Immanuel Kant: Transcendental Idealism
Transcendental idealism is one of the most important sets of claims defended by Immanuel Kant (1724–1804), in the Critique of Pure Reason. According to this famous doctrine, we must distinguish between appearances and things in themselves, that is, between that which is mind-dependent and that which is not. In Kant’s view, human cognition is limited to objects that somehow depend on our minds (namely, appearances), whereas the mind-independent world (things in themselves) lies beyond the limits of our experience and cognition. The doctrine of transcendental idealism is fundamental to Kant’s entire critical philosophy: its adoption marks the distinction that is typically drawn between Kant’s “pre-critical” phase (preceding the publication of the Critique of Pure Reason, that is, Kant’s first Critique) and his “critical” phase (typically taken to start—in its full-blown form—with the first Critique and to extend to all works produced thereafter). For this reason, the term ‘transcendental idealism’ is sometimes used in a (perhaps unduly) broad sense to refer to Kant’s critical philosophy in general. Kant himself uses the term in the more specific sense just outlined, which rests on the distinction between appearances and things in themselves. How and to what extent this distinction is linked to other major views and arguments in Kant’s critical philosophy is a question that has no easy or uncontroversial answer.
The focus of this article is Kant’s transcendental idealism (in the strict sense of the term) from the perspective of Kant’s theoretical philosophy and the first Critique in particular. Transcendental idealism is certainly one of the most vigorously discussed Kantian views, and there is a—sometimes astonishing—lack of consensus in these discussions. Substantial controversies concern interpretive questions (for example: What does the doctrine mean? What are the arguments that Kant formulates in its favor? How are we to understand these arguments exactly?) as well as philosophical questions (for example: How good are the arguments? Is the resulting view coherent?). To do justice to the deeply controversial nature of the issues discussed here, this article begins (Section 1) with an overview of key claims and arguments as presented by Kant in the first Critique to inform the reader about the key texts and considerations with respect to transcendental idealism, without straying into deeper issues of interpretation and evaluation. The remainder of the article introduces controversial interpretive and philosophical questions surrounding these texts, claims, and arguments. Section 2 discusses Kant’s argument(s) for transcendental idealism, as well as some relevant issues that have sparked heated debate. The following two sections focus on the doctrine itself—that is, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves—as opposed to the argument intended to establish its truth. Section 3 discusses questions and controversies related to the first part of the distinction, namely the status of Kantian appearances. Section 4 then focuses on the second part of this distinction, namely the status of Kantian things in themselves. The article concludes with some general remarks (Section 5) and references for further reading (Section 6).
Table of Contents
- Transcendental Idealism in the Critique of Pure Reason
- The Argument(s) for Transcendental Idealism and Some Related Disputes
- The Ideality of Space and Time
- Beyond Space and Time: Sensibility, Understanding, and the Case for Idealism
- Controversies with Respect to the Status of Kantian Appearances
- Controversies with Respect to the Status of Kantian Things in Themselves
- Concluding Remarks
- References and Further Reading
In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant develops and advocates the doctrine of transcendental idealism: we can have cognition only within the realm of experience; objects in this realm, that is, empirical objects, are mind-dependent. Kant calls such objects ‘appearances’ (in German: Erscheinungen), which are to be contrasted with ‘things in themselves’ (Ding(e) an sich). In contrast to ‘appearances’, the terms ‘thing in itself’ and ‘things in themselves’ stand for the mind-independent world. According to Kant’s idealism, things in themselves—the mind-independent world—are beyond our epistemic reach and cannot be an object of cognition (or knowledge) for epistemic agents such as ourselves, that is, human beings (or perhaps finite cognizers more broadly). (Although the terms ‘cognition’ and ‘knowledge’ are used interchangeably in this article, the former is used more commonly. This is an issue to which we return in Section 4.)
The first Critique is an inquiry into the possibility, scope, and limits of a priori cognition, that is, cognition that is pre-empirical and as such independent of experience—in a suitably qualifiable sense of ‘independence’. (Kant has no quarrel with the idea that “all our cognition commences with experience”; this, however, does not yet mean that all cognition “arises from experience” (B1).) (References to the Critique follow the standard A/B edition pagination. References to other Kantian works are cited by the volume and page number of the Academy edition: Immanuel Kant, Gesammelte Schriften, ed. by Preußische Akademie der Wissenschaften, Berlin 1900ff. For information on the translations used, see Section 6.) In the first Critique, Kant distinguishes three faculties of cognition (that is, cognitive powers of the mind)—sensibility, understanding, and reason—which are examined in turn with respect to their potential for a priori cognition. Transcendental idealism is developed within the course of this project, but most notably in the Transcendental Aesthetic, which is the part of the Critique in which Kant’s investigation into the possibility and limits of a priori cognition begins; the focus of this part is on sensibility. Kant’s account of sensibility is, in its entirety, of special relevance for his idealism.
Sensibility is the power of the mind to have intuitions, which are singular, immediate “representations” (that is, mental states) (A19/B33). (As you are reading this article, you are most probably perceiving the computer screen that is in front of you; in Kant’s parlance, you are having an intuition of your computer screen.) Kant asks whether intuitions and sensibility could be said to have a form that is characteristic of human perceiving subjects, allowing us to anticipate some features of objects, independently of our experience of them. He formulates his space and time arguments (A22–25/B37–B41, A30–32/B46–49) and concludes that this is indeed the case. In Kant’s view, space and time are “nothing other than merely forms”: they are somehow subjective, to be attributed to human minds and their workings (as opposed to the mind-independent world) (A26/B42, A32–33/B49–50). In a similar, albeit more negative sense, he speaks of the “transcendental ideality” of space and time: space and time are not entities or properties of the mind-independent world (A27–28/B43–44, A35–36/B52–53). It is thanks to this mind-dependent nature of space that the possibility of mathematical cognition, for example (which, in Kant’s view, is a species of a priori cognition), can be explained (4: 287–288). Kant thinks that his views on space and time have idealist implications for all objects encountered in sensible experience: these objects are spatiotemporal objects and, as such, merely appearances (A30). This claim regarding appearances is often framed as a claim about these objects being representations (of some sort) (ibid.); elsewhere, however, Kant suggests that appearances are the same things as the entities he calls ‘things in themselves’. In any case, a crucial claim of Kant’s idealism is that all our cognition of empirical, spatiotemporal objects amounts only to cognition of appearances, not things in themselves.
In the next major part of the Critique, the Transcendental Analytic, Kant further carries out his project with respect to the possibility and limits of a priori cognition, turning his attention to the second faculty of cognition, namely the understanding. The understanding is the power of the mind that allows us to have concepts, which, in contrast to intuitions, are general representations. (Think of the previous example: the intuition was described as a mental state that represents your very own computer screen; the concept <computer screen> is, by contrast, general: all computer screens, not just your screen, fall under the concept.) In examining the understanding and its concepts, Kant focuses on a priori, non-empirical concepts—that is, concepts that could not arise from mere experience. According to Kant, there are twelve such concepts. These concepts are the “categories”, paradigm cases of which are the concept of substance and the concept of cause and effect (A79–80/B105–106). Kant’s entire treatment of the understanding has implications for his idealism. The chapter on Phenomena and Noumena at the end of the Analytic explicitly takes up the question of what lessons follow for Kant’s idealism from his overall treatment of the understanding.
A prominent part of this overall treatment, forming the basis of these lessons, is the Transcendental Deduction, in which (A84–130/B116–169) Kant asks how we can legitimately apply non-empirical concepts (such as the concept of causality) to objects. Kant argues that this is possible because the categories function as “conditions of experience”. (‘Experience’ is a technical term in Kant and is synonymous with ‘empirical cognition’.) According to Kant, all objects that can be empirically cognized by finite/human cognizers are constituted in such a way that the categories are valid of them—we can legitimately apply our a priori concepts to them. The way Kant establishes the “objective validity” of the categories has an important implication, however: the objects to which we legitimately apply the categories can only be empirical objects—appearances, not things in themselves (see especially A129–130, B163–165). Again, Kant underlines the transcendental idealist implications of his account of the possibility of a priori cognition (this time in the course of an examination of the faculty of the understanding). It is in the context of this discussion (in the A-version of the Transcendental Deduction, as found in the first, 1781, edition of the Critique) that we encounter some influential Kantian formulations to the effect that the object of our cognition and thought is merely a transcendental object (A108–109).
In the chapter on Phenomena and Noumena (A235–260/B294–315), Kant discusses extensively the transcendental idealist implications of his account and (once again) draws attention to the fact that the domain of application of the categories is the domain of appearances, not things in themselves. Kant contrasts his own conception with earlier approaches (including his own, as it was presented in his Inaugural Dissertation – De mundi from 1770), which frame the distinction between appearances and things in themselves in more traditional terms, namely, as a division between a sensible and an intelligible world, or between phenomena and noumena. Things in themselves, by his account, are not noumena (at least not so far as a specific, “positive”, construal of the term is concerned—this is made clear in the second, 1787, edition of the Critique), and his own (critical) view does not amount to a division between an intelligible world and a sensible world (in the “positive” sense) (A255–256/B311–312).
The Transcendental Dialectic, which follows the Transcendental Analytic, contains the only two explicit definitions of ‘transcendental idealism’ in the entire Critique, and presents further notable considerations in favor of idealism. In this part of the work, Kant’s inquiry into the possibility and limits of a priori cognition concerns the third faculty of cognition, namely reason. Kant’s conception and characterization of reason is complex, but one important idea is that reason is a “faculty of drawing inferences” and a “faculty of principles” (A299/B355–356). (Reason is, among other things, the power of the mind to explore the relationships between propositions, drawing inferences from them: where propositions p and q, for instance, act as premises in a syllogism, proposition r, the conclusion, is drawn thanks to the faculty of reason. It is the task of reason to also move in the other direction: given a proposition p, we could seek further “cognitions”—expressed by further propositions (s, t)—that could serve as premises, such that p is a valid conclusion from them.)
Unlike the previous parts of the Critique, which established the possibility of a priori cognition with respect to the faculties of sensibility and of the understanding, a large part of the Dialectic answers the question of whether a priori cognition through reason is possible in the negative: metaphysica specialis in its traditional form—which had objects such as the soul, the world as a whole, and God—comes under attack. Of special relevance for idealism are the Antinomy chapter (A405–567/B432-595), and a particular section in the Paralogisms chapter (A366–380). (The latter played a historically important role in the reception and interpretation of Kant’s idealism.)
Kant thinks that reason inevitably leads to (a four-fold) antinomy. Some important metaphysical questions (for example, the question of whether the world has a beginning in time, or whether freedom could be compatible with natural necessity) are such that they (seem to) admit contradictory answers: that is, we can formulate good arguments for both a positive and a negative answer to such questions. According to Kant, we shall be confronted with this depressing situation of (equally) good arguments for opposing substantial metaphysical claims so long as we do not embrace transcendental idealism. Only if we accept transcendental idealism shall we have a way out of this situation and thus avoid the “contradiction of reason with itself” (A740/B768). Thus, Kant’s resolution of the antinomy functions as a further, indirect argument for transcendental idealism (A490–496/B518–525, A506–507/B534–535; for an important internal differentiation between the four antinomies that affects how the argument works, see Section 2.a.iii).
It is in this context that we find the second explicit definition of transcendental idealism in the entire Critique. (The first is mentioned shortly.) Kant writes:
We have sufficiently proved in the Transcendental Aesthetic that everything intuited in space or in time, hence all objects of an experience possible for us, are nothing but appearances, i.e., mere representations, which, as they are represented, as extended beings or series of alterations, have outside our thoughts no existence grounded in itself. This doctrine I call transcendental idealism. (A490–491/B518–519)
There is a further section in the Dialectic that is worth mentioning: a section that made its appearance in the A-edition and was so substantially revised in the B-edition that it was practically deleted. In the A-version of the Fourth Paralogism, Kant addresses questions of external world skepticism. Engaging with a “Cartesian” who calls our justification for the belief in an external world into question, Kant seeks to show that the skeptical worry is the product of fallacious reasoning, a “paralogism”. In response to such skeptical worry, Kant invokes transcendental idealism and gives us the first explicit definition of the doctrine in the Critique:
I understand by the transcendental idealism of all appearances the doctrine that they are all together to be regarded as mere representations and not as things in themselves, and accordingly that space and time are only sensible forms of our intuition, but not determinations given for themselves or conditions of objects as things in themselves. (A369)
Kant thinks that adopting this doctrine enables one to undercut the skeptical worry. Immunity to skeptical worries could thus be deemed a further consideration in favor of Kant’s idealism.
This article has thus far looked at Kant’s way of proceeding, the main arguments, and the most relevant passages for establishing and defining transcendental idealism in the first Critique. Before going deeper into controversial questions of interpretation and philosophical assessment in the sections to follow, there is one further general feature of Kant’s transcendental idealism that is worth noting, given that Kant himself highlights it in different ways and in different places. On multiple occasions, Kant insists that transcendental idealism, despite being called ‘idealism’, is somehow less idealist than doctrines that normally fall under that label. When first arguing for his doctrine in the Transcendental Aesthetic—in the A-edition of the Critique—Kant makes it clear that he is defending both the transcendental ideality and the empirical reality of space and time (A27–28/B43–44, A35–36/B52–53). (See also Kant’s take on the relationship between transcendental idealism and empirical realism in A369–370.)
In the Prolegomena, which was published two years after the first edition of the Critique and was meant to summarize the main claims and arguments of the Critique in a more accessible form, Kant elaborates further on the non-idealist features of his position through remarks dedicated to the issue (4: 288–294) and the inclusion of a relevant Appendix (4: 371–383). In this work—in response to initial reactions to his doctrine, which had already seen the light of day—Kant even suggests dropping the term ‘transcendental idealism’ in favor of terms such as ‘critical’ (4: 293–294, 4: 375) and ‘formal idealism’ (4: 375), which he thought to be more accurate/less misleading formulations of his actual views. (See also B519 note.)
In the second, revised edition of the Critique, Kant seeks to clarify matters further and to highlight these non-idealist features by making changes and adding footnotes and remarks that directly concern his idealism. In this context, he emphasizes that his claims about spatiotemporal objects as appearances do not amount to the claim “that these objects would be a mere illusion” (B69–71). He even adds a section called “Refutation of Idealism” (B274–279), in which he opposes idealism by addressing questions of external world skepticism, to replace the Fourth Paralogism section of the A-edition (a section that had already acquired a questionable reputation).
Despite their differences, all of Kant’s attempts to qualify his idealism point in the same direction: Kantian idealism is—at least by intention—supposed to be a moderate brand of idealism, to be distinguished from more radical—and, in Kant’s view, untenable—versions thereof. The label ‘formal idealism’, which Kant presents as an alternative to ‘transcendental idealism’, is informative in this respect. Kant distinguishes between the matter and form of our experience. (This is a distinction made in the very first section of the Transcendental Aesthetic, where Kant begins by discussing sensibility and intuitions and making his case for the claim that time and space are their forms; A19–22/B33–36.) The Kantian claim that time and space are (transcendentally) ideal, and that empirical objects are mind-dependent appearances, is to be understood as a thesis about the form of our experience. Idealism, as a view about the mind-dependence of empirical objects, is not the whole story, however. With regard to the matter of experience, Kant’s view is not meant to be idealist. In a letter to Beck from 1792, Kant reacts to certain criticisms: “I speak of ideality in reference to the form of representation while they [Kant’s critics, Garve and Eberhard] construe it as ideality with respect to the matter, i.e., ideality of the object and its existence itself” (11: 395).
With this general overview of Kant’s idealism, we now are in a position to look more carefully at the main texts, claims, and arguments just presented, paying particular attention to controversial questions of interpretation and philosophical assessment. The next section looks more closely at the argument(s) for idealism, whereas the following two main sections discuss in more detail the doctrine itself.
If there is one set of considerations that is indisputably central to Kant’s case for idealism, it is those relating to time and space that we find in the Aesthetic. A particular focus of this section is thus on the space and time arguments, the ideality of space and time, and related disputes. However, there are important (and controversial) questions to be raised with respect to other considerations (beyond those concerning time and space) that have a role in Kant’s overall case for idealism, which are therefore also addressed in this section.
As we have seen, Kant’s case for the ideality of space and time in the Aesthetic is of fundamental importance for establishing transcendental idealism. His arguments there have attracted considerable attention in the history of the reception of Kant as well as in Kant scholarship. The focus in this subsection is mostly on these arguments; towards the end of the subsection, Kant’s indirect argument for idealism in the Antinomy is also discussed.
Kant rests his case for the ideality of space and time in his so-called “space and time arguments” in the Aesthetic (A22–25/B37–41, A30–32/B46–49), which are intended to show that (representations of) space and time are a priori intuitions. It is worth noting here a subtlety that can have important consequences in our interpretation and that relates to the extent to which Kant’s space and time arguments (up to A25/B41 and A32/B49, respectively) concern merely our representations of space and time (that is, the nature and origin of the mental states of subjects that represent space and time) or, rather, space and time themselves (as the objects represented and as opposed to our representations of them). Although Kant’s own presentation is not always clear in this respect—some of his formulations would suggest that we are talking about space and time themselves—there are good reasons to think that Kant’s considered view is the former. The expression “(representation of) space and time” that is adopted in the following presentation of the space and time arguments is meant to call attention to this subtle and important issue—an issue to which we briefly return in the next subsection.
These arguments underwent some changes in the second edition of the Critique. In the B-edition, which is often thought to present a more helpful version of Kant’s arguments, and is thus the presentation referred to as standard, Kant splits his arguments into two broader categories: he distinguishes a “metaphysical” and a “transcendental exposition” of the concepts of space and time.
The arguments of the first group, the metaphysical exposition, proceed from certain reflections on some features of (our representations of) space and time to make claims about their a priori origin or intuitive nature. Kant thinks, for instance, that we need to presuppose the representation of space to be able to represent objects as “outside” us and “next to one another”. Based on such a consideration, he claims that the representation of space cannot be empirical and must be a priori (A23/B38, first space argument). (For a discussion of the first space argument, see Warren 1998.) Other arguments of this group seek to establish the claim that our representation of space and time is an intuition, as opposed to a concept. A key idea is that, in the case of (our representation of) space, “if one speaks of many spaces, one understands by that only parts of one and the same unique space” (A25/B39, third space argument). (For discussions of these types of arguments, see Allison 2004: 99–116, Falkenstein 1995: 159–252, Vaihinger 1892: 151–263.)
The “transcendental exposition” proceeds in a different way, and, in the case of both space and time, one specific argument is singled out. In the “argument from geometry” (which is the space version of the transcendental exposition, B40–41), the standard interpretation is that Kant is arguing that our representation of space must be an a priori intuition, which he demonstrates by invoking some features that he takes geometrical cognition to have. According to Kant, the sort of truths one establishes when engaging in geometry are necessary (as opposed to contingent) and synthetic (as opposed to analytic; that is, we cannot tell the truth value of geometrical propositions merely on the basis of their meaning). In the most widely accepted reading, Kant argues that our representation of space has to be an a priori intuition, if one wishes to account for these features of geometrical cognition. The argument can thus be described as a regressive transcendental argument that proceeds from certain assumptions (that we have synthetic a priori knowledge in the form of geometrical cognition) and leads to a conclusion (representation of space as an a priori intuition) that is a requirement, or an explanation, for the possibility of the assumed phenomenon. (For a reconstruction along such lines, see, for example, Strawson 1966: 277–278, Van Cleve 1999: 34–43.)
This argument has attracted considerable attention. One question concerns the argumentative weight of this type of (transcendental) consideration in Kant’s overall case for the transcendental ideality of space: it is sometimes thought that this is indeed Kant’s central argument (see, for example, Strawson 1966: 277), whereas some scholars assign more weight to the metaphysical expositions (see, for example, Allison 2004: 116–118). The latter stance can be motivated by the idea that the argument sketched above seems especially vulnerable, as it operates with substantive assumptions that many modern readers would want to reject. (For an alternative reading of the argument that resists reading it as a regressive transcendental argument, see Shabel 2004.)
The space and time arguments aim to establish that (our representations of) space and time are a priori intuitions. Building on these conclusions, Kant proceeds to draw some further conclusions in the section that immediately follows, entitled “Conclusions from the above concepts” (A26–28/B42–44, A32–36/B49–53). It is claimed there that space and time are merely a subjective condition of our sensibility and as such transcendentally ideal. Kant argues that “space represents no property at all of any things in themselves nor any relation of them to each other” (A26/B42); similarly, “time is not something that would subsist for itself or attach to things as an objective determination” (A32/B49). Things in themselves—the mind-independent world—are not in space and time.
These additional—and decisive, since they play a key role in establishing transcendental idealism—conclusions have attracted much criticism and have led to a famous problem. It has been argued that one could accept the time and space arguments and the intermediate conclusion that they establish, and still resist the further conclusion. That is, we could accept that (our representations of) space and time are a priori intuitions (as established in the metaphysical and transcendental expositions) but deem the further conclusion(s) regarding the transcendental ideality of space and time as unwarranted. This sort of criticism is often referred to as the “neglected alternative” charge or the “Trendelenburg’s gap” problem. Kant’s argument for the transcendental ideality of space and time is thought to involve a gap between the conclusion with respect to a priori intuitions and the further conclusion with respect to ideality. Another way of framing the point is to say that Kant failed to acknowledge and argue against an alternative, realist, possibility, namely that, although our representation of space and time has a non-empirical and intuitive nature, the mind-independent world still is in space and time. (The previous subsection mentioned that there is a subtle interpretive issue concerning the question of whether Kant’s concern in the space and time arguments is with our representations of space and time or, rather, with space and time themselves. It can be seen that this subtlety is intimately connected to the neglected alternative problem: how one frames these arguments—as arguments about space and time or, rather, as arguments about our representations of them—has an influence on where exactly and in what precise form the potential gap arises.)
This sort of objection has been raised in different—and perhaps not equivalent—forms against Kant. A much discussed and influential version is to be found in Trendelenburg (1870: 156–168), but considerations along similar lines can be found in some of the earliest responses to the Critique (see, for example, Pistorius 1786 and Pistorius 1788 for a somewhat different version of the neglected alternative charge). Similarly, Kantian defenses against this type of charge can assume different forms. A particularly heated debate from Kantian and anti-Kantian perspectives was conducted in 19th-century Germany (and is described, going back to the very early reception of the Critique, in Vaihinger 1892: 134–151). Contemporary Kant scholarship sees Kant’s distinctive account of intuitions, and the way he understands the distinction between sensibility and understanding in general, as key to understanding (and justifying) the move from the intermediate conclusion about (our representations of) space and time as a priori intuitions to the further conclusion about the ideality of space and time. (For treatments of the neglected alternative charge that focus on the intuitive nature of our representation of space and time, and how Kant understands this as key, see Allais 2015: 145–204, Willaschek 1997. For further discussions of the neglected alternative, see Falkenstein 1995: 289–309 and Allison 2004: 128–132.)
As a concluding remark on the problem of the neglected alternative, it is worth reminding ourselves of a feature of Kant’s case for idealism in the Critique that was mentioned above: the Aesthetic presents us with the direct, and central, argument, but Kant also claims to have provided us with an indirect argument for idealism in the Antinomy chapter of the Dialectic. Thus, even if the direct argument were faced with (insurmountable) difficulties, one might think that the indirect argument might fare better. For this reason, we shall now briefly turn to this further, indirect argument in favor of idealism.
Kant thinks that reason is faced with an antinomial conflict. The antinomial conflict arises with respect to the following questions: Does the world have a beginning in time and bounds in space (first antinomy, A426–433/B454/461)? Do composite substances consist of simple parts (second antinomy, A434–443/B462–471)? Could (or should) causality in accordance with the laws of nature be combined with a different kind of causality, namely causality through freedom (third antinomy, A444–451/B472–479)? Does a necessary being belong to the world (fourth antinomy, A452–461/B480–489)?
These questions (seem to) admit contradictory answers, supported by (equally) good arguments, and it is in this that the conflict resides. The “thesis” and the “antithesis”, as the two conflicting claims in response to the questions in each of the four cases, along with the arguments that are supposed to establish their truth, are the two sides of the antinomial conflict. Kant thinks that the conflict can be resolved (only) if we accept transcendental idealism; his resolution of the antinomy thus serves as an indirect argument for his idealism. This is the general picture—for a more specific sense of how the indirect argument works, it is helpful to take note of an important internal differentiation among the four questions/antinomies; namely, we ought to distinguish between the mathematical antinomies (first and second antinomies) and the dynamical antinomies (third and fourth antinomies).
Kant’s way of resolving the antinomial conflict is quite different with respect to each of these. In the case of mathematical antinomies, he argues that the thesis and the antithesis are merely contraries, not contradictories. (Contradictories always differ in truth value—if there is opposition in the sense of ‘contradiction’ between two claims, then it has to be the case that one of the opposing claims is true and the other one is false; by contrast, when the opposing claims are merely contraries, they both can be false, although they cannot both be true.) Kant takes the view that both the thesis as well as the antithesis are actually false, and that a third option emerges, once one accepts transcendental idealism. In the case of dynamical antinomies, the strategy differs. Kant argues that there is a sense in which both the thesis as well as the antithesis are true, and that the seemingly conflicting claims of each side of the conflict are in fact compatible (A528–532/B556–560). Because of these differences in strategy, there is a sense in which only the resolution of the mathematical antinomies could lay claim to being an “indirect proof” of transcendental idealism (A502–507/B530–535), given that it is supposed to be a reductio ad absurdum of the opposite of transcendental idealism (transcendental realism), elevating transcendental idealism to a necessary condition for avoiding the contradictory implications of the alternative. The dynamical antinomies are still supposed to play an invaluable role in Kant’s case for idealism, however, because the appeal to idealism is at least a sufficient condition for resolving the antinomial conflict that would otherwise arise in this case. (For an account of Kant’s resolution of the antinomy, which is followed closely in this presentation here, along with a discussion of some criticisms of Kant’s resolution, see Allison 2004: 384–395. See also Chiba 2012: 130–158 and 252–332.)
It is thus clear and indisputable that Kant’s considerations in the Antinomy play an important dialectical role, motivating the case for transcendental idealism. Kant himself takes special note of the dialectical role of the antinomy, when he writes, for instance (in a Letter to Garve from 1798), that the point from which he started was “the antinomy of pure reason” (as opposed to “the investigation of the existence of God, of immortality, and so on”); “that is what first aroused” him “from the dogmatic slumber” and drove him “to the critique of reason itself, in order to fix the scandal of ostensible contradiction of reason with itself” (12: 257–258). (Note that in a further famous remark in Prolegomena 4: 260, Kant says that it was David Hume that interrupted his dogmatic slumber. For a discussion of Hume’s role in the Kantian project, see Watkins 2005: 363–389.) In a so-called “Reflexion”, Kant speaks of the system of the Critique of Pure Reason as revolving “around 2 cardinal points: as system of nature and of freedom, each of which leads to the necessity of the other. – The ideality of space and time and the reality of the concept of freedom, from each of which one is unavoidably led to the other analytically” (Reflexion 6353, 18: 679). He goes on to establish some connections with his practical philosophy, but, in any case, the passage indirectly points to the crucial connection between the (third) antinomy and Kant’s idealism.
It is clear that the Antinomy is supposed to strengthen the case of transcendental idealism. How should we assess the arguments there from a philosophical perspective? We started the discussion about the Antinomy as a possible reaction to the problem of the neglected alternative with respect to the ideality of time and space presented above. Given that issues around space and time have a major role in the Antinomy, and that the Antinomy is supposed to furnish us with an indirect argument for idealism, the considerations there could be deemed directly relevant for this kind of problem. However, there might be some problems with invoking the Antinomy in response to this sort of problem. A case can be made for the view that the Antinomy does not concern the nature of time and space as such, but the relationship between the world, on the one hand, and space and time, on the other. (This is emphasized, for example, in Al-Azm 1972, throughout the analysis of the antinomies, which does not focus on the more specific issue of idealism; see especially p. 8.) In relation to this, the claim for which the Antinomy clearly functions as an indirect argument is not the transcendental ideality of time and space as such, but a more general core claim of transcendental idealism, namely that empirical objects (that is, the world we experience and cognize) are appearances, not things in themselves—the world of our experience and cognition is a mind-dependent world.
In any case, even if the Antinomy does not afford a solution to the neglected alternative problem, it is still a major indirect argument for idealism, understood more broadly as the idea that the empirical world is a world of appearances. It has traditionally been thought that the indirect case for idealism in the Antinomy is less likely to convince than the direct argument in the Aesthetic. Questions can be raised as to whether the resolution of the antinomy really depends on idealism or, rather, on key thoughts with respect to reason and sensibility that could be disentangled from it. (For a discussion of such questions see Wood et al. 2007. For the relevant exchange between Wood and Allison, see pp. 1–10 and 24–31, as well as Allison’s treatment of the Antinomy mentioned above. For an extensive treatment of the antinomy in its relationship to idealism, and in particular of how it lends support to a particular interpretation of Kant’s idealism, see Chiba’s discussion of the antinomy referred to above. For a critical analysis of the Second Antinomy that establishes some explicit connections with the role of idealism in the resolution of the antinomy, see Van Cleve 1999: 6–272. For a further treatment of the antinomy and its relationship to idealism, albeit embedded in a broader discussion of other issues, see Ameriks 1992.) A further source of worry concerns the antinomy itself (the conflict between the thesis and the antithesis) and whether it arises in the first place. The whole idea of the resolution of the antinomy is that we desperately need idealism to come to the rescue, but if the arguments of the thesis or the antithesis that are supposed to establish the conflicting claims are not sufficiently good, then no rescue would be needed at all. (For an overview of criticisms concerning the potential of these arguments to establish the claims they purport to establish and thus generate the antinomy in the first place—along with some responses from a Kantian perspective—see Allison 2004: 366–384. A notable type of criticism that has been voiced concerns the following problem: the arguments for the thesis or the antithesis, which should lead to a conflict to be resolved by appeal to transcendental idealism, could be taken to presuppose transcendental idealism themselves. If the very same claims that are supposed to be established in the course of the argument in the Antinomy were already presupposed by it, then such an argument in favor of idealism would of course be profoundly unsatisfactory. For versions of this type of criticism, see Kreimendahl 1998: 424–444.)
Against this background, a—not particularly ambitious—line of defense would be to assign to the indirect argument in the Antinomy a more heuristic, dialectical role in Kant’s case for idealism. One could view the considerations in the Antinomy as genetically important for motivating the case for idealism and historically alerting Kant to its potential merits; this would be compatible with letting the justificatory burden be carried by the direct argument in the Aesthetic. (Such an option is briefly discussed—without being adopted—in Jauernig 2021: 348–353, esp. 350–1.)
What is controversial about Kant’s case for idealism is not only how to assess and interpret his direct and indirect arguments for idealism, but also whether these two types of arguments are indeed the only considerations on which Kant rests his case, or rather, whether further considerations play an essential role. It is to such questions that we now turn.
Transcendental idealism is the claim that all empirical objects, objects in space and time, are mind-dependent, and that we cannot cognize the mind-independent world. We have taken a look at arguments that put time and space center stage in order to establish this doctrine: the reason why we should think that the empirical, spatiotemporal world is a mind-dependent world is the fact that time and space are mind-dependent; this is the central idea in the Aesthetic. (In the case of the indirect argument in the Antinomy, things are somewhat trickier, as mentioned above.)
In any case, there are two notable sets of considerations in the Critique that clearly do not concern the status of space and time and are worth discussing here: one rests on Kant’s generic views on sensibility, quite independently of his specific views on time and space; the other rests on Kant’s account of the understanding and, in particular, the role that his views on a priori concepts and their objective validity play in his idealism.
As we have seen, the Aesthetic discusses the faculty of cognition called ‘sensibility’. Kant asks whether intuitions and sensibility could be said to have a form that is characteristic of human perceiving subjects; space and time are then shown to be “nothing other than merely forms”, and it is on such grounds that transcendental idealism is established. But there is a different kind of key thought, operative at the level of sensibility but independent of considerations relating to space and time, which could be taken to lead to idealism. These key thoughts pertain to the “matter” (as opposed to the “form”) of experience. Sensibility is “the receptivity of our mind to receive representations insofar as it is affected in some way” (A51/B75). Kant begins his account of sensibility in the Aesthetic by noting that objects affect us, that is, have a (causal) impact on us, thereby supplying us with sensations. These sensations are “impressions” supplied by the senses; Kantian empirical intuitions have the form of space and time, and—as opposed to a priori intuitions—include the “material” component of sensations; through “affection” by objects we thus “receive” the “matter” of experience (A19–20/B33–34).
These thoughts on sensibility, affection, receptivity, and matter could be said to be intimately connected to idealism, quite independently of the views one holds with respect to space and time specifically. In fact, in his proto-critical Inaugural Dissertation, Kant explicitly states considerations with respect to affection and how the “representative state” of different subjects is “modified” differently by the presence of objects “according to the variations in the subjects”, as sufficient reason for the conclusion that, through the senses we represent only “things as they appear, while things which are intellectual are representations of things as they are” (2: 392). It is only a few sections later that Kant goes on to present considerations regarding time and space, which closely parallel his arguments with respect to space and time in the Aesthetic of the Critique (2: 398–406). (In the main body of the Critique, the claim that the sensible world is a world of appearances, not things in themselves, is introduced—at least explicitly/officially—as a conclusion that only follows from the specific considerations with respect to space and time in the Aesthetic.)
The idea that a generic feature of sensibility, as opposed to specific considerations with respect to space and time, leads to Kantian idealism is an influential but controversial reading. One could describe an argument for idealism that bypasses specific considerations with respect to space and time as a “short argument to idealism”. (This is an expression used in Ameriks 1990, where the early reception of Kant’s idealism by figures such as Reinhold and Fichte is described as resting on such an idea and is criticized on precisely such grounds; see also Ameriks 2003: 134–158. Some versions of “short” arguments rest the case for idealism on Kant’s account of the understanding and its concepts as opposed to Kant’s (specific) account of sensibility and its forms; see Ameriks 1992. For a prominent reading that interprets Kant’s idealism as turning on generic considerations with respect to sensibility, see Strawson 1966: 250.) Although readings that attribute to Kant a “short argument” have come under criticism as an interpretation of Kant, not everyone in contemporary Kant scholarship agrees that not focusing on space and time is a problem. In the influential interpretation of Kant’s idealism developed in Langton 1998, it is argued extensively, on exegetical and philosophical grounds, that Kant’s idealism follows from his distinctive views on sensibility, receptivity, and affection. (See esp. pp. 43–47 and 210–218.)
Although transcendental idealism is already established in the Aesthetic, that is, the part of the Critique that concerns sensibility, Kant’s treatment of the understanding and its a priori concepts is of particular importance—and arguably presupposed and anticipated in the Aesthetic—for establishing idealism. As we saw in Section 1, the objects to which we legitimately apply the categories can only be empirical objects, appearances, not things in themselves. This is certainly crucial for establishing transcendental idealism; however, the exact relationship between Kant’s account of the understanding and his idealism raises difficult interpretive and philosophical questions. The presentation of Kant’s argument(s) for idealism and related disputes shall be concluded by taking note of two such central questions. (For a series of contributions on transcendental idealism, where the (contested) role of the categories and the understanding takes center stage, see Schulting and Verburgt 2011, in particular the contributions on “transcendental idealism and logic”.)
With regard to interpretation, it is clear that a specific Kantian view of the understanding is necessary to establish one of the key claims of transcendental idealism, namely the non-cognizability of things in themselves: Kantian idealism requires the view that the understanding and its concepts cannot supply us with cognition of things in themselves. The more optimistic view, according to which the understanding can supply us with such cognition, would be a view that Kant himself held in his Inaugural Dissertation and abandoned in the Critique. As previously mentioned, the Inaugural Dissertation contains considerations with respect to the ideality of space and time which closely parallel Kant’s arguments with respect to space and time in the Critique. In the Inaugural Dissertation, Kant already thought that sensibility presents us with appearances, not things in themselves. But he thought simultaneously that the understanding does allow us to cognize things in themselves; hence, although cognitive access to the mind-independent world was precluded with respect to sensibility, the understanding did provide a route to this mind-independent world. It is precisely this view of the understanding that marks this work as “pre-critical”, whereas Kant’s view of sensibility as developed there already broadly corresponds to the “critical” view of the Critique, thus leading to the distinctive “proto-critical” status of the work as a whole.
The indisputable fact that Kant changes his view in the Critique could be interpreted as a rather radical break: one possible (and influential) reading is to interpret Kant’s treatment of the understanding and his claims with respect to a priori concepts as essentially parallel to his treatment of sensibility and his claims with respect to a priori intuitions. In such an understanding, we would essentially have two Kantian arguments for idealism: one argument that establishes the mind-dependence of purely “sensible” properties (such as spatiotemporal properties) in the Aesthetic and another that establishes a similar result with respect to a different kind of property, those that are described by means of the a priori concepts of the understanding (the categories) and could thus be called ‘categorial’—for example being a cause or a substance—in the Analytic. Even if Kant had not written a word on sensibility and space and time, he would still be committed to the view that the objects we cognize are mind-dependent appearances, not things in themselves, on the grounds of his distinctive account of the understanding and categorial properties; he would be committed to a form of conceptual idealism. (For a description of this kind of view, see Allais 2015: 292–303. This is not a view endorsed by Allais.)
In contrast to this interpretation, an alternative—and more moderate—reading of the kind of rupture between the “pre-critical” and “critical” Kant could operate along the following lines: the mind-dependence of objects of cognition and their properties—including categorial properties—is not to be attributed to the contribution of the understanding per se; it is instead to be attributed to the Kantian view that cognition requires the contribution of both the understanding and sensibility (A51–52/B75–76), so that the understanding alone is not sufficient. We cannot cognize the mind-independent world because we can have no intuition of it as such. (For this kind interpretation, see Allais 2015: esp. 292–303. For a defense of the claim that the central arguments in the Analytic cannot establish the mind-dependence of categorial properties, see Watkins 2002. The critique of “short arguments” for idealism in Ameriks 1990, 1992 is of relevance here as well.)
Related questions also arise at a more philosophical level. Kant’s (otherwise) valuable project in the Analytic has often been thought to be too intimately connected to his idealism. This has led to the influential view that one should try, from a philosophical perspective and with all due respect to Kant himself, to disentangle two aspects of Kant’s treatment that seem closely linked to each other in the Critique: (i) Kant’s defense of some a priori, non-empirical elements in our cognition of objects of experience, and (ii) the additional, idealist claim that objects of experience thus have to be mind-dependent. (For this kind of approach see Strawson 1966: esp. 15–24, Guyer 1987, Westphal 2004: 68–126.) How one could react to this sort of criticism from a Kantian perspective depends partly on how one interprets the exact relationship between Kant’s account of the understanding and his idealism in the first place; there are connections between this philosophical criticism and the more exegetical point of controversy presented above.
Some prominent philosophical and interpretive issues that surround Kant’s argument(s) for transcendental idealism have now been considered. We shall now take a closer look at the doctrine itself.
Transcendental idealism is a set of claims about appearances and things in themselves. Even independently of how one argues for this doctrine, there are additional, and difficult, questions concerning the doctrine itself: what does the distinction between appearances and things in themselves amount to, exactly, and how are we to understand the claim about the non-cognizability of the latter? A host of controversies surrounds these questions, and the rest of this article is dedicated to some of them. To understand the distinction between appearances and things in themselves, one, naturally, has to get a grip on issues that pertain to appearances as well as issues pertaining to things in themselves; these issues are often interconnected. For the purposes of presentation, we shall try to focus on each of these two sets of issues in turn. In this section, the focus is on Kant’s doctrine of appearances—that is, the status of mind-dependent objects—whereas the next section focuses on the doctrine of things in themselves—that is, the status of the mind-independent world according to Kant.
In the course of this discussion of Kantian appearances, we look at (part of) an influential objection to transcendental idealism—namely that it is too radical—and are introduced to a famous controversy in Kant scholarship, the debate between “one-world” and “two-world” interpretations of Kant’s idealism.
According to Kant, the empirical, spatiotemporal world is a world of appearances, not things in themselves; appearances, as opposed to things in themselves, somehow depend on minds. That much is clear. The doctrine has traditionally raised some eyebrows. As shown above, Kant’s idealism is intended to be a moderate version of idealism, to be distinguished from more radical—and in Kant’s view highly unattractive—versions thereof. Readers of the Critique have often felt that this is not quite the case and that transcendental idealism is, at least by implication, more radical than advertised. (The very first readers focused on precisely this sort of problem and inaugurated a long tradition of such worries; see especially Feder and Garve 1782, Jacobi 2004 . For a collection of early critical responses to Kant, in English translation, see Sassen 2000.) The concern has also been voiced that Kant himself openly admits sometimes how radical his idealism is, for instance in the Fourth Paralogism in the A-edition of the Critique. It is there that we find the first official definition of transcendental idealism, which is enlisted as a solution to the problem of external world skepticism. Kant (in)famously says there that “external objects (bodies) are merely appearances, hence also nothing other than a species of my representations, whose objects are something only through these representations, but are nothing separated from them” (A 370). In the historically dominant reading, Kant pursues an anti-skeptical strategy of a Berkeleyan stripe, aiming to secure our belief in the existence of the external world by reducing this world to a mind-dependent, mental entity to which we have privileged access. This strategy is often thought to be too radical and unattractive. (For readings of Kant’s Fourth Paralogism along such lines see Jacobi 2004 : 103–106, Kemp Smith 1923: 304–305, Turbayne 1955: 228–239.)
The radical idealism charge is general and complex and has been framed in a number of ways—but there is a famous problem that has played a particularly important role in framing this sort of criticism, which merits special mention. Kant starts presenting his account of sensibility (in the Aesthetic) by speaking about objects that affect us, that is, that have a (causal) impact on us, thereby supplying us with sensations—in this sense they supply us with the “matter” of experience. The affecting object-talk soon raised the question: what object are we talking about here? Given Kant’s distinction between appearances and things in themselves, it is natural to think that there are two candidates: the objects that affect human minds are either appearances or things in themselves. The concern has been raised that both options are untenable, the principal worries being (i) that objects as appearances are simply not fit for purpose, and (ii) that embracing the claim that things in themselves are the affecting objects would lead to serious problems and inconsistencies in the Kantian system. (For a classical statement of the problem see Jacobi 2004 ; see also Vaihinger 1892: 35–55.)
For the purposes of this section, we shall briefly look at the first option. The reason for appearances being considered unfit for purpose has to do with what it means for something to be an appearance. If we understand Kantian appearances as representations in human minds—as Kant himself sometimes says, and as some readers that point to this sort of problem do—then we would get the following picture: The “objects” that have a causal impact on minds (“affect” minds), thereby serving as sources of some mental states in these minds, namely their sensations, would themselves be mental states. This problem is intimately connected to the radical idealism charge and serves to illustrate it. From the point of view of commonsense realism, your mental state of perceiving a computer screen right now is (at least in part) the effect of there actually being an object out there, which is not itself a mental state in some human mind, but a “real” object, that is, an actual computer screen, or something close to it. In the kind of Kantian picture just sketched, however, there seem to be no such objects at all—and even if they exist, we are fundamentally cut off from them—and all we have are minds and their mental states.
In the kind of Kantian picture just presented, Kant’s talk of appearances as representations is taken at face value. Kantian appearances are mind-dependent, in the sense of being mind-immanent; they are taken to be mental states in our minds (or some construction out of such states). This reading was prevalent in the early reception of Kant, but subsequently it has been openly called into question by Kant scholars, leading to a debate that has shaped contemporary discussions of Kant’s idealism: the debate between so-called “one-world” and “two-world” interpretations of Kant’s idealism.
The interpretation of the mind-dependence of appearances just described has been subsequently characterized as a two-world interpretation of Kant’s idealism: the main idea behind this characterization is that such entities, in being mental states (of some sort), are to be contrasted with mind-transcendent, external world objects that would somehow exist “behind” the veil of appearances. In this kind of picture, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves amounts to a distinction between numerically distinct entities that form two disjoint sets. It is in this sense that we end up with two “worlds”: the world of mental states (appearances) on the one hand, and the world of mind-transcendent objects (things in themselves) on the other. This sort of interpretation of the mind-dependence of appearances is also often called ‘phenomenalist’, as it somehow “mentalizes” Kantian appearances. (For some (older) interpretations of Kant’s idealism along such lines see, for example, Strawson 1966: 256–263, Vaihinger 1892: 51, as well as the interpretations by early readers of Kant mentioned above, such as Jacobi, Feder and Garve. There have also been some newer interpretations that fall under the category, which explicitly react to the alternative that is discussed shortly and which are mentioned again further below; see Guyer 1987: 333–344, Van Cleve 1999: esp. 8–12 and 143–150, Stang 2014, and Jauernig 2021.) In any analysis of phenomenalist interpretations of Kantian appearances, one should also take note of the fact that, strictly speaking, not all such interpretations subscribe to the claim that Kantian appearances are mental states; in some versions, appearances are some sort of intentional object of our representations. (This is the case with respect to Jauernig’s interpretation; Van Cleve’s view of appearances as “virtual objects” is also closer to this reading; see also Aquila 1979, Robinson 1994, Robinson 1996 and Sellars 1968: 31–53, where an intentional object view is upheld.) In any case, two-world interpreters agree that Kantian appearances are not—strictly speaking—mind-transcendent, external world objects. (It is on the basis of this criterion that some readings are classified here as two-world readings, despite the fact that their proponents stress their differences from (traditional/standard) two-world readings, or even want to resist such a classification altogether, as is the case with Guyer’s remarks in Wood et al. 2007: 12–13, for example.)
This sort of interpretation is highly controversial and has come under attack by readers who argue for a one-world interpretation of Kant’s idealism. In the alternative reading, Kant’s talk of appearances as representations is not to be taken at face value: appearances are not to be understood as (constructions out of) mental states, and the relevant sense of mind-dependence is not mind-immanence. In this contrasting view, Kantian appearances are not just “in our minds”. This view results in a one-world interpretation of transcendental idealism, which has also been dubbed a “double-aspect” view. The main idea is that appearances are external world objects that are numerically identical to things as they are in themselves. (For some related remarks on the endorsement of the numerical identity claim by one-world theorists, see Section 3.b.ii.) The distinction between appearances and things in themselves does not amount to a distinction between distinct entities; rather, it is a distinction between different “aspects” of one and the same object. Since the 1980s, one-world interpretations of transcendental idealism have become increasingly popular.
Talk of aspects can be metaphorical, and the way one construes it can make a big difference to our understanding. In some of the first (explicit) formulations of one-world interpretations, talk of aspects was understood as talk about different ways of considering things: the very same object is taken to be an appearance, when considered in its relation to epistemic subjects, and a thing in itself, when considered independently of such a relation. Interpretations that understand the distinction in this way are often called ‘methodological’ or ‘epistemic’. (Interpretations along such lines have been proposed in Bird 1962, Prauss 1974, Allison 1983 and 2004. It is common to characterize methodological readings in terms of abstraction: we distinguish between appearances and things in themselves, because we abstract from the objects as appearances and the conditions of knowing them; see, for example, Guyer’s characterization of Allison’s view in Wood et al. 2007: 11–18. For some thoughts that complicate this picture, however, see Allison’s reaction: ibid., 32–39.)
This way of understanding the distinction contrasts with a metaphysical reading of Kant’s idealism. In that reading, the distinction between appearances and things in themselves concerns how things are, not how we consider them. From the perspective of a metaphysical version of one-world interpretations of transcendental idealism, the distinction between “two aspects of one and the same object” is to be understood as a distinction between two different sets of properties. There are different ways of understanding the distinction between these two sets of properties: for instance, as a distinction between relational properties on the one hand and intrinsic properties on the other hand—or a related distinction between essentially manifest qualities and intrinsic natures of things. Another example is a distinction between dispositional properties, one the hand, and categorical ones, on the other. (For different metaphysical accounts of the distinctions that illustrate each of these options, see Langton 1998: esp. 15–40, Allais 2007, 2015: 116–144 and 230–258, and Rosefeldt 2007. For a helpful discussion of the distinction between appearances and things in themselves that broadly falls in the one-world camp, see Onof 2019. For one of the oldest interpretations that is often read as a one-world account avant la lettre, see Adickes 1924: esp. 20–27.) The main idea of the one-world reading, in its metaphysical construal, is that the bearer of mind-dependent properties (appearance) and the bearer of mind-independent properties (thing in itself) are the very same object.
One-world interpretations have not gone unchallenged; both methodological as well as metaphysical versions have received thoroughgoing criticism. (Objections against Allison’s influential methodological reading have been raised, for instance, by Guyer and Van Cleve, who think that the two-world interpretation is ultimately correct; see Guyer 1987: 336–342, Van Cleve 1999: 6–8. See also the recently mentioned exchange between Guyer and Allison in Wood et al. 2007. For a further critique of methodological readings, which is also sympathetic to two-world readings, see Chiba 2012: 72–88.) Metaphysical versions of one-world interpretations are themselves partly a reaction to the problems of methodological one-world readings, as methodological readings were the first full-blown versions of one-world interpretations. (For some criticism of methodological interpretations from the perspective of metaphysical one-world interpretations, see Allais 2015: 77–97, Langton 1998: 7–14; see also Westphal 2001.) A rejection of methodological readings in favor of a metaphysical interpretation—which is critical of prominent two-world readings, without committing to a double-aspect view—has been already suggested and defended in Ameriks 1982 and 1992. More objections have been raised against newer, metaphysical versions of one-world interpretations, and newer versions of two-world interpretations have been defended as an alternative. (See especially Jauernig 2021, Stang 2014.)
The controversy just outlined turns on multiple interpretive and philosophical problems, which have received sustained attention and discussion. A first, major issue concerns direct textual evidence: what does Kant himself say about the status of appearances and the way we should understand the distinction between appearances and things in themselves? As we have already seen, there are plenty of passages in which Kant characterizes appearances as representations (in German: Vorstellungen; A30/B45, A104, A370, A375 note, A490–491/518–519, A494–495/B523, A563/B691). Such passages suggest a phenomenalist interpretation of appearances as mental states of some sort, supporting a two-world interpretation. On the other hand, proponents of one-world interpretations point to the many passages in the Critique that suggest that appearances and things in themselves are the same thing, and that Kant is thus committed to the numerical identity of an object as an appearance and as it is in itself (Bxx, Bxxv-xxviii, A27–28/B44, A38/B55, B69; B306). Taking a cue from this kind of passage, one could claim that Kant’s considered view cannot be that appearances are mental states of some sort, because in this case they would have to be numerically distinct from things in themselves (which would clearly be mind-independent and as such mind-transcendent entities, thus distinct from “representations”). Given this state of textual evidence, it is typical for Kant commentators to read one of these two categories of passages as some form of loose talk on Kant’s part, such that there is no contradiction with their overall interpretation.
A further prominent issue turns on philosophical considerations with respect to claims about numerical identity within the framework of transcendental idealism. A problem often pressed by two-world theorists against one-world interpretations concerns the coherence of a view that combines (i) the claim that appearances, but not things in themselves, are in space and time, with (ii) the claim about numerical identity between appearances and things in themselves. The worry is that one-world theorists, in claiming that appearances and things in themselves are numerically identical, are essentially claiming that one and the same object has contradictory properties—for example being spatial and not being spatial. (For such, or similar, philosophical objections with respect to numerical identity claims, see Van Cleve 1999: 146–150, Stang 2014. For a “one-world” perspective on such issues, see Allais 2015: 71–76. It is worth noting that one-world theorists tend to qualify and weaken the numerical identity claim that was—originally—characteristic of one-world interpretations, as part of their response to this kind of philosophical objection; for instance, the “one-world” terminology that was characteristic in Allais 2004 is dropped in Allais 2015: esp. 8–9 and 71–76. For an account that is favorable to the idea that questions of “one” vs. “two worlds” should not be at the heart of the debates on Kant’s idealism, see Walker 2010; see also Adams 1997: esp. 821–825.)
A third type of prominent philosophical and textual consideration in the debate revolves around Kant’s claim to have established a moderate brand of idealism that somehow incorporates realist features, being a version of merely formal and transcendental—rather than material or empirical—idealism. This is often taken to count against phenomenalist interpretations of Kantian appearances and to support one-world readings: in a one-world view, Kantian appearances are public, mind-transcendent objects of the external world; these objects are considered in their relation to epistemic subjects and our conditions of knowing such objects (methodological reading), or they are bearers of mind-dependent properties (metaphysical reading). This sort of view seems to accommodate Kant’s realism better than the view that Kantian appearances are somehow mental. (For a defense of this view, see, for instance, Allais 2015: 44–56. For a two-world perspective on such worries, see Jauernig 2021: esp. 114–129, 155–172.)
This final problem concerning the exact relationship between transcendental idealism and realism raises interesting questions as to whether one can confine oneself to an (alternative) interpretation of the status of appearances, or, rather, whether things in themselves have to be considered, to fully account for the non-idealist features of Kant’s doctrine. Historically, part of the motivation for one-world interpretations was the idea that if we have an understanding of appearances as sufficiently robust entities, then one can do justice to the realist features of Kant’s position, while in a sense dispensing with things in themselves. (In some of the first worked-out one-world readings, this idea was central to the discussion of the problem of affection introduced above. According to the interpretation developed in Bird 1962: 18–35 and Prauss 1974: 192–227, for instance, the role of affection is assigned to—robust, extramental—appearances; things in themselves are thought to be dispensable. See also Breitenbach 2004: 142–146.) Moreover, Kant himself, in (part of) his explicit reaction to one of the main charges pressed against him by his early readers, namely the complaint that transcendental idealism is not sufficiently realist, formulates some thoughts in his defense that make no appeal to things in themselves and merely turn on questions pertaining to the realm of appearances (4: 375).
That being said, there are some reasons—touched upon further below—to think that a solution to the radical idealism charge—and the problem of affection more specifically—that bypasses the problem of things in themselves might not be satisfactory. This also means that a discussion of the exact relationship between rival interpretations of transcendental idealism and realism can be inconclusive without an explicit discussion of the exact role that the mind-independent world—the things in themselves—play in the overall account, in each proposed view. It is to the role of things in themselves and their status in Kant’s idealism that we now turn.
We have taken a closer look at Kant’s doctrine of transcendental idealism by focusing on philosophical and exegetical issues with respect to appearances—as contrasted with things in themselves—and by acquainting ourselves with notable related controversies. In this section, the focus is on the other point of the contrast, namely the status of things in themselves, which raises issues equally fraught with deep controversies.
Although both points of the contrast—appearances vs. things in themselves—are the subject of heated debate, there is a sense in which the main controversy is located elsewhere in each case. In the case of appearances, the main controversy mostly concerns how one should understand the concept of an appearance and how one should cash out the exact kind of mind-dependence implied by this concept. Some think, for instance, that it implies the mind-immanence of the object in question (two-world reading), whereas others disagree (one-world reading). Despite this lack of consensus as to how exactly we should understand the concept of appearances, there is agreement on the fact that the concept is, according to Kant, clearly instantiated: Kant is clearly committed to there being objects of some sort that he calls ‘appearances’—even if these objects are taken to be very “insubstantial”, “minimal” or “virtual”. In the case of things in themselves, and putting some subtle and complicated details aside, there is a sense in which we have some consensus as regards how one should understand the concept of things in themselves, namely as the concept of a mind-independent world. The substantial controversy arises from further questions with respect to the instantiation of the concept. In the history of the reception and interpretation of Kant’s idealism, not everyone has agreed that Kant is committed to the existence of things in themselves, and many have thought that it would be philosophically problematic for Kant to do so.
Faced with the charge of offering too radical a version of idealism, Kant explicitly reacted by pursuing a two-pronged strategy. One part of the strategy, pursued in the Appendix in the Prolegomena (4: 375), was alluded to shortly before: it is a strategy that confines itself at the level of appearances and shows how Kant’s idealism has the resources to be distinguished from older—and untenable—versions of idealism; a key thought in this respect is the Kantian idea that experience has an a priori aspect. (For a defense of this sort of consideration, as well as related responses to the radical idealism charge, see Emundts 2008.) Kant’s strategy in the Prolegomena has a second part as well, however: in some remarks dedicated to the topic of idealism (esp. 4: 288–290; see also 4: 292–295), Kant invokes his commitment to there being a mind-independent world, things in themselves, as a feature of his overall view that distinguishes it from radical versions of idealism: the moderate, transcendental idealist thinks that the objects of experience are appearances; however, this does not mean that all that exists is an appearance—we have to add things in themselves into the mix.
The idea that things in themselves are an indispensable part of the mix has received special attention in the context of the—more specific—problem of affection. Recall the problem: Kant’s talk of affection by objects, which provides human minds with sensations, has raised the dilemma of whether these objects are appearances or things in themselves. In the view of Kant’s critics, both options are untenable. We saw above that the main worry with respect to the first option, appearances, was that such entities are not fit for purpose. Historically, this diagnosis was motivated by a two-world interpretation of Kantian appearances; it was also noted in passing that defending appearances in their role as affecting objects was part of the motivation for some of the first versions of one-world readings of appearances as robust, mind-transcendent entities. (See Bird 1962: 18–35, Prauss 1974: 192–227. For a further interpretation that wishes to resist attributing to Kant the idea that we are affected by things in themselves, see de Boer 2014.) Nonetheless, it has been argued—in some cases by proponents of one-world interpretations—that appearances cannot play the role of the affecting object, even if they are understood as mind-transcendental entities of the external world. (For such a view see, for example, Allison 2004: 64–68; for further critique of the idea that appearances could do the affection job, see Jauernig 2021: 310–312.)
Philosophical and exegetical considerations can thus be cited in support of the idea that things in themselves have to play a role in the overall picture—as part of a more plausible and coherent story about affection, but also to do justice to the moderate nature of Kant’s idealism more generally. This, however, leads us to the second horn of the affection dilemma: embracing the claim that things in themselves exist and affect human minds has been thought to lead to serious problems in the Kantian system. One difficulty is that this claim sounds like an unjustified assumption that begs the question against the external world skeptic. (For an old and influential criticism along such lines, see Schulze 1996 : esp. 183–192/[262–275].) Moreover, there is the further prominent concern that such an assumption would introduce a major inconsistency in the overall account, as it would be incompatible with Kantian epistemic strictures with respect to things in themselves. Two related problems stand out. First, according to transcendental idealism, we are supposed to have no knowledge or cognition of things in themselves—but if I claim that they exist and affect human minds, then I do seem to know a great deal about them. Second, a natural way of understanding Kant’s affection-talk is to refer to some sort of causal impact that external world objects have on human minds, thereby providing them with sensory input. According to Kant, however, the concept of cause and effect is supposed to be an a priori concept, a category, and as such to be valid only of appearances, not things in themselves. Assigning the role of affection to things in themselves seems thus to require an (illegitimate) application of the category of cause and effect to things in themselves, contrary to Kant’s own preaching. (For this type of criticism, see especially Schulze 1996 : 183–264/[263–389], Jacobi 2004 .)
Things in themselves have thus historically been thought to present us with fundamental problems. This raises both exegetical questions, as regards what sort of view Kant ultimately held, and philosophical questions, as regards how defensible Kant’s view on that matter actually is. This presentation of Kant’s idealism is completed by taking these two broad sets of questions in turn.
The claim that, as a matter of interpretation, Kant accepts the existence of things in themselves and assigns the role of affection to them has been traditionally a matter of (fierce) controversy. Although there are passages that clearly support attributing to Kant such a view, the overall picture is more complex. How one handles the relevant textual evidence depends on the stance one takes with respect to some complicated interpretive questions around terms such as ‘transcendental object’ and ‘noumenon’—terms that were briefly mentioned above but that now warrant further discussion.
With respect to direct evidence for Kant’s commitment to things in themselves, there are a number of relevant passages in the Critique and further critical works (8: 215, 4: 314–5, A251–252, A190/B235, 4: 451). In some of these passages, we have Kant speaking explicitly of things in themselves that affect perceiving subjects and provide them with the “matter” of empirical intuitions. Moreover, there are a number of passages in which Kant speaks clearly of an object that “grounds” appearances and constitutes their “intelligible cause” (A379–380, A393, A494/B522, A613–614/B641–642). (For a discussion of textual evidence for Kant’s commitment to things in themselves, see Adickes 1924: 4–37.) However, it is often noted that, as far as the latter category of passages is concerned, this object is not characterized as a ‘thing in itself’; the object is characterized instead as a ‘transcendental object’. This makes the interpretation of such passages contingent on our stance regarding the controversial question of how to best understand Kant’s references to such an object.
Kant’s discussion of a transcendental object has given rise to rather different interpretations. Some uphold the view that the expression does refer to things in themselves (see, for instance, Kemp Smith 1923: 212–219); others have denied that this is the case (see, for instance, Bird 1962: 68–69, 76–81); a weaker ambiguity thesis has also been advocated, according to which the expression refers to things in themselves only in some places, but not in some others (for this view, see Allison 1968). The main motivation for the view that ‘transcendental object’—at least in some places—does not refer to things in themselves has to do with certain passages in which Kant analyzes the concept of a transcendental object and in which he seems to be strongly suggesting that ‘transcendental object’, unlike ‘thing in itself’, does not stand for the mind-independent world, standing instead for a mind-immanent, merely intentional object. (This is often taken to be implied by Kant’s analysis of the concept of an object in the A-version of the Transcendental Deduction (A104–105, A108–109), in the course of his highly complex argument for the “objective validity” of the categories.) The main motivation for the opposing view, namely that ‘thing in itself’ and ‘transcendental object’ can be used somewhat interchangeably, is the fact that in many places Kant seems to be doing precisely that, without, for instance, feeling the need to explain the term ‘transcendental object’ when he first introduces it (A46/B63). (It is worth noting that part of the difficulty and controversy stems from the question of how we should best understand the term ‘transcendental’ more generally. Even the term ‘transcendental idealism’ is difficult to express in more standard philosophical vocabulary in an uncontroversial way for precisely this reason. For some standard definitions of ‘transcendental’ provided by Kant, see 4: 373 note, 4: 294, B25; for some considerations that challenge the idea that these definitions indeed capture Kant’s actual usage in some cases, see Vaihinger 1892: 35–355.)
A further complication when trying to evaluate the textual evidence for Kant’s commitment to things in themselves arises from Kant’s talk of noumena, certain views he holds with respect to those, and how all this connects to things in themselves. Although the predominant view in Kant scholarship is that there is evidence that Kant is committed to the existence of things in themselves and an affection by these, there are passages in the Critique that have often been thought to cast doubt on the firmness of Kant’s commitment. Some passages in the chapter on Phenomena and Noumena are particularly important in this respect, because they clearly—and intentionally—survived changes between the two editions and stem from a section in which Kant discusses his idealism in detail, thereby giving such passages particular weight. (For other passages in the Critique that have been cited as evidence against Kant’s commitment, see especially A288/B344–345, A368, A372, A375–376. For a discussion of a range of textual evidence, with the aim of showing that Kant is not committed to things in themselves, see Bird 1962: 18–35, Bird 2006: 40–44, 122–126, 553–585.)
In the chapter on Phenomena and Noumena, Kant expresses a clear agnosticism with respect to the existence of noumena (A-edition), or at least the existence of noumena in the positive sense of the term (B-edition). Kant tells us that “the concept of a noumenon” is “merely a boundary concept, in order to limit the pretension of sensibility” (A255/B311); although Kant’s stance towards this concept is not entirely dismissive, he notes that the concept has to be “taken merely problematically” (A256/B311), which, in Kant’s terminology, means that noumena, although conceptually possible, cannot be assumed to exist, because we do not know if their concept is instantiated. If ‘noumenon’ refers to things in themselves, we could infer from such passages that according to Kant we have to be non-committal with respect to the existence of a mind-independent world. (For readings along such lines, see, for instance, Bird 1962: 73–77, Cohen 1918: 658–662, Emundts 2008: 135–136, Senderowicz 2005: 162–168.)
However, the interpretation of Kant’s stance based on such passages is complicated and contentious, for a number of reasons. First, the changes Kant made in the B-edition, by introducing two senses of ‘noumenon’ (positive and negative), raise some questions of interpretation. Second, the idea that ‘noumenon’ (in the positive sense) and ‘thing in itself’ can be used interchangeably could be challenged. One line of thought that serves to challenge this idea turns on the debate between one- and two-world interpretations of transcendental idealism. Proponents of one-world interpretations have suggested that noumena, unlike things in themselves, are objects that are numerically distinct from appearances; in such an interpretation, when Kant expresses agnosticism with respect to noumena, he wants only to rule out two-world readings of transcendental idealism. (See, for instance, Allais 2010: 9–12 for this kind of strategy.) A different line of thought to the same effect would focus less on the metaphysical status of noumena—their numerical identity with, or distinctness from, things in themselves—and more on their epistemic status: noumena are objects of the (pure) understanding according to Kant and are as such fully cognizable by it; this is not the case with respect to things in themselves. Not affirming the possibility of an object of such demanding cognition would be compatible with a commitment to the mere existence of things in themselves; for some passages in support of this view, see A249, A252, A253, A249–250, A251, B306.
The exegetical and philosophical questions with respect to Kant’s commitment to things in themselves are deeply intertwined. Concerns about philosophical problems have often motivated certain interpretive stances, which aim to jettison the thing in itself. (Fichte, who opposed attributing to Kant such a commitment, is characteristic in this respect; see esp. Fichte 1970 [1797/1798]: 209–269.) Moreover, some approaches to the exegetical question already provide a hint of how a proponent of Kant’s commitment to things in themselves would deal with this from a philosophical perspective. This becomes obvious in the following subsection, which addresses the issue from a more philosophical perspective, and with which we conclude the presentation of Kant’s doctrine of appearances and things in themselves.
For those who ascribe to Kant a commitment to things in themselves, the question arises as to how one could defend Kant’s idealism against the worries raised above. As far as the concern that Kant’s commitment to things in themselves is an unjustified assumption (that begs the question against the external world skeptic) is concerned, different strategies have been suggested. One way of proceeding would be to argue that Kant has such an argument; of relevance are passages in Kant that sound like arguments for the view that the existence of appearances implies the existence of things in themselves (Bxxvi-xxvii, A251–252, 4: 314, 4: 451), as well as the argument in the Refutation of Idealism in the B-edition (more controversially so). (For some relevant thoughts—and problems—see Langton 1998: 21–22 and Guyer 1987: 290–329. For a further reconstruction of a Kantian argument that draws on less obvious resources—and is also relevant for further concerns with respect to Kant’s commitment—see Hogan 2009a and Hogan 2009b.) A different way of proceeding consists in not conceding that Kant has to argue for the existence of a mind-independent world: according to this line of defense, it is not essential to the Kantian project to refute external world skepticism and to give us an argument for the existence of things in themselves; rather, one could interpret the claim about the existence of a mind-independent world as a commonsense assumption that can be taken for granted. Since the Critique is an inquiry into the possibility and limits of a priori cognition, there is no question begging in accepting some commonsense assumptions (for instance about empirical knowledge or the existence of the external world) in this type of project. (For this type of reaction, see especially Ameriks 2003: 9–34.)
As far as the inconsistency worry (incompatibility with epistemic strictures and illegitimate application of the categories) is concerned, the following, to some extent interrelated, lines of defense stand out. It is often noted that, from a Kantian perspective, there is a distinction to be made between thinking and cognizing/knowing things in themselves through the categories; Kantian restrictions with respect to the application of the categories to things in themselves concern only the latter. (For more on this interpretation, see especially Adickes 1924: 49–74.) Moreover, it has been argued that we could interpret Kant’s epistemic strictures differently, so that no incompatibility arises between the non-cognizability of things in themselves and a commitment to them. Kant’s epistemic strictures are not a sweeping claim against all knowledge with respect to things in themselves; Kant merely prohibits determinate cognition of things in themselves (which would involve having intuition of the object as such and representing its properties). This is compatible with a more minimal commitment to the existence of the entity in question. Another (related) way of framing the point is to distinguish between knowing that an object has some mind-independent properties and knowing which properties these are. (For this type of reaction, see especially Langton 1998: 12–24, Chiba 2012: 360–368, Rosefeldt 2013: 248–256.)
These lines of defense can be connected with contemporary work on Kant’s concept of cognition (in German: Erkenntnis), which suggests that there is a distinction to be drawn between cognition and knowledge (in German: Wissen), and that Kant’s strictures are to be interpreted as non-cognizability, not as unknowability claims (which would preclude any form of knowledge about things in themselves). (For the distinction between cognition and knowledge, see Watkins/Willaschek 2017: esp. 85–89, 109 and Chignell 2014: 574–579.) The main idea in this distinction is that Kantian knowledge is closer to our contemporary notion of knowledge—which is generally analyzed as a form of justified true belief—whereas Kantian cognition is a kind of mental state that represents the object and involves concepts and intuitions. The upshot of these lines of defense is that the problem of things in themselves in Kant’s idealism might be more manageable than is often thought.
As has become evident, Kant’s transcendental idealism is a highly controversial doctrine, both in terms of interpretation and in terms of philosophical evaluation. As soon as one tries to translate Kantian jargon into more standard contemporary philosophical vocabulary, one often has to take a stance with respect to notable controversies. The conflicting interpretations are often subtle and very well worked-out, and in many cases aim to present Kant’s transcendental idealism as a coherent position that does not rest on crude considerations and blatant mistakes; in some other cases, the aim is to salvage parts of Kant’s doctrine that are philosophically defensible, while explicitly letting go of certain aspects of the official overall view. In any case, Kant’s transcendental idealism has been the topic of intensive scholarly engagement and rather vigorous philosophical discussions, which have led to deep controversies that are yet to reach consensus but that have also greatly advanced our understanding of Kant’s philosophy as a whole.
One clearly discernible tendency in contemporary interpretations of Kant, which exemplifies the enduring lack of consensus but also shows how much the interpretation of Kant’s idealism has evolved, concerns the debate between one-world and two-world interpretations. In its initial formulation, the debate was between two clear-cut interpretations of transcendental idealism: the old, traditional, metaphysical two-world interpretation on the one hand, and a newer, more methodological, one-world interpretation on the other hand. Metaphysical interpretations of Kant’s idealism have been making a comeback, complicating the picture with respect to one-world interpretations, as metaphysical versions thereof have been proposed. Moreover, there is a sense in which even the distinction between one- and two-world interpretations is being eroded. Partly pressed by proponents of two-world interpretations—which are also making something of a comeback—views initially associated with (metaphysical) one-world readings are now no longer cashed out in terms of the “one-world” or “numerical identity” terminology; the resulting view is a weaker, qualified version of “double aspect” readings. (This was noted in passing in Section 3.) Notwithstanding these signs of convergence, there are substantial differences remaining between opposing readings of Kant’s idealism, but more clarity has been achieved as to what the points of contention ultimately are.
A further contemporary tendency with wide-ranging implications, which was indirectly noted at different junctures of this article, concerns an emerging, more sophisticated understanding of Kant’s account of cognition as well as the (distinctive) role that intuitions and concepts play there. Getting a better grasp of these features of Kant’s view is central for understanding Kant’s entire philosophy. But it is also becoming increasingly clear that this is key to understanding and evaluating Kant’s idealism; it affects where we locate the argument(s) for transcendental idealism, whether Kant’s conclusions follow from the premises from which they are supposed, and how coherent the overall resulting view is. Subtler accounts of these issues are important resources, with many suggesting that Kant’s idealism is more philosophically viable than was traditionally thought.
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