Language in Classical Chinese Philosophy

At first glance, early Chinese thought as expressed in Warring States period (475-221 BCE) texts does not seem to focus on the kinds of questions about language that one might expect from philosophers working on “the philosophy of language.”  This does not mean, however, that language is philosophically insignificant to early Chinese thinkers.  But it does show that discussions of language in these texts are part of early Chinese authors’ engagement with a larger set of philosophical problems, particularly the problem of self-cultivation.  Here, “self-cultivation” means a set of generalized practices directed toward the goal of moral action, focusing on the development of a set of virtues and norms as they relate to the individual as well as progressively higher units of social organization.  Although positions on self-cultivation differ widely across strands of early Chinese thought, a common goal of all competing traditions is the rehabilitation of human conduct.  Discourse about appropriate “models” (fa 法) for such rehabilitation – whether they be concrete tools, exemplary individuals or abstract ideas – is found in all early Chinese philosophical texts.  This, then, raises the issue of language: how does the sage (shengren 聖), as one who has successfully mastered exercises of self-cultivation and thus furnishes us with the requisite fa, speak? Or, as some traditions ask, does the sage speak at all?  Do words promote or impede an individual’s development, and is the sage’s insight an ineffable experience or is it one that can, and should, be articulated for the benefit of others?  Thus, the problem of self-cultivation functions as a stage for various other intersecting concerns into human nature, the relation between human feelings and thought or judgment, the ideal social and political organization, and the relation between the human subject and the larger processes of nature and the cosmos, among other topics.  Discussions of the linguistic dimensions of sagehood then generate other questions about language:  How do words relate to psychological states? Is language a constitutive element of human nature, or is it a conventional practice that stands in a particular orientation to a naturally given state? Is language inherently tied to the incidence of social and political chaos, or is it a technology that can be used to institute order?   This entry offers a brief overview of how inquiries concerning language are developed in classical Confucian, Mohist, and Daoist writings.

Table of Contents

  1. Key Terms and Problems
  2. Speech (yan 言) as Virtuous Conduct (xing 行) in the Analects
  3. Language and Self-Cultivation in the Mencius
  4. Zhengming 正名 in the Xunzi
  5. The Mohist Canons
  6. ‘Not Speaking’ in the Daodejing
  7. ‘Goblet Words’ in the Zhuangzi
  8. Additional Trends
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Key Terms and Problems

Contemporary debates on language in Chinese philosophy, in the analytic tradition, have been determined to a large extent by the research of Graham (1989, 1978) and Hansen (1983) on the linguistic models displayed in the Mohist Canons. Harbsmeier (1989b, 1991), Mou (1999), Fraser (2007) and Robins (2000) represent a selection of scholars who have extended the inquiry into the grammatical and syntactical structures in the Canons by further developing some of the central theses put forward by Graham and Hansen, such as those concerning the use of word-types (like mass-nouns) and structures of predication. An enduring premise in this approach is the clear distinction between language (variously construed as speech/yan言 and names/ming名) and the reality (shi 實, literally, ‘objects’ or ‘solids’) with which it shares a formal, representational relationship.

Another trend in inquiries concerning language involves a less formal approach, replacing the focus on referential structures with an analysis that identifies language as part of an embodied, empirical model of experience. Geaney (2010, 2002), for instance, argues that conceptions of language in early China cannot be grasped without appreciating the larger perceptual index of sight and sound of which ‘names’ and ‘speech’ are a constitutive element. Wagner (2003) similarly underscores how conceptions of ming in early linguistic models (like that of Wang Bi) define speech in terms of aurality, with ‘names’ being understood as meaningful units of sound. Lewis (1999) calls for situating language somewhere between a purely oral, and thus aural, dimension and a written technology that serves as a more robust medium for recording and articulating judgments.

Alternate directions in the literature display a different set of concerns, foregrounding the socio-political applications of a theory of language. In this latter approach, conceptions of language are often perceived as being coextensive with a conception of culture. We find, as a result, numerous schools attempting to furnish an account of how culture is to be distinguished from a natural state, and how ‘names’ or ‘speech’ fit in relative to this distinction. Multiple accounts of this distinction—as either oppositional, as a continuum, as unconnected—lead to diverse possibilities for conceiving language as a spectrum that displays a naturalist bias at one extreme and a social normative agenda at the other.

Whether we choose to capture the discussions of language in classical Chinese philosophy with a referential model that focuses on predicate logic, a perception-based model of the senses, or a more expansive understanding of language as a socio-political technology, a basic vocabulary emerges across a wide selection of texts that ties the question of language to the larger problem of how one can know the world and provide an articulate judgment of one’s experience in it. Early Chinese accounts of language are intimately bound up with how one discriminates (bian 辨) one thing from another, categorizing the world accordingly in terms of what ‘is so’ (shi 是) and what is ‘not so’ (fei 非). This dialectical capacity for division separates things both on the descriptive as well as normative registers, and thus built into the ascription of something as ‘so’ is the clear sense that it ought to be so. Chris Fraser describes these dual senses of the distinction between shi and fei as follows:

They [shi and fei] apply both to the descriptive, empirical question of whether or not something is a certain kind of thing and the normative question of whether some action or practice is morally right or wrong. In effect, shi and fei refer to a very basic, general normative status that does not distinguish between the different flavors of correctness and error implicated in describing, commanding, recommending, permitting, or choosing . . . Because of their normative use, they are seen as inherently evaluative terms with action-guiding force. In ethical contexts, this feature is obvious, as shi-fei distinctions articulate values. Even in nonethical contexts, however, the attitude of deeming something shi or fei is regarded as action guiding.

A recurrent theme that we accordingly encounter in pre-Han texts concerns the relation of names (ming) to how one discriminates and orders one’s categories. What is a name (ming) in relation that which is so (shi)? Is the negation of a thing by pointing to what it is not (fei) the opposite of a given name in that context? And how does the normative dimension of the model of bian affect the use of names along distinctions between shi and fei? As we see later in the article, these are all problems concerning language and epistemology that emerge as points of contention between the various competing schools of classical China.

2. Speech (yan 言) as Virtuous Conduct (xing 行) in the Analects

Concerns with language in Confucius’ Analects come to rest squarely within the text’s overarching composition of a program of self-cultivation. Names (ming 名) and the activity of speaking (yan 言), broadly construed in both a nominal and verbal sense, therefore do not present the reader with the kind of problematic that requires establishing a logical relation between mental content (as determining the ‘meaning’ of a word) and the world as a given, objective correlate. Rather, the salient question the text repeatedly poses is how to use words and speak in general such that one’s linguistic comportment can coincide with one’s character as a virtuous person. A direct consequence of aligning the question of language along these lines is to be seen in frequent discussions in the Analects where both the style of a person’s speech (its elocutionary attributes, such as tempo and diction) as well as its content emerge as useful measures of moral development. The Master is thus concerned with whether one’s words are sincere (xin 信) and unequivocally identifies “clever or cunning speech” (qiao yan巧言) (Analects, 1.3) with the absence of ren or virtue, as it is broadly construed in this text.

There exists in the Analects, then, no sense of the inherent value of words as signifiers of an external reality. Rather, language is analyzed as a philosophical problem only in relation to the viability of a virtue-based ethics, and its efficacy is to be judged in its successful subordination to, and implementation of, a model of virtuous conduct (xing 行) (see Analects, 9.24). At one end of this spectrum, the Master invokes the rhetorically powerful example of the Ancients, who remain silent out of fear that their actions will not match their words (see 4.22). But of more use is the model of the ‘nobleperson’ or junzi 君子, who displays a flawless calibration of words to action. Scattered across the text, the majority of discussions regarding the nature and use of words comes to settle on the need to emulate the linguistic perspicuity exhibited by this ideal type. The junzi speak with sincerity (xin 信) (see 1.7) and their use of language is repeatedly described as careful (see 1.14), slow (12.3) and always bound by the larger concerns with virtuous conduct (2.13, 4.24).

The capacity to undermine the Confucian art of self-cultivation through a gross misuse of language emerges as a necessary corollary to the conceptual bind the text forges between one’s speech (yan 言) and conduct (xing 行). While all who are virtuous speak in accordance with their character, it is not the case that all who speak are necessarily virtuous (see 14.4). Language can then serve equally as a marker of both moral health as well as moral decrepitude. It is this basic observation that underlies a central Confucian conviction that the health of a society, and its apex political institutions, can be achieved through the practice of zhengming 正名, or ‘correcting names.’ While this is an overt concern and stated objective in the Xunzi, the Analects underscores the important role that zhengming plays in a famous passage that links socio-political disorder ultimately with a state of linguistic disorder (see 13.3). If names (ming ) in their specific designation refer not to discrete objective correlates (‘son,’ ‘father’ as neutral, discrete units) but rather to how one must act in relation to the roles associated with such names (to ‘be a son,’ to ‘be a father’), then a state of linguistic disorder is one in which the designation of behavioral norms implied in the use of names no longer works or implies a failure of these norms. Where the performative designations of our names are not properly understood, socio-political chaos must necessarily reign. The Analects thus points in the direction of a prescriptive theory of language in its brief formulation of a program of zhengming, which involves the rehabilitation of such a comprised language and its social and political ill-effects.

3. Language and Self-Cultivation in the Mencius

In the Mencius, the Confucian program of self-cultivation is given further conceptual depth to the extent that a more robust metaphysics of human nature (ren xing 人性) anchors the entire project. The text organizes its discussions of language with particular attention to its overriding concerns with the nature and development of the heart (xin 心) and the attainment of a kind of moral animation in the human subject, which it describes in Mencius 2A2 as having a “flood like qi” (hao ran zhi qi 浩然之氣). In other words, the imperative in the Mencius is not simply to secure a complementary organization of language (yan 言) and virtuous conduct (xing 行), as we have seen in the Analects. The text adds depth to this generalized formulation of language by integrating the question of how to use words with its more intricate moral psychology of the heart and human nature. One appreciates the implications of this move in the naturalized status that extends to language itself. For instance, Mencius 4A15 establishes a parity between certain basic physical attributes, like the pupils of a person’s eyes, and the kind of language they speak. Crucially, these attributes—one anatomical, another linguistic—function as potent markers of a more fundamental moral signature of human nature. Thus, if the inherently moral capacities of being human are to be realized, the text points to both one’s pupils as well as one’s words as the natural markers of moral development.

The position the Mencius takes on the status and role of language is, however, not so straightforward if we consider two basic paradigms in the text that bring everything into moral orientation. The first of these models is that of the ‘nobleperson’ or junzi 君子, who is able to grow the “four (moral) sprouts” (si duan 四端) of the heart and successfully master the virtuous conducts of benevolence (ren 仁), ritual propriety (li 禮), righteousness (yi 義) and knowledge (zhi 知). Such a perfected moral state, while it manifests in the junzi’s physical comportment, remains wordless (bu yan不言, Mencius 7A21). At the cosmological level, the text is emphatic about the silence of Heaven (tian 天), whose commandments, which remain unarticulated, can be gleaned only from the evidence of the King’s conduct and the people’s acceptance (see Mengzi 5A5).

However, it is between the poles of silence and grandiose speech that the Mencius affirms the efficacy and value of language. While it describes the junzi as effecting a wordless practice, the text simultaneously upholds speech that is simple and concise (compare Mencius 7B32, 4B15). The overarching framework of ren xing, furthermore, supplies the authors with a standard for truth or genuineness such that speech that complements the natural development of virtuous conduct is positively upheld as corresponding with the reality (shi 實) of things (Mengzi 4B17). A corollary to a genuine/natural language is the potentially false modality of speech, and the Mencius explicitly participates in this arbitration between truth and falsity by rejecting what it terms as “one-sided” and “perverse” speech (see Mencius 2A2, 3B9). Here we are presented with an important dimension to the linguistic philosophy of the Mencius in its thematization of the activity of disputation, or bian 辯, a dialectical framework of language characterized by the eristic exchanges between various parties to a debate. Words in this context admit either to being true or false, and the text explicitly stakes its claims by rendering the principles of competing schools, like those of Yang Zhu and Mo Di, as “one-sided” and “perverse.” Yet, measures of truth and falsity in the Mencius, it bears repeating, do not function in relation to an objective, neutral external world. Rather, the performative dimension of self-cultivation remains the basic conceptual frame. To speak truly and genuinely, in a way that corresponds to the reality of things, implies that such words are distinguished primarily by their virtuous quality. The perversity of the speech of adversaries, like Yang Zhu and Mo Di, is a problem precisely because of the potential of such misguided language to draw society down into a bestial condition, where the genuine principles of benevolence and righteousness are nowhere to be seen (Mencius 3B9).

4. Zhengming 正名 in the Xunzi

Xunzi’s philosophy revolves around the central premise that one’s humanity can be successfully shaped only through concerted effort within the institutional frameworks of education and ritual. A conceptual locus in the text is accordingly represented by the concept of wei偽, ‘deliberate effort,’ a model of virtuous conduct that involves the concerted implementation of institutionally mandated practices. Xunzi’s often cited constructivism is thus to be distinguished from the Mencian belief in the continuity between nature (xing 性) and institutions, the latter being mechanisms by means of which natural dispositions, as positive traits already present in an individual, can be fully actualized. Nature and nurture for Xunzi are not complementary as they are for Mencius, and the former’s claim that “human nature is evil” (xing e 性惡) implies that the work of nurture is a focused undoing or rectification of a naturally undesirable configuration of elements in an individual. The notion of wei偽 therefore implies a concerted level of intervention in natural processes and patterns, denoting an activity that is distinguished by its levels of artifice rather than spontaneity.

Xunzi’s concern with establishing right order, then, does not extend to achieving a harmonious state prescribed in nature, but instead refers to appropriately functioning conventions of society and politics. It is within this overall context of assumptions regarding nature and the institutions that are necessary for a society’s ordered existence that the question of language proves to be of pivotal importance in the text. Names (ming 名) in the Xunzi are a technology through which the undesirable traits of human nature can both be expressed as well as curtailed. As the text states, names have neither “innate appropriateness” (gu yi固宜), nor do they admit to any “intrinsic reality” (gu shi固實). Yet, there are those which are “intrinsically good” ([ming you] gu shan 名有固善). Xunzi thus frees language from any problematic tie with nature since words share no constitutive bond with xing 性, a state that, in turn, is described as “evil,” e 惡. At the same time, however, they are potential markers of virtuous conduct, and it is successfully utilizing this potential of language to rehabilitate society that constitutes a central aim of the text.

The chapter entitled Zheng Ming 正名, “Correcting Names,” details the Xunzi’s intricate treatment of language in both its calamitous as well as remedial versions. The text begins by attributing a significant source of disorder in society to a particular linguistic condition, which it associates with a series of flawed acts like “splitting names,” “making up new names,” and “throwing into disorder established names.” What comes in for censure here is, in essence, the relativism of standards provoked by the competing theories of the Mohists and other camps like the School of Names (Ming jia 名家). The text diagnoses as deplorable a situation in which each school articulates a ‘name’ for itself, evaluating and discriminating reality on the basis of a set of purely subjective observations. One’s ability to understand and negotiate reality (shi 實), according to the Xunzi, depends on the quality of our names or ming 名 (broadly construed to include categories and distinctions) made in language. Where numerous distinctions crowd around the same reality (be it an object, a relation, a character, a role, and so forth), the designation between ming 名 and shi 實 breaks down to result in chaos and confusion.

How, then, does one go about “correcting names”? The text upholds its Confucian commitment to tradition, adapting its conservatism, however, to the specific task of rehabilitating the linguistic standards perfected and fixed by the previous generations of kings. These are the “common names” (san ming 散名), which exhibit a clarity of designation between ‘names’ and ‘reality’ that must be modeled if the disorder that prevails in society is to be corrected. The Xunzi elaborates a nuanced framework to explain this positive linguistic model, explaining the origin of ‘correct’ names in relation to other aspects of an individual’s physical, psychological and epistemic experience, and, in this respect, arguably makes its most significant contribution regarding questions of language. What the sage, like the true kings of the past, is able to successfully identify is the evolution of a given experience through its various stages of development: starting with the elemental origins in the senses; the psychological shaping of such sensory stimuli in feelings/dispositions or qing 情; and the overall understanding or knowledge (zhi 知) of the heart that is able to make sense of and correctly judge the entire process as it unfolds. Sages display a mastery over this entire psycho-physical complex, and their acute zhi 知 enables them to identify which things involve a similar sensory experience and evoke corresponding, similar dispositions, and which things must be accordingly distinguished as generating divergent stimuli and responses. This perspicacity leads to the correct designations in language, where each set of names exhibits a careful sorting of accumulated sensory and psychological data with the constant inflow of new experiences. It is this sorting activity at the level of names that constitutes, in the most rudimentary sense, the deliberate effort (wei 偽) that the Xunzi praises in the work of sages and the larger institutional frameworks of education and ritual. The implementation of zheng ming obviates the proliferation of multiple standards and classes of things by which people can judge their reality. To ‘correct names,’ then, is, first and foremost, to safeguard a society from the scourge of relativism. The text accordingly recommends the king to regulate definitions of names in order that his citizens clearly understand the meanings and referents of words that are in use. Ming 名and shi 實 are thereby harmonized, such that the relations between words and their referents are made plainly manifest and are agreed upon in the social and political conventions through which language is put to use. Zhengming is thus primarily about the social and political benefits to be gained from using language in a particular mode. As the text affirms in its advice to kings, correcting names equips the people with a unified intention and enables them, ultimately, to follow the law. This is the only path to good and successful governance.

5. The Mohist Canons

The short tracts of text that comprise the Mohist Canons as well as the longer work of the Mozi offer a series of dense statements on the nature of language. The Canons in particular put forward a theoretical framework that establishes standards for making true statements and engaging in clear and effective communication. As scholars have often suggested, the Canons are remarkable for the technical nature of their discussions on names (ming), on the relation between names and the reality of objects (shi), and on the epistemic status of our language. Yet, there is an unmistakable sense that the text remains bound to the narrow objective of establishing a sound theory of language for the purposes of defining the basic tenets of Mohist doctrine. A general frame for these inquiries into the nature and the proper use of names is therefore the model of ‘debate’ or bian, which is explicitly thematized in the Canons as the guiding activity through which the proper dao (as envisioned by the Mohists) can be codified and defended. The text defines bian as “contending over claims which are the converse of each other” and continues to state that “winning in disputation is fitting the fact.” Claims which are, in a bian-type exchange, the “converse” of each other are, as we have already seen, the dichotomy of claiming one thing to be so (shi) and another to be not-so (fei). The Mohist is emphatic on the factual nature of this distinction, explicitly marking out the categories of shi and fei as either fitting with reality or not, and the Canons equip the practitioner with the requisite tools and knowledge with which to master this art of discrimination and to articulate the true and correct picture of Mohist doctrine.

We should thus read the Canons as, first and foremost, a text that expounds a dialectical model equipping a speaker to clearly distinguish what is so or right (shi) from what is not so or wrong (fei). As a manual of argumentation or debate (bian), it accordingly inquires into the fundamental laws governing names (ming 名) and their referencing of objects/reality (shi), and discusses more complex problems surrounding the nature of evidence in arguments, the relation between sentences and a speaker’s thoughts, the uses of analogy, and the methods of illustrating, matching, adducing, and inferring (to name but a few of the themes covered).

At the heart of the diverse discussions on language in the Canons lies what Angus Graham has called a “radically nominalist approach to naming.” Such a model does not admit a premise of essences at work in language, whereby a name for a thing might be understood as referencing a core, defining idea that transcends all particular instantiations. To categorize something as ‘this’ or as ‘so’ (shi), and to extend that category to a ming or ‘name,’ is to simply pick out one thing among others and identify it as what it is called. “[T]here is no ‘essence’,” as Graham suggests, “merely the existence (you 有) of the thing with all its properties.”

The nominalism of the Canons does not, however, commit the Mohist to a relativistic view on truth or to a skepticism regarding the epistemic status of names. A central objective of the text in this respect is the identification of the correct procedures for relating names to objects so that language can be used consistently and correctly. The Canons thus articulate a larger epistemological framework by presenting specific sources of knowledge and identifying specific objects of knowledge that allow for a more structured and nuanced discussion of how names are engendered and the various orders of meaning they convey. Knowledge (zhi 知) can be obtained “by hearsay [report], by explanation, and by personal experience [observation]” and its specific objects are “names (ming), objects (shi), how to relate [an object to a name], and how to act.” We find here a basic set of premises shared by the Confucians—namely, that distinguishing between objects using names, and being able to successfully apply the correct names (that is, relate names to objects) produces knowledge and has the effect of guiding one’s actions. Yet, while the Confucian paradigm, as we have seen it on display in Analects 13.3 and in the Xunzi, sets about rectifying the reality of behavior and conduct so as to rehabilitate the correct norms codified in language, the Mohist Canons are emphatic on the need to grasp the act of naming itself. The name (ming), in other words, functions as a definition of the thing (shi), and in doing so denotes its reality.

At the heart of the Canons, then, lies a basic set of premises regarding how to discriminate between the names for various things based on more subtle distinctions between the various kinds or classes of names and referents. Thus, for example, Canon A78 identifies three classes of ming that align with the kinds of referents they point to:

Names. Unrestricted; Classifying; Private.

‘Thing’ (wu 物) is ‘unrestricted’; any object necessarily requires this name. Naming something ‘horse’ is ‘classifying’; for ‘like the object’ we necessarily use this name. Naming someone ‘Jack’ is ‘private’; this name stays confined in this object.

Unrestricted (da 達) names, covering the largest class or kind, have a general scope of designation (like the name, thing/wu 物); then there are class (lei 類) names, which refer to particular kinds/classes of things and are thus limited in scope (like horse/ma 馬); finally, there are personal or private (si 私) names, which are singular in reference (like a proper noun, Jack). That this typology functions on the basis of an underlying ontology of sameness and difference is evident in the logic which drives us from using one type of name to another. Between the word ‘thing’ and ‘horse,’ we have separated out members and distinguished one kind of ‘thing’ from others with which it does not share defining traits. A horse is not a hammer, and thus can be distinguished by a name that marks both its difference from other things (hammers) and its sameness with others (other horses). The Canons appear to take for granted the idea that the reality of objects (shi 實) is divided along such natural classes of sameness and difference, and names, as definitions of this reality, correspond to and express these divisions of classes as given facts that are observable in one’s experience.

The act of speaking (yan 言), then, is a dynamic composite of naming, where a directed intention on the part of the speaker to convey some idea or thought (yi 意) leads to an explicit choice of naming in relation to reality. This act of referring (ju 舉) is an integral moment of the speech act, which the Canons define as “picking out an object from among others by means of its name.” To refer, furthermore, “is to present the analogue for the object” and every reference therefore is an act of setting up an “archetype” (ni 擬) which the chosen name evokes as a meaningful standard (fa 法). Speaking (yan 言) is described as an “emergence of references” (chu ju出舉), a linking up of various names that evoke models or archetypes that all speakers are in possession of. Thus, in addition to the premise that there are different kinds of names (based upon sameness and difference, for example), the Canons also appear to assume the role that convention plays through mutually agreed upon standards or archetypical referents for the names shared among a linguistic community.

6. ‘Not Speaking’ in the Daodejing

The canonical texts of early Daoism also question the role and status of language in relation to an ideal of self-cultivation that is set up as a prime objective to be achieved. However, in sharp contrast to the constructivist tendencies of Confucian discourses, texts like the Daodejing and Zhuangzi explicitly reject the idea that language can be optimally regulated in and through institutional frameworks and conventional practices. There is, moreover, a thoroughgoing suspicion that pervades these texts regarding the value of language in general, and we repeatedly encounter the claim that linguistic expression, in its very constitution, is ridden with epistemic poverty (insofar as words do not attain any true standards for knowledge). This leads to a more extreme position, often cited by scholars in both the Daodejing and Zhuangzi, that rejects language, as such, as a medium of expression. Harmonization with dao, the focus of self-cultivation, is thus understood to be a distinctly extra-linguistic experience.

The Daodejing makes its case for the ineffable quality of a practice of self-cultivation by describing the sage repeatedly as one who does not speak. Daodejing 56 emphasizes in this regard the inversely proportional relation between knowledge and speaking, where “one who understands [dao] does not speak” and one who has no understanding whatsoever has much to say (zhi zhe bu yan, yan zhe bu zhi 知者不言,言者不知). As a categorical rebuke of the Confucian faith in institutional practice and of the conceptual locus established by the notion of deliberate effort (wei偽) in texts like the Xunzi, the Daodejing extols the model of “non (or non-coerced) action” (wu wei 無為). Sages, in other words, must abandon the strictures that come down by way of conventional standards, habits, cultures of education, and other institutionalized patterns of behavior and conduct. Acting without acting, then, is to divest oneself of the social mores that, in a Confucian practice, are pivotal to the successful implementation of a program of self-cultivation. The text appears to suggest that such sagacity entails a termination of speech, as we learn in Daodejing 2, which describes how sages who excel in the affairs of non-action “practice the teaching that is without words” (xing buy an zhi jiao行不言之教).

And yet, the irony, if not the outright contradiction, of an argument that claims the inadequacy of language that is itself put in words is not lost on the authors of the Daodejing. To use language to extol a condition that appears, on the face of it, to be extra-linguistic therefore suggests a more nuanced perspective that these authors hold. We find, for instance, an additional set of claims in the text that uphold a certain kind of speech, and which positively describe words of the sage that mirror the spontaneous patterns of the dao. The ontology captured by the character ziran 自然, the ‘self-so-ing’ essence of dao that manifests in diverse cycles of change and natural progression, finds expression in a particular modality of speech in which words match the fluidity of nature. Rather than a state of complete and total aphasia (the speechlessness that, for example, defines the Pyrrhonian skeptic), the art of wuwei involves a perspicuous and measured operation of language. The Daodejing does in fact describe positive linguistic traits to be modeled, like words that are “trustworthy” (信, Daodejing 8) and that are “lacking in that which can be blamed” ([善言]無瑕讁, Daodejing 27). The text even identifies certain standards by which the reliability of speech can be judged, stating in Daodejing 81, for instance, that “trustworthy words are not beautiful” (信言不美). The sage who acts without acting, then, also speaks without speaking. As a linguistic complement to its model of wuwei, the Daoejing, rather than eliding language completely from its agenda, recommends a certain modulation of speech whereby the errors in how we utilize language might be removed and its potential to express the patterns of dao might be affirmed.

7. ‘Goblet Words’ in the Zhuangzi

While it retains the core themes of the Daodejing, the Zhuangzi elevates its criticism of Confucian and Mohist discourse and dismantles, in a spectacular fashion, the fundamental structures of dialectical speech that underlie both philosophical positions. The authors of the Inner Chapters (Neipian 內篇) build, in this respect, an elaborate critique of argumentation [or disputation] (bian 辯) —a genre of thinking and speaking that is defined by eristic speech, which, as we have seen, pivots on the choice of arguing for one alternative over another. The Qiwulun, the second of the Inner Chapters, evaluates the tenability of such a basic kind of dialectical exchange it associates with the debates of the Confucians and Mohists, where each party argues for its set of claims as true and as constituting a body of knowledge, and correspondingly associates the opposing party’s claims with falsity. The linguistic structure underpinning all such eristic speech is represented by the clear distinction between a positive ascription of what is the case (conveyed by the character shi 是) and a negative attribution using the character fei 非 to reference all that is not. In sharp disagreement with the linguistic models of texts like the Mozi and the Mohist Canons, the Zhuangzi associates this dichotomy of shi-fei claims—of what is and is not so, of what is right and wrong—with a vocabulary of artifice and inflexibility.


The way has never had borders; speech has never had any regularity. Make claims about what is so, or what is right, and there are boundaries.

The method of defining what is so, as we read here, consists literally in a making of a definition (conveyed by the characters wei shì為是), where the artifice of a fixed category stands in direct contrast to the processual nature of experience that is dao. Furthermore, dividing language in terms of strict labels, standards or categories continually eludes the reality of dao and only serves to delude an individual with false standards for knowledge. Bian 辯, owing to the very nature of sophistical speech, therefore endlessly carries on and, as per the diagnosis of the Zhuangzi, serves only to wear out the heart-mind (xin 心).

Yet, in analogous fashion to the Daodejing, the Zhuangzi does not recommend an indiscriminate abandoning of all speech. The exemplary model of the sage not only speaks, but does so in a language that, in fact, occasionally spills into the genre of dialectics.


Of things, there are none that are not ‘that’ (bi 彼); of things there are none that are not ‘this’ (shi 是); One cannot see a thing if one approaches it as ‘that,’ one knows it as ‘this’ only as it is known to oneself. Thus it is said: ‘That’ emerges from ‘this,’ ‘this’ follows from ‘that.’

. . . 為是不用而寓諸庸…因是已。已而不知其然,謂之道。

[The sage] does not use a [fixed] definition of what is the case (wei shi為是) but instead lodges it in the usual . . . This is to judge what is so on a given basis (yin shi因是) and stop. Stopping without knowing (bu zhi不知) it to be so, this is called dao.

Unlike the rhetorical ploys and logic-chopping inherent to the activity of bian 辯, the generation of categories in the sage’s dialectic is fluid and perpetually under revision. A key insight in the Zhuangzi thus relates to the inescapability of linguistic expression and the corresponding need to constantly modulate our categories so they can adapt to shifting perspectives and contexts.

The text articulates this positively appraised framework of language using the metaphor of “goblet words” (zhiyan 卮言), a class of speech that is set apart from the ordinary use of language. While the latter functions through a stable matrix of ascriptions and designations between words and reality, the image of the goblet serves the purpose here of emphasizing a thorough dynamism in the way that words can be deployed. Like a goblet that continually overflows only to be filled again with water, the Zhuangzi perceives of a transformative speech that similarly ‘overflows’ each act of categorization or definition. Language, in such a figuration, enables a speaker to express multiple possibilities of experience, and it takes on a varied and rich descriptive quality that, as the text states, “harmonizes with the natural” (he yi tian ni 和以天倪). In sharp contrast to the Confucian agenda of zhengming, which strives toward instituting a catalog of names deemed to be singular and fixed in their denotations, the goblet language of the Zhuangzi is forever under revision, accumulating ever more shades and textures to our names so they may correspond to the self-so-ing (ziran 自然) ontology of dao.

8. Additional Trends

There are of course additional texts and trends, both in pre-Han Chinese literature and in later literary traditions, that further illuminate the line of inquiry that has been introduced here. One body of work that offers ample opportunity for further research is the corpus of excavated materials that has yet to receive an in-depth treatment focusing on the themes and problems of language. Two texts, the Tai Yi Sheng Shui 《太一生水名》and Heng Xian《恆先》, for example, identify a set of positions on names (ming) as part of larger cosmogonic models. In the case of the Tai Yi Sheng Shui text, the problem of naming is specifically related to a cosmogonic account in which an underlying structure of binary pairings governs the nature and use of names. The text articulates the question of language, in other words, in relation to an account of genesis, and the potential of names (ming 名) is rendered in their ability to either maintain or upset a generative structure that is understood to subtend all things. This imbrication of cosmogony and language, moreover, points explicitly to the role of cultivation that we have identified as deeply connected to the question of language in classical Chinese accounts. The regenerative logic of the cosmogonic account, when it is replicated at the level of language, endows the speaker with the ability to bring harmony to the realm of human endeavors and to aid in the cultivation of one’s person. The Tai Yi Sheng Shui resorts to the familiar model of sages, and presents them as figures who utilize cosmogonic principles of regeneration and rebirth by appropriately wielding the ‘name’ of dao. In doing so, the text explicitly praises them for achieving the completion of affairs (shi 事) and the cultivation of their persons (shen身).

The Heng Xian seems to offer an alternative account in which the organizing conceptual frame is the ontological division between being or presence (you 有) and non-being or absence (wu 無). ‘Names,’ in this binary account, are endowed with a mediating role between a conscious, coercive activity and a complete absence of the same. The text articulates this middle ground through the creative notion of names and accompanying “endeavors” (shi 事) that “become (or happen) of themselves” (zi wei自為).

This article has offered but one perspective on the treatment of language in classical Chinese texts, foregrounding the intersection of concepts of language and the larger concern with cultivation practices. Numerous possibilities for thinking about the nature of language emerge along a spectrum where speech is rendered, at one end, as a natural disposition, or, at the other, as an artificial construct that must be calibrated to achieve a desired state at the individual as well as communal levels. Irrespective of a bias toward naturalism or constructivism, a recurring theme emerges in the figure of the sage or shengren who supplies each of the schools with a model or fa 法for how language should ideally be deployed. The excavated literature adds additional diversity to this conversation, offering another iteration of the sage who appears to borrow from both the Confucian as well as Daoist theories of language and their corresponding models of sagacity.

9. References and Further Reading

  • Allan, Sarah. 2003. “The Great One, Water, and the Laozi: New Light from Guodian.” T’oung Pao 89 (4/5):237–285.
  • Boltz, William. 1985. “Desultory Notes on Language and Semantics in Ancient China.” Journal of the American Oriental Society 105 (2):309–313.
  • Brindley, Erica F. 2013. “The Cosmos as Creative Mind: Spontaneous Arising, Generating, and Creating in the Heng Xian.” Dao 12 (2):189–206.
  • Fraser, Chris. 2007. “Language and ontology in early Chinese thought.” Philosophy East and West 57 (4):420–456.
  • Fraser, Chris. 2016. The Philosophy of the Mòzĭ: The First Consequentialists: Columbia University Press.
  • Geaney, Jane. 2002. On the Epistemology of the Senses in Early Chinese Thought: University of Hawaii Press.
  • Geaney, Jane. 2010. “Grounding “language” in the senses: What the eyes and ears reveal about Ming 名 (names) in early chinese texts.” Philosophy East and West 60 (2):251–293.
  • Graham, Angus C. 1978. Later Mohist Logic, Ethics, and Science: Chinese University Press.
  • Graham, Angus C. 1989. Disputers of the Tao: Philosophical argument in ancient China: Open Court La Salle, Ill.
  • Hall, David L., and Roger T. Ames. 1987. Thinking Through Confucius: State University of New York Press.
  • Hansen, Chad. 1983. Language and Logic in Ancient China: University of Michigan Press.
  • Harbsmeier, Christoph. 1989a. “The Classical Chinese Modal Particle Yi.” In Proceedings of the Second International Conference on Sinology, 471–503. Academia Sinica.
  • Harbsmeier, Christoph. 1989b. “Marginalia Sino-Logica.” In Understanding the Chinese Mind: The Philosophical Roots, edited by Robert E. Allinson, 59–83. Oxford.
  • Harbsmeier, Christoph. 1991. “The mass noun hypothesis and the part-whole analysis of the White Horse Dialogue.” In Chinese Texts and Philosophical Contexts: Essays Dedicated to Angus C. Graham, 49–66. Open Court.
  • Hutton, E.L. 2014. Xunzi: The Complete Text: Princeton University Press.
  • Kjellberg, Paul. 2007. “Dao and Skepticism.” Dao 6 (3):281–299.
  • Lewis, Mark E. 1999. Writing and Authority in Early China: State University of New York Press.
  • Loy, Hui-chieh. 2003. “Analects 13.3 and the Doctrine of “Correcting Names”.” Monumenta Serica 51:19–36.
  • Mou, Bo. 1999. “The structure of the Chinese language and ontological insights: a collective-noun hypothesis.” Philosophy East and West:45–62.
  • Perkins, F. 2014. Heaven and Earth Are Not Humane: The Problem of Evil in Classical Chinese Philosophy: Indiana University Press.
  • Robins, Dan. 2000. “Mass nouns and count nouns in classical Chinese.” Early China 25:147–184.
  • Wagner, R. G. 2003. Language, Ontology, and Political Philosophy in China: Wang Bi’s Scholarly Exploration of the Dark (Xuanxue): State University of New York Press.
  • Yearley, Lee H. 2005. “Daoist Presentation and Persuasion: Wandering among Zhuangzi’s Kinds of Language.” Journal of Religious Ethics 33 (3):503–535.
  • Zhuangzi. 1956. Zhuangzi Yinde (A Concordance to Chuang Tzu), Harvard-Yenching Institute Sinological Index Series. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.

Author Information

Rohan Sikri
University of Georgia
U. S. A.