Susanne K. Langer (1895—1985)

Susanne K. Langer
Photo by Monozigote, CC BY-SA 4.0, via Wikimedia Commons

Susanne Langer was an American philosopher working across the analytic and continental divide in the fields of logic, aesthetics, and theory of mind. Her work connects in various ways to her central concerns of feeling and meaning.

Feeling, in Langer’s philosophy, encompasses the qualitative, sensory, and emotional aspects of human experience. It is not limited to mere emotional states but includes the entire range of sensory and emotional qualities that humans perceive and experience. Langer argues that feeling is not separate from rationality but, rather, an integral part of human intelligence and creativity.

In contrast to the logical positivists with whom she is sometimes associated, Langer argues for an expanded field of meaning. In contrast to the early Wittgenstein, who argues for a very limited field of meaning bounded by strict usage of language, Langer argues that symbolisms other than language are capable of expressing thoughts that language cannot.

Langer’s theory of feeling is closely tied to her theory of art, where she argues that artworks express forms of feeling. Artists use various elements, such as colours, shapes, sounds, and rhythms, to formulate feeling in their work, with each artwork being an art symbol. According to Langer, the artist’s task is to formulate the quality or gestalt of a particular feeling in their chosen medium.

In her broader philosophy of mind, Langer suggests that feeling is a fundamental aspect of human consciousness. She contends that feeling is not limited to individual emotions but is the basis for all forms of human thought, perception, and expression. In this sense, feeling serves as the foundation for higher-level cognitive processes, including symbolic thought and language.

Langer’s legacy includes her influential books on logic, philosophy of art, and theory of mind. Her position, whilst subject to minor terminological changes during her career, remains overwhelmingly consistent over half a century, and the resulting vision is a bold and original contribution to philosophy. Her ideas in the philosophy of art have been engaged with by various philosophers, including Nelson Goodman, Malcolm Budd, Peter Kivy, Brian Massumi, and Jenefer Robinson. In neuroscience and psychology, her notion of feeling, and her conceptual framework of mind, have been made use of by figures including Antonio Damasio and Jaak Panksepp. Overall, Langer’s work has left a lasting impact on philosophy, with her insights into the role of feeling in human life continuing to resonate with contemporary scholars and researchers.

Langer’s inclusiveness and rigor have recommended her thought to the generations since her passing. In the arts and biosciences her ideas are becoming more widely known. Langer’s work is a model of synthetic conceptual thinking which is both broad and coherent.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Feeling
  3. Logic
  4. The ‘New Key’ in Philosophy
  5. Theory of Art
  6. Theory of Mind
  7. Political Philosophy and Contribution to the ‘Modern Man’ Discourse
  8. Legacy
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Sources
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Life and Work

Susanne K. Langer (née Knauth) grew up in the Upper West Side of Manhattan, New York. The second of five children born to affluent German immigrants, Langer spoke German at home and French at school, and later claimed she only felt fully comfortable with English by the time she reached high school. Formative experiences included family summer vacations to Lake George and family music recitals in which Langer played the cello.

She attended Radcliffe College from 1916 and was awarded her doctorate in 1926 (Langer took the same classes as male students at Harvard during this time, who were taught separately; Harvard would not award men and women degrees on an equal basis until 1975). During Langer’s time at Radcliffe, she notably studied logic under Henry Sheffer, who introduced her to the ideas of Russell and the early Wittgenstein, as well as under Alfred North Whitehead, with Langer attending the lecture series which would become Process and Reality (1929). Whitehead would also supervise Langer’s doctoral thesis and write the introduction to her first book, The Practice of Philosophy (1930). Sheffer published very little, and Langer’s second book, An Introduction to Symbolic Logic (1937), is presented as putting forward Sheffer’s approach to logic, something Sheffer himself never did.

Langer married William Langer in 1921, who would go on to become a scholar of European history, and the two spent much of their first year of marriage in Vienna. Langer lived the rest of her life in America, though she returned to Europe with her family in the summer of 1933 for a European tour and to visit Edmund Husserl in Schluchsee, Germany. The couple had two children but divorced in 1941, with Langer never remarrying.

In addition to the intellectual influences of Whitehead, Sheffer, and Wittgenstein, Langer was strongly taken by the ideas of Ernst Cassirer; they met and corresponded, with Langer going on to translate Cassirer’s Language and Myth (1946) into English.

Langer’s third book, Philosophy in a New Key (1942), sold more than half a million copies. Arguing that there had been a shift in many fields towards recognition of the role of the symbolic in human life, ritual, art and language, the book brought together findings from many areas and offered a conceptual framework within which to understand, in particular, language and music.

After her divorce, Langer moved to New York City and stayed there for a decade as she wrote her theory of art, Feeling and Form (1953). Langer had part-time and temporary positions at various academic departments, including Radcliffe (1926-42) and Columbia (1945-50), but she did not have a full-time academic post until 1954, when she took up the chair of the philosophy department at Connecticut College for Women. From 1962, she was funded by a grant from the Edgar J. Kaufmann Foundation for her major work on theory of mind, at which point she retired to concentrate on her writing. After this, she split her time between Old Lyme, Connecticut and summers in a wood cabin in Ulster County, New York. Due to ill health and, in particular, failing eyesight, she published a curtailed version of her final, third volume of Mind in 1982. She died in 1985.

2. Feeling

Langer’s notion of feeling underpins all her other work. Feeling tells organisms how they are doing in various categories of need, both internal and external. As Langer puts it:

Feeling is the constant, systematic, but private display of what is going on in our own system, the index of much that goes on below the limen of sentience, and ultimately of the whole organic process, or life, that feeds and uses the sensory and cerebral system. (Langer, 1967)

Langer’s basic analytical unit of life is the act, which she considers in terms of phases. Langer repeatedly acknowledges the futility of drawing hard dividing lines in the natural sciences. Her preference instead is to find centres of activity which hold together because they are functional. An act is a functional unit, and can be considered on dramatically different scales, from cell to organ, to organism and ecosystem. Feeling is anything that can be felt, which is to say that it is a felt phase of an act. Feeling is the mark of at least primitive mentality or mentation, though not, at least in known non-human animals, mind. The relationship of feeling to logic in Langer’s work is that she argues for an expanded logical field of meaning which includes feeling, which is not considered as an irrational disturbance in an organism but the origin of logic; Langer writes that only a highly emotional animal could have developed the methods of logic. Lastly, there are unconscious processes, but there is no unconscious feeling: whatever can be felt is felt consciously. That anything that can be felt is a felt phase of an act emphasises this.

Langer describes how a phase is not a thing but a mode of appearance, explaining that when iron, for instance, is heated to become red-hot, redness is a phase, a mode of appearance, rather than being a new entity. When the iron is cooled the redness vanishes; Langer claims that, similarly, feeling is like this redness of the iron, mere appearance that has no independent existence. This is not to deny the importance of these appearances, however, since they are what the organism has to guide its negotiation with both its internal and external environment. Langer considers the notion of feelings to be a reification, that the process of feeling does not result in ontologically distinct products.

To the extent that an organism is able to react to a stimulus, it is able to feel. There are processes that may appear animated, such as leaves blowing along a path, or water bubbling up from a geyser, but in these examples the processes are entirely dictated by the external environment rather than being active agents seeking to maintain certain balances. If the stimuli in these examples cease, the wind for the leaf and the heat for the geyser, the animation would cease too, and immediately.

Animals feel, they feel their internal and external environment, they feel their own responses to the environment, and they feel as the environment responds to their actions. On human feeling, Langer writes:

Pure sensation—now pain, now pleasure—would have no unity, and would change the receptivity of the body for future pains and pleasures only in rudimentary ways. It is sensation remembered and anticipated, feared or sought or even imagined and eschewed that is important in human life. It is perception molded by imagination that gives us the outward world we know. And it is the continuity of thought that systematizes our emotional reactions into attitudes with distinct feeling tones, and sets a certain scope for an individual’s passions. In other words: by virtue of our thought and imagination we have… a life of feeling. (Langer, 1953)

Langer’s ideas are distinguished from those of the Classical Associationists; feeling is far from being a passive or neutral process, as Langer here stresses the feedback loop of imagination and perception in giving us access to the world. In stressing the continuity of the life of feeling, Langer is stressing the continuity of consciousness—not entirely unbroken in human experience, but normatively present. Feeling, for Langer, is the driving force of consciousness, motivating, among other functions, imagining and seeking and remembering.

This view of feeling leads to a particular view of consciousness: not as an emergent property of complex organisms such as humans but as a continuum along which there are simpler and more complex consciousnesses; whatever being is capable of feeling has at least a primitive awareness of, at a minimum, its sensory environment. Langer considers these very simple organisms, therefore, to be feeling, which is to be constantly attaining psychical phases of sensory acts, and that this constitutes mental activity. Langer describes this as mentation until it reaches the high development that it does in humans, which is the point at which this activity passes the threshold to be considered mind.

The clear question to come out of this is to ask what, if not consciousness, accounts for the gulf between animal mentation and the human mind. And, for Langer, the answer to this is symbolic thought.

Many animals are capable of reacting appropriately to signs (in later works Langer calls these signals), but, in known examples, only humans respond symbolically to the environment. A sign or signal, for Langer, is a symptom of an event; this can be natural, as in footprints signifying that a person or animal has walked a certain way, or artificial, as in a school bell signifying that the end of the school day has come. Symbols, by contrast, call attention primarily to concepts rather than objects; Langer writes that if someone says “Napoleon,” the correct response is not to look around for him but to ask “What about Napoleon?” The symbolic therefore allows people to imagine non-actual situations, including other times and places and the speculative.

Langer considers both emotion and logic to be high developments of feeling. Langer writes that logic is a device for leading people between intuitions, these intuitions being meaningful personal understandings (see the next section for a fuller discussion of Langer’s logic). Langer does not have a fully developed theory of emotion, though she refers to emotional situations in individual people and groups not infrequently. Her notion of feeling is certainly compatible with the use that is made of it by scientists such as Jaak Panksepp and Antonio Damasio, though it need not necessitate their ideas of emotion.

Langer’s notion of art concerns feeling as well: she argues that artworks present forms of feeling for contemplation. The purpose of art is to render pre-reflexive experience available to consciousness so that it can be reflected (rather than merely acted) upon. Knowledge of feeling captures what artworks are meant to help us with educationally, socially, and cross-culturally. We have access, in life and in art, to forms only, from which we extrapolate meaning. In life, the forms of feeling are too embedded in practical situations for us to contemplate them. When art is viewed as art, the experience of them is disinterested, the forms are isolated from practical situations.

Despite Langer’s emphasis on embodiment, she also clearly emphasises cognitive evaluations. As in many other areas, Langer’s work can be seen to bridge perspectives that are often considered incompatible: in this case, that emotion is either fundamentally embodied or fundamentally cognitive:

Certainly in our history, presumably for long ages – eons, lasting into present times – the human world has been filled more with creatures of fantasy than of flesh and blood. Every perceived object, scene, and especially every expectation is imbued with fantasy elements, and those phantasms really have a stronger tendency to form systematic patterns, largely of a dramatic character, than factual impressions. The result is that human experience is a constant dialectic of sensory and imaginative activity – a making of scenes, acts, beings, intentions and realizations such as I believe animals do not encounter. (Langer, 1972)

Langer here clearly believes cognitive evaluations matter—beliefs, whether about ghosts and monsters and gods or about why the bus is late and what might be done about it, and especially expectations, which determine to a surprising extent what is perceived. Langer also stresses here the dynamic real-time mixing of sensory and imaginative activity, disposing the holder of these expectations towards certain kinds of experience.

This emphasis on feeling in Langer has clear parallels to her contemporary John Dewey, who focused on experience similarly. These parallels have been drawn out most thoroughly by Robert Innis in his monograph on Langer.

3. Logic

Langer’s most distinctive contribution to the philosophy of logic is her controversial claim of a presentational logic that operates differently from, but is no less reasonable than, traditional logic. This presentational logic functions by association rather than by logical implication (as in traditional logic) or causality; nonetheless, Langer considers it also to be a logic because presentational forms contain relational patterns. Langer first put forward this idea in her doctoral dissertation in 1926, ‘A Logical Analysis of Meaning’, in which Langer investigated the meaning of meaning from the starting point that the dictionary definition of meaning seems to have little to do with meaning in art or religion.

Langer developed this idea further in her first book, The Practice of Philosophy (1930), in which she also situated philosophy in relation to science. Arguing that analysis is an indispensable part of any complex understanding, she distinguished between the empirical sciences which pursue facts and the rational sciences which instead pursue meanings—the latter exemplified by mathematics and logic. These rational sciences, Langer claimed, are the foundation of the ‘higher’ and more concrete subjects of ethics and metaphysics. Langer points out, for instance, that it was in studying numbers that philosophers gained the understanding they needed to approach more accurately the concept of infinity, and that Zeno’s paradox—that matter in its eternal motion is really at rest—is solved by a clear understanding of the continuum.

Aspects of Langer’s views here are heavily influenced by logical positivism, and this impression of these ideas is likely to be strengthened in the reader’s mind by Langer’s positive discussion of Bertrand Russell and of the early Wittgenstein of the Tractatus. One feature that Langer shares with logical positivism, for instance, is her view that philosophy is a critique of language. But even in this first book, published at approximately the peak of logical positivism’s popularity, Langer explicitly distinguishes her views from those of logical positivism. Already at this point, Langer is insisting on the importance of an interpretant in the meaning relation, reinserting the aspect of personal experience which logical positivism had carefully removed.

One of Langer’s contributions to the logic of signs and symbols is the claim that the semantic power of language is predicated on the lack of any rival interest in vocables. Langer uses the example of an actual peach to replace the spoken word ‘plenty’, and she argues that we are too interested in peaches for this to be effective: the peach would be both distracting and wasted. It is the irrelevance of vocables for any other purpose than language that leads to the transparency of spoken language, where meaning appears to flow through the words.

Langer’s textbook, An Introduction to Symbolic Logic (1937), was written expressly to take students to the point where they could tackle Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica (1910-3). This textbook contains not only instruction on the formal aspects of symbolic logic, Boolean as well as that of Principia Mathematica, but also extensive philosophical discussion on metaphor, exemplification, generalization and abstraction. As well as achieving this task, the book functions as an introduction to how Sheffer practiced logic, since he did not publish such a text.

Sheffer had followed Josiah Royce in considering logic to be a relational structure rather than dealing solely with inference. Langer takes this notion and follows it through its implications, paying special attention to the distinctions between types of logic and meaning.

From one perspective, Langer’s view is very radical, since expanding the notion of meaning to logical resemblance incorporates huge swathes of life which had been dismissed by many of the thinkers she cites most, such as Russell and the early Wittgenstein, as nonsense. However, this emphasis on the structure of relations can also be seen as a form of hylomorphism, connecting Langer’s views to a tradition which stretches back to Aristotle.

4. The ‘New Key’ in Philosophy

Langer’s next book, Philosophy in a New Key (1942), might be thought of as her central work, in that it serves as a summation and development of her previous work in logic and an expanded field of meaning, but also gives early formulation to her ideas in all the fields which would preoccupy her for the rest of her career, including art and theory of mind, but also touching on linguistics, myth, ritual, and ethnography.

In the book Langer claims that figures as diverse as Freud, Cassirer, Whitehead, Russell, and Wittgenstein are all engaged in a shared project to understand the nature of human symbolization. Along the way, Langer touches on a wide variety of subjects of philosophical interest. Her theory of depiction, for instance, is given, along with a speculative account of the early development of language, and the relation of fantasy to rational thought.

Langer justifies the exploration of all these different topics in a single text by relating them all to a single idea: that across a wide range of humanities subjects there had been, in the late 19th and early 20th centuries, a fundamental shift in the intellectual framework within which work was done in these disciplines and that this shift was related in every case to an expanded appreciation of the nature of human symbolization. Langer describes this shift using the musical metaphor of a key change—hence Philosophy in a New Key. In her introduction, Langer offers a brief account of previous shifts in philosophy such as, for instance, the Cartesian notion of looking at reality as a dichotomy of inner experience and outer world.

Langer refers to her theory of the symbolic as a semantic theory, which proved controversial, as her theory includes but is not limited to language. This is the expanded field of meaning that Langer sought to describe and provided conceptual scaffolding for. Where Wittgenstein’s Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus famously ends with the statement that “whereof we cannot speak, we must remain silent” (Wittgenstein, 1922), Langer argues that language is only one of many symbolisms, albeit one of particular importance, and that other symbolisms, including myth, ritual, and art, can form thoughts which language is incapable of. Whether or not Langer is correct depends not only on whether the semantic can be broadened in this way so that the semantic does not need a corresponding syntax, for instance, but also on whether there are thoughts which language is not capable of expressing.

Langer’s distinction between discursive and presentational symbolic forms in Philosophy in a New Key has received extensive discussion. Briefly, discursive forms are to be read and interpreted successively, whereas presentational forms are to be read and interpreted as a whole. Additionally, another important difference is that in discursive symbolisms the individual elements have independent meaning whereas in non-discursive symbolism they do not; words have independent meaning even when isolated from a wider text or utterance, whilst lines, colours and shapes isolated from an artwork do not have independent meaning.

Scientific language and mathematical proofs are straightforwardly discursive, whereas photographs and paintings are straightforwardly presentational. Some less intuitive but still important applications of this distinction exist, however, with novels and poems, for instance, being considered presentational forms by Langer; despite being formed with language, the artwork functions as a whole, and cannot be judged without considering the whole. On the other hand, graphs and charts function discursively, despite being visual.

Langer’s discussion of ritual is related to her careful reading of Ernst Cassirer, whom Langer met and corresponded with, and who considered Philosophy in a New Key to be the book on art which corresponded to his three-volume Philosophy of Symbolic Forms (1923-9). Langer would translate and write the introduction for the English-language edition of Cassirer’s Language and Myth (1946). Considering rain dances, for instance, Langer discusses them neither as a dishonest trick of tribal seniors nor as magic. Instead, the group activity is seen as symbolic:

Rain-making may well have begun in the celebration of an imminent shower after long drought; that the first harbinger clouds would be greeted with entreaty, excitement, and mimetic suggestion is obvious. The ritual evolves while a capricious heaven is making up its mind. Its successive acts mark the stages that bring the storm nearer. (Langer, 1942)

Langer notes, moreover, that participants do not try to make it snow in mid-summer, nor to ripen fruits entirely out of season. Instead, the elements are either present or imminent, and participants encourage them.

Langer’s treatment of music in the book is notable, defending critic Clive Bell’s famous phrase in Art (1917) that called art ‘significant form’. Langer argues that the sense in which this is true is that music is a symbolic form without fixed conventionally assigned meanings—she calls music an “unconsummated symbolism.” (Langer, 1942) Langer dismisses both the hedonic theory of art and the contagion theory, and she argues instead that music expresses the composer’s knowledge of feeling, an idea she attempts to elucidate and clarify but which she attributes to numerous European composers, critics, and philosophers including Wagner, Liszt and Johann Adam Hüller.

Philosophy in a New Key might also be thought to be central because Langer’s later theory of art is explicitly introduced on its cover as being derived from Philosophy in a New Key, and subsequently her Mind trilogy is introduced as having come out of her research on living form that informed her philosophy of art. Langer herself frequently refers back to Philosophy in a New Key in her later works, whereas The Practice of Philosophy never went beyond the first edition, with Langer in her later life turning down requests by the publisher to put it back in print.

The book was unexpectedly popular. Despite its enthusiastic popular reception, the book was largely neglected by the academic community at the time. The book’s success may partly explain Langer’s relative prominence within musical aesthetics compared to her relative neglect in the aesthetics of other artforms since her treatment of music in Philosophy in a New Key is much fuller than her brief and scattered comments on other artforms. Langer was well aware of this, and indeed the subsequent work, Feeling and Form, gives separate and sustained attention to a wide variety of artforms.

5. Theory of Art

After Philosophy in a New Key’s popular success in giving an account of music, Langer generalised its account to a theory of all the arts. Feeling and Form (1953) is split into three major parts: the first deals with introductory matters; part two, by far the largest part of the book, gives separate and sustained attention to each of the artforms dealt with in turn, including painting, sculpture, architecture, music, dance, poetry, myth and legend, prose fiction, comedic drama and tragic drama (there is also a short appendix on film at the end of the book); then, in part three, Langer gives her general account.

Helpfully, in part three she compares her ideas in detail to those of R. G. Collingwood, whose Principles of Art (1938) had appeared just fifteen years before; this very much helps to locate Langer’s position. The final chapter of Feeling and Form considers art from the point of view of its public, considering the educational and social role of art, in a way that both ties Feeling and Form into the sections on ritual and myth in Philosophy in a New Key and anticipates some arguments Langer would make in Volumes 1 and 3 of Mind. The theory of art presented here is based primarily on Feeling and Form, but also includes elements and quotes from the two other later books in which Langer discusses art at length: Problems of Art (1957) and Mind: Volume 1 (1967).

Langer’s theory states that artworks present forms of feeling. This is possible because both feeling and artistic elements are experienced as qualitative gradients; the forms of each are congruent. Feeling may be complex or simple—more or fewer gradients can be experienced simultaneously; artworks, similarly, may present many gradients at once or very few. In either case, there is a unity to the feeling or artwork—an overall quality. It is this quality of feeling that an artist tries to express when creating a work, negotiating the artistic elements.

Artists work by weighing qualities in the forming artwork—a formulation that seems to capture practices as diverse as traditional easel painting or the selection of ready-mades, a composer writing a symphony or a rock band writing a song, or theatre directors giving feedback to actors on blocking or actors improvising a scene of street theatre. “Artistic forms,” Langer writes, “are more complex than any other symbolic forms we know. They are, indeed, not abstractable from the works that exhibit them. We may abstract a shape from an object that has that shape, by disregarding color, weight and texture, even size; but to the total effect that is an artistic form, the color matters, the thickness of lines matters, and the appearance of texture and weight.” (Langer, 1957) The value of art is intrinsic to the work, rather than being a communication medium, and it is the sensuous qualities of the work which give the viewer access to the meaning (literary work being experienced in the sensuous imagination).

Langer holds that artworks are each a symbol expressive of human feeling. By expression—to press out—Langer means projection, she uses the example of horns projected from the head of a reindeer. An art object is therefore a projection of feeling, not spontaneous feeling—but the artist’s knowledge of feeling. Langer’s Expressivism, moreover, does not insist on melodrama and high emotion. Whilst it could be argued that Langer’s concept of expression differs too significantly from others in the Expressivist tradition to be called such, Langer herself writes that she, Croce, and Collingwood are embarked on a shared project, as well as Bell, Fry, and Cassirer. (Langer, 1953) So long as it is remembered that Langer does not claim that artworks express emotion, the grouping seems fair; Langer’s account concerns expressive form articulating knowledge of feeling rather than a contagious and spontaneous outpouring.

Langer writes that artists try to express a unitary gestalt:

What any true artist – painter or poet, it does not matter – tries to “re-create” is not a yellow chair, a hay wain or a morally perplexed prince, as a “symbol of his emotion,” but that quality which he has once known, the emotional “value” that events, situations, sounds or sights in their passing have had for him. He need not represent those same items of his experience, though psychologically it is a natural thing to do if they were outstanding forms; the rhythm they let him see and feel may be projected in other sensible forms, perhaps even more purely. When he finds a theme that excites him it is because he thinks that in his rendering of it he can endow it with some such quality, which is really a way of feeling. (Langer, 1967)

Langer believes that people feel, and artists have developed special sensitivity to feeling, and when working in an artistic mode, they seek to articulate what they have felt, so that the resulting artwork seems to possess the same quality as the feeling the artist has in mind (remembering that consciousness is a fundamentally embodied process for Langer, feeling raised above the “limen of sentience”). Langer stresses that the artist need not have experienced the feeling, but they must be capable of imagining it.

Langer distinguishes between what she calls primary and secondary illusions. A primary illusion is what an artform stably presents—so painting, sculpture, and architecture must present virtual space whilst a piece of music must present virtual time. This is the contextual framework within which artistic elements exist. Further primary illusions include virtual powers (dance) and virtual memory (literature). Primary illusions do not come and go, and are not a presentation of gradients; because of this they are not the site of particular interest in most artworks—Langer, for instance, criticises the work of Russian artist Malevich for generating a sense of space in his “magic squares” but nothing else. Secondary illusions, by contrast, present gradients; artworks can function because of the congruence between gradients of feeling and gradients in artworks. Gradients are projected into artworks, and while there are no set rules for how this is done, it is possible to analyse an artwork to see how a work has been achieved. By stressing the absence of rules of projection, what Langer means is that the results of these analyses cannot be generalised and reapplied—this is one major way in which art images are distinguished from models, which generally do have a single stable rule of projection; the salience of a gradient depends on the artwork. The relationship of secondary illusions to primary illusion is that of feeling to a life of feeling.

Feeling and Form did not find the success of its predecessor yet it has been mentioned or taught in some aesthetics programmes in the UK and US; perhaps surprisingly, it also seems to have been featured in university aesthetics syllabuses in China and India. Feeling and Form has also been made use of by philosophers seeking to put forward accounts of particular artforms. Robert Hopkins, for instance, has offered a limited defence of her ideas of virtual kinetic volume in sculpture as found in Feeling and Form.

Philosopher Paul Guyer has suggested, in his sub-chapter on Langer in his History of Modern Aesthetics, that the reason for the neglect of Feeling and Form may be timing; the publication of Feeling and Form in 1953 coincided with the publication of Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations, the latter text preoccupying philosophy departments for decades. Accounts of art such as Langer’s which offered a single function which all artworks were meant to perform, expression in Langer’s case, were not in keeping with the intellectual fashion for proceduralist theories, such as George Dickie’s institutional theory of art or Arthur Danto’s historical account.

Langer produced two other books in this phase of her career. Problems of Art (1957) is a transcribed and edited collection of Langer’s talks on art to different audiences. Langer addresses different sorts of audiences, including general and non-specialist and technical, and so her position on many points is made clearer because of the different registers in which she addresses her audiences. She had had four years since the publication of Feeling and Form in which to synthesise the formulation of many of her ideas into a clearer form. The book also contains a reprint of her important and otherwise difficult-to-find essay from 1951 in honour of Henry Sheffer, ‘Abstraction in Science and Abstraction in Art’.

Secondly, Langer produced Reflections on Art: A Source Book of Writings by Artists, Critics, and Philosophers (1958). This latter book is a collection of writings on art which Langer considered to be both important and otherwise hard to find. Whilst invaluable in tracing influences on Langer’s ideas, Reflections on Art is not particularly helpful as an introductory text because of its focus on, in particular, metaphor and expression, at the expense of a wider survey of writings on art.

6. Theory of Mind

In the first volume of Mind (1967), Langer sets out the problem as she sees it: the mind-body duality resists efforts to solve it because it is built on faulty premises, that mind is not metaphysically distinct from body, and that behaviorism in psychology has previously led to an avoidance of the most pressing issues of the discipline. To tackle this, Langer puts forward the thesis, which she planned to substantiate over three volumes, that the whole of animal and human life, including law, the arts, and the sciences, is a development of feeling. The result is a biologically grounded theory of mind, a conceptual structure within which work in the life sciences can be integrated.

Furthermore, Langer claims that it is possible to know the character of the mind by studying the history of art, which shows the development and variety of feeling in its objectified forms. Langer proceeds, then, to first take issue with the ‘idols of the laboratory’—jargon, controlled experiment, and objectivity, claiming that each of these has its place but have held back progress in the life sciences. Claiming that each of these weaknesses is philosophical, Langer argues that scientific knowledge ultimately aims to explain phenomena, and that at a pre-scientific level work is motivated and guided by images which present the phenomenal character of a particular dynamic experience. Images are susceptible to analysis in a way that feeling itself is not. Here Langer calls art symbols a “systematic device whereby observations can be made, combined, recorded and judged, elements distinguished and imaginatively permuted, and, most important, data exhibited and shared, impressions corroborated.” (Langer, 1967) This is material art history seen as a data set, a treasure trove for psychological research.

Langer goes on to explore artistic projection, the artistic idea, and abstraction in art and science before considering living form—that functional artworks need a semblance of livingness, something Aristotle already remarked upon as the single most important characteristic of art. The image of mind that art provides can be used by those studying the mind to test the validity of their accounts.

This then sets up Langer’s discussion of acts and the growth and evolution of acts. Langer coins a new term, pressions, to name the class of relations which hold between acts and situations, such as impression, expression and suppression. Langer sees the evolution of life as fundamentally the evolution of acts, and sees the dominance of both mechanical models and imputing an agent such as God or Nature to situations as antithetical to serious understanding of this process.

The second volume of mind deals with a single section of her project, ‘The Great Shift’ from animal mentation to human mind. Starting with plankton, Langer considers progressively more complex examples, considering topics including instinct and the growth of acts. Langer seeks to neither deny animal feeling nor anthropomorphise animal feeling and behaviour. Langer draws on Jakob von Uexküll’s idea of animal ambient—that differing sensory abilities lead to different animals living in different experiential spaces even if they share the same actual space.

Langer discusses the migration of birds and other animals, arguing that animal travels should be seen as round trips, and migration as an elaboration of the same: a round trip with a long stopover. Also discussed are the parent-young relations of dolphins and the alleged use of language by chimpanzees. Langer brings a large amount of empirical material to bear on these issues, before moving on to consider the specialisation of man. She argues that Homo sapiens has been successful because of specialisation, against the argument that the species is a generalist. Langer considers the shape of the human foot, and that there is no evidence in this for humans ever living entirely in trees. The shape of the foot in facilitating bipedality, and an upright posture, and a larger brain, are all discussed, as is consideration of the hand as a sense organ. Langer then stresses a hugely important feature of the human brain, that it is able to finish impulses on a virtual level instead of needing to enact these in the actual world. This liberates the brain for conceptual thought.

Langer discusses dreaming and argues that the evidence suggests the brain requires constant activation, which is what has driven its increase in size and function. She then links the biologically grounded model of mentation she has drawn so far with the components of symbolization, discussing how mental abstraction is affected by memory, the origin of imagination, and the origins of speech in expression rather than communication.

Langer claims then that speech is necessary for social organisation and that all natural languages are socially adequate. Langer discusses the dangers of the imaginative capacity of humanity, and the feeling of reality, before discussing morality—a concern she notes is peculiar to man.

The final volume of Mind is not what Langer had planned, with an epistemological theory and a metaphysics. Due to poor health and failing eyesight, Langer left the final section of the book with only a brief outline.

What the third volume accomplishes, however, is to make connections between the model of man as the symbolic animal, which had been achieved by the end of the second volume, and various anthropological data relating to tribes, city states, and other societies. The focus of the third volume is considerably broadened to accommodate symbolic mind in society, and Langer by necessity only offers glimpses into this; Adrienne Dengerink Chaplin calls it a “holistic, biologically based, philosophical anthropology.” (Dengerink Chaplin, 2020)

Langer also offers a view of philosophy of religion, that “even as the power of symbolic thought creates the danger of letting the mind run wild, it also furnishes the saving counterbalance of cultural restraint, the orientating dictates of religion.” (Langer, 1953) A religious community and religious symbols keep a rein on individuation, strengthening social bonds; the loss of these religious frameworks in the modern world is a large part of the disorientation of modern life.

As the trajectory of her intellectual career intersected with Wittgenstein’s at several important junctures, it is of interest that she gives a brief verdict on his Philosophical Investigations: that it is a despairing resort to behaviourism.

7. Political Philosophy and Contribution to the ‘Modern Man’ Discourse

Langer’s contribution to political philosophy has received little attention, and her interest in it is certainly minor compared to her substantial interests in logic, the arts, and theory of mind. It consists of chapters on the structure of society in Philosophy in a New Key and the third volume of Mind, and, most notably, articles on the political danger of outdated symbolism governing societies in ‘The Lord of Creation’ (1944), and on what might be done to tackle the persistence of international war in ‘World Law and World Reform’ (1951).

‘The Lord of Creation’ essentially presents the arguments of Philosophy in a New Key through the lens of political philosophy and sociology. Symbolisation, Langer argues, is the source of the distinctiveness of human society—whilst animals, intelligent or not, live very realistic lives, humans are characteristically unrealistic: “magic and exorcism and holocausts—rites that have no connection with common-sense methods of self-preservation.” (Langer, 1944) This is because, Langer claims, people live lives in which there is a constant dialectic of sensory and imaginative activity, so that fantastic elements permeate our experience of reality: “The mind that can see past and future, the poles and the antipodes, and guess at obscure mechanisms of nature, is ever in danger of seeing what is not there, imagining false and fantastic causes, and courting death instead of life.” (Langer, 1944) This human condition has become a human crisis, according to Langer, because scientific progress has led to such upheavals in human living, especially in terms of the symbols which previously gave a shared context to human life.

Industrialisation, secularisation and globalisation have within two centuries, and in many places less, led to a poverty in the governing symbols available to humanity, according to Langer. People are now living together without overarching societal ties of religion or ethnicity, and are left with the vague notion of nationality to unite them, a concept Langer has little patience for, considering it to be a degraded tribalism:

At first glance it seems odd that the concept of nationality should reach its highest development just as all actual marks of national origins – language, dress, physiognomy, and religion – are becoming mixed and obliterated by our new mobility and cosmopolitan traffic. But it is just the loss of these things that inspires this hungry seeking for something like the old egocentric pattern in the vast and formless brotherhood of the whole earth. (Langer, 1944)

The problem is not merely industrial warfare, for Langer, but industrial warfare at a time when ‘modern man’ is simultaneously symbolically impoverished.

‘World Law and World Reform’ is a densely argued twelve pages; Langer argues that whilst civil war is a failure of institutions, and as such not irradicable, international war is, by nature, institutional. What she means by this is that the power of nation states is backed up by the threat and use of force, and it is the display and use of this force which enables diplomacy. Langer dismisses the notion of popular demand for war, arguing that it is diplomats—here she lists kings, presidents, premiers, other leading personages and their cabinets—who prepare and make war: “The threat of violence is the accepted means of backing claims in the concert of nations, as suit and judgement are in civil life.” (Langer, 1951)

Langer argues that this situation is the result of an essentially tribal philosophy of government, which did relatively little damage in the past, but which has the potential to end human life on earth since the invention of atomic weapons. Her solution is the creation and empowerment of a world judiciary, which would be invested with the power to adjudicate and enforce its decisions. She acknowledges that the United Nations is the most notable international institution of her era and lists five reforms which would make it suitable to perform the role of this world judiciary: “1) Extend membership to all nations; 2) Make the General Assembly a legislative body with power to adopt a constitution; 3) Give the World Court the power of summons, and make its decisions binding; 4) Set up a high secretariat (or other executive) to administer world interests; 5) Internationalize all armed force, setting up a federal guard (not enlisted by national units) and allowing the several nationals national police guards of their own, for domestic use.” (Langer, 1951)

Langer is not optimistic about these steps happening in short order, but she argues that historical parallels exist, and that the steps need not happen in one go and can be worked towards as a far-sighted goal. Her historical parallels are action to combat the Black Death and, later, to end legal child labour. In both of these situations, a pre-existing social malady became intolerable due to social changes which exacerbated them, and it was this which prompted social reform. Langer argues that, similarly, properly constituted world courts could bring an end to international war.

8. Legacy

Because of Langer’s many temporary academic positions, and her focus on research instead of teaching from the mid-1950s onwards, her legacy is mainly to be found in her publications, especially books, rather than in direct influence on students. Having said this, numerous individuals who would go on to be influential in their fields studied with Langer, including artist Eva Hesse and philosopher Arthur Danto. Danto would write the preface to the abridged version of Mind.

Langer herself is a subject of growing interest, with research being undertaken into her life, career, and index card system. The Susanne K. Langer Circle is an international group of scholars with interest in Langer’s work and life and is affiliated with Utrecht University. It hosted the first international conference on Langer’s work in 2022.

Langer’s textbook Introduction to Symbolic Logic was the first introductory book on the subject and made the methods of symbolic logic much more accessible. Randall Auxier has published an updated version of this with many more exercises and expanded discussion.

In philosophy of art, Langer’s ideas on expression have been engaged with by a range of prominent thinkers in the philosophy of music, including Malcolm Budd, Peter Kivy, and Jenefer Robinson. Nelson Goodman’s positions on many issues, in particular those he discusses in Languages of Art (1968), are influenced by Langer’s ideas, something Goodman half acknowledges in his introduction, though Goodman somewhat disingenuously cites Langer directly only as Cassirer’s translator.

Philosopher Brian Masumi has engaged with Langerean thought, particularly her work in Feeling and Form, discussing her ideas on motif and, especially, semblance, writing “Langer has probably gone further than any other aesthetic philosopher toward analyzing art-forms not as “media” but according to the type of experiential event they effect.” (Massumi, 2011) Langer in Massumi has been a very influential reference for younger philosophers engaging with her thought.

Jarold Lanier, the ‘father of virtual reality’, attributes the term ‘virtual world’ to Langer—computing and virtual reality pioneer Ivan Sutherland had Feeling and Form era Langer in mind. Here is the first reference to a virtual world in Langer—she is discussing architecture, in particular how one nomadic camp may be set up in the same geographical area where one from another culture used to be, but the sense is extremely evocative when considered in light of virtual reality:

A place, in this non-geographical sense, is a created thing, an ethnic domain made visible, tangible, sensible. As such it is, of course, an illusion. Like any other plastic symbol, it is primarily an illusion of self-contained, self-sufficient, perceptual space. But the principle of organization is its own: for it is organized as a functional realm made visible —the center of a virtual world, the “ethnic domain,” and itself a geographical semblance. (Langer, 1953)

Lanier made the change from virtual world to virtual reality, but the fundamental notion is Langerean. Pioneering media theorist Marshall McLuhan similarly seems to have had Langer in mind, occasionally citing her, when considering how media reshapes and reconstitutes (again, the above quote is suggestive here when considering McLuhan’s famous dictum “the medium is the message.”)

In neuroscience, several notable figures have referred in print approvingly to Langer’s ideas on feeling, including Jaak Panksepp, Gerald Edelman, and Antonio Damasio. The latter refers to his notion of background feeling as being what Langer describes, though he arrived at it independently. In psychology, Fred Levin writes that Langer anticipated by decades  the notion of feeling that the biosciences would adopt.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Primary Sources

  • A Logical Analysis of Meaning, doctoral thesis, Radcliffe College, 1926.
    • Unpublished thesis making the case for an expanded understanding of meaning which includes religion and the arts, argues that philosophy is the clarification of concepts.
  • The Practice of Philosophy. New York: Henry Holt, 1930.
    • Explains Langer’s perspective on what it is to do philosophy, and its distinction from and relation to other fields, including science, mathematics and logic, and art.
  • An Introduction to Symbolic Logic. New York: Allen and Unwin, 1937. Second revised edition, New York, Dover, 1953.
    • Textbook aiming to take beginners to the point of being able to tackle Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica.
  • Philosophy in a New Key: A Study in the Symbolism of Reason, Rite and Art. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1942.
    • Langer’s most influential book—drawing together researches in psychology, art, ritual, language and logic to claim that there had been a recent philosophical shift predicated on an expanded awareness of the symbolic.
  • ‘The Lord of Creation’. In Fortune Magazine (1944).
    • Popular treatment discussing how the power of symbolisation is both a strength and source of the precariousness of human society.
  • ‘Abstraction in Science and Abstraction in Art’. In Structure, Method and Meaning: Essays in Honor of Henry M. Sheffer, edited by Paul Henle, Horace M. Kallen and Susanne K. Langer, 171–82. New York: Liberal Arts Press, 1951.
    • Defends the thesis that scientific abstraction concerns generalisation whilst artistic abstraction specifies unique objects which are forms of feeling.
  • ‘World Law and World Reform’. The Antioch Review, Vol. 11, No. 4 (Winter, 1951).
    • Langer’s most sustained political philosophy defending the implementation of empowered world courts.
  • Feeling and Form: A Theory of Art Developed from Philosophy in a New Key. New York: Charles Scribner’s, 1953.
    • An Expressivist theory of art which discusses numerous artforms in detail before generalising the conclusions.
  • Problems of Art: Ten Philosophical Lectures. New York: Charles Scribner’s, 1957.
    • Accessible collection of lectures to different audiences on art topics.
  • Reflections on Art: A Source Book of Writings by Artists, Critics, and Philosophers. Editor. Baltimore, MD: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1958.
    • Langer’s choice of aesthetics readings with introduction.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Auxier, Randall E. ‘Susanne Langer on Symbols and Analogy: A Case of Misplaced Concreteness?’ Process Studies 26 (1998): 86–106.
    • Suggests a modification to Langer’s account of symbols and considers this part of her account in relation to that of both Whitehead and Cassirer.
  • Auxier, Randall E. Logic: From Images to Digits. 2021. Ronkonkoma: Linus Learning.
    • An accessible and updated version of Langer’s symbolic logic, separating it from the implied metaphysics of the original.
  • Browning, Margaret M. ‘The Import of Feeling in the Organization of Mind’ in Psychoanalytic Psychology, Vol. 33, No. 2 (2016), pp. 284–298.
    • Pursues and defends a Langerean view of feeling from a neuroscientific perspective.
  • Browning, Margaret M. ‘Our Symbolic Minds: What Are They Really?’ in The Psychoanalytic Quarterly, Vol. 88, No. 1 (2019), pp. 25–52.
    • Discusses intersubjectivity from a Langerean perspective.
  • Budd, M. Music and the Emotions, London: Routledge, 1985.
    • A serious critique of Langer’s musical aesthetics.
  • Dengerink Chaplin, Adrienne. The Philosophy of Susanne Langer: Embodied Meaning in Logic, Art, and Feeling, London: Bloomsbury Academic, 2019.
    • Monograph on Langer with a particular focus on the influence of Wittgenstein, Whitehead, Scheffer and Cassirer on the development of Langer’s thought.
  • Dryden, Donald. ‘The Philosopher as Prophet and Visionary: Susanne Langer’s Essay on Human Feeling in the Light of Subsequent Developments in the Sciences’. Journal of Speculative Philosophy 21, No. 1 (2007): 27–43.
    • A brief summary of some of the applications of Langer’s theory of mind with a view to defending the applicability of the Langerean view.
  • Dryden, Donald. ‘Susanne Langer and William James: Art and the Dynamics of the Stream of Consciousness’. Journal of Speculative Philosophy, New Series, 15, No. 4 (1 January 2001): 272–85.
    • Traces commonalities and distinctions in the ideas on thinking and feeling of James and Langer.
  • Dryden, Donald. ‘Whitehead’s Influence on Susanne Langer’s Conception of Living Form’, Process Studies 26, No. 1–2 (1997): 62–85.
    • A clear account of what Langer does and does not take from Whitehead particularly concerning act form.
  • Gaikis, L. (ed.) The Bloomsbury Handbook of Susanne K. Langer. London: Bloomsbury Academic, 2024.
    • Featuring an extensive collection of major scholars on Langer, this book elucidates her transdisciplinary connections and insights across philosophy, psychology, aesthetics, history, and the arts.
  • Ghosh, Ranjan K. Aesthetic Theory and Art: A Study in Susanne K. Langer. Delhi: Ajanta Books International, 1979.
    • Doctoral dissertation on Langer which takes the unusual step, in an appendix, of applying her theories to specific artworks.
  • Hopkins, R. ‘Sculpture’ in Jerrold Levinson (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Aesthetics. Oxford University Press. pp. 572–582 (2003).
    • Criticizes and offers a limited defence of Langer’s notion of virtual kinetic volume in sculpture.
  • Innis, Robert E. Susanne Langer in Focus: The Symbolic Mind. Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2009.
    • The first English-language monograph on Langer; particularly helpful in locating Langer in relation to the pragmatist tradition.
  • Lachmann, Rolf. Susanne K. Langer: die lebendige Form menschlichen Fühlens und Verstehens. Munich: W. Fink, 2000.
    • The first monograph on Langer (German language).
  • Lachmann, Rolf. “From Metaphysics to Art and Back: The Relevance of Susanne K. Langer’s Philosophy for Process Metaphysics.” Process Studies, Vol. 26, No. 1–2, Spring-Summer 1997, 107–25.
    • English-language summary by Lachman of his above book.
  • Massumi, B. Semblance and Event: Activist Philosophy and the Occurrent Arts. Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press, 2011.
    • An aesthetics of interactive art, ephemeral art, performance art, and art intervention. The titular semblance is Langerean and the early part of the book features an extended discussion on and from ideas taken from Feeling and Form.
  • Nelson, Beatrice K. ‘Susanne K. Langer’s Conception of “Symbol” – Making Connections through Ambiguity’. Journal of Speculative Philosophy, New Series 8, No. 4 (1 January 1994): 277–96.
    • Considers what is involved and at stake in Langer’s synthetic project.
  • Reichling, Mary. ‘Susanne Langer’s Concept of Secondary Illusion in Music and Art’. Journal of Aesthetic Education 29, No. 4 (1 December 1995): 39–51.
    • Opening up of the philosophical discussion on secondary illusions with reference to specific works and art criticism.
  • Sargeant, Winthrop. ‘Philosopher in a New Key’. New Yorker, 3 December 1960.
    • New Yorker profile on Langer.
  • Saxena, Sushil. Hindustani Sangeet and a Philosopher of Art: Music, Rhythm, and Kathak Dance Vis-À-Vis Aesthetics of Susanne K. Langer. New Delhi: D. K. Printworld, 2001.
    • Applies Langerean aesthetics to a type of music Langer did not discuss.
  • Schultz, William. Cassirer and Langer on Myth: An Introduction. London: Routledge, 2000.
    • Discussion of literary myths in Cassirer and Langer, both commonalities and distinctions in their positions.
  • van der Tuin, Iris. ‘Bergson before Bergsonism: Traversing ‘Bergson’s Failing’ in Susanne K. Langer’s Philosophy of Art’. Journal of French and Francophone Philosophy 24, No. 2 (1 December 2016): 176–202.
    • Considers Feeling and Form in relation to the philosophy and reception of Henri Bergson.


Author Information

Peter Windle
University of Kent
United Kingdom