of the Absolute Power of all Kings and in particular of the King of England,  published in 1648, is hardly anything more than a collection of ideas expressed in the République. John Locke’s First Treatise of Government (1689) may, therefore, be considered not only a refutation of Filmer’s political ideas, but also a critical commentary upon Bodin’s political theory. Thomas Hobbes, in his The Elements of Law (1640), cites Bodin by name and approves Bodin’s opinion according to which sovereign power in the commonwealth may not be divided (II.8.7. “Of the Causes of Rebellion”). This principle of indivisible sovereign power is also expressed in Hobbes’ later political works De cive (1642) and Leviathan (1651).

10. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • Oppiani De venatione (1555)
  • Oratio de instituenda iuventute… (1559)
  • Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem (1566)
  • La réponse aux paradoxes de Malestroit (1568)
  • La harangue de Messire Charles des Cars (1573)
  • Les Six Livres de la République (1576; all references in this article are to the edition of 1583)
  • Apologie de Réne Herpin pour la République (before 1581)
  • Recueil de tout ce qui s’est négocié en la compagnie du tiers état… (1577)
  • Juris universi distributio (1578)
  • De la démonomanie des sorciers (1580)
  • De republica libri sex (1586)
  • Sapientiae moralis epitome (1588)
  • Paradoxon (1596)
  • Universae naturae theatrum (1596)
  • Consilia de principe recte instituendo (1602)
  • Colloquium heptaplomeres (1841)
  • Epître de Jean Bodin touchant l’institution de ses Enfans de 1586 (1841)

i. Modern Editions of Bodin’s works

1. Collected Works
  • Bodin, Jean. Oeuvres philosophiques de Jean Bodin. Ed. Pierre Mesnard. Trans. Pierre Mesnard.  Paris: PUF, 1951.
    • Includes the following Latin works, together with their French translations: Oratio de instituenda in repub. juventute ad senatum populumque tolosatemJuris universi distributio, and Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem.
  • Bodin, Jean. Selected Writings on Philosophy, Religion and Politics. Ed. Paul L. Rose. Genève: Droz, 1980.
    • Includes the following seven works: Bodin’s letter to his nephew (1586), Consilium de institutione principis (1574-86), Sapientia moralis epitome (1588), Latin dedicatory letter to the Paradoxon quod nec virtus ulla in mediocritate nec summum hominis bonum in virtutis actione consistere possit (1596) and the French translation of the text, Le Paradoxe de Jean Bodin Angevin (1598), Bodin’s letter to Jean Bautru des Matras (1560s), as well as a letter to a friend in which he gives reasons for supporting the Catholic League (1590).
2. Individual Works
  • Bodin, Jean. Method for the Easy Comprehension of History. Trans. Beatrice Reynolds. New York: Columbia University Press, 1945.
    • Includes an introduction by Reynolds.
  • Bodin, Jean. Six Books of the Commonwealth. Abr. ed. Trans. Marian J. Tooley. Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1955.
    • An abridgment of Bodin’s major work, together with an introduction.
  • Bodin, Jean. The Six Bookes of a Commonweal. Trans. Richard Knolles. Ed. Kenneth Douglas McRae. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1962.
    • This is the only existing full English translation of the work; facsimile reprint of Knolles’ English translation of 1606 that compares the French and Latin versions of the text. McRae’s introductory material discusses Bodin’s life, his career and his influence.
  • Bodin, Jean. Address to the Senate and People of Toulouse on Education of Youth in the Commonwealth. Trans. George Albert Moore. Chevy Chase, Md: Country Dollar Press, 1965.
    • Moore’s translation of an important and interesting early text by Bodin.
  • Bodin, Jean. Colloquium of the Seven about Secrets of the Sublime. Trans. Marion Leathers Kuntz. Princeton, N. J.: Princeton University Press, 1975. Second edition. University Park, PA: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2008.
    • First complete modern translation of the work, together with highly informative introductory material.
  • Bodin, Jean. On Sovereignty. Trans. Julian H. Franklin. Ed. Julian H. Franklin. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.
    • Contains chapters 8 and 10 of the First book, and chapters 1 and 5 of the Second book of the République. Concentrates on Bodin’s analysis of sovereignty. Franklin’s textual notes are informative.
  • Bodin, Jean. Response to the Paradoxes of Malestroit. Trans. Henry Tudor. Eds. Henry Tudor and R. W. Dyson. Bristol: Thoemmes Continuum, 1997.
    • Most recent English translation of the text, it is based on the first edition of the work, but also included are the major changes that occurred between the first (1568) and second (1578) editions. Includes a concise and useful introduction.
  • Bodin, Jean. On the Demon-Mania of Witches. Abr. ed. Trans. Randy A. Scott and Jonathan L. Pearl. Toronto: Centre for Reformation and Renaissance Studies, 2001.
    • Abridged translation of Bodin’s Démonomanie that contains about two-thirds of the original text and informative notes.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Blair, Ann. The Theater of Nature. Jean Bodin and Renaissance Science. Princeton, N. J.: Princeton University Press, 1997.
    • Indispensable study concerning the methods and practices of Renaissance science in the light of Bodin’s Theatrum.
  • Brown, John L. The Methodus ad facilem historiarum cognitionem of Jean Bodin. Washington, D.C.: Catholic University of America Press, 1939. Reprint. New York: AMS Press, 1969.
    • Central study that analyses the background and influence of Bodin’s Methodus. Brown establishes that Bodin’s earlier work contains many of the political and legal principles that were further developed in the République.
  • Franklin, Julian H. Jean Bodin and the Rise of Absolutist Theory. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1973.
    • An influential study on the topic of the formation of Bodin’s absolutist view, as it is expressed in the République.
  • Heller, Henry. “Bodin on Slavery and Primitive Accumulation.” The Sixteenth Century Journal 25.1 (1994): 53-65.
    • Argues that Bodin conceived of slavery not only as something irrational and unnatural, but as a permanent threat to the stability of the state.
  • McRae, Kenneth D. “Ramist Tendencies in the Thought of Jean Bodin.” Journal of the History of Ideas 16.3 (1955): 306-323.
    • Argues that several of Bodin’s writings reveal the influence of Ramist concepts; even the République (in which the Ramist influence is less evident) can be described as Ramist in its structure.
  • O’Brien, Denis P. “Bodin’s Analysis of Inflation.” History of Political Economy 32.2 (2000): 267-292.
    • A longer version of the introduction that O’Brien wrote to the 1997 edition of Bodin’s Response. Argues that Bodin should be regarded as the pioneer formulator of the quantity theory of money.
  • Pearl, Jonathan L. “Humanism and Satanism: Jean Bodin’s Contribution to the Witchcraft Crisis.” Canadian Review of Sociology and Anthropology 19.4 (1982): 541-548.
    • On Bodin’s influence on the “witchcraft crisis”. Pearl reminds us that the Renaissance witnessed, not only a revival of the arts and the birth of modern science, but also the re-appearance of the occult: magic, astrology and witchcraft.
  • Remer, Gary. “Dialogues of Toleration: Erasmus and Bodin.” Review of Politics 56.2 (1994): 305-336.
    • Examines two different types of dialogues of toleration; Erasmus’ common truth and Bodin’s subjective. Erasmus’ traditional conception aims at the discovery of truth in religious questions; Bodin’s conception, on the contrary, does not presuppose that a common truth may be discovered, since every opinion is one part of the truth.
  • Rose, Paul Lawrence. Bodin and the Great God of Nature. The Moral and Religious Universe of a Judaiser. Genève: Droz, 1980.
    • A valuable study concerning Bodin’s ideas on religion and ethics; many of Bodin’s less-known works are considered. Rose argues that Bodin went through three religious conversions in his lifetime.
  • Salmon, John Hearsey McMillan. “The Legacy of Jean Bodin: Absolutism, Populism or Constitutionalism?” The History of Political Thought 17. Thorverton (1996): 500-522.
    • Discusses the ways in which Bodin’s ideas were understood and transformed in France’s neighboring countries during the seventeenth century.
  • Tooley, Marian J. “Bodin and the Mediaeval Theory of Climate.” Speculum 28.1 (1953): 64-83.
    • A scholarly investigation of Bodin’s medieval predecessors regarding the theory of climates. Argues that contrary to his predecessors, Bodin was more interested in the practical implications of the things he observed.
  • Ulph, Owen. “Jean Bodin and the Estates-General of 1576.” Journal of Modern History 19.4 (1947): 289-296.
    • Examines Bodin’s role, as deputy from the bailiwick of Vermandois, during the estates-general at Blois in 1576.
  • Wolfe, Martin. “Jean Bodin on Taxes: The Sovereignty-Taxes Paradox.” Political Science Quarterly 83.2 (1968): 268-284.
    • Argues that Bodin’s main objective in writing about taxes was to push for reform in France’s fiscal system.

i. Bibliography

  • Couzinet, Marie-Dominique, ed. Jean Bodin. Roma: Memini, 2001.
    • Indispensable for conducting serious research on Bodin. Contains references to over 1,500 articles, books and other documents.

ii. Conference proceedings and Article Collections

  • Denzer, Horst, ed. Jean Bodin – Proceedings of the International Conference on Bodin in Munich. München: C.H. Beck, 1973.
    • Fine collection of twenty-four articles (in English, French and German) by the foremost Bodin scholars. Part II contains discussions, and part III an exhaustive bibliography on Bodin from the year 1800 onwards.
  • Franklin, Julian H., ed. Jean Bodin. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2006.
    • Collection of twenty previously published articles or book chapters (in English).


Author Information

Tommi Lindfors
University of Helsinki