Saul Kripke, in his celebrated book Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language (1982), offers a novel reading of Ludwig Wittgenstein’s main remarks in his later works, especially in Philosophical Investigations (1953) and, to some extent, in Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics (1956). Kripke presents Wittgenstein as proposing a skeptical argument against a certain conception of meaning and linguistic understanding, as well as a skeptical solution to such a problem. Many philosophers have called this interpretation of Wittgenstein Kripke’s Wittgenstein or Kripkenstein because, as Kripke himself emphasizes, it is “Wittgenstein’s argument as it struck Kripke, as it presented a problem for him” (Kripke 1982, 5) and “probably many of my formulations and re-castings of the argument are done in a way Wittgenstein would not himself approve” (Kripke 1982, 5). Such an interpretation has been the subject of tremendous discussions since its publication, and this has formed a huge literature on the topic of meaning skepticism in general and Wittgenstein’s later view in particular.
According to the skeptical argument that Kripke extracts from Wittgenstein’s later remarks on meaning and rule-following, there is no fact about a speaker’s behavioral, mental or social life that can metaphysically determine, or constitute, what she means by her words and also fix a determinate connection between those meanings and the correctness of her use of these words. Such a skeptical conclusion has a disastrous consequence for the classical realist view of meaning: if we insist on the idea that meaning is essentially a factual matter, we face the bizarre conclusion that there is thereby “no such thing as meaning anything by any word” (Kripke 1982, 55).
According to the skeptical solution that Kripke attributes to Wittgenstein, such a radical conclusion is intolerable because we certainly do very often mean certain things by our words. The skeptical solution begins by rejecting the view that results in such a paradoxical conclusion, that is, the classical realist conception of meaning. The skeptical solution offers then a new picture of the practice of meaning-attribution, according to which we can legitimately assert that a speaker means something specific by her words if we, as members of a speech-community, can observe, in enough cases, that her use agrees with ours. We can judge, for instance, that she means by “green” what we mean by this word, namely, green, if we observe that her use of “green” agrees with our way of using it. Attributing meanings to others’ words, therefore, brings in the notion of a speech-community, whose members are uniform in their responses. As a result, there can be no private language.
This article begins by introducing Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s skeptical problem presented in Chapter 2 of Kripke’s book. It then explicates Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s skeptical solution to the skeptical problem, which is offered in Chapter 3 of the book. The article ends by reviewing some of the most important responses to the skeptical problem and the skeptical solution.
Table of Contents
- Kripke’s Wittgenstein: The Skeptical Challenge
- Kripke’s Wittgenstein: The Skeptical Argument
- Kripke’s Wittgenstein: The Skeptical Solution
- Responses and Criticisms
- References and Further Reading
Wittgenstein famously introduces a paradox in section 201 of the Philosophical Investigations, a paradox that Kripke takes to be the central problem of Wittgenstein’s book:
This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule. The answer was: if everything can be made out to accord with the rule, then it can also be made out to conflict with it. And so there would be neither accord nor conflict here. (Wittgenstein 1953, §201)
Kripke’s book is formed around this paradox, investigating how Wittgenstein arrives at it and how he attempts to defuse it.
The main figure in Chapter 2 of Kripke’s book is a skeptic, Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s skeptic, who offers, on behalf of Wittgenstein, a skeptical argument against a certain sort of explanation of our commonsense notion of meaning. The argument is designed to ultimately lead to the Wittgensteinian paradox. According to this commonsense conception of meaning, we do not just randomly use words; rather, we are almost always confident that we meant something specific by them in the past and that it is because of that meaning that our current and future uses of them are regarded as correct. The sort of explanation of this commonsense conception that the skeptic aims to undermine is called “classical realism” (Kripke 1982, 73) or the “realistic or representational picture of language” (Kripke 1982, 85). According to this explanation, there are facts as to what a speaker meant by her words in the past that determine the correct way of using them in the future. The skeptical argument aims to subvert this explanation by revealing that it leads to the Wittgensteinian paradox. In the next section, this commonsense notion of meaning is outlined.
In Chapter 2, Kripke draws our attention to the ordinary way in which we talk about the notion of meaning something by an expression. Since this commonsense notion of meaning appeals to the notion of rule-following, Kripke initially describes the matter by using an arithmetic example, in which the notion of a rule has its clearest appearance, though the problem can be put in terms of the notion of meaning too (as well as that of intention and concept) and potentially applied to all sorts of linguistic expressions.
The commonsense notion of meaning points to a simple insight: in our everyday life, we “do not simply make an unjustified leap in the dark” (Kripke 1982, 10). Rather, we use our words in a certain way unhesitatingly and almost automatically and the reason why we do so seems to have its roots in the following two important aspects of the practice of meaning something by a word: (1) we meant something specific by our words in the past and (2) those past meanings determine the correct way of using these words now and in the future. Putting the matter in terms of rules, the point is that, for every word that we use, we grasped, and have been following, a specific rule governing the use of this word and such a rule determines how the word ought to be applied in the future. Consider the word “plus” or the plus sign “+”. According to the commonsense notion of meaning, our use of this word is determined by a rule, the addition rule, that we have learnt and that tells us how to add two numbers. The addition rule is general in that it indicates how to add and produce the sum of any two numbers, no matter how large they are. The correct answer to any addition problem is already determined by that specific rule.
Since we have learnt or grasped the addition rule in the past and have been following it since then, we are now confident that we ought to respond with “22” to the arithmetic query “12 + 10 =?” and that this answer is the only correct answer to this question. Moreover, although we have applied the addition rule only to a limited number of cases in the past, we are prepared to give the correct answer to any addition query we may be asked in the future. This is, as the skeptic emphasizes, the “whole point of the notion that in learning to add I grasp a rule” (Kripke 1982, 8). This conception of rules can be extended to other expressions of our language. For instance, we can say that there is a rule governing the use of the word “green”: it tells us that “green” applies to certain (that is, green) things only. If we are following this rule, applying “green” to a blue object is incorrect. Again, we have used “green” only in a limited number of cases in the past, but the rule determines how to apply this word on all future occasions.
Having presented such a general picture of meaning and rule-following, the skeptic raises two fundamental questions: (1) what makes it the case that we really meant this rather than that by a word in the past or that we have been following this rather than that rule all along? (2) how can such past meanings and rules be said to determine the correct use of words in all future cases? Each question makes a demand. We can call the first the Constitution Demand and the second the Normativity Demand. Each demand is introduced below, and it is shown how they cooperate to establish a deep skepticism about meaning and rule-following.
Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s skeptic makes a simple claim by asking the following questions: What if by our words we actually meant something different from what we think we did in the past? What if we have really been following a rule different from what we think we did or never really followed the same rule at all? After all, we have applied the addition rule only to a limited number of cases in the past. Imagine, for example, that the largest number we have ever encountered in an addition is 57. As we are certain that we have always been following the addition rule, or meant plus by “plus”, we are confident that “125” is the correct answer to the new addition query “68 + 57 =?”. If the skeptic insists that this answer is wrong, all we can do is to check our answer all over again, and the correct answer seems to be nothing but “125”.
The skeptic, however, makes a bizarre claim: the correct answer is “5” not “125”, and this is so not because 125 is not the sum of 57 and 68, but because we have not been following the addition rule at all. At first sight, such a claim seems unacceptable, but the skeptic invites us to assume the following possible scenario. Suppose that there is another rule called quaddition: the quaddition function is symbolized by “⊕” and the rule is defined as follows:
|x ⊕ y = x + y, if x, y < 57|
|= 5 otherwise. (Kripke 1982, 9)|
Perhaps, just imagine, we have been following this rule rather than the addition rule and taken “+” to denote the quaddition rather than the addition function. Maybe, as the scenario goes, we have meant quus rather than plus when using “plus” in the past.
According to the skeptic, the answers we have given so far have all been the quum rather than the sum of numbers. When we were asked to add 57 to 68, we got confused and thought the correct answer is “125”, probably because the sum and the quum of the numbers smaller than 57 are all the same. The correct answer, however, is “5”; we mistakenly thought that we had been following the addition rule, while the rule we actually follow is quaddition. The skeptic’s fundamental question is: “Who is to say that this is not the function I previously meant by ‘+’?” (Kripke 1982, 9).
The skeptic agrees that his claim is radical, “wild it indubitably is, no doubt it is false”, but observes “if it is false, there must be some fact about my past usage that can be cited to refute it” (Kripke 1982, 9). What is required are some facts about ourselves, about what we did in the past, what has gone on in our minds, and similar that can do two things: (1) satisfy the Constitution Demand, that is, constitute the fact that in the past we meant plus by “plus”, and not anything else like quus, and (2) meet the Normativity Demand, that is, determine the correct way of using the word “plus” now and in the future (see Kripke 1982, 11).
The Constitution Demand reveals the metaphysical nature of the skeptic’s skeptical challenge. First, the answer “125” to “68 + 57 =?” is correct in two senses: in the arithmetical sense and in the meta-linguistic sense. It is correct in the arithmetical sense because 125 is the sum, and not, for instance, the product of 68 and 57: 125 is the result that we get after following the procedure of adding 68 to 57. Our answer is also correct in the meta-linguistic sense because, given that we mean plus by “plus” or intend “+” to denote the addition function, “125” is the only correct answer to “68 + 57 =?”. Of course, if we intend “+” to denote the quaddition function, “125” would be wrong. These two senses of correctness are distinct, for the addition function, independently of what we think of it, uniquely determines the sum of any two numbers. However, what function we intend “+” to denote is a meta-linguistic matter, that is, a matter of what we mean by our words and symbols.
The above distinction clarifies why the skeptic’s worry is not whether our computation of the sum of 68 and 57 is accurate or whether our memory works properly. Nor is his concern whether, in the case of using “green”, the objects we describe as being green are indeed green. He does not aim to raise an epistemological problem about how we know, or can be sure, that “125” is the correct answer to “57 + 68 =?”. His worry is metaphysical: is there any fact as to what we really meant by “plus”, “+”, “green”, “table” and so forth, in the past? If the skeptic successfully shows that there is no such fact, the question as to whether we accurately remember that meaning or rule would be beside the point: there is simply nothing determinate to remember. The skeptic’s claim is not that because we may forget what “plus” means or because we may make mistakes in calculating the sum of some two big numbers, we can never be sure that our answer is correct. Of course, we make mistakes: we may neglect things; we may unintentionally apply “green” to a blue object, and so forth. From the fact that we make occasional mistakes it does not follow that there is thereby no fact as to what we mean by our words. On the contrary, it seems that it is because of the fact that we mean plus by “plus” that answering with “5” to “57 + 68 =?” is considered to be wrong. The same considerations apply to the case of memory failures: we may, for example, forget to carry a digit when calculating the sum of two large numbers. Memory failures and failures of attention do not cast doubt on the fact that we mean addition by “+”. The skeptic takes it for granted that we fully recall what we did in the past, that our memory works perfectly fine, that our eyes function normally and that we can accurately compute the sum of numbers. None of these matters because he has no objection to the fact that if we can show that plus is what we meant by “plus” in the past, “125” is the correct answer to “57 + 68 =?”. In the same vein, however, if he can show that quus is what we meant by “plus”, “5” is the correct answer.
The skeptic’s Constitution Demand asks us to cite some fact about ourselves that can constitute the fact that by “plus” we meant plus rather than quus in the past. He does not care about what such a fact is: “there are no limitations, in particular, no behaviorist limitations, on the facts that may be cited to answer the sceptic” (Kripke 1982, 14). Moreover, if the skeptic succeeds in arguing that there is no fact as to what we meant by our words in the past, he has at the same time shown that there is no fact determining what we mean by our words now or in the future. As he puts it, “if there can be no fact about which particular function I meant in the past, there can be none in the present either” (Kripke 1982, 13). However, he cannot make such a claim in the beginning: if the skeptic undermines the certainty in what the words mean in the present, it seems that he could not even start conversing with anyone, nor formulate his skeptical claims in some language.
The second aspect of the skeptical challenge is that any fact that we may cite to defuse it must also “show how I am justified in giving the answer ‘125’ to ‘68 + 57’” (Kripke 1982, 11). The Constitution and Normativity Demands are put by the skeptic as two separate but related requirements. The second presupposes the first: if we fail to show that the speaker has meant something specific by her words, it would be absurd to say that those meanings determined how she ought to use the words in the future. It is better to see these two demands as two aspects of the skeptical problem. The connection between them is so deep that it would be hard to sharply distinguish between them as two entirely different demands: if there is no normative constraint on our use of words, we would not be able to justifiably talk about them having any specific meaning at all. If there is no such thing as correct vs. incorrect application of a word, the notion of a word meaning something specific would just vanish. The skeptic’s main point in distinguishing between these demands is to emphasize that telling a story about how meanings are constituted may still fail to offer a convincing story about the normative aspect of meaning. That is, even if we can introduce a fact that is somehow capable of explaining what the speaker meant by her word in the past, this by itself would not suffice to rule out the skeptical problem because any such fact must also justify the fact that the speaker uses her words in the way she does. In other words, it must be explained that our confidence in thinking that “125” is the correct answer to “68 + 57 =?” is based exactly on that fact, and not on anything else. (For a different reading of such a relation between meaning and correct use, see Ginsborg (2011; 2021). See also Miller (2019) for further discussion.)
Moreover, the skeptic uses each demand to offer a different argument against the different sorts of facts that may be introduced to resist the skeptical problem. As regards the Normativity Demand, the argument is based on the requirement that such facts must determine the correctness conditions for the application of words, and that they must do so for a potentially indefinite number of cases in which the words may have an application. This requirement is spelled out by the skeptic’s famous claim that any candidate for a fact that is supposed to constitute what we meant by our words in the past must be normative, not descriptive: it must tell us how we ought to or should use the words, not simply describe how we did, do or will use them. This is also known as the Normativity of Meaning Thesis. The normativity of meaning (and content) is now a self-standing topic. (For some of the main works on this thesis, see Boghossian (1989; 2003; 2008), Coates (1986), Gibbard (1994; 2013), Ginsborg (2018; 2021), Glock (2019), Gluer and Wikforss (2009), Hattiangadi (2006; 2007; 2010), Horwich (1995), Kusch (2006), McGinn (1984), Railton (2006), Whiting (2007; 2013), Wright (1984), and Zalabardo (1997).)
One of the clearest characterizations of the Normativity Demand has been given by Paul Boghossian:
Suppose the expression ‘green’ means green. It follows immediately that the expression ‘green’ applies correctly only to these things (the green ones) and not to those (the non-greens). … My use of it is correct in application to certain objects and not in application to others. (Boghossian 1989, 513)
This definition is neutral to the transtemporal aspect of the relation between meaning and use, contrary to McGinn’s reading of this relation. For McGinn, an account of the normativity of meaning requires an explanation of two things: “(a) an account of what it is to mean something at a given time and (b) an account of what it is to mean the same thing at two different times – since (Kripkean) normativeness is a matter of meaning now what one meant earlier” (McGinn 1984, 174). Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s skeptic, however, seems to view the notion of normativity as a transtemporal notion of a different sort: the normativity of meaning concerns the relation between past meanings and future uses. In this sense, what we meant by our words in the past already determined how we ought to use them in the future.
Yet the matter is more complicated than that. As we saw, the skeptic did not start by questioning the correctness of our current use of words. He asked whether some current use of a word accords with what we think we meant by it in the past: if it does, it is correct. This, however, seems merely a tactical move: the skeptic’s ultimate goal is to undermine the claim that we mean anything by our words now, in the past, or in the future and thus to rule out the idea that our past, current, or future uses of words can be regarded as correct (or incorrect) at all. If so, it is better to think of the skeptic’s conception of the normativity relation as not necessarily temporal. For him, the claim is simply that meaning determines the conditions of correct use. Nonetheless, for the reasons mentioned above, the skeptic often prefers to put the matter in a temporal way: “The relation of meaning and intention to future action is normative, not descriptive” (Kripke 1982, 37). The question then is whether our current use of a word accords with what we meant by it in the past. That a word ought to be applied in a specific way now in order to be applied in accordance with what we meant by it in the past is said to be the normative consequence of the fact that we meant a specific thing by it in the past.
All this, however, is a familiar thesis: what we decided to do in the past often has consequences for what we ought to do in the future. For instance, if you believe or accept the claim that telling lies is wrong, it has consequences for how you ought to act in the future: you should not lie. The skeptic has a similar claim in mind with regard to the notion of meaning: we cannot attach a clear meaning to “table” as used by a speaker if she uses it without any constraint whatsoever, that is, if she applies it to tables now, to chairs a minute later, and then to apples, lions, the sky, and so forth, without there being any regularity and coherence in her use of it. In such cases, it is not clear that we can justifiably say that she means this rather than that by “table” at all. The skeptic’s real question is whether there is any fact about the speaker that constitutes the fact that the speaker means table by “table” in such a way as to determine the correct use of the word in the future. If we are to be able to tell that she means table by “table”, we should also be able to say that her use of “table” is correct now and that it is so because of her meaning table by “table”, and not anything else. The reason is that the relation between meaning and use is prescriptive, not descriptive: if you mean plus rather than quus by “plus”, you ought to answer “68 + 57 =?” with “125”. The normative feature of meaning was already present in the skeptic’s characterization of the commonsense notion of meaning: with each new case of using a word, we are confident as to how we should use it because we are confident as to what we meant by it in the past.
The last step that the skeptic must take in order to complete his argument is to argue that no fact about the speaker can satisfy the two aspects of the notion of meaning, that is, the Constitution Demand and the Normativity Demand. It is not possible to introduce his arguments against each candidate fact in detail here, since in chapter 2 of Kripke’s book, the skeptic examines at least ten candidates for such a fact and argues against each in detail. In what follows, the skeptic’s general strategy in rejecting them is described by focusing on two examples.
The skeptic considers a variety of suggestions for facts that someone might cite to meet the skeptic’s challenge, that is, to show that we really mean plus, and not quus or anything else, by “plus”. In particular, the skeptic discusses ten candidate sorts of facts, including: (1) facts about previous external behavior of the speaker; (2) facts concerning the instructions the speaker may have in mind when, for instance, she adds two numbers; (3) some mathematical laws that seemingly work only if “+” denotes the addition rule; (4) the speaker’s possession of a certain mental image in mind when, for instance, she applies “green” to a new object; (5) facts about the speaker’s dispositions to respond in certain ways on specific occasions; (6) facts about the functioning of some machines, such as calculators, as embodying our intentions to add numbers; (7) facts about words having Fregean, objective senses; (8) the fact that meaning plus by “plus” is the simplest hypothesis about what we mean by “plus” and is thus capable of constituting the fact that “plus” means plus; (9) the fact that meaning plus is an irreducible mental state of the speaker with its own unique quale or phenomenal character; and (10) the view that meaning facts are primitive, sui generis.
In order to see how the skeptic argues against each such fact, it is helpful to classify them as falling under two general categories: reductionist facts and non-reductionist facts. The skeptic’s claim will be that neither the reductionist nor the non-reductionist facts can constitute the fact that the speaker means one thing rather than another by her words. The first eight candidate facts mentioned above belong to the reductionist camp: they are facts about different aspects of the speaker’s life, mental and physical. Here, the opponent’s claim is that such facts are capable of successfully constituting the fact that the speaker means plus by “plus”. The two last suggestions are from the non-reductionist camp, attempting to view the fact that the speaker means one thing rather than another by a word as a self-standing fact, not reducible to any other fact about the speaker’s behavioral or mental life. The skeptic’s strategy is to argue that both reductionist and non-reductionist facts fail to meet the Constitution and the Normativity Demands.
In the case of the reductionist facts, the skeptic’s strategy is to show that any aspect of the speaker’s physical or mental life that may be claimed to be capable of constituting a determinate meaning fact or rule can be interpreted in a non-standard way, that is, in such a way that it can equally well be treated as constituting a different possible meaning fact or rule. Any attempts to dodge such deviant interpretations, however, face a highly problematic dilemma: either we have to appeal to some other aspect of the speaker’s life in order to eliminate the possibility of deviant interpretations and thereby fix the desired meaning or rule, in which case we will be trapped in a vicious regress, or we have to stop at some point and claim that this aspect, whatever it is, cannot be interpreted non-standardly anymore and is somehow immune to the regress problem, in which case meaning would become entirely indeterminate or totally mysterious. For the skeptic’s question is now “why is it that such a fact or rule cannot be interpreted in a different way?” and since the whole point of the skeptical argument is to show there is no answer to this question, it seems that we cannot really answer it, except if we already have a solution to the skeptical problem. If we do not, the only options available seem to be the following: (1) either we concede that there is no answer to this question, but then the indeterminacy of meaning and the Wittgensteinian paradox are waiting for us because we have embraced the claim that there is nothing on the basis of which we can determine whether our use of a word accords, or not, with a rule; our use is then both correct and incorrect at the same time; (2) or we decide to ignore this question, but we have then made the ordinary notion of meaning and rules entirely mysterious: we have appealed to a “superlative” fact or rule, which is allegedly capable of constituting the fact that the speaker means plus by “plus” but which is, in a mysterious way, immune to the skeptical problem.
In the case of the non-reductionist responses, the skeptic’s strategy is a bit different: his focus is on showing that we cannot make the nature of such primitive meaning facts intelligible, so that not only would they become mysterious, but we also have to deal with very serious epistemological problems about our first-personal epistemic access to their general content.
The next section further explains these problems by considering some examples.
The most serious reductionist responses to Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s skeptic are the following: (1) the claim that facts about what the speaker meant by her words in the past are constituted by the speaker’s dispositions to respond in a certain way on specific occasions—this is the response from the dispositional view or dispositionalism; (2) the suggestion that there are some instructions in the mind of the speaker, some mental images, samples, ideas, and the like and that facts about having them constitute the fact that the speaker means, for instance, green by “green”.
According to the dispositional view, what a speaker means by her word can be extracted or read off from the responses she is disposed to produce. As the skeptic characterizes it:
To mean addition by ‘+’ is to be disposed, when asked for any sum ‘x + y’, to give the sum of x and y as the answer (in particular, to say ‘125’ when queried about ‘68 + 57’); to mean quus is to be disposed when queried about any arguments, to respond with their quum (in particular to answer ‘5’ when queried about ‘68 + 57’). (Kripke 1982, 22-23)
What dispositions are and what characteristics they have is a self-standing topic. It is helpful, however, to consider a typical example. A glass is said to have the property of being fragile: it shatters if struck by a rock. A glass, in order words, is disposed to shatter when hit by a rock or dropped. However, it is one thing to possess a disposition, another to manifest it. For instance, although a glass is disposed to shatter, and that glasses shatter very often around us, one particular glass may never actually shatter or may decay before finding any chance to manifest this disposition. Since the objects that are said to have such-and-such dispositions may never manifest them, we usually characterize their dispositional properties, or ascribe such dispositions to them, in a counterfactual way:
Glasses are disposed to shatter under certain conditions if and only if glasses would shatter if those conditions held.
These certain, normal, optimal, ideal, or standard conditions, as they are sometimes called, are supposed to exclude the conditions under which glasses may fail to manifest their disposition to shatter. There are various problems with how such conditions can be properly specified, which are not our concern here. (On dispositions, see Armstrong (1997), Bird (1998), Carnap (1928), Goodman (1973), Lewis (1997), Mellor (2000), Mumford (1998), Prior (1985), and Sellars (1958).)
Humans too can be said to possess different dispositions, which manifest themselves under certain circumstances. For instance, a child observes her parents pointing to a certain thing and saying “table”; they encourage the child to mouth “table” in the presence of that thing; the child tries to do so and when she is successful, she is rewarded; if she says “table” in the presence of a chair, she is corrected; and the process continues. The child is gradually conditioned to say “table” in the presence of the table. She then generalizes it: in the presence of a new table, she utters “table”. She is now said to be disposed to respond with “table” in the presence of tables, with “green” in the presence of green things, with the sum of two numbers when asked “x + y =?”, and so forth. Call these the “dispositional facts”. According to the dispositional view, such facts are capable of constituting what the speaker means by her words, or as the skeptic prefers to put it, from these dispositions we are supposed to “read off” what the speaker means by her words. For instance, if the speaker is disposed to apply “green” to green objects only, we can read off from such responses that she means green by “green”. Similarly, if she is disposed to apply “green” to green objects until a certain time t (for example, until the year 2100) and to blue objects after time t, we must conclude that she means something else, for instance, grue by “green” (Goodman 1973). Now, as the speaker is disposed to respond with “125” to “68 + 57 =?”, the dispositionalists’ claim is that the speaker means plus by “plus”.
The skeptic makes three objections. The first is that facts about dispositions cannot determine what the speaker means by “plus”; this is to say that the dispositional view fails to meet the Constitution Demand. The problem that the skeptic puts forward in this case is sometimes called the “Finitude Problem” or “Finiteness Problem” (Blackburn (1984a), Boghossian (1989), Ginsborg (2011), Horwich (1990), Soames (1997), and Wright (1984)). The other two objections concern the dispositional view’s success in accommodating the normative aspect of meaning: the dispositional view cannot account for systematic errors as “errors” and dispositional facts are descriptive in nature, while meaning facts are supposed to be normative. These different problems are however related, as the next three sections make clear.
According to the skeptic, facts about the speaker’s dispositions to respond in specific ways on certain occasions fail to constitute the fact that the speaker means plus by “plus” because “not only my actual performance, but also the totality of my dispositions, is finite” (Kripke 1982, 26). During our lifetime, we can produce only a limited number of responses. The skeptic now introduces a brand-new skeptical hypothesis: perhaps, the plus sign “+” stands for a function that we can call skaddition. It can be symbolized by “*” and defined as follows (see Kripke 1982, 30):
x * y = x + y, if x and y are small enough for us to have any disposition to add them in our lifetime;
x * y = 5, otherwise.
There are at least two possible meaning facts now, or two different rules, which are compatible with the totality of the responses a speaker can produce in her life: one possible fact is that she means addition by “+” and the other is that she means skaddition by “+”. The skeptic’s claim is that even if the speaker actually responds with the sum of all the numbers that she is asked to add in her lifetime, we still cannot read off from such responses that she really means plus by “plus”, for even the totality of her dispositions to respond to “x + y =?” is compatible with both “+” meaning addition and “+” meaning skaddition. The dispositional view fails to show that the fact that the speaker means addition, and not skaddition, by “+” can be constituted by facts about the speaker’s dispositions to respond with the sum of numbers. Therefore, the general strategy of the skeptic in this case is to uncover that no matter how the speaker actually responds, such responses can be interpreted differently, that is, in such a way that they remain compatible with different possible meaning facts or rules.
The skeptic anticipates an obvious objection from the dispositionalists, according to which the way the skeptic has characterized the dispositional view is too naive. A more sophisticated version of this view could avoid the finitude problem by including provisos like “under optimal conditions”. Their claim is that, under such conditions, “I surely will respond with the sum of any two numbers when queried” (Kripke 1982, 27). The main difficulty, however, is to specify these ideal, optimal or standard conditions in a non-question-begging way. For the skeptic, there are two general ways in which these conditions can be specified: (1) by using non-semantical and non-intentional terms, that is, in a purely naturalistic way, and (2) by using semantical and intentional terms. Both fail to bypass the skeptical problem, as the skeptic argues.
According to the skeptic, attempts for the first option lead to entirely indeterminate conjectures because we need to include conditions like “if my brain had been stuffed with sufficient extra matter”, “if it were given enough capacity to perform very large additions”, “if my life (in a healthy state) were prolonged enough”, and the like (see Kripke 1982, 27). Under such conditions, the dispositionalist may claim, I would respond by the sum of two numbers, no matter how large they are. According to the skeptic, however, “we have no idea what the results of such experiments would be. They might lead me to go insane, even to behave according to a quus-like rule. The outcome really is obviously indeterminate” (Kripke 1982, 27). It is completely unknown to us how such a person would be disposed to respond in a possible world in which she possesses such peculiar, beyond-imagination abilities.
In order to avoid such a problem, the dispositionalists may go for the second option and claim:
If I somehow were to be given the means to carry out my intentions with respect to numbers that presently are too long for me to add (or to grasp), and if I were to carry out these intentions, then if queried about ‘m + n’ for some big m and n, I would respond with their sum (and not with their quum). (Kripke 1982, 28)
The skeptic’s objection, however, is that this characterization of the optimal conditions is hopeless because it begs the question against the skeptic’s main challenge: what determines the intention of the speaker to use “+” in one way rather than another? The dispositional view presupposes, in its optimal conditions, that the speaker has a determinate intention toward what she wants to do with the numbers. Obviously, if I mean plus by “plus” or intend “+” to denote the addition function, I will be disposed to give their sum. But the problem is to determine what I mean by “plus” or what intention I have with regard to the use of “+”. This means that the dispositional view fails to meet the Constitution Demand.
The dispositional account fails to accommodate the simple fact that we might be disposed to make systematic mistakes. Suppose that the speaker, for any reason, is disposed to respond slightly differently to certain arithmetic queries: she responds to “6 + 5 =?” with “10”, to “6 + 6 =?” with “11”, to “6 + 7 =?” with “12”, and so on. According to the skeptic, the dispositionalists cannot claim that the speaker means plus by “+” but simply makes mistakes, unless they beg the question against the skeptic. For, on their view, “the function someone means is to be read off from his dispositions” (Kripke 1982, 29). The dispositional account aims to show that because the speaker is disposed to respond with the sum of numbers, we can conclude that she follows the addition rule. But, in the above example, the speaker’s responses do not accord with the addition function; therefore, we cannot read off from these responses that she means plus by “plus”. Dispositionalists cannot claim that the speaker intends to give the sum of numbers but makes mistakes. Rather, all that they can say is that the speaker does not mean plus by “plus”. Otherwise, they beg the question against the skeptic by presupposing what the speaker means by “plus” in advance. This is related to the third problem with the dispositional view.
According to the skeptic, not only does the dispositional view fail to meet the Constitution Demand, but it also fails to meet the Normativity Demand. As shown in the previous section, the dispositional view fails to accommodate the fact that a speaker might make systematic mistakes. The skeptic’s more general claim is that even if the dispositional view can somehow find a way to dodge the finitude problem, it still fails to accommodate the normative feature of meaning because the dispositional facts are descriptive in nature, not normative or prescriptive. As the skeptic puts it:
A dispositional account misconceives the sceptic’s problem – to find a past fact that justifies my present response. As a candidate for a ‘fact’ that determines what I mean, it fails to satisfy the basic condition on such a candidate, […], that it should tell me what I ought to do in each new instance” (Kripke 1982, 24).
When queried about “68 + 57 =?”, we are confident that the correct answer to this query is “125” because we are confident that we mean plus by “plus”. Meaning facts are normative, in that what we meant by “plus” in the past already determined how we ought to respond in the future. Nonetheless, facts about the speaker’s dispositions are descriptive: they do not say that because the speaker has been disposed to respond in this way, she should or ought to respond in that way in the future. They just describe how the speaker has used, uses or will use the word. Therefore, “this is not the proper account of the relation, which is normative, not descriptive” (Kripke 1982, 37): if you meant green by “green” in the past, you ought to apply it to this green object now. The dispositionalist cannot make such a claim, but must rather wait to see whether the speaker is or would be disposed to apply “green” to this green object.
The skeptic’s main objection against the dispositional view is that the speaker’s consistent responses cannot be counted as correct or as the responses the speaker ought to produce. If the responses that the speaker is disposed to produce cannot be viewed as correct, we cannot talk about their being in accordance with a determinate rule or a specific meaning: with no normative constraint on use, there can be no talk of meaning. According to Kripke, this is the skeptic’s chief objection to the dispositional view: “Ultimately, almost all objections to the dispositional account boil down to this one” (Kripke 1982, 24). (For defenses of the dispositional view against the skeptic see, for instance, Coates (1986), Blackburn (1984a), Horwich (1990; 1995; 2012; 2019), Ginsborg (2011; 2021), and Warren (2018).)
The skeptic’s strategy to reject the reductionist responses, such as the dispositional view, can thus be generally stated as follows: it does not matter how the speaker responds because, in whatever way she responds, it can be made compatible with her following different rules. Her answering with “125” to “68 + 57 =?” can be interpreted in such a way as to remain compatible with her following the skaddition rule. We then face a very problematic dilemma.
Suppose that one offers the following solution: each time that the speaker applies the addition rule, she has some other instruction or rule in mind, such as the “counting rule”; by appealing to this latter rule, we can then respond to the skeptic by claiming that “suppose we wish to add x and y. Take a huge bunch of marbles. First count out x marbles in one heap. Then count out y marbles in another. Put the two heaps together and count out the number of marbles in the union thus formed. The result is x + y” (Kripke 1982, 15). The skeptic’s response is obvious and based on the fact that a rule (the addition rule) is determined in terms of another rule (the counting rule). The skeptic can claim that, perhaps, by “count” the speaker always meant quount, not count; he then goes on to offer his non-standard, compatible-with-the-quus-scenario interpretation of “count” (see Kripke 1982, 16). The vicious regress of interpretations reappears, that of rules interpreting rules. At some point, we must stop and say that this rule cannot be interpreted in any other, non-standard way. The skeptic then asks: what is it about this special, “superlative” rule that prevents it from being interpreted in different ways? The skeptical challenge can be applied to this rule, unless we answer the skeptic’s question. But answering that very question is the whole point of the skeptical problem. Any attempt to escape the regress without answering the skeptic’s question, on the other hand, only makes such an alleged superlative rule mysterious.
The skeptic rejects a specific version of non-reductionism, according to which the fact that the speaker means plus by “plus” is primitive, irreducible to any other fact about the speaker’s behavioral or mental life. Whenever I use a word, I just directly know what I mean by it; nothing else about me is supposed to constitute this fact. The skeptic himself thinks that “such a move may in a sense be irrefutable” (Kripke 1982, 51). Nevertheless, he describes this suggestion as “desperate” (Kripke 1982, 51) and makes two objections to it: (1) it leaves the nature of such a primitive state completely mysterious, since this state supposedly possesses a general content that is present in an indefinite number of cases in which we may use the word, but our minds or brains do not have the capacity to consider each such case of use explicitly in advance; (2) it has to propose that we somehow have a direct, first-personal epistemic access to the general content of such a state, which is not known via introspection, but which seems to be, in a queer way, always available to us. The skeptic’s objections have also been called the “argument from queerness” (see Boghossian (1989; 1990) and Wright (1984)).
According to the skeptic, the non-reductionist response “leaves the nature of this postulated primitive state – the primitive state of ‘meaning addition by “plus”’ – completely mysterious” (Kripke 1982, 51). It is mysterious because it is supposed to be a finite state, embedded in the speaker’s finite mind or brain, whose capacity is limited, but it is also supposed to possess a general content that covers a potentially infinite number of cases in which the word may be used and that is always available to the speaker and tells her what the correct way of using the word is in every possible case:
Such a state does not consist in my explicitly thinking of each case of the addition table, nor even of my encoding each separate case in the brain: we lack the capacity for that. Yet (as Wittgenstein states in the Philosophical Investigations, §195) ‘in a queer way’ each such case already is ‘in some sense present’. (Kripke 1982, 52).
It is very hard, according to the skeptic, to make sense of the nature of such states that are finite but have such a general content.
Moreover, it is not clear how to explain our direct and non-inferential epistemic access to the content of these states. The primitive state of meaning plus by “plus” determines the correct use of the word in indefinitely (or even infinitely) many cases. Yet, as the skeptic says, “we supposedly are aware of it with some fair degree of certainty whenever it occurs” (Kripke 1982, 51). We directly and non-inferentially know how to use “plus” in each possible case of using it. As Wright characterizes the argument from queerness, “how can there be a state which each of us knows about, in his own case at least, non-inferentially and yet which is infinitely fecund, possessing specific directive content for no end of distinct situations?” (Wright 1984, 775). The skeptic’s claim is that there is no plausible answer to this question.
The skeptic’s skeptical argument is now complete: any reductionist or non-reductionist response to his skeptical problem is shown to be a failure. Granted that, it remains to see to what conclusions the skeptic has been leading us all along.
George Wilson (1994; 1998) has usefully distinguished between two different conclusions that the skeptical argument establishes: (1) the Basic Skeptical Conclusion and (2) the Radical Skeptical Conclusion. The Basic Skeptical Conclusion is the outcome of the skeptic’s detailed arguments against the aforementioned candidate facts. After arguing that all of them fail to determine what the speaker means by her words, the skeptic claims that “there can be no fact as to what I mean by ‘plus’, or any other word at any time” (Kripke 1982, 21). In order to see why the argument has a further radical conclusion, we must consider why the skeptic thinks that his argument’s target is “classical realism” (Kripke 1982, 73, 85).
According to the broad realist treatment of meaning, there are facts as to what a (declarative) sentence means or what a speaker means by it. For Kripke, the early Wittgenstein in the Tractatus (1922) supports a similar view of meaning, according to which:
A declarative sentence gets its meaning by virtue of its truth conditions, by virtue of its correspondence to facts that must obtain if it is true. For example, ‘the cat is on the mat’ is understood by those speakers who realize that it is true if and only if a certain cat is on a certain mat; it is false otherwise (Kripke 1982, 72).
We can tell the same story about the sentences by which we ascribe meaning to our and others’ utterances, such as “Jones means plus by “plus””. According to the realist, this sentence has a truth-condition: it is true if and only if Jones really means plus by “plus”, or if the fact that Jones means plus by “plus” obtains. It is a fact that Jones means plus, and not anything else, by “plus” and depending on the sort of realist view that one holds (such as naturalist reductionist, non-naturalist, non-reductionist, and so forth), such meaning facts are either primitive or, in one way or another, constituted by some other fact about the speaker. Such a realist conception of meaning provides an explanation of why we mean what we do by our words. The skeptical argument rejects the existence of any such fact, as it appears in its Basic Skeptical Conclusion.
If we support such a realist view of meaning, the skeptical argument has a very radical outcome because the combination of the Basic Skeptical Conclusion and the classical realist conception of meaning amounts to the Radical Skeptical Conclusion, according to which “there can be no such thing as meaning anything by any word” (Kripke 1982, 21). For Kripke, this conclusion captures the paradox that Wittgenstein presents in section 201 of the Philosophical Investigations. Any use you make of a word is both correct and incorrect at the same time because it is compatible with different meanings and there is no fact determining what meaning the speaker has in mind. The notion of meaning simply vanishes, together with that of correctness of use. The classical realist explanation of meaning, therefore, leads to the Wittgensteinian paradox. Kripke, however, believes that his Wittgenstein has a “solution” to this problem, though its aim is not to rescue classical realism.
The Radical Skeptical Conclusion seems to be obviously wrong at least for two reasons. For one thing, we do very often mean specific things by our words. For another, the Radical Skeptical Conclusion is “incredible and self-defeating” (Kripke 1982, 71) because if it is true, the skeptical conclusions themselves would not have any meaning. According to Kripke, his Wittgenstein does not “wish to leave us with his problem, but to solve it: the sceptical conclusion is insane and intolerable” (Kripke 1982, 60). Kripke’s Wittgenstein agrees with his skeptic that there is no fact about what we mean by our words and thus accepts the Basic Skeptical Conclusion: he thinks that the classical realist explanation of meaning is deeply problematic. Nonetheless, he rejects the Radical Skeptical Conclusion as unacceptable. Although there is no fact as to what someone means by her words, we do not need to accept the conclusion that there is thereby no such thing as meaning and understanding at all. What we need to do is instead to throw away the view that resulted in such a paradox, that is, the classical realist conception of meaning. Such a view was a misunderstanding of our ordinary notion of meaning.
Kripke distinguishes between two general sorts of solutions to the skeptical problem: straight solutions and skeptical solutions. A straight solution aims to show that the skeptic is wrong or unjustified in his claims (see Kripke 1982, 66). The suggested facts previously mentioned can be seen as various attempts to offer a straight solution. The skeptic argues that they are all hopeless as they lead to the paradox. A skeptical solution, however, starts by accepting the negative point of the skeptic’s argument, that is, that there is no fact as to what someone means by her words. The skeptical solution is built on the idea that “our ordinary practice or belief is justified because – contrary appearances notwithstanding—it need not require the justification the sceptic has shown to be untenable” (Kripke 1982, 67).
Consider the sentences by which we attribute meaning to others and ourselves, that is, meaning-ascribing sentences, such as “Jones means plus by “plus”” or “I mean plus by “plus””. The classical realist conception of the meaning of such sentences is truth-conditional: the sentence “Jones means plus by “plus”” is true if and only if Jones means plus by “plus” (that is, if and only if the fact that Jones means plus by “plus” obtains) and thus its meaning is that Jones means plus by “plus”. Similarly, the sentence “I mean plus by “plus”” is true if and only if I do mean plus by “plus” (that is, if and only if the fact that I mean plus by “plus” obtains) and thus means that I do mean plus by “plus”. (My concentration will be on the third-personal attributions of meaning such as “Jones means plus by “plus””, while similar considerations apply to the case of self-attributions). The skeptic argues that there is no such fact obtaining which makes these sentences true. The skeptical solution abandons the classical realist truth-conditional treatment of meaning. (See Boghossian (1989), Horwich (1990), McDowell (1992), Peacocke (1984), Soames (1998), and Wilson (1994; 1998) for the claim that Wittgenstein’s aim has not been to rule out the notion of truth-conditions, but the classical realist conception of it.)
Alternatively, as Kripke puts it:
[His] Wittgenstein replaces the question “What must be the case for [a] sentence to be true?” by two other : first, “Under what conditions may this form of words be appropriately asserted (or denied)?”; second, given an answer to the first question, “What is the role, and the utility, in our lives of our practice of asserting (or denying) the form of words under these conditions?” (Kripke 1982, 73)
Once we give up on the classical realist view of meaning, all we need to do is to take a careful look at our ordinary practice of asserting meaning-ascribing sentences under certain conditions. Kripke’s Wittgenstein calls these conditions Assertibility Conditions or Justification Conditions (Kripke 1984, 74). In its most general sense, the assertibility conditions tell us under what conditions we are justified to assert something specific by using a sentence. When our concern is to attribute meaning to ourselves and others, these conditions tell us when we can justifiably assert that Jones means plus by “plus” or that I follow the addition rule. We already know that we cannot say that we are justified in asserting that Jones means plus by “plus” because the fact that he means plus obtained. Nor can we do the same in our own case: there is no fact about any of us constituting the fact that we mean this rather than that by our words.
Having agreed with the skeptic that there is no fact about meaning, it seems to Kripke’s Wittgenstein that all that we are left with is our feeling of confidence, blind inclinations, mere dispositions or natural propensities to respond or to use words in one way rather than another: it seems that “I apply the rule blindly” (Kripke 1982, 17). The assertibility conditions specify the conditions under which the subject is inclined, or feels confident, to apply her words in such and such a way: “the ‘assertibility conditions’ that license an individual to say that, on a given occasion, he ought to follow his rule this way rather than that, are, ultimately, that he does what he is inclined to do” (Kripke 1982, 88). This, however, does not imply that there is thereby no such thing as meaning one thing rather than another by some words. The evidence justifying us to assert or judge that Jones means green by “green” is our observation of Jones’s linguistic behavior, that is, his use of the word under certain publicly observable circumstances. We can justifiably assert that Jones means green by “green” if we can observe, in enough cases, that he uses this word as we do or would do, or more generally, as others in his speech-community are inclined to do. This is the only justification there is, and the only justification we need, to assert that he means green by “green”. We can also tell a story about why such a practice has the shape it has and why we are participating in it at all, without appealing to any classical realist or otherwise explanation of such practices: participating in them has endless benefits for us. Consider an example from Kripke:
Suppose I go to the grocer with a slip marked ‘five red apples’, and he hands over apples, reciting by heart the numerals up to five and handing over an apple as each numeral is intoned. It is under circumstances such as these that we are licensed to make utterances using numerals. (Kripke 1982, 75-76)
We can assert that the grocer and the customer both mean five by “five”, red by “red”, and apple by “apple” if they agree in the way they are inclined to apply these terms. Our lives depend on our participation and success in such practices. If the customer responds with some bizarre answers, others including the grocer start losing their justification to assert that he really means plus by “plus”: the only justification there is for making such assertions starts vanishing.
Note again that such agreed-on dispositions, blind inclinations or natural propensities to respond in certain ways, contrary to the dispositional account of meaning, are not supposed to form a fact that can constitute some meaning fact, such as the fact that the grocer means apple, and not anything else, by “apple”. The sort of responses we naturally agree to produce and the impact they have on our lives give rise to our “form of life”. The members of our speech-community agree to use “plus” and other words in specific ways: they are uniform in their responses. We live a plus-like form of life (see Kripke 1982, 96). However, there is and can be no (realist or otherwise) explanation of why we agree to respond as we do. Any attempt to cite some fact constituting such agreements leads to the emergence of the Wittgensteinian paradox. For this reason, it would be nothing but a brute empirical fact, a primitive aspect of our form of life, that we all agree as we do (see Kripke 1982, 91).
Once we accept such an alternative picture of meaning, we realize that one of its consequences is the impossibility of a private language. Kripke’s Wittgenstein emphasizes that “if one person is considered in isolation, the notion of a rule as guiding the person who adopts it can have no substantive content” (Kripke 1982, 89). The skeptical solution cannot admit the possibility of a private language, that is, a language that someone invents and only she can understand, independently of the shared practices of a speech-community. This comes from the nature of the assertibility conditions: “It turns out that […] these conditions […] involve reference to a community. They are inapplicable to a single person considered in isolation. Thus, as we have said, Wittgenstein rejects ‘private language’” (Kripke 1982, 79).
Consider the case of a Robinson Crusoe who has been in isolation since birth on an island. Crusoe is inclined to apply his words in certain ways. He is confident, for instance, that when he applies “green” to an object, his use is correct, that he means green or in any case something determinate by this word. Facing a new object, he thinks he ought to apply “green” to this object too. As there is no one else with whose use or responses he can contrast his, all there is to assure him that his use is correct is himself and his confidence. To Crusoe, thus, whatever seems right is right, in which case no genuine notion of error, mistake, or disagreement can emerge: if he feels confident that “green” applies to a blue object, this is correct. The assertibility conditions in this case would be along these lines:
“Green” applies to this object if and only if Crusoe thinks or feels confident that “green” applies to the object.
This is the reason why Wittgenstein famously stated that “in the present case I have no criterion of correctness. One would like to say: whatever is going to seem right to me is right. And that only means that here we can’t talk about ‘right’” (Wittgenstein 1953, §258). In order for certain applications of “green” to be incorrect, there are to be certain correct ways of applying it. For a solitary person, however, “there are no circumstances under which we can say that, even if he inclines to say ‘125’, he should have said ‘5’, or vice versa” (Kripke 1982, 88). The correct answer is simply “the answer that strikes him as natural and inevitable” (Kripke 1982, 88). Crusoe’s use is wrong only when he feels it is wrong.
Nonetheless, if Crusoe is a member of a speech-community, a new element enters the picture: although Crusoe may simply feel confident that applying “green” to this (blue) object is correct, others in his speech-community disagree. The assertibility conditions for how “green” applies turn into the following condition:
“Green” applies to this object if and only if others are inclined to apply “green” to that object, or if others feel confident that “green” applies to it.
As Kripke’s Wittgenstein puts it, “others will then have justification conditions for attributing correct or incorrect rule-following to the subject, and these will not be simply that the subject’s own authority is unconditionally to be accepted” (Kripke 1982, 89). This is the reason why Kripke thinks that Wittgenstein’s argument against the possibility of private language (known as the private language argument) is not an independent argument. Nor is it the main concern of Wittgenstein in the Investigations. Rather, it is the consequence of Wittgenstein’s new way of looking at our linguistic practices, according to which speaking and understanding a language is a sort of activity. As Wittgenstein famously puts it, “to understand a sentence means to understand a language. To understand a language means to be master of a technique” (Wittgenstein 1953, §199). If so, then “to obey a rule, to make a report, to give an order, to play a game of chess, are customs (uses, institutions)” (Wittgenstein 1953, §199). There is an extensive literature on the implications of the private language argument as well as Kripke’s reading of it (see for instance, Baker and Hacker (1984), Bar-On (1992), Blackburn (1984a), Davies (1988), Hanfling (1984), Hoffman (1985), Kusch (2006), Malcolm (1986), McDowell (1984; 1989), McGinn (1984), Williams (1991), and Wright (1984; 1991)).
Since the publication of Kripke’s book, almost every aspect of his interpretation of Wittgenstein has been carefully examined. The responses can be put in three main categories: those focusing on the correctness of Kripke’s interpretation of Wittgenstein, those discussing the plausibility of the skeptical argument and solution, and those attempting to offer an alternative solution to the skeptical problem. Many interesting and significant issues, which were first highlighted by Kripke in his book, have since turned into self-standing topics, such as that of the normativity of meaning, the dispositional view of meaning, and the community conception of language. In what follows, it will only be possible to glance upon some of the most famous responses to Kripke’s Wittgenstein. They mainly debate the issues over the individualist vs. communitarian readings of Wittgenstein and the reductionist factualist vs. non-reductionist factualist interpretations of his remarks.
In their 1984 book, Scepticism, Rules and Language, Baker and Hacker defend an individualistic reading of Wittgenstein’s view of the notion of a practice and thereby reject Kripke’s suggested communitarian interpretation. For them, not only does Kripke misrepresent Wittgenstein, but the skeptical argument and the skeptical solution are both wrong. They believe that Wittgenstein never aimed to reject a philosophical view and defend another. Thus, they find it entirely unacceptable to agree with Kripke that Wittgenstein “who throughout his life found philosophical scepticism nonsensical […] should actually make a sceptical problem the pivotal point of his work. It would be even more surprising to find him accepting the sceptic’s premises […] rather than showing that they are ‘rubbish’” (Backer and Hacker 1984, 5). According to Baker and Hacker, the skeptical argument cannot even be treated as a plausible sort of skepticism; it rather leads to pure nihilism: “Why his argument is wrong may be worth investigating (as with any paradox), but that it is wrong is indubitable. It is not a sceptical problem but an absurdity” (Backer and Hacker 1984, 5). For, as they see it, a legitimate skepticism about a subject matter involves only epistemological rather than metaphysical doubts. An epistemological skeptic would claim that we do mean specific things by our words (as we normally do) but, for some reason, we can never be certain what that meaning is. For Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s skeptic, however, there is no fact about meaning at all and this leads to a paradox, which results in the conclusion that there is no such thing as meaning anything by any word. But “this is not scepticism at all, it is conceptual nihilism, and, unlike classical scepticism, it is manifestly self-refuting” (Backer and Hacker 1984, 5).
According to the way Baker and Hacker read Wittgenstein, the paradox mentioned in section 201 of the Investigations is intended by Wittgenstein to reveal a misunderstanding, not something that we should live with, and “this is shown by the fact that no interpretation, i.e. no rule for the application of a rule, can satisfy us, can definitively fix, by itself, what counts as accord. For each interpretation generates the same problem” (Backer and Hacker 1984, 13). Our understanding of words has nothing to do with the task of fixing a mediating interpretation because the result of such an attempt is a regress of interpretations. For Wittgenstein, understanding is nothing but that which manifests itself in our use of words, in our actions, in the technique of using language. Thus, Wittgenstein cannot be taken to be offering a skeptical solution either.
Moreover, for Baker and Hacker, the community view that Kripke attributes to Wittgenstein, as Wittgenstein’s alternative view, must be thrown away. For if it is the notion of a practice that Wittgenstein thinks of as fundamental, we can find no compelling reason to conclude that Crusoe cannot come up with a practice, in the sense of acquiring a technique to use his words and symbols. After all, it is enough that such an understanding manifests itself in Crusoe’s practices. According to Baker and Hacker, to participate in a practice is not just to act but to repeat an action over time with regularity. If so, then “nothing in this discussion involves any commitment to a multiplicity of agents. All the emphasis is on the regularity, the multiple occasions, of action” (Backer and Hacker 1984, 20).
Blackburn also defends an individualistic reading of Wittgenstein. For him, there is no metaphysical difference between the case of Crusoe and the case of a community. For whatever is available to Kripke’s Wittgenstein to avoid the skeptical problem in the case of a community of speakers is equally available to an anti-communitarianist defending the case of Crusoe as a case of genuine rule-following. For instance, consider the problem with the finiteness of dispositions. If the objection is that the totality of the dispositions of an individual, because of being finite, fails to determine what the individual means by her words, the totality of the dispositions of a community too is finite and thus fails to determine what they mean by their words. This means that the community can also be seen as following the skaddition rule: the agreement in their similar responses would remain compatible with both scenarios, that is, their following the addition rule and their following the skaddition rule.
On the other hand, according to Blackburn, if the claim is merely that it is only within a community of speakers that a practice can emerge, we are misreading Wittgenstein. The claim that a practice emerges only within a community may mean different things. It might for instance mean that to Crusoe, whatever seems right is right, so that a community is inevitably required to draw a distinction between what is right and what only seems right. As Blackburn points out, however, the case of an individual and that of a community does not differ metaphysically with respect to this issue because the same problem arises in the case of a community: whatever seems right to the community is right. Alternatively, the claim may mean that it is only because of the interactions between the members of a community that the notion of a practice can be given a legitimate meaning. Blackburn’s objection is that we have no argument against the possibility that Crusoe can interact with himself and thus form a practice: we can imagine that Crusoe interacts with his past self, with the symbols, signs and the like that he used in the past. There is no reason to assume that because his responses are not like ours, Crusoe’s practice is not a practice. The point is that if he is part of no community, there simply is no requirement that he responds as any others do. Consequently, it is implausible to claim that, within a speech-community, “we see ourselves as rule-followers because why is it that Crusoe cannot see himself as a rule-follower?”
For Blackburn, the negative point that Wittgenstein makes is that we must not think of the connection between use of words and understanding them as mediated by something, such as some interpretation, mental image, idea, and so forth, because doing so leads to the regress of interpretations: the search for some other medium making the previous one fixed would go on forever. This is a misunderstanding of our practices. Wittgenstein’s positive insight is that “our rules are anchored in practice […] That is, dignifying each other as rule-following is essentially connected with seeing each other as successfully using techniques or practices” (Wittgenstein 1984a, 296). But such a notion of a practice is not necessarily hinged on a community: “we must not fall into the common trap of simply equating practice with public practice, if the notion is to give us the heartland of meaning” (Wittgenstein 1984b, 85). Blackburn, thus, defends an individualist view of rule-following against the communitarian view that Kripke’s Wittgenstein offers in his skeptical solution.
Colin McGinn, in his well-known book Wittgenstein on Meaning (1984), also defends an individualist reading of Wittgenstein. Some of his objections are similar to those made by Blackburn and by Baker and Hacker: Kripke neglects Wittgenstein’s positive remark, offered in the second part of section 201 of the Investigations, that the paradox is the result of a misunderstanding that must be removed. For McGinn, this forms a reductio for the conception of meaning that treats the notion of interpretation as essential to the possibility of understanding a language (McGinn 1984, 68). Wittgenstein’s aim has been to remove a misconception of this notion, according to which understanding is a kind of mental process, such as that of translating or interpreting words. Kripke is thus unjustified in his claim that Wittgenstein offers a skeptical problem and then a skeptical solution to such a problem. For McGinn, Wittgenstein has never been hostile to notions like “facts” and “truth-conditions” as they are ordinarily used; his target has rather been to unveil a misunderstanding of them, one that builds on the notion of interpretation. This means that McGinn supports a factualist reading of Wittgenstein against the non-factualist view that Kripke seems to attribute to him. This factualist view takes the notion of a practice, or the ability to use words in certain ways, to form a fact as to what someone means by her words: “At any rate, if we want to talk in terms of facts it seems that Wittgenstein does suggest that understanding consists in a fact, the fact of having an ability to use signs” (McGinn 1984, 71). (For some of the well-known factualist readings of Wittgenstein, and the skeptical solution, see, for instance, Byrne (1996), Davies (1998), Soames (1997; 1998), Stroud (1996), and Wilson (1994; 1998). See also Boghossian (1989; 1990), Kusch (2006) and Miller (2010) for further discussions.)
Moreover, for McGinn, the notion of a practice or a custom does not involve the notion of a community. Thus, he agrees with Blackburn and with Baker and Hacker on this point. It is true that Wittgenstein embraces the idea of multiplicity, but this has nothing to do with the multiplicity of subjects, but rather with a multiplicity of instances of rule-following: a word cannot be said to have a meaning if it is used just once; meaning emerges as the result of using words repeatedly over time in a certain way. He also sees the skeptic’s objections to non-reductionism as misplaced. For him, if we treat meaning as an irreducible state of the speaker, we may have a difficult time coming up with a theory that can explain how we directly know the general content of such states. But “lack of a theory of a phenomenon is not in itself a good reason to doubt the existence of it” (McGinn 1984, 161). (For a well-known criticism of McGinn’s view, see Wright (1989).)
On the other hand, McDowell and Peacocke have defended a communitarian reading of Wittgenstein. According to Peacocke, Wittgenstein’s considerations on rule-following reveal that following a rule is a practice, which is essentially communal: “what it is for a person to be following a rule, even individually, cannot ultimately be explained without reference to some community” (Peacocke 1981, 72). We need some public criteria in order to be able to draw the distinction between what seems right to the individual and what is right independently of what merely seems to her to be so, and to assess whether she follows a rule correctly; these criteria would emerge only if the individual can be considered as a member of a speech-community. For Peacocke, Wittgenstein has shown that the individualistic accounts of rule-following are based on a misunderstanding of what is fundamental to the existence of our ordinary linguistic practices.
According to McDowell, Kripke has misinterpreted Wittgenstein’s central point in his remarks on the paradox presented especially in section 201 of the Investigations. His chief remark is offered in the second part of the same paragraph, where Wittgenstein says: “It can be seen that there is a misunderstanding here […] What this shews is that there is a way of grasping a rule which is not an interpretation, but which is exhibited in what we call ‘obeying the rule’ and ‘going against it’ in actual cases” (Wittgenstein 1953, §201). If Wittgenstein views the paradox as the result of a misunderstanding, we cannot claim that he is sympathetic to any skeptic. According to McDowell, for Wittgenstein, the paradox comes not from adopting a realist picture of meaning but from a misconception of our linguistic practices, according to which meaning and understanding are mediated by some interpretation. When we face the question as to what constitutes such an understanding, “we tend to be enticed into looking for a fact that would constitute my having put an appropriate interpretation on what I was told and shown when I was instructed in [for instance] arithmetic” (McDowell 1984, 331). Such a conception of a fact determining an intermediate interpretation is a misunderstanding. For, as Wittgenstein famously said, “any interpretation still hangs in the air along with what it interprets, and cannot give it any support” (Wittgenstein 1953, §198).
For McDowell, if we miss this fundamental point, we then face a devastating dilemma: (1) we try to find facts that fix an interpretation, which obviously leads to the regress of interpretations; but then, (2) in order to escape such a regress, we may be tempted to read Wittgenstein as claiming that to understand is to possess an interpretation but “an interpretation that cannot be interpreted” (McDowell 1984, 332). The latter attempt, however, dramatically fails to dodge the regress of interpretations: it rather pushes us toward an even worse difficulty, that is, that there is a superlative rule which is, in a mysterious way, not susceptible to the problem of the regress of interpretations. For McDowell, “one of Wittgenstein’s main concerns is clearly to cast doubt on this mythology” (McDowell 1984, 332). Understanding has nothing to do with mediating interpretations at all.
McDowell is also against the skeptical solution, which begins by accepting the (basic) skeptical conclusion of the skeptical argument: the whole point of Wittgenstein’s discussion of the paradox in the second part of section 201 has been to warn us against the paradox, that the dilemma in question is not compulsory. The paradox emerges as the result of a misunderstood treatment of meaning and understanding, according to which understanding involves interpretation. If so, there is then no need for a skeptical solution at all. For McDowell, once we fully appreciate Wittgenstein’s point about the paradox, we can see that there really is nothing wrong with our ordinary talk of communal facts, that is, facts as to what we mean by our words in a speech-community: “I simply act as I have been trained to. […] The training in question is initiation into a custom. If it were not that […] our picture would not contain the materials to entitle us to speak of following (going by) a sign-post” (McDowell 1984, 339). To understand a language is to master the technique of using this language, that is, to acquire a practical ability. This, however, does not imply admitting a purely behaviorist view of language and thereby emptying the notion of meaning from its normative feature. McDowell’s Wittgenstein treats acting in a certain way in a community “as acting within a communal custom” (McDowell 1984, 352), which is a rule-governed activity.
As we saw, Blackburn, McGinn, and Baker and Hacker defend an individualist reading of Wittgenstein’s remarks on rule-following, while Peacocke and McDowell support a communitarian one. Boghossian (1989) and Goldfarb (1985) also raise serious doubts about whether the skeptical solution can successfully make the notion of a community central to the existence of the practice of meaning something by a word. For them, the assertibility conditions are either essentially descriptive, rather than normative (Goldfarb 1985, 482-485), or they are capable of being characterized in an individualistic way, in which no mention of others’ shared practices is made at all (Boghossian 1989, 521-522). Nonetheless, defending an individualist view of meaning is one thing, advocating a factualist view of it is another: there are individualist factualist views (such as McGinn’s), as well as communitarian factualist views (such as McDowell’s). Moreover, the factualist views may themselves be reductionist (such as Horwich’s) or non-reductionist (such as Wright’s).
For instance, although Wright has offered various criticisms of Kripke’s Wittgenstein’s view, he thinks that the proper solution to the skeptical problem is a particular version of non-reductionist factualism. Like McGinn, Wright finds the skeptic’s argument from queerness against non-reductionism unconvincing (Wright 1984, 775ff.). Nonetheless, contrary to McGinn, he believes that we need to solve the epistemological problems that come with such a view. According to Wright, the generality of the content of our semantical and intentional states or, as he calls it, their “indefinite fecundity”, is not mysterious at all: it is simply part of the ordinary notion of meaning and intention that these states possess such a general content. Wright gives an example to clarify his point: “suppose I intend, for example, to prosecute at the earliest possible date anyone who trespasses on my land” (Wright 1984, 776). The content of such an intention is general: it does not constrain my action to a specific time, occasion, or person, so that “there can indeed be no end of distinct responses, in distinct situations, which I must make if I remember this intention, continue to wish to fulfil it, and correctly apprehend the prevailing circumstances” (Wright 1984, 776). If so, the main problem with non-reductionism is to account for the problem of self-knowledge, that is, to offer an account of why and how it is that we, as first-persons, non-inferentially and directly know the general content of our meaning states on each occasion of use. For one thing, it is part of our ordinary notion of meaning and intention that “a subject has, in general, authoritative and non-inferential access to the content of his own intentions, and that this content may be open-ended and general, may relate to all situations of a certain kind” (Wright 1984, 776). For another, however, Wright believes that we must, and can, account for such a phenomenon. He attempts to put forward an account of how we know what we mean and intend, differently from the way others, third-persons, know such meanings and intentions. His account is called the “Judgement-Dependent” account of meaning and intention, which Wright develops in several of his writings. Unpacking this account involves much technicality that goes beyond the scope of this article. (See especially Wright (1992; 2001) for his account. For a different response-dependent response to Kripke’s Wittgenstein, which also defends non-reductionism, see Pettit (1990).) Wright’s main point is that the fact that the non-reductionist response must deal with the problem of self-knowledge forms no decisive argument against its plausibility. On this point, Boghossian is on board with Wright: in order to reject the non-reductionist response what the skeptic needs to do is to provide “a proof that no satisfactory epistemology was ultimately to be had” (Boghossian 1989, 542). The skeptic, however, has no such argument to offer. For Wright, this means that if we explain these features of meaning, non-reductionism “is available to confront Kripke’s sceptic, and that, so far as I can see, the Sceptical Argument is powerless against it” (Wright 1984, 776). (For more on Wright’s criticisms of Kripke, see Wright (1986; 1992, appendix to chapter 3; 2001, part II). For the main defenses of non-reductionism against Kripke’s Wittgenstein, see also Hanfling (1985), Pettit (1990), and Stroud (1996).)
Paul Horwich, on the contrary, defends a communitarian version of reductionist factualism, or more accurately a communitarian version of the dispositional view against the skeptic. His main attempt is to show that “Wittgenstein’s equation of meaning with ‘use’ (construed non-semantically) is the taken-to-be-obvious centrepiece of his view of the matter, […] [contrary] to Kripke’s interpretation [that] the centrepiece is his criticism of that equation!” (Horwich 2012, 146). For Horwich, facts about the speaker’s environment, or more particularly facts about his linguistic community, are important and must be carefully taken care of in our account of meaning. His community-based dispositional view goes against the individualistic theory, according to which “what a person means is determined solely by the dispositions of that person” (Horwich 1990, 111). The community-based version of this view aims to show that “individuals are said to mean by a word whatever that word means in the linguistic community they belong to”. Horwich calls this view the Community-Use Theory. According to Horwich, there are (naturalistic) facts with normative consequences, that is, facts about how a speaker is naturally disposed to respond as a member of a speech-community. If we accept what Horwich calls uncontroversial universal principles, that is, the principles of the form “Human beings should be treated with respect”, “one should believe the truth”, and the like, we can then see that such principles are capable of entailing the sort of conditionals that have certain factual claims as their antecedents and certain normative claims as their consequents. Such conditionals would have the following form: “If Jones is a human being, then he ought to be treated with respect” or “If it is true that 68 + 57 = 125, then one ought to believe it” (see Horwich 1990, 112). All we need is then certain agreed-on principles that can tell us what the normative outcomes of non-normative situations are. Since we can have non-semantical, dispositional facts as the antecedents of these conditionals, it would be a mistake to think that factual claims, such as those made by the naturalistic dispositional view of meaning, cannot have normative consequences. For Horwich, therefore, the communal version of the dispositional view can accommodate the normative feature of meaning: factual claims about what a speaker means, whose truth depends on the obtaining of certain facts about the speaker’s dispositions being in agreement with those of the members of the speech-community, can have normative outcomes. Horwich engages in detailed discussions of Wittgenstein’s view of the deflationary theory of truth, different aspects of the normativity of meaning thesis, and the notion of communal dispositions. (For a different sort of reductionist dispositional view, which treats the dispositional facts as irreducibly normative, see Ginsborg (2011; 2018; 2021). See also Maddy (2014) and Marie McGinn (2010) for certain naturalist responses to Kripke’s Wittgenstein.)
Further salient reactions to Kripke’s Wittgenstein, such as those made by Chomsky (1986), Goldfarb (1985), Kusch (2006), Pettit (1992), and Soames (1997), are too technical to be properly unpacked in this article. Reference to some further key works on the topic can be found in the Further Reading section.
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Ali Hossein Khani
Iranian Institute of Philosophy (IRIP)