Immanuel Kant: Logic
For Immanuel Kant (1724–1804), formal logic is one of three paradigms for the methodology of science, along with mathematics and modern-age physics. Formal logic owes this role to its stability and relatively finished state, which Kant claims it has possessed since Aristotle. Kant’s key contribution lies in his focus on the formal and systematic character of logic as a “strongly proven” (apodictic) doctrine. He insists that formal logic should abstract from all content of knowledge and deal only with our faculty of understanding (intellect, Verstand) and our forms of thought. Accordingly, Kant considers logic to be short and very general but, on the other hand, apodictically certain. In distinction to his contemporaries, Kant proposed excluding from formal logic all topics that do not properly belong to it (for example, psychological, anthropological, and metaphysical problems). At the same time, he distinguished the abstract certainty (that is, certainty “through concepts”) of logic (and philosophy in general) from the constructive evidence of mathematical knowledge. The idea of formal logic as a system led Kant to fundamental questions, including questions about the first principles of formal logic, redefinitions of logical forms with respect to those first principles, and the completeness of formal logic as a system. Through this approach, Kant raised some essential problems that later motivated the rise of modern logic. Kant’s remarks and arguments on a system of formal logic are spread throughout his works (including his lectures on logic). Nonetheless, he never published an integral, self-contained presentation of formal logic as a strongly proven doctrine. A lively dispute has thus developed among scholars about how to reconstruct his formal logic as an apodictic system, in particular concerning his justification of the completeness of his table of judgments.
One of Kant’s main results is his establishment of transcendental logic, a foundational part of philosophical logic that concerns the possibility of the strictly universal and necessary character of our knowledge of objects. Formal logic provides transcendental logic with a basis (“clue”) for establishing its fundamental concepts (categories), which can be obtained by reinterpreting the logical forms of judgment as the forms of intuitively given objects. Similarly, forms of inference provide a “clue” for transcendental ideas, which lead to higher-order and meta-logical perspectives. Transcendental logic is crucial to and forms the largest part of Kant’s foundations of metaphysics, as they are critically investigated and presented in his main work, the Critique of Pure Reason.
This article focuses on Kant’s formal logic in the systematic order of logical forms and outlines Kant’s approach to the foundations of formal logic. The main characteristics of Kant’s transcendental logic are presented, including his system of categories and transcendental ideas. Finally, a short overview is given of the subsequent role of Kant’s logical views.
Table of Contents
- The Concept of Formal Logic
- General Methodology
- The Foundations of Logic
- Transcendental Logic (Philosophical Logic)
- Influences and Heritage
- References and Further Reading
Presentations of the history of logic published at the beginning of the 21st century seem to positively re-evaluate Kant’s role, especially with regard to his conceptual work that led to a new development of logic (see, for example, Tiles 2004). Although older histories of logic written from the standpoint of mathematical logic did appreciate Kant’s restitution of the formal side of logic, they ascribed to Kant a relatively unimportant role. They criticized him for what seemed to be his view on logic as principally not exceeding the traditional, Aristotelian boundaries (Kneale and Kneale 1991) and for his principled separation of logic and mathematics (Scholz 1959). Nevertheless, during the 20th century, some Kant scholars have confirmed and extensively elaborated on his relevance to mathematical logic (for example, Wuchterl 1958, Schulthess 1981). Moreover, it is significant that several founders of modern logic (including Frege, Hilbert, Brouwer, and Gödel) explicitly referred to and built upon aspects of Kant’s philosophy.
According to Kant, formal logic appears to be an already finished science (accomplished by Aristotle), in which essentially no further development is possible (B VIII). In fact, some of Kant’s statements leave the impression that his views of formal logic may have been largely compiled from contemporary logic textbooks (B 96). Nonetheless, Kant mentions that the logic of his contemporaries was not free of insufficiencies (Prolegomena IV:323). He organized the existing material of formal logic in a specific way; he separated the extraneous (for instance, the psychological, anthropological, and metaphysical) material from formal logic proper. What is particularly important for Kant are his redefinitions of logical forms in terms of formal unity and consciousness. These redefinitions are indispensable for his main contributions: his systematic view of formal logic and the application of this view in transcendental logic.
It also became apparent, primarily due to K. Reich’s 1948 monograph, that Kant’s systematic view of formal logic assumed, as an essential component, a justification of the completeness of formal logic with respect to the forms of our thinking. This conforms with Kant’s critique of Aristotle for his unsystematic, “rhapsodical” approach in devising the list of categories, since Kant intended to repair this deficiency by setting up a system of categories specifically on the basis of formal logic.
Finally, the contemporary development of logic, where logic has far exceeded the shape of a standard (“classical”) mathematical logic, has made it technically possible to explore some features of Kant’s logic that have largely escaped the attention of the earlier, “classically” based perception of Kant’s logic.
Although formal logic is the starting point of Kant’s philosophy, there is no separate text in which Kant systematically, in a strictly scientific way, presented formal logic as a doctrine. Essential parts of this doctrine, however, are contained in his published works, especially those on the foundations of metaphysics, in his handwritten lecture notes on logic (with the addition of Jäsche’s compilation), and in the transcripts of Kant’s lectures on logic. These lectures are based primarily on the textbook by G. F. Meier; and, according to the custom of the time, they include a large amount of material that does not strictly pertain to formal logic. Kant’s view was that it was harmful to beginners to receive instruction in a highly abstract form, in contrast to their concrete and intuitive way of thinking (compare II:305‒306). Nevertheless, many places in Kant’s texts and lectures are pertinent to or reflect the systematic aspect of logic. On this ground, it is possible to reconstruct and describe most of the crucial details of Kant’s doctrine of formal logic.
The reason Kant did not write a systematic presentation of formal logic can be attributed to his focus on metaphysics and the possibility of its foundations. Besides, he might have presumed that the systematic doctrine of formal logic could be recognized from the sections and remarks he had included about it in his written work, at least to the extent to which formal logic was necessary to understand his argument on the foundations of metaphysics. Furthermore, Kant thought that once the principles were determined, a formal analysis (as is required in logic) and a complete derivation of a system could be relatively easily accomplished with the additional help of existing textbooks (see B 27‒28, 108‒109, A XXI: “more entertainment than labor”).
We first present Kant’s doctrine of formal logic, that is, his theory of concepts, judgments and inference and his general methodology. Then, we address the question of the foundations of logic and its systematic character. Finally, we outline Kant’s transcendental logic (that is, logical foundations of metaphysics), especially in relation to formal logic, and give a brief overview of his historical influence.
What we here term “formal logic” Kant usually calls “general logic” (allgemeine Logik), in accordance with some of his contemporaries and predecessors (Jungius, Leibniz, Knutzen, Baumgarten). Kant only rarely uses the terms “formal logic” (B 170, also mentioned by Jungius) or “formal philosophy” (Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals IV:387), and he preferred to define “logic” in this general sense as a science of the “formal rules of thinking,” rather than merely a general doctrine of understanding (Verstand) (XVI refl. 1624; see B IX, 78, 79, 172). Let us note the distinction between Kant’s use of the term “formal philosophy” and its contemporary use (philosophy in which modern formalized methods are applied).
The following are the essential features of Kant’s formal logic (see B 76‒80):
(1) Formal logic is general inasmuch as it disregards the content of our thought and the differences between objects. It deals only with the form and general rules of thought instead and can only be a canon for judging the correctness of thought. In distinction, a special logic pertains to a special kind of objects and is conjoined with some special science as its organon to extend the content of knowledge.
(2) Formal logic is pure, as it is not concerned with the psychological empirical conditions under which we think and that influence our thought. These psychological conditions are dealt with in applied logic. In general, pure logic does not incorporate any empirical principles, and according to Kant, it is only in this way that it can be established as a science that proves its propositions with strong certainty.
Formal logic should abstract from the distinction of whether the content to which logical forms apply is pure or empirical. Therefore, formal logic is distinguished from transcendental logic, which is a special logic of pure (non-empirical) thinking and which deals with the origin of our cognitions that is independent of given objects. However, transcendental logic is, in a sense, also general, because it deals with the general content of our thought—that is, with the categories that determine all objects.
It is clear that Kant conceives logical forms, as forms of thought, in mentalistic, albeit not in psychological terms. For him, forms of thought are ways of establishing a unity of our consciousness with respect to a given variety of representations. In this context, consciousness comes into play quite abstractly as the most general instance of unity, since ultimately it is we ourselves, in our own consciousness, who are uniting and linking representations given to us. This abstract (non-empirical) unity is to be distinguished from a mere psychological association of representations, which is dispersed and dependent on changing subjective states, and thus cannot establish unity.
By using a mentalistic approach, Kant stresses the operational character of logic. For him, a logical form is a result of the abstract operations of our faculty of understanding (Verstand), and it is through these operations that a unity of our representations can be established. In connection with this, Kant defines function as “the unity of the action [Handlung] of ordering different representations under a common one” (B 93) and he considers logical forms to be based on functions. We see in more detail below how Kant applies his concept of function to logical forms. Further historical development and modifications of Kant’s notion of function can be traced in Frege’s notion of “concept” and Russell’s “propositional functions.”
According to Kant, the unity that a concept establishes from a variety of representations is a unity in a common mark (nota communis) of objects. The form of a concept as a common mark is universality, and its subject matter is objects. Three types of operations of understanding bring about a concept: comparison, reflection, and abstraction.
(1) Through comparison, as a preparatory operation, we become conscious of the identity and difference of objects, and come to an identical mark that is contained in representations of many things. This is a common mark of these things, which is a “partial concept” contained in their representations; other marks may also be contained in these representations, making the things different from one another.
(2) Through reflection, which is essential for concept formation, we become conscious of a common mark as belonging to and holding of many objects. This is a “ground of cognition” (Erkenntnisgrund) of objects, which universally holds of them. Universality (“universal validity”) is the form through which we conceive many objects in one and the same consciousness.
(3) Through abstraction, we leave out (“abstract from”) the differences between objects and retain only their common mark in our consciousness.
Kant characterizes the sort of unity that is established by a concept in the following, foundational way. Each concept, as a common mark that is found in many representations, has an analytic unity (identity) of consciousness “on itself.” At the same time, the concept is presupposed to belong to these, possibly composed, representations, where it is combined (synthesized) with the other component marks. That is, each concept presupposes a synthetic unity of consciousness (B 134 footnote).
On the ground of this functional theory of concepts, Kant explains the distinction between the content (intension) and the extension (sphere) of a concept. This distinction stems from the so-called Port-Royal logic (by A. Arnauld and P. Nicole) of the 17th century and has since become standard in so-called traditional logic (that is, in logic before or independent of its transformation starting with Boole and Frege’s methodology of formalization). According to Kant, concept A has a content in the sense that A is a “partial concept” contained in the representation of an object; concept A has extension (sphere) in the sense that A universally holds of many objects that are contained under A (Jäsche Logic §7 IX:95, XVI refl. 2902, Reich 1948 p. 38). The content of A can be complex, that is, it can contain many marks in itself. The content and extension of a concept A stand in an inversely proportional relationship: the more concept A contains under itself, the less A contains in itself, and vice versa.
A traditional doctrine (mainly originating from Aristotle) of the relationship between concepts can also be built on the basis of Kant’s theory of concepts. A concept B can be contained under A if A is contained in B, that is, as Kant says, if A is a note (a “ground of cognition”) of B. In this case, Kant calls A a higher concept with respect to B, and B a lower concept with respect to A. Kant also says that A is a “mark of a mark” B (a distant mark). Obviously, A is not meant as a second-order mark but rather as a mark of the same order as B. Also, A is a genus of B, while B is a species of A. Through abstraction, we ascend to higher and higher concepts; through determination, we descend to lower and lower concepts. The relationship between higher and lower concepts is subordination, and the relationship between lower concepts among themselves without mutual subordination is coordination. According to Kant, there is no lowest species, because we can always add a new mark to a given concept and thus make it more specific. Finally, with respect to extension, a higher concept is wider, and a lower concept is narrower. The concepts with the same extension are called reciprocal.
Judgment is for Kant the way to bring given representations to the objective unity of self-consciousness (see B 141, XVI refl. 3045). Because of this unifying of a manifold (of representations) in one consciousness, Kant conceives judgment as rule (Prolegomena §23 IV:305, see Jäsche Logic §60 IX:121). For example, the objective unity is the meaning of the copula “are” in the judgment “All bodies are heavy”; what is meant is not our subjective feeling of heaviness, but rather the objective state of affairs that bodies are heavy (see B 142), which is representable by a thinking agent (“I”) irrespective of the agent’s changeable psychological states.
As Kant points out, there is no other logical use of concepts except in judgments (B 93), where a concept, as a predicate, is related to objects by means of another representation, a subject. No concept is related to objects directly (like intuition). In a judgment, a concept becomes an assertion (predicate) that is related to objects under some condition (subject) by means of which objects are represented. A logical unity of representations is thus established in the following way: many objects that are represented by means of some condition A are subsumed under some general assertion B, under which other conditions A’, A”, . . . too can possibly be subsumed. The unity of a judgment is objective, since it is conditioned by a representation (a subject concept or a judgment) that is objective or related to objects. The objective unity in a judgment is generalized by Kant so as to hold not merely between concepts (subject and predicate), but also between judgments themselves (as parts of a hypothetical or a disjunctive judgment).
According to Kant, the aspects and types of the unity of representations in a judgment can be exhaustively and systematically described and brought under the four main “titles”: quantity, quality, relation, and modality. This is a famous division of judgments that became standard in traditional logic after Kant.
The assertion of a judgment can be related to its condition of objectivity without any exception or with a possible exception. In the first case, the judgment is universal (for example, “All A are B”), and in the second case, it is particular (for example, “Some A are B”).
With respect to a given condition of objectivity, an assertion is combined or not combined with it. In the first case, the judgment is affirmative (for example, “Some A are B”), while in the second case, it is negative (for example, “Some A are not B”).
If taken together, quantity and quality yield the four traditionally known (Aristotelian) types of judgment: universal affirmative (“All A are B,” AaB), universal negative (“No A is B,” AeB), particular affirmative (“Some A are B,” AiB), and particular negative (“Some A are not B,” AoB).
In a judgment, an assertion is brought under some condition of objective validity. There are three possible relations of the condition of objective validity to the assertion—subject–predicate, antecedent–consequent, and whole–members—each one represented by an appropriate exponent (“copula” in a wider sense).
(1) In a categorical judgment, a concept (B) as a predicate is brought under the condition of another concept (A) that is a subject that represents objects. Predicate B is an assertion that obtains its objective validity by means of the subject A as the condition:
x, which is contained under A, is also under B (XVI refl. 3096, Jäsche Logic §29 IX:108, symbols modified).
The relation of a categorical judgment is represented by the copula “is.” A categorical judgment stands under the principle of contradiction, which is formulated by Kant in the following way:
No predicate contradictory of a thing can belong to it (B 190).
Hence, there is no violation of the principle of contradiction in stating “A is B and non-B” as far as B or non-B does not contradict A. Only, “and” is not a logical operator for Kant, since it can be relativized by time: “A is B” and “A is non-B” can both be true, but at different moments in time (B 192). (Thus, Kant’s logic of categorical judgments can be considered as “paraconsistent,” in the sense that p and not-p, not violating the law of contradiction, do not entail an arbitrary judgment.)
(2) In a hypothetical judgment, some judgment (say, categorical), q, is an assertion that obtains its objective validity under the condition of another judgment, p: q is called a consequent, p its antecedent (ground), while their relation is what Kant calls (in accordance with other logics of the time) consequence. The exponent of the hypothetical judgment is “if . . . then . . .,” but it need not correspond to the main operator of a judgment in the sense of the syntax in modern logic. This means that a hypothetical judgment is not simply a conditional, since, for instance, it should also include universally quantified propositions like “If the soul is not composite, then it is not perishable,” which could be naturally formalized as “x ((Sx ˄ ¬Cx) → ¬Px) (compare Dohna-Wundlacken Logic XX-II:763; see examples in LV-I:203, LV-II:472). Let us note that “If something is a human, then it is mortal” is for Kant a hypothetical judgment, in distinction to the categorical judgment “All humans are mortal” (Vienna Logic XX-II:934, Hechsel Logic LV-II:31).
A hypothetical judgment stands under the principle of sufficient reason:
Each assertion has its reason.
Not having a reason contradicts the concept of assertion. By this principle (to be distinguished from Leibniz‘s ontological principle of the same name), q and not-q are excluded as consequents of the same antecedent: they cannot be grounded on one and the same reason. As can be seen, only now do we come to a version of the Aristotelian principle of contradiction, according to which no predicate can “simultaneously” belong and not belong to the same subject. On the other hand, we have no guarantee that there will always be an antecedent sufficient to decide between some p and not-p as its possible consequents. (In this sense, it could be said that Kant’s logic of assertions is “paracomplete.”)
(3) In a disjunctive judgment, the component judgments are parts of some whole (the disjunctive judgment itself) as their condition of objective validity. That is, the objectively valid assertion is one of the mutually exclusive but complementary parts of the whole, for example:
x, which is contained under A, is contained either under B or C, etc. (XVI refl. 3096, Jäsche Logic §29 IX:108).
The exponent of the disjunctive relation is “either . . . or . . .” in the exclusive sense, and, again, it should not be identified with the main operator in the modern sense. To see this, let us take Kant’s example of a disjunctive judgment, “A learned man is learned either historically or rationally,” which would, in a modern formalization, give a universally quantified sentence “x (Lx ® (Hx ˅ Rx)) (Jäsche Logic §29 IX:107).
In a disjunctive judgment, under the condition of an objective whole, some of its parts hold with the exclusion of the rest of the parts. A disjunctive judgment stands under the principle of excluded middle between p and not-p, since it is a contradiction to assert (or to deny) both p and not-p.
Remark. With respect to relation, a judgment is gradually made more and more determinate: from allowing mutually contradictory predicates, to excluding such contradictions on some ground but allowing undecidedness among them, to positing exactly one of the contradictory predicates by excluding the others. Through the three relations in a judgment, we step by step upgrade the conditions of a judgment, improve its unity, and strengthen logical laws, starting from paraconsistency and paracompleteness to finally come to a sort of classical logic.
In general, we can see that relation is what the objective unity of consciousness in a judgment basically consists in: it is a unifying function that (in three ways) relates a manifold of given representations to some condition of their objectivity. Since judgment is generally defined as a manner of bringing our representations to the objective unity of consciousness, the relation of a judgment makes the essential aspect of a judgment.
This is one of the most distinctive parts of Kant’s logic, revealing its purely intensional character. One and the same judgment structure (quantity, quality, and relation of a judgment) can be thought by means of varying and increasing strength as possible, true, and necessary. Correspondingly, Kant distinguishes
(2) assertoric, and
judgments (assertoric judgment is called “proposition,” Satz). For example, the antecedent p of a hypothetical judgment is thought merely as problematic (“if p”); secondly, p can also occur outside a hypothetical judgment as, for some reason, an already accepted judgment, that is, as assertoric; finally, p can occur as necessarily accepted on the ground of logical laws, thus apodictic.
These modes of judgment pertain just to how a judgment is thought, that is, to the way the judgment is accepted by understanding (Verstand). Kant says that (1) problematic modality is a “free choice,” an “arbitrary assumption,” of a judgment; (2) assertoric modality (in a proposition) is the acceptance of a judgment as true (logical actuality); while (3) apodictic modality consists in the “inseparable” connection with understanding (see B 101).
There is no special exponent (or operator) of modality; modality is just the “value,” “energy,” of how the existing exponent of a relation in a judgment is thought. Modality is in an essential sense distinguished from the quantity, quality, and relation, which, in distinction, constitute the logical content of a judgment (see B 99‒100; XVI refl. 3084).
Despite a very specific nature of modality, it is in a significant way—through logical laws—correlated with the relation of a judgment:
(1) logical possibility of a problematic judgment is judged with respect to the principle of contradiction—no judgment that violates this principle is logically possible;
(2) logical actuality (truth) of an assertoric judgment is judged with respect to the grounding of the judgment on some sufficient reason;
(3) logical necessity of an apodictic judgment is judged with respect to the decidability of the judgment on the ground of the principle of excluded middle
(see Kant’s letter to Reinhold from May 19, 1789 XI:45; Reich 1948 pp. 73‒76).
The interconnection of relation and modality is additionally emphasized by the fact that Kant sometimes united these two aspects under the title of queity (quaeitas) (XVI refl. 3084, Reich 1948 pp. 60‒61).
- Systematic Overview
Kant gives an overview of his formal logical doctrine of judgments by means of the following table of judgments:
In his transcendental logic, Kant adds singular and infinite judgments as special judgment types. In formal logic (as was usual in logic textbooks of Kant’s time), they are subsumed under universal and affirmative judgments, respectively (see B 96‒97). A characteristic departure from the custom of 17th- and 18th-century logic textbooks is Kant’s (generalized) aspect of relation, which is not reducible to the subject–predicate relation, and directly comprises categorical, hypothetical, and disjunctive judgments—bypassing, for example, subdivision into simple and compound judgments. Another divergence from the custom of the time is Kant’s understanding of modality as independent of explicit modal expressions (“necessarily,” “contingently,” “possibly,” “impossibly”). Instead, Kant understands modality as an intrinsic moment of each judgment (for example, the antecedent and the consequent of a hypothetical judgment are as such problematic, and the consequence between them is assertoric), in distinction to the customary division into “pure” and “modal” propositions. The result of this was a more austere system of judgments that is reduced to strictly formal criteria in Kant’s sense and avoids the admixture of psychological, metaphysical, or anthropological aspects (B VIII).
Kant’s table of judgments has a systematic value within his formal logic. The fact that Kant uses the tabular method to give an overview of the doctrine of judgments shows, according to his methodological view on the tabular method (Section 6), that he is only summarizing a systematic whole of knowledge. Formal logic, as a system, is a “demonstrated doctrine” (Section 6), where everything “must be certain completely a priori” (B 78, compare many other places like B IX; A 14; Prolegomena IV:306; Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals IV:387; XVI refl. 1579 p. 21, 1587, 1620 p. 41, 1627, 1628; Preisschrift XX:271). Kant’s text supports the view that his formal logic should include a systematic, a priori justification of his table of judgments, despite dispute among scholars about how this justification can be reconstructed (see Section 7).
In an inference, a judgment is represented as “unfailingly” (that is, a priori, necessarily) connected with (and “derived” from) another judgment that is its ground (see B 360).
Kant distinguishes two ways we can derive a judgment (conclusion) from its ground:
(a) by the formal analysis of a given judgment (ground, premise), without the aid of any additional judgment—such an inference, which is traditionally known as immediate consequence, Kant calls an inference of understanding (Verstandesschluß, B 360);
(b) by the subsumption under some already accepted judgment (major premise) with the aid of some mediate judgment (additional, minor premise)—this is an inference of reason (Vernunftschluß), that is, a syllogism (B 360, compare, for example, XVI refl. 3195, 3196, 3198, 3201).
Kant distinguishes between “understanding” (Verstand) and “reason” (Vernunft) in the following way: understanding is the faculty of the unity of representations (“appearances”) by means of rules, while “reason” is the faculty of the unity of rules by means of principles (see B 359, 356, 361). Obviously, inference of understanding essentially remains at the unity already established by means of a given judgment (rule), whereas inference of reason starts from a higher unity (principle) under which many judgments can be subsumed.
Additionally, we can infer a conclusion by means of a presumption on the ground of already accepted judgments. This inference Kant names inference of the power of judgment (Schluß der Urteilskraft), but he does not consider it to belong to formal logic in a proper sense, since its conclusion, because of possible exceptions, does not follow with necessity.
This part of Kant’s logical theory includes a variant of the traditional (Aristotelian) doctrine of immediate consequence, but as grounded in Kant’s previously presented theory of judgment. According to Kant, in an inference of understanding, we merely analyze a given judgment with respect to its logical form. Thus, Kant divides inference of understanding in accordance with his division of judgments:
(a) with respect to the quantity of a judgment, an inference is possible by subalternation: from a universal judgment to its corresponding particular judgment of the same quality (AaB / AiB, AeB / AoB);
(b) with respect to the quality of a judgment, an inference is possible according to the square of opposition (which usually includes subalternation): of the contradictories (AaB and AoB, AeB, and AiB), one is true and another false; of the contraries (AaB and AeB), at least one is false; of the subcontraries (AiB and AoB), at least one is true;
(c) with respect to the relation of a judgment, there is an inference by conversion (simple or changed): if B is (not) predicated of A, then A is (not) predicated of B (AaB / BiA, AeB / BeA, AiB / BiA);
(d) with respect to modality, an inference is possible by contraposition (for example AaB / non-BeA); Kant assigns contraposition to modality because the contraposition changes the logical actuality of the premise (proposition) to the necessity of the conclusion; that is, granted the premise, the conclusion expresses the exclusion (opposite) of self-contradiction (XVI refl. 3170, Hechsel Logic LV-II:448): granted AaB, non-B contradicts A (also, granted AeB or AoB, universal exclusion of non-B contradicts A, that is, non-BiA follows).
These inferences are valid on the ground of Kant’s assumption of the non-contradictory subject concept. Otherwise, if the subject concept is self-contradictory (nothing can be thought by it), then both contradictories would be false. For example, “A square circle is round” and “A square circle is not round” are both false due to the principle of contradiction (Prolegomena §52b IV:341, B 821: “both what one asserts affirmatively and what one asserts negatively of the object [of an impossible concept] are incorrect”; see B 819, 820‒821).
Kant considers inference of reason within a variant of traditional theory of syllogisms, which includes categorical syllogism (substantially reduced to the first syllogistic figure), hypothetical syllogism, and disjunctive syllogism, everything shaped and modified in accordance with his theory of judgments and his conception of logic in general.
Each syllogism starts from a judgment that has the role of the major premise. In Kant’s view, the major premise is a general rule under the condition of which (for example, of its subject concept) a minor premise is subsumed. Accordingly, the condition of the minor premise itself (for example, its subject concept) is subsumed in the conclusion under the assertion of the major premise (for example, its predicate) (B 359‒361, B 386‒387). The major premise becomes in a syllogism a (comparative) principle from which other judgments can be derived as conclusions (see B 357, 358). Since there are three species of judgments with respect to relation, Kant distinguishes three species of syllogisms according to the relation of the major premise (B 361, XVI refl. 3199):
(a) Categorical syllogism. Kant starts from a standard doctrine of first syllogistic figure, where the major concept (predicate of the major premise) is put in relation to the minor concept (subject of the minor premise) by means of the middle concept (the subject of the major and the predicate of the minor premise): MaP, SaM / SaP; MeP, SaM / SeP; MaP, SiM / SiP; MeP, SiM / SoP. Kant insists that only the first figure of the categorical syllogism is an inference of reason, whereas in other figures there is a hidden immediate inference (sometimes reductio ad absurdum is needed) by means of which a syllogism can be transformed into the first figure (B 142 footnote, XVI refl. 3256; see The False Subtlety of the Four Syllogistic Figures in II).
(b) Hypothetical syllogism. The major premise is a hypothetical judgment, in which the antecedent and the consequent are problematic. Subsumption is accomplished by means of the change of the modality of the antecedent (or of the negation of the consequent) to an assertoric judgment (minor premise), from where in the conclusion the assertoric modality of the consequent (or of the negation of the antecedent) follows. The inference from the affirmation of the antecedent to the affirmation of the consequent is modus ponens, and the inference from the negation of the consequent to the negation of the antecedent is modus tollens of the hypothetical syllogism.
(c) Disjunctive syllogism. The major premise is a disjunctive judgment, where the disjuncts are problematic. Subsumption is carried out by the change of the problematic modality of some disjuncts (or their negations) to assertoric modality, from where in the conclusion the assertoric modality of the negation of other disjuncts (the assertoric modality of other disjuncts) follows. The inference from the affirmation of one part of the disjunction to the negation of the other part is modus ponendo tollens, and the inference from the negation of one part of the disjunction to the affirmation of the other part is modus tollendo ponens of the disjunctive syllogism.
In hypothetical and disjunctive syllogisms, there is no middle term (concept). As explained, the subsumption under the rule of the major premise is carried out just by means of the change of the modality of one part (or of its negation) of the major premise (see XVI refl. 3199).
In Kant’s texts, we can find short indications on how a theory of polysyllogisms should be built (for example, B 364, B 387‒389). Inference can be continued on the side of conditions by means of a prosyllogism, whose conclusion is a premise of a given syllogism (an ascending series of syllogisms), as well as on the side of what is conditioned by means of an episyllogism, whose premise is the conclusion of a given syllogism (a descending series of syllogisms). In order to derive, by syllogisms, a given judgment (conclusion), the ascending totality of its conditions should be assumed (either with some first unconditioned condition or as an unlimited but unconditioned series of all conditions) (B 364). In distinction, a descending series from a given conclusion could be only a potential one, since the acceptance of the conclusion, as given, is already granted by the ascending totality of conditions (B 388‒389). By requiring a given, completed ascending series of syllogisms, we advance towards the highest, unconditioned principles (see B 358). In this way, the logical unity of our representations increases towards a maximum: our reason aims at bringing the greatest manifold of representations under the smallest number of principles and to the highest unity (B 361).
The inference of the power of judgment is only a presumption (“empirical inference”), and its conclusion a preliminary judgment. On the ground of the accordance in many special cases that stand under some common condition, we presume some general rule that holds under this common condition. Kant distinguishes two species of such an inference: induction and analogy. Roughly,
(a) by induction, we conclude from A in many things of some genus B, to A in all things of genus B: from a part of the extension of B to the whole extension of B;
(b) by analogy, we conclude from many properties that a thing x has in common with a thing y, to the possession by x of all properties of y that have their ground in C as a genus of x and y (C is called tertium comparationis): from a part of a concept C to the whole concept C
(see XVI refl. 3282‒3285).
What justifies such reasoning is the principle of our power of judgment, which requires that many cases of accordance should have some common ground (by means of belonging to the extension of the same concept or by having the marks of the same concept). However, since we do not derive this common ground with logical necessity, no objective unity is established, but only presumed, as a result of our subjective way of reflecting.
For Kant, fallacious inferences should be explained by illusion (Schein, B 353): an inference may seem to be correct if judged on the ground of its appearance (species, Pölitz Logic XXIV-II:595, Warsaw Logic LV-II:649), although the real form of this proposed inference may be incorrect (just an “imitation” of a correct form, B 353, 354). Through such illusions, logic illegitimately becomes an organon to extend our knowledge outside the limits of the canon of logical forms. Kant calls dialectic the part of logic that deals with the discovery and solutions of logical illusions in fallacious inferences (for example, B 390, 354), in distinction to mere analytic of the forms of thought. Formal logic gives only negative criteria of truth (truth has to be in accordance with logical laws and forms), but cannot give any general material criterion of truth, because material truth depends on the specific knowledge about objects (B 83‒84). Formal logic, which is in itself a doctrine, becomes in its dialectical part the critique of fallacies and of logical illusion. In his logic lectures and texts, Kant addresses some traditionally well-known fallacies (for example, sophisma figurae dictionis, a dicto secundum quid ad dictum simpliciter, sophisma heterozeteseos, ignoratio elenchi, Liar). Below, in connection with Kant’s transcendental logic, we mention some of his own characteristic, systematically important examples of fallacies.
Since, according to Kant, formal logic abstracts from the differences of objects and hence cannot focus on the concrete content of a particular science, it can only give a short and very general outline of the form of a science, as the most comprehensive logical form. This outline is a mere general doctrine on the formal features of a method and on the systematic way of thinking. On the other hand, many interesting distinctions can be found in Kant’s reflections on general methodology that cast light on Kant’s approach to logic, philosophy, and mathematics.
Building on his concept of the faculty of reason, Kant defines method in general as the unity of a whole of knowledge according to principles (or as “a procedure in accordance with principles,” B 883). By means of a method, knowledge obtains the form of a system and transforms into a science. Non-methodical thinking (without any order), which Kant calls “tumultuar,” serves in combination with a method the variety of knowledge (whereas method itself serves the unity). In a wider sense, Kant speaks of a fragmentary (rhapsodical) method, which consists only in a subjective and psychological connection of thinking (it does not establish a system, but only an aggregate of knowledge, not a science, but merely ordinary knowledge).
In further detail, Kant’s general methodology includes the doctrine of definition, division, and proof—mainly a redefined, traditionally known material, with Kant’s own systematic form.
Let us first say that for Kant a concept is clear if we are conscious of its difference from other concepts. Also, a concept is distinct if its marks are clearly known. Now, definition is, according to Kant, a clear, distinct, complete, and precise (“reduced to a minimal number of marks”) presentation of a concept. Since all these requirements for a definition can be strictly fulfilled only in mathematics, Kant distinguishes various forms of clarification that only partially fulfill the above-mentioned requirements, as exposition, which is clear and distinct, but need not be precise and complete (see XVI refl. 2921, 2925, 2951; B 755‒758). Division is the representation of a manifold under some concept and as interrelated, by means of mutual opposition, within the whole sphere of the concept (see XVI refl. 3025).
Proof provides certainty to a judgment by making distinct the connection of the judgment with its grounds (see XVI refl. 2719). Proofs can be distinguished with respect to the grade of certainty they provide. (1) A proof can be apodictic (strong), in a twofold way: as a demonstration (proof by means of the construction in an intuition, in concreto, as in mathematics) or as a discursive proof (by means of concepts, in abstracto, as in philosophy). In addition, a strong proof can be direct (ostensive), by means of the derivation of a judgment from its ground, or indirect (apagogical), by means of showing the untenability of a consequent of the judgment’s contradictory. In his philosophy, Kant focuses on the examples where indirect proofs are not applicable due to the possibility of dialectical illusion (contraries and subcontraries that only subjectively and deceptively appear to be contradictories, which is impossible in mathematics, B 819‒821). (2) Sometimes the grounds of proof give only incomplete certainty, for instance, empirical certainty (as in induction and analogy), probability, possibility (hypothesis), or merely apparent certainty (fallacious proof) (see Critique of Judgment §90 V:463).
Furthermore, Kant distinguishes the syllogistic and tabular methods. The syllogistic method derives knowledge by means of syllogisms. An already established systematic whole of knowledge is presented in its whole articulation (branching) by the tabular method (as is the case, for example, with Kant’s tables of judgments and categories; see, for example, Pölitz Logic XXIV-II:599, Dohna-Wundlacken Logic XXIV-II:80, Hechsel Logic LV-II:494). In addition, the division of the syllogistic method into the synthetic (progressive) and analytic (regressive) is important. The former proceeds from the principles to what is derived, from elements (the simple) to the composed, from reasons to what follows from them, whereas the latter proceeds the other way around, from what is given to its reasons, elements, and principles. (For the application of these two syllogistic methods in metaphysics, see, for instance, B 395 footnote.)
Finally, Kant comes to the following three general methodological principles (B 685‒688):
(1) the principle of “homogeneity of the manifold under higher genuses”;
(2) the principle of specification, that is, of the “variety of the homogeneous under lower species”;
(3) the principle of continuity of the transition to higher genuses and to lower species.
These principles correspond to the three interests of the faculty of reason: the interests of unity, manifold, and affinity. Again, all three principles are just three sides of one and the same, most general, principle of the systematic (“thoroughgoing”) unity of our knowledge (B 694).
The end result of the application of methodology in our knowledge is a “demonstrated doctrine,” which derives knowledge by means of apodictic proofs. It is accompanied by a corresponding discipline, which, by means of critique, prevents and corrects logical illusion and fallacies.
As stated by Kant, formal logic itself should be founded and built according to strict criteria, as a demonstrated doctrine. It should be a “strongly proven,” “exhaustively presented” system (B IX), with the “a priori insight” into the formal rules of thinking “through mere analysis of the actions of reason into their moments” (B 170). Since in formal logic “the understanding [Verstand] has to do with nothing further than itself and its own form” (B IX), formal logic should be grounded in the condition of the possibility of the understanding in the formal sense, and this condition is technically (operationally) defined by Kant as the unity of pure (original) self-consciousness (apperception) (B 131, compare XVI 21 refl. 1579: logical rules should be “proven from the reason [Vernunft]”). This unity is the fundamental, qualitative unity of the act of thinking (“I think”) as opposed to a given manifold (variety) of representations. The operational “one-many” opposition, as well as the further analysis of its general features and structure, should be appropriate as a foundational starting point from which a system of logic could be strongly derived. The basic step of the analysis of this fundamental unity is Kant’s distinction between the analytic and synthetic unity of self-consciousness (see, for example, B §§15‒19): at first, the act of thinking (“I think”) appears simply to accompany all our representations. It is the identity of my consciousness in all my representations, termed by Kant analytic unity of self-consciousness. But this identity of consciousness would, for me (as a thinking subject), not be possible if I would not conjoin (synthesize) one representation with another and be conscious of this synthesis. Thus, the analytic unity of self-consciousness is possible only under the condition of the synthetic unity of self-consciousness (B 133). Kant further shows that the synthetic unity is objective, because it devises a concept of object with respect to which we synthesize representations into a unity. This unity is necessary and universally valid, that is, independent of any changeable, psychological state.
In Kant’s words: “the synthetic unity of apperception is the highest point to which one must affix all use of the understanding, even the whole logic and, after it, transcendental philosophy; indeed this faculty is the understanding itself” (B 134 footnote; see A 117 footnote and Opus postumum XXII:77). (For a formalization of Kant’s theory of apperception according to the first edition of the Critique of Pure Reason, see Achourioti and Lambalgen 2011.)
Kant himself did not write a systematic presentation of formal logic, and the form and interpretation of Kant’s intended logical system are disputed among Kant scholars. Nevertheless, it is evident that each logical form is conceived by Kant as a type of unity of given representations, that this unity is an act of thinking and consciousness, and that each logical form is therefore essentially related to the “original” unity of self-consciousness. Some scholars, starting from the concept of the original unity of self-consciousness—that is, from the concept of understanding (as confronted with a given “manifold” of our representations)—proposed various lines of a reconstruction of Kant’s assumed completeness proof of his logical forms (or supplied such a proof on their own), in particular, of his table of judgments (see a classical work by Reich 1948, and, for example, Wolff 1995, Achourioti and van Lambalgen 2011, Kovač 2014). There are authors who offer arguments that the number and the species of the functions of our understanding are for Kant primitive facts, and can be at most indicated (Indizienbeweis) on the ground of the “functional unity” of a judgment (Brandt 1991; see a justification of Kant’s table of judgments in Krüger 1968).
Besides formal logic, Kant considers a branch of philosophical logic that deals with the foundations of ontology and the rest of metaphysics and shows how objects are constituted in our knowledge by means of logical categorization. This branch of logic Kant names “transcendental logic.”
Kant’s transcendental logic is based on two important distinctions, which exerted great influence in the ensuing history of logic and philosophy: the distinction between a priori and a posteriori knowledge, and the distinction between synthetic and analytic judgments (see B 1‒3).
Knowledge is a priori if it is possible independently of any experience. For instance, “Every change has its cause.” As the example shows, knowledge can be a priori, but about an empirical concept, like “change,” since given a change, we independently of any experience know that it should have a cause. A priori knowledge is pure if it has no empirical content, like, for example, mathematical propositions.
Knowledge is a posteriori (empirical) if it is possible only by means of experience. An example is “All bodies are heavy,” since we cannot know without experience (just from the concept of body) whether a body is heavy.
Kant gives two certain, mutually inseparable marks of a priori knowledge: (1) it is necessary and derived (if at all) only from necessary judgments; (2) it is strictly universal, with no exceptions possible. In distinction, a posteriori knowledge (1) permits that the state of affairs that is thought of can also be otherwise, and (2) it can possess at most assumed and comparative universality, with respect to the already perceived cases (as in induction) (B 3‒4).
Analytic and synthetic judgments are distinguished with respect to their content: a judgment is analytic if it adds nothing to the content of the knowledge given by the condition of the judgment; otherwise, it is synthetic.
That is, analytic judgments are merely explicative with respect to the content given by the condition of the judgment, while synthetic judgments are expansive with respect to the given content
(see Prolegomena §2a IV:266, B 10‒11). Kant exemplifies this distinction on affirmative categorical judgments: such a judgment is analytic if its predicate does not contain anything that is not contained in the subject of the judgment; otherwise, the judgment is synthetic: its predicate adds to the content of the subject what is not already contained in it. An example of analytic judgments is “All bodies are extended” (“extended” is contained in the concept “body”); an example of synthetic judgments is the empirical judgment “All bodies are heavy” (“heavy” is not contained in the concept “body”).
We note that Kant’s formal logic should contain only analytic judgments, although its laws and principles refer to and hold for all judgments (analytic and synthetic) in general (see Reich 1948 14‒15, 17). Conversely, analytic knowledge is based on formal logic, affirming (negating) only what should be affirmed (negated) on pain of contradiction. Let us remark that for Frege, unlike for Kant, this notion of analytic knowledge holds also for arithmetic.
The objective of Kant’s transcendental logic is pure forms of thinking in so far as they a priori refer to objects (B 80‒82). That is, necessary and strictly universal ways should be shown for how our understanding determines objects, independently of, and prior to, all experience. In Kant’s technical language, this means that transcendental logic should contain synthetic judgments a priori.
According to Kant’s restriction on transcendental logic, objects can be given to us only in a sensible intuition. These objects can be conceived as making Kant’s only legitimate, empirical domain of theoretical knowledge. Hence, the task is to discover which pure forms of our thought (categories, “pure concepts of understanding”), and in which way, determine the empirically given objects. Kant obtains categories from his table of logical forms of judgment (“metaphysical deduction of categories,” B §10, see §§20, 26) because these forms, besides giving unity to a judgment, are also what unite a sensibly given manifold into a concept of an object. Technically expressed, a form of a judgment is a “function of unity” that can serve to synthesize a manifold of an intuition. The manifold is synthesized into a unity that is a concept of an object given in the intuition. To “deduce” categories, Kant introduces some small emendations into his table of the logical functions in judgments. These emendations are needed because what is focused on in transcendental logic is not merely the form of thought, but also the a priori content of thought. Thus, Kant extends the division of “moments” under the titles of quantity and quality of judgments by adding singular and infinite judgments, respectively (for instance, “Plato is a philosopher”; “The soul is non-mortal”). He also changes the term “particular judgment” for “plurative,” since the intended content is not an exception from totality (which is the logical form of a particular judgment), but plurality independently from totality. With respect to the content, Kant reverses the order under the title of quantity (Prolegomena §20 footnote IV:302).
(Prolegomena §21 IV:303).
Sometimes, the order of the categories of quality is also changed: reality, limitation, full negation (Prolegomena §39 IV:325). In the Critique of Pure Reason, the table is more explicative. Under “Relation,” Kant lists:
(a) inherence and subsistence (substantia et accidens);
(b) causality and dependence (cause and effect);
(c) community (interaction between agent and patient).
Under “Modality,” he adds negative categories of impossibility, non-existence, and contingency (B 106). (For a possible reconstruction of a deduction of categories from the synthetic unity of self-consciousness as the first principle, see Schulting 2019.)
Kant further shows that all objects of a sensible intuition in general (be it in space and time or not) presuppose a synthetic unity (in self-consciousness) of a manifold according to categories. On the ground of this premise, he also shows that all objects of our experience, too, stand under categories. Briefly, in the proof of this result, Kant shows, first, that each of our empirical intuitions presupposes a synthetic unity according to which space and time are determined in this intuition. We then abstract from the space-time form of our empirical intuition, isolate just the synthetic unity, and, by subsumption under the first premise (on intuitions in general), conclude that this synthetic unity is based on the categories, which are applicable to our space-time intuition (“transcendental deduction of categories,” B §§20, 21, 26, B 168‒169).
In addition, transcendental logic comprises a theory of judgments a priori and of their principles. These principles determine how categories, which are pure concepts, are applied to objects given in our intuition and make our knowledge of objects possible. For Kant, there is no way to come to a theoretical knowledge of objects other than by means of experience, which includes, as its formal side, categories as well as space and time. Accordingly, there are a priori judgments about how categories can have objective validity in application to what can be given in our space-time intuition. As Kant puts it: the conditions (including categories) of the possibility of experience are at the same time the conditions of the possibility of the objects of experience, and thus have objective validity (B 197).
Kant systematically elaborates the principles of the pure faculty of understanding in consonance with his table of judgments. According to these principles, different moments that constitute our experience (1. intuition; 2. sensation; 3. perception of permanence, change, and simultaneity; 4. formal and material conditions in general) are subsumed under corresponding categories (1. extensive magnitude, 2. intensive magnitude, 3. categories of relation, 4. modal categories).
Kant emphasizes that concepts themselves cannot be conceived as objects (noumena) in the same (empirical) domain of objects (appearances, phaenomena) to which they as concepts apply. That is, in modern terms, we can speak of noumena only within a second-order regimentation of domains, with the lower (empirical) domain as ontologically preferred.
There are further concepts to which we are led, not by our faculty of understanding and the forms of judgment, but by our faculty of reason and its forms of inference. In distinction to categories, which are applicable to the domain of our experience, the concepts of the faculty of reason do not have their corresponding objects given in our intuition; their correspondents can only be purported objects “in themselves” (Dinge an sich), which transcend all our experience. A concept of the “unconditioned” (“absolute,” referring to the totality of conditions) for a given “conditioned” thing or state is termed by Kant a transcendental idea. Transcendental ideas, although going beyond our experience, have a regulative role to direct and lead our empirical thought towards the paradigm of the unconditioned synthetic unity of knowledge. According to the three species of inference of reason (categorical, hypothetical, and disjunctive), there are three classes of transcendental ideas (B 391, 438‒443):
(1) the unconditioned unity of the subject (the idea of the “thinking self”) that is not a predicate of any further subject;
(2) the unconditioned unity of the series of conditions of appearance (the idea of “world”), which further divides into four ideas in correspondence with the four classes of categories:
(a) the unconditioned completeness of the composition of the whole of appearances,
(b) the unconditioned completeness of the division of a given whole in appearance,
(c) the unconditioned completeness of the causal series of an appearance,
(d) the unconditioned completeness of the dependence of appearances regarding their existence;
(3) the unconditioned unity of the ground of all objects of thinking, in accordance with the principle of complete determination of an object regarding each possible predicate (the idea of “being of all beings”).
These transcendental ideas are in a natural way connected with a dialectic of our faculty of reason, where reason aims towards the knowledge of empirically unverifiable objects (B 397‒398).
(1) Through transcendental paralogisms, we come to think of the formal subject of our thought as of a substance.
(2) Through the antinomies of pure reason, the following opposites (seeming contradictions) remain undecided:
(a) the world has a beginning – the world is infinite;
(b) each composed thing consists of simple parts – there is nothing simple in things (they are infinitely divisible);
(c) there is a causality of freedom – everything happens according to the laws of nature;
(d) there is an absolutely necessary being – everything is contingent.
(3) The ideal of pure reason leads us to found the principle of complete determination on the idea of the most perfect being. In addition, Kant assumes here that “existence” is not a real predicate—that is, it does not contribute to the determination of a thing.
Kant insists on separating and excluding (1) the formal logical subject (“I think”) of all our thought from the empirical objects (substances) about which the subject can think; (2) the domain of experience from the members of this domain; and (3) the totality of concepts applicable to the domain from these concepts themselves. Thus, Kant’s transcendental dialectic includes and deals with logical problems connected with the possible disregarding of what we could today call type-theoretical distinctions and the distinction between a theory and its metatheory.
Let us add a methodological remark about the relationship between mathematical and transcendental logical knowledge. The rigor of mathematical evidence (intuitive certainty, B 762) is based, according to Kant, on the possibility of constructing mathematical concepts in intuition. This construction can be ostensive (geometric) or “symbolic” (“characteristic”, B 745, 762, as in arithmetic and algebra). However, as Kant points out, this is not available for transcendental logic, where knowledge should also be apodictic and a priori, but confined to the abstract, conceptual “exposition” (without a construction in intuition, albeit with an application of concepts to intuition). For this reason, definitions and demonstrations in the strictest sense are possible in mathematics, but not in transcendental logic (B 758‒759, 762‒763).
Although Kant’s logic, if taken literally, is in form and content largely traditional as well as significantly dependent on the science of his time, it offered new essential and foundational perspectives that are deeply (and often unknowingly) built into modern logic.
Kant required a formal, though not mathematical, rigor in logic, purifying it of psychological and anthropological admixtures. This rigor was required in two ways: (a) in the sense of functionally defined logical forms, and (b) in the sense of a systematic, scientific form of logic. Kant’s transcendental logic is characterized by the strict distinction of formal logical and metaphysical aspects of concepts, as well as by defined standards of the justification of concepts and of their application in an empirical model of knowledge. Nevertheless, Kant strictly separated mathematical and philosophical rigor. It is in the aspect of the possibilities of the “symbolic construction” of concepts that modern logic has made great advances in comparison to Kant’s logic.
Let us give some examples of Kant’s influence on the posterior development of logic and philosophy.
Kant’s table of judgments influenced a large part of traditional or reformed traditional logic deep into the 20th century. Besides, although Frege criticized Kant’s table of judgment as contentual and grammatical, in Frege’s distinction between “judging” and the content of judgment, Kant’s distinction between modality and the logical content of the judgment can be traced. Kant’s restriction of the importance of categorical judgments, with an emphasis also on the logical relation between judgments, announced the future development of truth-functional propositional logic. Kant’s criterion of sensible intuition for the givenness of objects inspired Hilbert’s finitistic formalism with “concrete signs” and their shapes as the immediately intuitively given of his metamathematics. Kant’s foundational theory of the unity of apperception (in application to time) inspired the emergence of intuitionism (Brouwer). Kant’s undecidability of geometry by analytic means, properly corrected and reinterpreted, anticipates Gödel’s incompleteness results.
Kant’s distinctions of the analytic and the synthetic, and of the a priori and the a posteriori, had a deep impact on philosophical and mathematical logic, and have delineated an important part of philosophical discussions after Kant. Frege especially praised Kant’s analytic-synthetic distinction, despite his departure from Kant, according to whom arithmetic was, like geometry, synthetic. The analytic-synthetic distinction was a crucial subject of discussion and revision, for example, in Carnap‘s, Gödel’s, Quine‘s, and Kripke’s philosophies of logic, language, and knowledge.
Kant’s duality of the conceptual system and empirical model, with differentiated logical (and ontological) orders of concepts and their (intended) corresponding objects, already leads into the area of solving logical antinomies and of incompleteness (see Tiles 2004). With his conception of successively upgrading logical laws (from the law of contradiction, to the law of sufficient reason, to the law of excluded middle), Kant implicitly offered a general picture of possible logics that exceeds classical logic—as far as it was possible with the tools available to him. His logical foundations of philosophy can still inspire modern logical-philosophical investigations.
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Institute of Philosophy, Zagreb