Joseph Butler (1692—1752)

butlerBishop Joseph Butler is a well-known religious philosopher of the eighteenth century. He is still read and discussed among contemporary philosophers, especially for arguments against some major figures in the history of philosophy, such as Thomas Hobbes and John Locke. In his Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel (1729), Butler argues against Hobbes’s egoism, and in the Analogy of Religion (1736), he argues against Locke’s memory-based theory of personal identity.

Overall, Butler’s philosophy is largely defensive. His general strategy is to accept the received systems of morality and religion and, then, defend them against those who think that such systems can be refuted or disregarded. Butler ultimately attempts to naturalize morality and religion, though not in an overly reductive way, by showing that they are essential components of nature and common life. He argues that nature is a moral system to which humans are adapted via conscience. Thus, in denying morality, Butler takes his opponents to be denying our very nature, which is untenable. Given this conception of nature as a moral system and certain proofs of God’s existence, Butler is then in a position to defend religion by addressing objections to it, such as the problem of evil.

This article provides an overview of Butler’s life, works, and influence with special attention paid to his writings on religion and ethics. The totality of his work addresses the questions: Why be moral? Why be religious? Which morality? Which religion? In attempting to answer such questions, Butler develops a philosophy that possesses a unity often neglected by those who read him selectively. The philosophy that develops is one according to which religion and morality are grounded in the natural world order.

Table of Contents

  1. Life
  2. Human Nature as Made for Virtue
  3. Human Life as in the Presence of God
  4. This Life as a Prelude to a Future Life
  5. The World as a Moral Order
  6. The Christian Scriptures as a Revelation
  7. Public Institutions as Moral Agents
  8. Butler’s Influence
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Works by Butler
    2. Secondary Literature

1. Life

Joseph Butler was born into a Presbyterian family at Wantage. He attended a dissenting academy, but then converted to the Church of England intent on an ecclesiastical career. Butler expressed distaste for Oxford’s intellectual conventions while a student at Oriel College; he preferred the newer styles of thought, especially those of John Locke, the 3rd Earl of Shaftesbury and Francis Hutcheson, leading David Hume to characterize Butler as one of those “who have begun to put the science of man on a new footing, and have engaged the attention, and excited the curiosity of the public.” Butler benefited from the support of Samuel Clarke and the Talbot family.

In 1719, Butler was appointed to his first job, preacher to the Rolls Chapel in Chancery Lane, London. Butler’s anonymous letters to Clarke had been published in 1716, but a selection of his Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel (1729) was the first work published under his name. The Rolls sermons are still widely read and have held the attention of secular philosophers more than any other sermons in history. Butler moved north and became rector of Stanhope in 1725. Only at this point is his life documented in any detail, and his tenure is remembered mainly for the Analogy of Religion (1736). Soon after publication of that work, Butler became Bishop of Bristol. Queen Caroline had died urging his preferment, but Bristol was one of the poorest sees, and Butler expressed some displeasure in accepting it. Once Butler became dean of St. Paul’s in 1740, he was able to use that income to support his work in Bristol. In 1750, not long before his death, Butler was elevated to Durham, one of the richest bishoprics. The tradition that Butler declined the See of Canterbury was conclusively discredited by Norman Sykes (1936), but continues to be repeated uncritically in many reference works. Butler’s famous encounter with John Wesley has only recently been reconstructed in as full detail as seems possible given the state of the surviving evidence, and we are now left with little hope of ever knowing what their actual relationship was. They disagreed, certainly, on Wesley’s right to preach without a license, and on this point Butler seems entirely in the right; but Butler may have supported Wesley more than he opposed him, and Wesley seems entirely sincere in his praise of the Analogy.

Butler has become an icon of a highly intellectualized, even rarefied, theology, “wafted in a cloud of metaphysics,” as Horace Walpole said. Ironically, Butler refused as a matter of principle to write speculative works or to pursue curiosity. All his writings were directly related to the performance of his duties at the time or to career advancement. From the Rolls sermons on, all his works are devoted to pastoral philosophy.

A pastoral philosopher gives philosophically persuasive arguments for seeing life in a particular way when such a seeing-as may have a decisive effect on practice. Butler had little interest in, and only occasionally practiced, natural theology in the scholastic sense; his intent is rather defensive: to answer those who claim that morals and religion, as conventionally understood, may be safely disregarded. Butler tried to show, as a refutation of the practice of his day (as he perceived it), that morals and religion are natural extensions of the common way of life usually taken for granted, and thus that those who would dispense with them bear a burden of proof they are unable to discharge. In arguing that morals and religion are favored by a presumption already acknowledged in ordinary life, Butler employs many types of appeal, at least some of which would be fallacious if used in an attempted demonstrative argument.

2. Human Nature as Made for Virtue

Butler’s argument for morality, found primarily in his sermons, is an attempt to show that morality is a matter of following human nature. To develop this argument, he introduces the notions of nature and of a system. There are, he says, various parts to human nature, and they are arranged hierarchically. The fact that human nature is hierarchically ordered is not what makes us manifestly adapted to virtue, rather, it is what Butler calls “conscience” that is at the top of this hierarchy. Butler does sometimes refer to the conscience as the voice of God; but, contrary to what is sometimes alleged, he never relies on divine authority in asserting the supremacy, the universality or the reliability of conscience. Butler clearly believes in the autonomy of the conscience as a secular organ of knowledge.

Whether the conscience judges principles, actions or persons is not clear, perhaps deliberately since such distinctions are of no practical significance. What Butler is concerned to show is that to dismiss morality is in effect to dismiss our own nature, and therefore absurd. As to which morality we are to follow, Butler seems to have in mind the common core of civilized standards. He stresses the degree of agreement and reliability of conscience without denying some differences remain. All that is required for his argument to go through is that the opponent accept in practice that conscience is the supreme authority in human nature and that we ought not to disregard our own nature.

The most significant recent challenge to Butler’s moral theory is by Nicholas Sturgeon (1976), a reply to which appears in Stephen Darwall (1995).

Besides the appeal to the rank of conscience, Butler offered many other observations in his attempt to show that we are made for (that is, especially suited to) virtue. In a famous attack on the egoistic philosophy of Thomas Hobbes, he argues that benevolence is as much a part of human nature as self-love. Butler also argues that various other aspects of human nature are adapted to virtue, sometimes in surprising ways. For example, he argues that resentment is needed to balance benevolence. He also deals forthrightly with self-deception.

Only three of the fifteen sermons deal with explicitly religious themes: the sermons on the love of God and the sermon on ignorance.

3. Human Life as in the Presence of God

Butler’s views on our knowledge of God are among the most frequently misstated aspects of his philosophy. Lewis White Beck’s exposition (1937) of this neglected aspect of Butler’s philosophy has itself been generally neglected, and both friends and foes frequently assert that Butler “assumed” that God exists. Butler never assumes the existence of God; rather, at least after his exchange with Clarke, he takes it as granted that God’s existence can be and has been proved to the satisfaction of those who were party to the discussion in his time. The charge, frequently repeated since the mid-nineteenth century, that Butler’s position is reversible once an opponent refuses to grant God’s existence, is therefore groundless. It is true that Butler does not expound any proof of God’s existence. (Notice that this fact makes it problematic to identify him with the character Cleanthes in Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion.) However, he does endorse many such proofs, using common names rather than citing specific texts.

The sermons on the love of God are rarely read today, but they provide abundant evidence that Butler’s God is not some remote deity who created the world and then lost interest in it. On the contrary, the difference that God makes to us is the difference that a lively sense of God’s presence makes.

4. This Life as a Prelude to a Future Life

Butler considered the expectation of a future life to be the foundation of all our hopes and fears. He does not state exactly why this is so, and most commentators have concluded that he is referring to hopes and fears regarding what will happen to us as individuals when we die. Such an intention would be contrary to Butler’s general line of thought. More consonant with what Butler does say is the Platonic point that one cannot truly benefit by acting viciously and then escaping punishment. Since that is what appears to happen in this world, appearances must be denied. Secondly, and here Butler would agree with Hume, in this world there is an appearance that the superintendence of the universe is not entirely just. Thus, there are three logical options: (1) the universe is ultimately unjust, (2) contrary to appearances, this world is somehow just, or (3) the universe is just, but only when viewed more broadly than we are able to see now. Given these options, Butler thinks there are good practical reasons for accepting the third in practice.

The first chapter of the Analogy is devoted to the argument that what little we know of the nature of death is insufficient to warrant an assurance that death is the end of us. And when we lack sufficient warrant for acting on the presumption of a change, we must act on the presumption of continuance. The recurrent objection, offered by such otherwise sympathetic readers as Richard Swinburne, is that in the physical destruction of the body, we do have sufficient warrant. Roderick Chisholm (1986) has proposed a counter to this criticism.

Butler appends to his discussion of a future life a brief essay on personal identity, and this is the only part of the Analogy widely read today. That it is read independently is perhaps just as well since it is difficult to see how it is related to the general argument. Butler says he needs to answer objections to personal identity continuing after death, which he certainly must do. But the view he proposes to refute is Locke’s, and Locke seemed not to see that his theory of personal identity presented a problem for expectation of a future life. Locke’s theory was that memory is constitutive of personal identity. Even if Butler is right in his objection to Locke’s theory, he certainly needs personal memories to be retained since they are presupposed by his theory of rewards and punishments after death.

5. The World as a Moral Order

Butler’s work is directed mainly against skeptics (and those inclined toward skepticism) and as an aid for those who propose to argue with skeptics. The general motivation for his work is to overcome intellectual embarrassment at accepting the received systems of morals and religion. To succeed, Butler must present a case that is plausible if not fully probative, and he must do so without resorting to an overly reductive account of morals and religion. Butler’s strategy is to naturalize morals and religion. Although generally scorning scholastic methods, Butler does accept the ontological argument for God’s existence, the appeal to the unity and simplicity of the soul and the distinction of natural and revealed religion. The fundamental doctrine of natural religion is the efficacy of morals—that the categories of virtue and vice, already discussed in terms of human nature, have application to the larger world of nature. To some, fortune and misfortune in this world seem not to be correlated with any moral scheme. But, with numerous examples, Butler argues that the world as we ordinarily experience it does have the appearance of a moral order.

Butler takes up two objections: the possibility that the doctrine of necessity is true and the familiar problem of evil. With regard to necessity, he argues that, even if such is the case, we are in no position to live in accord with necessity since we cannot see our own or others’ actions as entirely necessitated. Butler’s approach to the problem of evil is to appeal to human ignorance, a principal theme in various aspects of his work. What Butler must show is that we do not know of the actual occurrence of any event such that it could not be part of a just world. Since he does appeal to our ignorance, Butler cannot be said to have produced a theodicy, a justification of the ways of God to us, but his strategy may show a greater intellectual integrity, and may be sufficient for his purposes.

6. The Christian Scriptures as a Revelation

Butler’s treatment of revealed religion is less satisfactory, since he had only a partial understanding of modern biblical criticism. Butler does insist on treating the Bible like any other book for critical purposes. He maintains that if any biblical teaching appears immoral or contrary to what we know by our natural faculties, then that alone is sufficient reason for seeking another interpretation of the scripture. The point of a revelation is to supplement natural knowledge, not to overrule it. Far from compromising the role of religion, this view is entailed by the fact that nature, natural knowledge and revelation all have a common source in God.

It is only in the second part of his Analogy that Butler argues against the deists. The characterization of his work as on the whole a reply to the deists is entirely a modern invention and is not found anywhere in the first century of reactions.

Only one chapter of the Analogy is devoted to the “Christian evidences” of miracles and prophecy, and even there Butler confines himself to some judicious remarks on the logical character of the arguments, especially with regard to miracles. In general, Butler presents revelation as wholly consistent with, but also genuinely supplemental of, natural knowledge. Hume says he castrated his Treatise of Human Nature (1739/1740) out of regards for Butler. But based on the texts that survive, there is no reason to think Hume would have gotten the better of the argument. Charles Babbage (1837) eventually showed why Hume had no valid objection to Butler.

Unfortunately, Butler’s account of scripture is entirely two-dimensional. He does not doubt the point that scripture was written in terms properly applicable to a previous state of society, but he has little sense of the canonical books themselves being redactions of a multitude of oral and literary traditions and sources.

7. Public Institutions as Moral Agents

In the six sermons preserved from the years he served as the Bishop of Bristol, Butler defends the moral nature of various philanthropic and political institutions of his day. And in his Charge to the Clergy at Durham, he presents a concise rationale for the Church.

8. Butler’s Influence

Ernest Mossner (1936) is still the most useful survey of Butler’s influence. Mossner claims that Butler was widely read in his own time, but his evidence may be insufficient to convince some. However that may be, there is no doubt that by the late eighteenth century Butler was widely read in Scottish universities, and from the early nineteenth century at Oxford, Cambridge and many American colleges, perhaps especially because the Scottish influence was so strong in America. Butler’s work impressed David Hume and John Wesley, and Thomas Reid, Adam Smith and David Hartley considered themselves Butlerians. Butler was a great favorite of the Tractarians, but the association with them may have worked against his ultimate influence in England, especially since Newman attributed his own conversion to the Roman Church to his study of Butler. S. T. Coleridge was among the first to urge study of the sermons and to disparage the Analogy. The decline of interest in the Analogy in the late nineteenth century has never been satisfactorily explained, but Leslie Stephen’s critical work was especially influential.

The editions most frequently cited today appeared only after wide interest in Butler’s Analogy had evaporated. The total editions are sometimes said to be countless, but this is true only in the sense that there are no agreed criteria for individuating editions. The numerous ancillary essays and study guides are still useful as evidence of how Butler was studied and understood. At its height, Butler’s influence cut across protestant denominational lines and party differences in the Church of England, but serious interest in the Analogy is now concentrated among certain Anglican writers.

9. References and Further Reading

Butler’s first biography appeared in the supplement to the Biographia Britannica (London, 1766). The most frequently reprinted biography is by Andrew Kippis and appeared in his second edition of the Biographia Britannica (London, 1778-93). This second edition is often confused with the supplement to the first edition. The only full biography is Bartlett (1839).

The best modern edition of Butler’s works is J.H. Bernard’s, but it is a modernized text, as of 1900, and contains errors. Serious readers may consult the original editions, now available on microfilm.

a. Works by Butler

  • Several Letters to the Reverend Dr. Clarke. London: Knapton, 1716.
  • Fifteen Sermons Preached at the Rolls Chapel. London: second edition, 1729; six sermons added in the 1749 edition.
  • Analogy of Religion, Natural and Revealed, to the Constitution and Nature. London: Knapton, 1736.
  • Charge Delivered to the Clergy. Durham: Lane, 1751.

b. Secondary Literature

  • Babbage, Charles. Ninth Bridgewater Treatise. London: J. Murray, 1837.
  • Babolin, Albino. Joseph Butler. Padova: LaGarangola, 1973. 2 vols.
  • Baker, Frank. “John Wesley and Bishop Joseph Butler: A Fragment of Wesley’s Manuscript Journal 16th to 24th August 1739.” Proceedings of the Wesley Historical Society. 42 (May 1980) 93-100.
  • Bartlett, Thomas. Memoirs of the Life, Character and Writings of Joseph Butler. London: John W. Parker, 1839.
  • Beck, Lewis White. “A Neglected Aspect of Butler’s Ethics.” Sophia 5 (1937) 11-15.
  • Butler, J.F. “John Wesley’s Defense Before Bishop Butler.” Proceedings of the Wesley Historical Society. 20 (1935) 63-67.
  • Butler, J.F. “John Wesley’s Defense Before Bishop Butler: A Further Note.” Proceedings of the Wesley Historical Society. 20 (1936) 193-194.
  • Chisholm, Roderick. “Self-Profile” in Roderick M. Chisholm, ed. Radu J. Bogdan. Dordrecht:Reidel, 1986.
  • Cunliffe, Christopher, ed. Joseph Butler’s Moral and Religious Thought: Tercentenary Essays. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992.
  • Darwall, Stephen. The British Moralists and the Internal ‘Ought’ 1640-1740. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995.
  • Mossner, E.C. Bishop Butler and the Age of Reason. New York: Macmillan, 1936.
  • Penelhum, Terence. Butler. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1985.
  • Stephen, Leslie. “Butler, Joseph.” Dictionary of National Biography, 1886.
  • Sturgeon, Nicholas L. “Nature and Conscience in Butler’s Ethics.” Philosophical Review 85 (1976) 316-356.
  • Sykes, Norman. “Bishop Butler and the Primacy” Theology (1936) 132- 137.
  • Sykes, Norman. “Bishop Butler and the Primacy” (letter) Theology (1958) 23.

Author Information

David E. White
St. John Fisher College
U. S. A.