Laws of Nature

Laws of Nature are to be distinguished both from Scientific Laws and from Natural Laws. Neither Natural Laws, as invoked in legal or ethical theories, nor Scientific Laws, which some researchers consider to be scientists’ attempts to state or approximate the Laws of Nature, will be discussed in this article. Instead, it explores issues in contemporary metaphysics.

Within metaphysics, there are two competing theories of Laws of Nature. On one account, the Regularity Theory, Laws of Nature are statements of the uniformities or regularities in the world; they are mere descriptions of the way the world is. On the other account, the Necessitarian Theory, Laws of Nature are the “principles” which govern the natural phenomena of the world. That is, the natural world “obeys” the Laws of Nature. This seemingly innocuous difference marks one of the most profound gulfs within contemporary philosophy, and has quite unexpected, and wide-ranging, implications.

Some of these implications involve accidental truths, false existentials, the correspondence theory of truth, and the concept of free will. Perhaps the most important implication of each theory is whether the universe is a cosmic coincidence or driven by specific, eternal laws of nature.  Each side takes a different stance on each of these issues, and to adopt either theory is to give up one or more strong beliefs about the nature of the world.

Table of Contents

  1. Laws of Nature vs. Laws of Science
  2. The Two Principal Views
    1. Regularity
    2. Necessitarianism
  3. Shared Elements in the Competing Theories
  4. The Case for Necessitarianism
    1. Accidental Truths vs. Laws of Nature
    2. False Existentials
    3. Doom vs. Failure
  5. The Case for Regularity
    1. Naturalizing Philosophy
    2. Revisiting Physical Impossibility
    3. Regularity and Explanation
    4. Problems with Necessitarianism I—Its Inverting the Truth-making Relation
    5. Problems with Necessitarianism II—Its Unempiricalness
    6. The Regularists’ Trump Card—The Dissolution of the Problem of Free Will and Determinism
  6. Statistical Laws
  7. Is the Order in the Universe a Cosmic Coincidence?
  8. Notes
  9. References and Further Reading

1. Laws of Nature vs. Laws of Science

In 1959, at the annual meeting of the American Association for the Advancement of Sciences, Michael Scriven read a paper that implicitly distinguished between Laws of Nature and Laws of Science. Laws of Science (what he at that time called “physical laws”) – with few exceptions – are inaccurate, are at best approximations of the truth, and are of limited range of application. The theme has since been picked up and advanced by Nancy Cartwright.

If scientific laws are inaccurate, then – presumably – there must be some other laws (statements, propositions, principles), doubtless more complex, which are accurate, which are not approximation to the truth but are literally true.

When, for example, generations of philosophers have agonized over whether physical determinism precludes the existence of free will (for example, Honderich), they have been concerned with these latter laws, the laws of nature itself.

It is the explication of these latter laws, the Laws of Nature, that is the topic of this article. It does not examine the “approximate truths” of science. Thus, to cite just one example, the controversy over whether scientific laws are (merely) instruments lies outside the topic of this article.

2. The Two Principal Views

Theories as to the features of Laws of Nature fall into two, quite distinct, schools: the Humeans (or Neo-Humeans) on the one side, the Necessitarians on the other.

a. Regularity

Recent scholarship (for example, that of J. Wright and of Beauchamp and Rosenberg) makes a convincing case that the received view as to what David Hume offered as an explication of the concept of law of nature was quite mistaken, indeed the very opposite of what Hume was arguing. What, historically, until late in the Twentieth Century, was called the “Humean” account of Laws of Nature was a misnomer. Hume himself was no “Humean” as regards laws of nature. Hume, it turns out, was a Necessitarian – i.e. believed that laws of nature are in some sense “necessary” (although of course not logically necessary). His legendary skepticism was epistemological. He was concerned, indeed even baffled, how our knowledge of physical necessity could arise. What, in experience, accounted for the origin of the idea? What, in experience, provided evidence of the existence of the property? He could find nothing that played such a role.

Yet, in spite of his epistemological skepticism, he persisted in his belief that laws of nature are (physical) necessities. So as not to perpetuate the historical error as to what “Humean” properly connotes, this arsticle abandons that term altogether and adopts the relatively unproblematical term “Regularity” in its stead. At the very least, the Regularists’ Theory of Laws of Nature denies that Laws of Nature are ‘physically necessary’. There is no physical necessity, either in laws or in nature itself. There is no intermediate state between logical necessity on the one hand and sheer contingency on the other.

b. Necessitarianism

Necessitarians, in contrast, argue that there is physical (or as they sometimes call it “nomic” or “nomological”) necessity. They offer two different accounts. According to some Necessitarians, physical necessity is a property of the Laws of Nature (along with truth, universality, etc.); according to other Necessitarians, physical necessity inheres in the very woof and warp (the stuff and structure) of the universe.

Thus, for example, on the first of these two Necessitarian theories, electrons will bear the electrical charge -1.6 x 10-19 Coulombs because there is a Law of Nature to that effect, and the universe conforms to, or is ‘governed’ by, this physically necessary (i.e. nomological) principle (along with a number of others, of course).

On the second of the two Necessitarian theories, the “necessity” of an electron’s bearing this particular electrical charge “resides” in the electron itself. It is of the very ‘nature’ of an electron, by necessity, to have this particular electrical charge. On this latter account, the statement “All electrons bear a charge of -1.6 x 10-19 Coulombs” is a Law of Nature because it correctly (veridically) describes a physical necessity in the world.[ 1 ]

3. Shared Elements in the Competing Theories

Regularists and Necessitarians agree as to five conditions necessary for a statement’s being a Law of Nature.

Laws of Nature
1. are factual truths, not logical ones; “The boiling point of sulfur is 444.6° Celsius” expresses a factual truth. “Every number has a double” expresses a logical truth.
2. are true for every time and every place in the universe; There are no laws of nature that hold just for the planet earth (or the Andromeda Galaxy, for that matter), nor are there any that hold just for the Eighteenth Century or just for the Mesozoic Era.
3. contain no proper names; Laws of nature may contain general concepts, such as “mass”, “color”, “aptitude”, “capital”, “diabetes”, “return on investments”, etc.; but may not contain such terms as “the Fraser River”, “the planet Earth”, “$59.22”, “June 18, 1935”, “IBM”, etc.
4. are universal or statistical claims; and “(All pure) copper conducts electricity” expresses a law of nature. But “Stars exist” (although true) does not express a law of nature: it is neither a universal nor a statistical claim.
5. are conditional claims, not categorical ones. Categorical claims which are equivalent to conditional claims (e.g. “There are no perpetual motion machines of the first kind” which is equivalent to “If anything is a perpetual motion machine then it is not of the first kind”) are candidates for lawfulness.[ 2 ]

Categorical claims (e.g., again, “There are stars”) which are not equivalent to conditionals are not candidates for lawfulness.

Note: Laws of physics which are expressed mathematically are taken to be elliptical for conditional truths. For example, the law “mv = mo/(1 – v2/c2)½ ” is to be read as equivalent to “for any massy object, if its velocity is v, then its mass [mv] is equal to its rest mass [mo] divided by …”

Are these five conditions jointly sufficient for a proposition’s being a Law of Nature? Regularists say “yes”; Necessitarians, “no”.

4. The Case for Necessitarianism

Necessitarians lay claim to a number of examples which, they say, can be explicated only by positing a sixth necessary condition for laws of nature, namely, by positing natural (physical /nomic /nomological) necessity.

a. Accidental Truths vs. Laws of Nature

Moas (a large flightless bird that lived in New Zealand) have been extinct for more than a century. We can assume (this example is Popper’s [The Logic of Scientific Discovery, Appendix *x]) that some one of them (we needn’t know which one) was the oldest Moa ever to have lived. Suppose it died at the age of n years. Thus the statement “No moa lives beyond the age of n years” is true (where “lives” is being used as a tenseless verb). Moreover this statement satisfies all the other necessary conditions specified above.

But, Necessitarians will argue, the statement “No moa lives beyond the age of n years” is not a law of nature. It is counterintuitive to believe that such a statement could be on the same (metaphysical) footing as “No perpetual motion machine of the first kind exists”, or, citing another example, “No object having mass is accelerated beyond the speed of light”. The latter statements are bona fide laws of nature; the former a mere ‘accidental’ truth. The difference lies in the (alleged) fact that the latter two cases (about perpetual motion machines and about massy objects) are physically necessary truths; the former (about moas) is a mere accidental truth. To use Popper’s terminology, genuine laws of nature “forbid” certain things to happen; accidental truths do not. Suppose the oldest moa – we’ll call him Ludwig – died, of an intestinal infection, at the age of (let’s say) 12 years. (I haven’t any idea what the average life span of moas was. It’s irrelevant for our purposes.) Now suppose that Ludwig had a younger brother, Johann, hatched from the same clutch of eggs, one hour later than Ludwig himself. Poor Johann – he was shot by a hunter 10 minutes before Ludwig died of his illness. But, surely, had Johann not been shot, he would have lived to a greater age than Ludwig. Unlike his (very slightly) older brother, Johann was in perfect health. Johann was well on his way to surviving Ludwig; it’s just that a hunter dispatched him prematurely. His death was a misfortune; it was not mandated by a law of nature.

b. False Existentials

False existential statements of the sort “Some silver burns at -22° Celsius” and “There is a river of cola” are logically equivalent to statements satisfying all of the five necessary conditions specified above. If those conditions were to constitute a set of sufficient conditions for a statement’s being a law of nature, then the statement “No river is constituted of cola” would be a law of nature.[ 3 ]

The oddity goes even more deeply. Given that what it is to be physically impossible is to be logically inconsistent with a law of nature, then every false existential statement of the sort “Some S is P” or “There is an S that is a P” would turn out to be, not just false, but physically impossible.

But surely the statement “There is a river of cola”, although false, is not physically impossible. There could be such a river. It would merely require a colossal accident (such as befell Boston in 1912 when a huge vat of molasses ruptured), or the foolish waste of a great deal of money.

If “there is a river of cola” is not to be regarded as physically impossible, then some one or more further conditions must be added to the set of necessary conditions for lawfulness. Physical necessity would seem to be that needed further condition.

c. Doom vs. Failure

Suppose (1) that Earth is the only planet in the universe to have supported intelligent life; and (2) that all life on Earth perished in 1900 when the earth was struck by a meteor 10,000 km in diameter. Clearly, under those conditions, the Wright Brothers would never have flown their plane at Kitty Hawk. Even though tinkerers and engineers had been trying for centuries to build a heavier-than-air motorized flying machine, everyone had failed to produce one. But their failure was merely failure; these projects were not doomed. Yet, if the universe had had the slightly different history just described, the statement “there is a heavier-than-air motorized flying machine” would turn out to be physically impossible; hence the project was doomed. But, Necessitarians will argue, not all projects that fail are doomed. Some are doomed, for example, any attempt to accelerate a massy object beyond the speed of light, or, for example, to build a perpetual motion machine of the first kind. Again, just as in the case of accidental truths and lawful truths, we do not want to collapse the distinction between doom and failure. Some projects are doomed; others are mere failures. The distinction warrants being preserved, and that requires positing physical necessity (and—what is the other side of the same coin—physical impossibility).

5. The Case for Regularity

With the dawning of the modern, scientific, age came the growing realization of an extensive sublime order in nature. To be sure, humankind has always known that there is some order in the natural world—for example, the tides rise and fall, the moon has four phases, virgins have no children, water slakes thirst, and persons grow older, not younger. But until the rise of modern science, no one suspected the sweep of this order. The worldview of the West has changed radically since the Renaissance. From a world which seemed mostly chaotic, there emerged an unsuspected underlying order, an order revealed by physics, chemistry, biology, economics, sociology, psychology, neuroscience, geology, evolutionary theory, pharmacology, epidemiology, etc.

And so, alongside the older metaphysical question, “Why is there anything, rather than nothing?”, there arises the newer question, “Why is the world orderly, rather than chaotic?” How can one explain the existence of this pervasive order? What accounts for it?

a. Naturalizing Philosophy

Even as recently as the Eighteenth Century, we find philosophers (e.g. Montesquieu) explicitly attributing the order in nature to the hand of God, more specifically to His having imposed physical laws on nature in much the same way as He imposed moral laws on human beings. There was one essential difference, however. Human beings – it was alleged – are “free” to break (act contrary to) God’s moral laws; but neither human beings nor the other parts of creation are free to break God’s physical laws.

In the Twentieth Century virtually all scientists and philosophers have abandoned theistic elements in their accounts of the Laws of Nature. But to a very great extent—so say the Regularists—the Necessitarians have merely replaced God with Physical Necessity. The Necessitarians’ nontheistic view of Laws of Nature surreptitiously preserves the older prescriptivist view of Laws of Nature, namely, as dictates or edicts to the natural universe, edicts which – unlike moral laws or legislated ones – no one, and no thing, has the ability to violate.

Regularists reject this view of the world. Regularists eschew a view of Laws of Nature which would make of them inviolable edicts imposed on the universe. Such a view, Regularists claim, is simply a holdover from a theistic view. It is time, they insist, to adopt a thoroughly naturalistic philosophy of science, one which is not only purged of the hand of God, but is also purged of its unempirical latter-day surrogate, namely, nomological necessity. The difference is, perhaps, highlighted most strongly in Necessitarians saying that the Laws of Nature govern the world; while Regularists insist that Laws of Nature do no more or less than correctly describe the world.

b. Revisiting Physical Impossibility

Doubtless the strongest objection Necessitarians level against Regularists is that the latter’s theory obliterates the distinction between laws of nature (for example, “No massy object is accelerated beyond the speed of light”) and accidental generalizations (e.g. “No Moa lives more than n years”). Thus, on the Regularists’ account, there is a virtually limitless number of Laws of Nature. (Necessitarians, in contrast, typically operate with a view that there are only a very small number, a mere handful, of Laws of Nature, that these are the ‘most fundamental’ laws of physics, and that all other natural laws are logical consequences of [i.e. ‘reducible to’] these basic laws. I will not further pursue the issue of reductivism in this article.)

What is allegedly wrong with there being no distinction between accidental generalizations and ‘genuine’ Laws of Nature? Just this (say the Necessitarians): if there is a virtually limitless number of Laws of Nature, then (as we have seen above) every false existential statement turns out to be physically impossible and (again) the distinction between (mere) failure and doom is obliterated.

How can Regularists reply to this seemingly devastating attack, issuing as it does from deeply entrenched philosophical intuitions?

Regularists will defend their theory against this particular objection by arguing that the expression “physically impossible” has different meanings in the two theories: there is a common, or shared, meaning of this expression in both theories, but there is an additional feature in the Necessitarians’ account that is wholly absent in the Regularists’.

The common (i.e. shared) meaning in “physically impossible” is “inconsistent with a Law of Nature”. That is, anything that is inconsistent with a Law of Nature is “physically impossible”. (On a prescriptivist account of Laws of Nature, one would say Laws of Nature “rule out” certain events and states-of-affairs.)

On both accounts – Necessitarianism and Regularity – what is physically impossible never, ever, occurs – not in the past, not at present, not in the future, not here, and not anywhere else.

But on the Necessitarians’ account, there is something more to a physically impossible event’s nonoccurrence and something more to a physically impossible state-of-affair’s nonexistence. What is physically impossible is not merely nonoccurrent or nonexistent. These events and states-of-affairs simply could not occur or exist. There is, then, in the Necessitarians’ account, a modal element that is entirely lacking in the Regularists’ theory. When Necessitarians say of a claim – e.g. that someone has built a perpetual motion machine of the first kind – that it is physically impossible, they intend to be understood as claiming that not only is the situation described timelessly and universally false, it is so because it is nomically impossible.

In contrast, when Regularists say that some situation is physically impossible – e.g. that there is a river of cola – they are claiming no more and no less than that there is no such river, past, present, future, here, or elsewhere. There is no nomic dimension to their claim. They are not making the modal claim that there could not be such a river; they are making simply the factual (nonmodal) claim that there timelessly is no such river. (Further reading: ‘The’ Modal Fallacy.)

According to Regularists, the concept of physical impossibility is nothing but a special case of the concept of timeless falsity. It is only when one imports from other theories (Necessitarianism, Prescriptivism, and so forth) a different, modal, meaning of the expression, that paradox seems to ensue. Understand the ambiguity of the expression, and especially its nonmodal character in the Regularity theory, and the objection that the Necessitarians level is seen to miss its mark.

(There is an allied residual problem with the foundations of Necessitarianism. Some recent authors [e.g. Armstrong and Carroll] have written books attempting to explicate the concept of nomicity. But they confess to being unable to explicate the concept, and they ultimately resort to treating it as an unanalyzable base on which to erect a theory of physical lawfulness.)

c. Regularity and Explanation

Another philosophical intuition that has prompted the belief in Necessitarianism has been the belief that to explain why one event occurred rather than another, one must argue that the occurring event “had to happen” given the laws of nature and antecedent conditions. In a nutshell, the belief is that laws of nature can be used to explain the occurrence of events, accidental generalizations—’mere truths devoid of nomic force’—can not be so utilized.

The heyday of the dispute over this issue was the 1940s and 50s. It sputtered out, in more or less an intellectual standoff, by the late 60s. Again, philosophical intuitions and differences run very deep. Regularists will argue that we can explain events very well indeed, thank you, in terms of vaguely circumscribed generalities; we do not usually invoke true generalities, let alone true generalities that are assumed to be nomically necessary. In short, we can, and indeed do several times each day, explain events without supposing that the principles we cite are in any sense necessary. Regularists will point to the fact that human beings had, for thousands of years, been successfully explaining some events in their environment (e.g. that the casting cracked because it had been cooled down too quickly) without even having the concept of nomicity, much less being able to cite any nomologically necessary universal generalizations.

Necessitarianism, on this view, then, is seen to dovetail with a certain – highly controversial – view of the nature of explanation itself, namely, that one can explain the occurrence of an event only when one is in a position to cite a generalization which is nomologically necessary. Few philosophers are now prepared to persist with this view of explanation, but many still retain the belief that there are such things as nomologically necessary truths. Regularists regard this belief as superfluous.

d. Problems with Necessitarianism I—Its Inverting the Truth-making Relation

Religious skeptics – had they lived in a society where they might have escaped torture for asking the question – might have wondered why (/how) the world molds itself to God’s will. God, on the Prescriptivist view of Laws of Nature, commanded the world to be certain ways, e.g. it was God’s will (a law of nature that He laid down) that all electrons should have a charge of -1.6 x 10-19 Coulombs. But how is all of this supposed to play out? How, exactly, is it that electrons do have this particular charge? It is a mighty strange, and unempirical, science that ultimately rests on an unintelligible power of a/the deity.

Twentieth-century Necessitarianism has dropped God from its picture of the world. Physical necessity has assumed God’s role: the universe conforms to (the dictates of? / the secret, hidden, force of? / the inexplicable mystical power of?) physical laws. God does not ‘drive’ the universe; physical laws do.

But how? How could such a thing be possible? The very posit lies beyond (far beyond) the ability of science to uncover. It is the transmuted remnant of a supernatural theory, one which science, emphatically, does not need.

There is another, less polemical, way of making the same point.

Although there are problems aplenty in Tarski’s theory of truth (i.e. the semantic theory of truth, also called the “correspondence theory of truth”), it is the best theory we have. Its core concept is that statements (or propositions) are true if they describe the world the way it is, and they are false otherwise. Put metaphorically, we can say that truth flows to propositions from the way the world is. Propositions ‘take their truth’ from the world; they do not impose their truth on the world. If two days before an election, Tom says “Sylvia will win”, and two days after the election, Marcus says, “Sylvia won”, then whether these statements are true or false depends on whether or not Sylvia is elected. If she is, both statements are true; if she is not, then both statements are false. But the truth or falsity of those statements does not bring about her winning (or losing), or cause her to win (or lose), the election. Whether she wins or loses is up to the voters, not to certain statements.

Necessitarians – unwittingly perhaps – turn the semantic theory of truth on its head. Instead of having propositions taking their truth from the way the world is, they argue that certain propositions – namely the laws of nature – impose truth on the world.

The Tarskian truth-making relation is between events or state-of-affairs on the one hand and properties of abstract entities (propositions) on the other. As difficult as it may be to absorb such a concept, it is far more difficult to view a truth-making relationship the ‘other way round’. Necessitarianism requires that one imagine that a certain privileged class of propositions impose their truth on events and states of affairs. Not only is this monumental oddity of Necessitarianism hardly ever noticed, no one has ever tried to offer a theory as to its nature.

e. Problems with Necessitarianism II—Its Unempiricalness

Eighteenth-century empiricists (Hume most especially) wondered where, in experience, there was anything that prompted the concept of physical necessity. Experience, it would seem, provides at best only data about how the world is, not how it must be, i.e. experience provides data concerning regularity, not (physical) necessity. Hume’s best answer, and it is clearly inadequate, lay in a habit of mind.

Twentieth-century empiricists are far more concerned with the justification of our concepts than with their origins. So the question has now evolved to “what evidence exists that warrants a belief in a physical necessity beyond the observed and posited regularities in nature?”

A number of Necessitarians (see, for example, von Wright) have tried to describe experiments whose outcomes would justify a belief in physical necessity. But these thought-experiments are impotent. At best – as Hume clearly had seen – any such experiment could show no more than a pervasive regularity in nature; none could demonstrate that such a regularity flowed from an underlying necessity.

f. The Regularists’ Trump Card—The Dissolution of the Problem of Free Will and Determinism

In the Regularity theory, the knotted problem of free will vs. determinism is solved (or better, “dissolved”) so thoroughly that it cannot coherently even be posed.

On the Regularists’ view, there simply is no problem of free will. We make choices – some trivial, such as to buy a newspaper; others, rather more consequential, such as to buy a home, or to get married, or to go to university, etc. – but these choices are not forced upon us by the laws of nature. Indeed, it is the other way round. Laws of nature are (a subclass of the) true descriptions of the world. Whatever happens in the world, there are true descriptions of those events. It’s true that you cannot “violate” a law of nature, but that’s not because the laws of nature ‘force’ you to behave in some certain way. It is rather that whatever you do, there is a true description of what you have done. You certainly don’t get to choose the laws that describe the charge on an electron or the properties of hydrogen and oxygen that explain their combining to form water. But you do get to choose a great many other laws. How do you do that? Simply by doing whatever you do in fact do.

For example, if you were to choose(!) to raise your arm, then there would be a timelessly true universal description (let’s call it “D4729”) of what you have done. If, however, you were to choose not to raise your arm, then there would be a (different) timelessly true universal description (we can call it “D5322”) of what you did (and D4729 would be timelessly false).

Contrary to the Necessitarians’ claim – that the laws of nature are not of our choosing – Regularists argue that a very great many laws of nature are of our choosing. But it’s not that you reflect on choosing the laws. You don’t wake up in the morning and ask yourself “Which laws of nature will I create today?” No, it’s rather that you ask yourself, “What will I do today?”, and in choosing to do some things rather than others, your actions – that is, your choices – make certain propositions (including some universal statements containing no proper names) true and other propositions false.

A good example embodying the Regularists’ view can be found in the proposition, attributed to Sir Thomas Gresham (1519?-1579) but already known earlier, called – not surprisingly – “Gresham’s Law”:

[Gresham’s Law is] the theory holding that if two kinds of money in circulation have the same denominational value but different intrinsic values, the money with higher intrinsic value will be hoarded and eventually driven out of circulation by the money with lesser intrinsic value.

In effect what this “law” states is that ‘bad money drives out good’. For example, in countries where the governments begin issuing vast amounts of paper money, that money becomes next-to-worthless and people hoard ‘good’ money, e.g. gold and silver coins, that is, “good” money ceases to circulate.

Why, when paper money becomes virtually worthless, do people hoard gold? Because gold retains its economic value – it can be used in emergencies to purchase food, clothing, flight (if need be), medicine, etc., even when “bad” paper money will likely not be able to be so used. People do not hoard gold under such circumstances because Gresham’s “Law” forces them to do so. Gresham’s “Law” is purely descriptive (not prescriptive) and illustrates well the point Regularists insist upon: namely, that laws of economics are not causal agents – they do not force the world to be some particular way rather than another. (Notice, too, how this non-nomological “Law” works perfectly adequately in explaining persons’ behavior. Citing regularities can, and does, explain the way the world is. One does not need to posit an underlying, inaccessible, nomicity.)

The manner in which we regard Gresham’s “Law” ought, Regularists suggest, to be the way we regard all laws of nature. The laws of physics and chemistry are no different than the laws of economics. All laws of nature – of physics, of chemistry, of biology, of economics, of psychology, of sociology, and so forth – are nothing more, nor anything less, than (a certain subclass of) true propositions.

Persons who believe that there is a problem reconciling the existence of free will and determinism have turned upside down the relationship between laws of nature on the one side and events and states of affairs on the other. It is not that laws of nature govern the world. We are not “forced” to choose one action rather than another. It is quite the other way round: we choose, and the laws of nature accommodate themselves to our choice. If I choose to wear a brown shirt, then it is true that I do so; and if instead I were to choose to wear a blue shirt, then it would be true that I wear a blue shirt. In neither case would my choosing be ‘forced’ by the truth of the proposition that describes my action. And the same semantic principle applies even if the proposition truly describing my choice is a universal proposition rather than a singular one.

To make the claim even more pointedly: it is only because Necessitarianism tacitly adopts an anti-semantic theory of truth that the supposed problem of free will vs. determinism even arises. Adopt a thoroughgoing Regularist theory and the problem evaporates.

6. Statistical Laws

Many, perhaps most, of workaday scientific laws (recall the first section above) are statistical generalizations – e.g. the scientific claims (explanatory principles) of psychology, economics, meteorology, ecology, epidemiology, etc.

But can the underlying, the “real,” Laws of Nature itself be statistical?

With occasional reluctance, especially early in the Twentieth Century, physicists came to allow that at least some laws of nature really are statistical, for example, laws such as “the half-life of radium is 1,600 years” which is a shorthand way of saying “in any sample of radium, 50% of the radium atoms will radioactively decay within a period of 1,600 years”.

Regularists take the prospect (indeed the existence) of statistical laws of nature in stride. On the Regularists’ account, statistical laws of nature – whether in areas studied by physicists or by economists or by pharmacologists – pose no intellectual or theoretical challenges whatsoever. Just as deterministic (i.e. exceptionless) laws are descriptions of the world, not prescriptions or disguised prescriptions, so too are statistical laws.

Necessitarians, however, frequently have severe problems in accommodating the notion of statistical laws of nature. What sort of metaphysical ‘mechanism’ could manifest itself in statistical generalities? Could there be such a thing as stochastic nomicity? Popper grappled with this problem and proposed what he came to call “the propensity theory of probability”. On his view, each radium atom, for example, would have its “own”(?) 50% propensity to decay within the next 1,600 years. Popper really did see the problem that statistical laws pose for Necessitarianism, but his solution has won few, if any, other subscribers. To Regularists, such solutions appear as evidence of the unworkability and the dispensability of Necessitarianism. They are the sure sign of a theory that is very much in trouble.

7. Is the Order in the Universe a Cosmic Coincidence?

An important subtext in the dispute between Necessitarians and Regularists concerns the very concepts we need to ‘make sense’ of the universe.

For Regularists, the way-the-world-is is the rock bottom of their intellectual reconstruction. They have reconciled themselves to, and embraced, the ultimately inexplicable contingency of the universe.

But for Necessitarians, the way-the-world-is cannot be the rock bottom. For after all, they will insist, there has to be some reason, some explanation, why the world is as it is and is not some other way. It can’t simply be, for example, that all electrons, the trillions upon trillions of them, just happen to all bear the identical electrical charge as one another—that would be a cosmic coincidence of an unimaginable improbability. No, this is no coincidence. The identity of electrical charge comes about because there is a law of nature to the effect that electrons have this charge. Laws of nature “drive” the world. The laws of physics which, for example, describe the behavior of diffraction gratings (see Harrison) were true from time immemorial and it is because of those laws that diffraction gratings, when they came to be engineered in modern times, have the peculiar properties they do.

Regularists will retort that the supposed explanatory advantage of Necessitarianism is illusory. Physical necessity, nomicity if you will, is as idle and unempirical a notion as was Locke’s posit of a material substratum. Locke’s notion fell into deserved disuse simply because it did no useful work in science. It was a superfluous notion. (The case is not unlike modern arguments that minds are convenient fictions, the product of “folk” psychology.)

At some point explanations must come to an end. Regularists place that stopping point at the way-the-world-is. Necessitarians place it one, inaccessible, step beyond, at the way-the-world-must-be.

The divide between Necessitarians and Regularists remains as deep as any in philosophy. Neither side has conceived a theory which accommodates all our familiar, and deeply rooted, historically-informed beliefs about the nature of the world. To adopt either theory is to give up one or more strong beliefs about the nature of the world. And there simply do not seem to be any other theories in the offing. While these two theories are clearly logical contraries, they are – for the foreseeable future – also exhaustive of the alternatives.

8. Notes

  1. Throughout this article, the term “world” is used to refer to the entire universe, past, present, and future, to whatever is near and whatever is far, and to whatever is known of that universe and what is unknown. The term is never used here to refer to just the planet Earth.Clearly, one presupposition of this article is that the world (i.e. the universe) is not much of our making. Given the sheer size of the universe, our human effect on it is infinitesimal. The world is not mind-constructed. The world is some one particular way, although it remains a struggle to figure out what that way is. [ Return ]
  2. A perpetual motion machine of the first kind is a hypothetical machine in which no energy is required for performing work. [ Return ]
  3. In detail, the statement “There is a river of cola” is an existential affirmative statement (a classical so-called I-proposition). Its contradictory (or better, among its contradictories) is the statement “No river is constituted of cola” (a classical so-called E-proposition). Now, given that “There is a river of cola” is, ex hypothesi, timelessly false, then the universal negative proposition, “No river is constituted of cola”, is timelessly true. But since the latter satisfies all five of the necessary conditions specified (above) for being a law of nature, it would turn out to be a law of nature. [ Return ]

9. References and Further Reading

  • Armstrong, David M., What is a Law of Nature? (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), 1983.
  • Beauchamp, Tom L., editor, Philosophical Problems of Causation, (Encino, CA: Dickenson Publishing Co., Inc.), 1974.
  • Beauchamp, Tom L. and Alexander Rosenberg, Hume and the Problem of Causation, (New York: Oxford University Press), 1981.
  • Berofsky, Bernard, Freedom from Necessity: The Metaphysical Basis of Responsibility, (New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul), 1987.
  • Carroll, John W., Laws of Nature, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), 1994.
  • Cartwright, Nancy, How the Laws of Physics Lie, (Oxford: Oxford University Press), 1983.
  • Clarke, Randolph, “Recent Work on Freedom and Determinism”, in Philosophical Books, vol. 36, no. 1 (Jan. 1995), pp. 9-18.
  • Dretske, Fred, “Laws of Nature,” in Philosophy of Science, vol. 44, no. 2 (June 1977), pp. 248-268.
  • Gerwin, Martin, “Causality and Agency: A Refutation of Hume”, in Dialogue (Canada), XXVI (1987), pp. 3-17.
  • Harrison, George R., “Diffraction grating,” in McGraw-Hill Encyclopedia of Physics, edited by Sybil P. Parker, (New York: McGraw-Hill Book Co.), 1983, pp. 245-247.
  • Honderich, Ted, “One Determinism,” (revised with added introduction) in Philosophy As It Is, edited by Ted Honderich and Myles Burneat, (New York: Penguin Books), 1979. The original paper appeared in Essays on Freedom of Action, edited by Ted Honderich (London: Kegan Paul Ltd.), 1973.
  • Hume, David A., A Treatise of Human Nature [1739], edited by L.A. Selby-Bigge, (London: Oxford University Press), 1888, reprinted 1960.
  • Kneale, William, “Natural Laws and Contrary-to-Fact Conditionals,” in Analysis, vol. 10, no. 6 (June 1950), pp. 121-125. Reprinted in Beauchamp (1974) [see above], pp. 46-49.
  • Maxwell, Nicholas, “Can there be necessary connections between successive events?”, in British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, vol. 19 (1968), pp. 1-25.
  • Molnar, George, “Kneale’s Argument Revisited,” in The Philosophical Review, vol.78, no. 1 (Jan. 1969) pp. 79-89. Reprinted in Beauchamp (1974) [see above], pp. 106-113.
  • Montesquieu, Baron de, The Spirit of the Laws, [1st edition 1748; last edition (posth.) 1757], translated and edited by Abbe M. Cohler, Basia Carolyn Miller, and Harold Samuel Stone, (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), 1988.
  • Popper, Sir Karl, The Logic of Scientific Discovery, (New York: Basic Books), 1959.
  • Popper, Sir Karl, “The Propensity interpretation of the calculus of probability, and the quantum theory”, in Observation and Interpretation in the Philosophy of Physics, [1957] edited by Stephen Korner, (New York: Dover Publications, Inc.) 1962, pp. 65-70.
  • Popper, Sir Karl, “The Propensity Interpretation of Probability,” in British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, vol. 10 (1959), pp. 25-42.
  • Popper, Sir Karl, “Suppes’s Criticism of the Propensity Interpretation of Probability and Quantum Mechanics,” in The Philosophy of Karl Popper, edited by Paul Arthur Schilpp, (La Salle, IL: Open Court), 1974, pp. 1125-1140.
  • Reichenbach, Hans, Nomological Statements and Admissible Operations, (Amsterdam: North-Holland Publ. Co.), 1954.
  • Scriven, Michael, “An Essential Unpredictability in Human Behavior,” in Scientific Psychology: Principles and Approaches, edited by Ernest Nagel and Benjamin Wolman, (New York: Basic Books), 1965, pp. 411-25.
    • This important paper implicitly adopts a Regularity theory of laws of nature.
  • Scriven, Michael, “The Key Property of Physical Laws – Inaccuracy,” in Current Issues in the Philosophy of Science – Proceedings of Section L of the American Association for the Advancement of Sciences, 1959, edited by H. Feigl and G. Maxwell, (New York: Holt Rinehart and Winston), 1961, pp. 91-104.
  • Strawson, Galen, The Secret Connexion: Causation, Realism, and David Hume, (Oxford: Oxford University Press), 1989.
  • Swartz, Norman, The Concept of Physical Law, (New York: Cambridge University Press), 1985.
  • Swartz, Norman, “Reply to Ruse,” in Dialogue (Canada), XXVII, (1988), pp. 529-532.
  • Weinert, Friedel, editor, Laws of Nature: Essays on the Philosophical, Scientific and Historical Dimensions, (Berlin: de Gruyter), 1995.
    • This volume contains a very extensive bibliography, pp. 52-64.
  • Wright, Georg Henrik von, Causality and Determinism, (New York: Columbia University Press), 1974.
  • Wright, John P., The Sceptical Realism of David Hume, (Manchester: Manchester University Press), 1983.

Author Information

Norman Swartz
Simon Fraser University