Legal validity governs the enforceability of law, and the standard of legal validity enhances or restricts the ability of the political ruler to enforce his will through legal coercion. Western law adopts three competing standards of legal validity. Each standard emphasizes a different dimension of law (Berman 1988, p. 779), and each has its own school of jurisprudence.
Legal positivism emphasizes law’s political dimension. Legal positivism recognizes political rulers as the only source of valid law and adopts the will of the political ruler as its validity standard. Leading legal positivists include Jeremy Bentham, John Austin, and H.L.A. Hart.
Natural law theory emphasizes law’s moral dimension. Natural law theory recognizes universal moral principles as the primary source of valid law. These moral principles provide a standard of legal validity that imposes moral limits on the ruler’s coercive powers. Leading natural law theorists include Aristotle, Cicero, Justinian, and Thomas Aquinas.
The historicist school emphasizes law’s historical dimension. The historicist school recognizes legal custom as the primary source of valid law. Legal custom provides a standard of legal validity that imposes customary limits on the political ruler’s coercive powers. Leading historicists include Sir Edward Coke, John Selden, Sir Matthew Hale, and Sir William Blackstone.
Legal positivism recognizes positive law as the only real law and rejects law’s moral and historical dimensions as sources of valid laws. Natural law theory and the historicist school, on the other hand, often integrate law’s three dimensions. They recognize each dimension as a potential source of valid law but emphasize a particular dimension through their validity standard. Blackstone’s unique jurisprudence adopts two validity standards, one from law’s historical dimension, and one from law’s moral dimension.
Standards of legal validity are historically cyclical. A society typically adopts a standard of legal validity based on moral principles, custom, or both. This validity standard restricts the ruler’s ability to enforce his will through legal coercion. Then, intellectual challenges to moral principles and legal custom minimize their esteem. A new validity standard is adopted based on the will of the political ruler. Abuses of coercive powers by political rulers eventually stimulate renewed restrictions on those powers. The society adopts a revived standard of legal validity based on moral principles, custom, or both. The revived validity standard will typically endure until the memory of abuse fades, when the cycle begins again.
This cycle began with Hesiod in 700 B. C. E. and continued into the 21st Century. In common law jurisprudence, judicial acceptance of Hart’s legal positivism eroded Blackstone’s validity standards based on moral principles and custom. In civil law jurisprudence, Soviet and Nazi abuses of positivist legal systems revived validity standards based on moral principles. This essay describes the cycle of legal validity in Western law and proposes a fresh approach to legal validity to break this cycle.
Table of Contents
- The Sophists
- Justinian’s Corpus Juris Civilis
- Positivism in American Jurisprudence
- A Fresh Approach
- References and Further Reading
The first standard of legal validity in the Western legal tradition appears in Hesiod’s religious poem Works and Days, circa 700 B. C. E. Hesiod presents an archetypal jurisprudence that integrates law’s three dimensions. Dikê, the goddess of human justice, personifies law’s moral dimension. Dikê’s father Zeus personifies law’s political dimension. Dikê’s mother Thetis, the Titan embodiment of custom and social order, personifies law’s historical dimension.
Justice “sets the laws straight with righteousness” and distinguishes men from beasts. Divinely decreed moral principles establish the validity standard for human law and customs, and conforming laws and customs establish the nomoi (law). Just men obey the nomoi, and obedience brings peace and prosperity. Disobedience brings punishment to the individual and his city through famine, plague, infertility, and military disaster.
The Sophists, wandering teachers of the fifth century B. C. E., challenged Greek conventions in religion, morality, and political conduct. They rejected Hesiod’s moral dimension by rejecting the existence of divine lawgivers and universal moral principles. They rejected Hesiod’s historical dimension by denying any normative authority to custom. Might was right, and law functioned only in the political dimension as the will of the strongest.
The Sophist Protagoras of Abdera (b. circa 481 B. C. E.), rejected law’s moral dimension. As an agnostic, Protagoras rejected the divine lawgiver. As a moral relativist, Protagoras rejected the existence of universal moral principles. Unlike later Sophists, however, Protagoras accepted the validity of custom in law’s historical dimension.
Protagoras based his moral relativism on the argument that a shared factual knowledge of the world is impossible. The foundation of Protagoras’ relativism is the “man-measure” of the Aletheia (Truth). “Man is the measure of all things, of those that are that they are, of those that are not that they are not.”
Sense perception forms the basis of all knowledge, Protagoras believed, and every sense impression that a person receives is securely true. The data of sense perception, however, are private, subjective states. The wind is truly warm to the man who perceives it as warm, but the same wind is truly cold to the man who perceives it as cold. Perceived objects therefore have contradictory properties and there are no public facts.
Protagoras maintained that all knowledge claims are thus equally true. Furthermore, their truth endures regardless of conflicting claims. Protagoras therefore claimed “it is equally possible to affirm and deny anything of anything.” (Aristotle, Metaphysics, 1007b).
Protagoras extended his doctrine that all knowledge claims are equally true to claim that all virtue claims are equally true. Virtue claims are relative to the claimant because virtue is only another form of knowledge. (Plato, Protagoras, 323a-328d). There are no universal moral principles, and law’s moral dimension does not exist.
Although Protagoras rejected law’s moral dimension, he embraced law’s historical dimension. Although all knowledge and virtue claims are equally true, Protagoras argued they are not all equally sound. Only the ignorant equated truth with soundness. One set of thoughts can therefore be “better than another, but not in any way truer.” The same is true of laws. All laws are equally true, but not all laws are equally sound.
Protagoras accepted a duty to obey the law. Since no moral or legal code is truer than any other, no individual should assert his moral or legal judgments over those advanced by the state. Society is required to preserve humanity. The perpetuation of society, in turn, requires respect for law and custom. Men should obey the state’s laws and customs so long as they function soundly. (Plato, Protagoras, 322d; Theaetetus, 167b).
The Sophist Callicles (b. circa 484 B. C. E.), rejected law’s historical dimension and denied any duty to obey the law. Using “nature” to mean the antithesis of mind, Callicles argued that nature’s normative authority (phusis) supersedes the normative authority of man’s laws and customs (nomoi). Man’s laws and customs violate “nature’s own law” and “natural justice.” Nature’s law, not man’s, should govern our actions.
Callicles said that what men call “right” merely expresses what men believe to be to their advantage. Legal conventions in democracies wrongfully elevate the weak over the strong. The majority of weaker folk frame the laws for their advantage to prevent the stronger from gaining advantage over them. The true nature of right is established by nature, not men, and nature’s law establishes right in the strong. Natural justice provides that the better and wiser man should rule over and have more than the inferior. Might, therefore, makes right. All animals and races of man recognize right as the sovereignty and advantage of the stronger over the weaker. (Plato, Gorgias, 483b-d, 490a).
The Sophist Thrasymachus (b. circa 459 B. C. E.) argued for disobeying laws and customs. Defining justice as obedience to the laws, Thrasymachus argues that justice is nothing but the advantage of the stronger. Obedience furthers the advantage of others and reduces the obedient to a form of slavery. Only disobedience to law profits a man and leads to his advantage. Injustice is therefore “a stronger, freer, and more masterful thing than justice.” (Plato, Republic, 338c-344c).
Solon’s constitution created an archetypal positivist legal system in Athens in 594 B. C. E. Solon reposed political and judicial authority in the heliastic courts. The courts enforced undefined laws with no standard of legal validity other than the unrestrained will of the jurors. Pericles’ introduction of payments for jurors in 451 B. C. E. enthroned Athens’ poorest and least educated class as dikasts in the heliastic courts. The Athenian courts became infamous for injustice and gullibility. Xenophon writes that Athenian courts often acted on emotion to put innocent men to death and acquit wrongdoers. (Xenophon 1990, pp.41-42). Eighty dikasts who found Socrates innocent voted for his death.
Athenian ostracism (ostrakismos) permitted the conviction, exile, and execution of any Athenian without charges, hearing, or defense. Originally intended for removing tyrants, Plutarch records that ostracism quickly became a way of pacifying jealousy of the eminent. Ostracism breathed out malice in exile and death. Every one was liable to it whose reputation, birth, or eloquence rose above the common level. (Plutarch 1914, pp. 2, 230, 233).
Athens ostracized its greatest heroes from envy of their honors. Athens ostracized Aristides, the hero of the Battle of Marathon, in 483 B. C. E. Athens ostracized Themistocles, savior of Athens at the Battle of Salamis, in 471 B. C. E. Both men were exiled for ten years without charges or a hearing.
Lack of procedural safeguards encouraged frivolous public prosecutions (graphai) and impeachments (eisangeliai), giving free reign to Athens’ gullible and imprudent dikasts. Frivolous political prosecutions destroyed Athens’ leadership, spawning bloody regime changes and military disasters. The frivolous prosecution of Pericles in 443 B. C. E. precipitated the Peloponnesian War with Sparta. The frivolous prosecution of Alcibiades in 415 B. C. E. caused Athens’ ablest general to switch sides and lead Sparta against Athens.
The greatest ignominy involves the Arginusae generals in 404 B. C. E. Six Athenian naval commanders won a great naval victory against Sparta at Arginusae. A violent storm prevented their recovering the dead and shipwrecked. The generals were nevertheless impeached and executed for failing to do so. Deprived of her best generals, Athens lost the war the next year in a devastating naval defeat at Aegospotami.
Political prosecutions wreaked political havoc as well. Five regime changes rocked Athens between 411 B. C. E. and 403 B. C. E. These regimes included the reign of terror by the Thirty Tyrants in 404 B. C. E.
Athenian positivism criminalized thought and expression in frivolous prosecutions against philosophers. Anaxagoras circa 430 B. C. E., Protagoras circa 415 B. C. E., and Socrates in 399 B. C. E. were all convicted on manufactured charges of impiety (asebeia). Impiety was undefined by Athenian law. Every juror defined it anew in every case as he pleased.
Athens often regretted its decisions. Socrates’ lead accuser Anytus was stoned for his role in Socrates’ death. Athens honored Socrates with a bronze statue by Lysippus. Athens thus gained “the indelible reproach of decreeing to the same citizens the hemlock on one day and statues on the next.” (Hamilton 2010, p. 289).
Plato described Socrates as the bravest, wisest, and most upright man of his time. Plato planned a career in politics but “withdrew in disgust” after observing how Athenian courts “corrupted the written laws and customs.” (Plato, Letter VII, 325a-c). Plato reacted to Socrates’ death by repudiating the Sophists, reviving law’s moral and historical dimensions, and formulating a natural law standard of legal validity based on principles of universal justice.
Plato begins his revival of law’s historical dimension by emphasizing the autonomy of law, which he considered the most important aspect of government. Autonomous laws wield supremacy over political rulers. Political rulers are subject to the same laws as other citizens, and they may not alter the laws to suit their will.
Plato wrote that the preservation or ruin of a community depends on the autonomy of laws more than anything else. Respecting law’s autonomy preserves the entire community. Disregarding it brings destruction. Autonomy is so important that “the man who is most perfect in obedience to established law” should receive the highest post in government. The second most obedient man should receive the second highest post, and so on for all the posts. (Plato, Laws, 715c-d.)
Plato begins his revival of law’s moral dimension by persuasively refuting Protagoras’ moral relativism in the Theaetetus. Protagoras claimed that all sense perceptions are equally true. Since knowledge is perception, all knowledge claims are equally true. Since moral claims are a species of knowledge claims, all moral claims are equally true. Therefore, no one set of moral principles has authority to guide the laws.
Plato offers eleven objections to Protagoras’ arguments in the Theaetetus. Three are recounted here. First, Plato denies that knowledge is perception. If knowledge were perception, we would understand anyone speaking to us in a foreign tongue. This is clearly not the case. Second, remembered knowledge refutes Protagoras’ claim that knowledge is perception. Remembered knowledge involves no perception, but it is knowledge nonetheless.
Third, moral relativism is self-refuting. Assume, as Protagoras claims, that “all beliefs are true.” Assume also that another man exists who believes that “not all beliefs are true.” If Protagoras is correct, then the second man’s belief must be true. Protagoras’ belief that “all beliefs are true” is thus refuted. (Plato, Theaetetus, 160e-177b).
Plato continues his revival of law’s moral and historical dimensions in the Crito. The Crito considers whether a duty exists to obey the law. Socrates’ friend Crito argues for Socrates to escape and avoid his unjust execution.
Socrates replies that the soul is more precious than the body. Good actions benefit our souls, but wrong actions mutilate them. The important thing is not living, but living well. This means living honorably. Socrates utilizes three principles in determining whether to escape. First, circumstances never justify wrong action. Second, one should not injure others, even when they injure you. Third, one “ought to honor one’s agreements, provided they are right.” (Plato, Crito, 47e-49e).
Plato defines law’s moral dimension through these principles. Justinian’s Corpus Juris Civilis defines its moral dimension by these same principles in the sixth century. (Justinian, Digest, 1.1.10). Blackstone’s Commentaries does the same in the eighteenth century. (Blackstone 1828, p. 27).
Plato next refutes Thrasymachus’ claim in the Republic that disobeying the law “is a stronger, freer, and more masterful thing” than obeying the law. In the Crito’s “Speech of the Laws,” the Laws present two arguments for obedience. The first is the “argument from agreement.” Socrates has undertaken to live his life in obedience to Athens’ laws. Athens did not force Socrates to live in its precincts. Socrates was free to leave at any time. By choosing to stay in Athens with full knowledge of how the laws functioned, Socrates promised obedience to the laws.
The Laws’ orders are “in the form of proposals, not savage commands.” Socrates can either obey the Laws or persuade (the personification of) the Law that they are at fault. If Socrates escapes without persuading the personification of the Laws that they were at fault, he would dishonor his agreement to obey the laws. Dishonoring a just agreement violates the ethic of “living well” and damages the soul.
The Laws’ second argument is the “argument from injury.” Disobedience destroys both the Laws and the city, which cannot exist if legal judgments are ignored. Socrates concludes that “both in war and in the law courts and everywhere else you must do whatever your city and your country command, or else persuade them in accordance with universal justice” that they are at fault.
The Laws’ second argument implies a natural law standard of validity based on principles of universal justice. The Laws insist they operate as “proposals, not savage commands.” Socrates’ duty to obey the Laws is contingent on the Laws’ compliance with principles of universal justice. By implication, there is no duty to obey the Laws if they violate principles of universal justice. (Plato, Crito, 51e-52d).
Aristotle designs his legal philosophy to avoid the catastrophes described in his Athenian Constitution. Aristotle accepts the necessity of law’s political dimension because laws cannot enforce themselves. Nevertheless, the Athenian legal history proves the political dimension is not sufficient to preserve a society or achieve its happiness.
Human nature demands more than political power from law. Law must accomplish justice and foster virtue. Justice is required to prevent revolution, and virtue is required for human happiness. Man separated from justice is “the worst of animals,” and man without virtue “is the most unholy and the most savage of animals.” (Aristotle, Politics 1253a).
Aristotle writes in the Politics that securing justice is the state’s most important function. Justice is more essential to the state than providing the necessities of life. Governments must be founded on justice to endure. Governments that rule unjustly and give unequal treatment to similarly placed subjects provoke revolutions. Justice maintained, however, forms a bond between the members of society that preserves the state. (Aristotle, Politics 1328b, 1332b, 1253a).
Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics defines justice as lawfulness concerned with the common advantage and happiness of the political community. Aristotle distinguishes between legal justice (to nomikon dikaion) and natural justice (physikon dikaion). Legal justice involves positive laws and custom enacted by man, such as conventional measures for grain and wine. These “are just not by nature but by human enactment” and “are not everywhere the same.”Aristotle secures legal justice by granting autonomy to law and by utilizing custom to encourage obedience. (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b-1135a).
Natural justice, on the other hand, involves principles of natural law that originate in nature. Such principles do not arise in the minds of men “by people’s thinking this or that.” Natural law principles apply with equal force everywhere, just as fire burns both in Greece and in Persia. Aristotle secures natural justice by adopting natural law precepts as the standard of legal validity. Positive laws that violate natural law precepts are nullified. (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1134b).
Aristotle secures legal justice by restricting the will of the political ruler through autonomous laws. The Politics teaches that unrestrained power produces tyranny, even in democracies. Aristotle considers whether societies function best under the “rule of men” or the “rule of law.” He concludes that laws, when good, should be supreme. Political rulers should merely complement the law by acting as its guardians and ministers. They should only regulate those matters on which the laws are unable to speak with precision owing to the difficulty of any general principle embracing all particulars. (Aristotle, Politics, 1282b).
Aristotle gives four reasons for emphasizing law’s autonomy over the will of the political ruler. First, law frees the state from the desires and passions that afflict political rulers. “The law is reason unaffected by desire. Desire … is a wild beast, and passion perverts the minds of rulers, even when they are the best of men.” (Aristotle, Politics, 1287a). Second, tyranny results when political rulers exercise autonomy over law, even in democracies. Third, the orderly rotation of political offices requires autonomous laws. Equality, liberty, justice, and expediency mandate that every mature citizen participates in governing the state. Fourth, the orderly rotation of political offices preserves the state by assuring evenhanded administration by magistrates.
Aristotle utilizes law’s historical dimension to secure legal justice through custom. Aristotle uses the term nomos for law, and nomos includes custom and convention as components of the social norm. Aristotle writes in the Politics that legal custom is itself a form of justice. Custom and convention maintain social stability by encouraging obedience to the law. The law has no power to command obedience except that of habit, which can only be given by time. Aristotle urges caution in changing the law because changes enfeeble the power of the law. If the advantage of a change is small, it is wiser to leave errors in the law. The citizens usually lose more by the habit of disobedience than they gain by changing the law. (Aristotle, Politics, 1255a, 1269a).
Aristotle utilizes law’s moral dimension to secure natural justice in two ways. The first is by nullifying positive laws that subvert natural law precepts. Aristotle formulates a natural law standard of legal validity. Aristotle’s Rhetoric describes natural law as an unwritten law, based on nature, and common to all people. “There is in nature a common principle of the just and unjust that all people in some way divine.” (Aristotle, Rhetoric, 1373b).
Natural law provides immutable and universal standards of justice. Natural law constitutes a separate body of binding law that exceeds positive law in authority. Human actions should complete nature rather than subvert it, and natural law nullifies positive laws that subvert natural law precepts. (Aristotle, Rhetoric, 1373b).
Like Plato, Aristotle argues that the universal standards of natural law justify disobeying positive laws. Aristotle’s Rhetoric provides two examples invalidating positive law for violating natural law precepts. The first is the case of Sophocles’ Antigone, where Antigone disobeys Creon’s order and provides funeral rites to her brother Polyneices. The second is Aristotle’s guide to jury nullification of written law by appealing to higher principles of natural law. (Aristotle, Rhetoric, 1373b, 1375a-b).
Aristotle never explains why natural law wields supremacy over positive law. The supremacy of natural law is consistent, however, with Aristotle’s view in the Physics that the ultimate causes of nature are divine. (Aristotle, Physics, 198b-199b).
The second way that Aristotle secures natural justice is by fostering virtue. Aristotle believed that human happiness depended on virtue more than liberty. The government is thus responsible for producing a virtuous state, and this is best accomplished through law. Although virtue encompasses more than mere conformity to law, virtue will only develop and flourish in a state that supports the legal enforcement of virtue. The state must provide moral education through its laws to make its citizens just and good. Failing to do so undermines the state’s political system and harms its citizens. (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1179b; Politics, 1280b, 1310a, 1337a).
Marcus Tullius Cicero (106-43 B. C. E.) was a politician, philosopher, orator, and attorney. Cicero’s De Legibus (The Laws), De Officis (On Duties), and De Re Publica (The Republic) greatly influence the natural law tradition. Cicero esteemed Plato and Aristotle. Although not a Stoic, Cicero adopted Stoicism’s divine Nature as the source of natural law precepts that dictate legal validity. The histories of Herodotus, Thucydides, Xenophon, and Polybius persuaded Cicero that natural law imposes justice on human events.
Cicero’s signature contribution to jurisprudence is his explication of Nature as divine lawgiver. Law and justice originate in Nature as a divinely ordained set of universal moral principles. Cicero describes Nature as the omnipotent ruler of the universe, the omnipresent observer of every individual’s intentions and actions, and the common master of all people. Belief in divine Nature stabilizes society, encourages obedience to law, and leads to individual virtue. (Cicero, De Legibus, 2.15-16).
Law’s moral dimension dominates Cicero’s jurisprudence. Cicero defines natural law as perfect reason in commanding and prohibiting. These principles are the sole source of justice and provide the sole standard of legal validity. “True law is right reason in agreement with Nature.” (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.33).
The precepts of natural law are eternal and immutable. They apply universally at all places, at all times, and to all people. Natural law summons to duty by its commands, and averts from wrongdoing by its prohibitions. Nature serves as the enforcing judge of natural law precepts, and Nature’s punishment for violating natural law precepts is inescapable. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.33).
Natural law provides the naturae norma, the standard of legal validity for positive law and custom. The naturae norma provides the only means for separating good provisions from bad. Justice entails that laws and customs comply with the naturae norma and preserve the peace, happiness, and safety of the state and its citizens. Positive laws and customs that fail to do so are not regarded as laws at all. (Cicero, De Legibus, 1.44, 2.11-2.14).
Regarding Cicero’s political dimension of law, the magistrate’s limited role is to govern and to issue orders that are just and advantageous in keeping with the laws. Although the magistrate has some control of the people, the laws are fully in control of the magistrate. An official is the speaking law, and the law is a nonspeaking official. (Cicero, De Legibus, 3.2).
Political rulers cannot alter, repeal, or abolish natural law precepts. Furthermore, political rulers have no role in interpreting or explaining natural law precepts. Every man can discern the precepts of natural law for himself through reason. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.33).
Political rulers must issue just commands as measured by natural law precepts. Individuals are protected against unjust coercion. Although rulers may use sanctions to enforce legitimate commands, every affected subject has the right to appeal to the people before enforcement of any sanction. Furthermore, no ruler can issue commands concerning single individuals. Any significant sanction against an individual, such as execution or loss of citizenship, is reserved to the highest assembly of the people. As a further protection, all laws must be officially recorded by the censors. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 2.53-2.54; De Legibus, 3.10-3.47).
Like Aristotle, Cicero requires that magistrates be subject to the power of others. Successive terms are forbidden, and ten years must pass before the magistrate becomes eligible for the same office. Every magistrate leaving office must submit an account of his official acts to the censors. Misconduct is subject to prosecution. No magistrate may give or receive any gifts while seeking or holding office, or after the conclusion of his term. (Cicero, De Legibus, 3.9-3.11).
Regarding Cicero’s historical dimension of law, Cicero agrees with Aristotle that custom maintains social stability by encouraging obedience to law. Custom can even achieve immortality for the commonwealth. The commonwealth will be eternal if citizens conduct their lives in accordance with ancestral laws and customs. (Cicero, De Re Publica, 3.41).
The Corpus Juris Civilis (Body of Civil Law) codified Roman law pursuant to the decree of Justinian I. Completed in A.D. 535, the four works of the Corpus became the sole legal authorities in the empire. The Institutes was a law school text. The Codex contained statutes dating from A.D. 76. The Digest contained commentaries by leading jurists, and the New Laws was supplemented as new laws became necessary.
The Corpus is the direct ancestor of modtern Wester civil law systems. Its influence on canon law is seen in the medieval maim Ecclesia vivit lege romana (the Church lives on Roman law). Common law jurisprudence never accepted the Corpus as binding authority. Nevertheless, its twelfth century revival profoundly influenced the formation of common law jurisprudence through the works of the father of the common law, Henry de Bracton (C. E. 1210 – C. E. 1268).
The Corpus divides law into public law involving state interests and private law governing individuals. Private law is a mixture of natural law, the law of nations, and municipal law. The Corpus establishes a clear hierarchy among law’s three dimensions. The moral dimension occupies the highest position and provides the standard of legal validity. The historical dimension of legal custom occupies the second position, and the political dimension of Roman municipal law occupies the lowest position.
The Corpus’ moral dimension resides in two bodies of law, natural law and the law of nations. Like Cicero, the Corpus originates natural law in a divine lawgiver. “The laws of nature, which are observed by all nations alike, are established by divine providence.” The precepts of natural law are universal, eternal, and immutable. (Justinian, Institutes, 1.2.11; Digest, 1.3.2).
Natural law governs all land, air, and sea creatures, including man. “The law of nature is that which she has taught all animals; a law not peculiar to the human race, but shared by all living creatures.” The Corpus extends natural law to “all living creatures” to repudiate the Sophist arguments that law is merely a human convention with no basis in nature, justice does not exist, and there is no duty to obey law. The Corpus‘ rebuttal focuses on the highly socialized behavior of such animal species as ants, bees, and birds. Although animals cannot legislate or form social conventions, they nevertheless follow norms of behavior. These norms affirm the existence of natural law. (Justinian, Institutes, 1.1.3, 2.1.11).
The Institutes and the Digest state three precepts of natural law: “Honeste vivere, alterum non laedere, suum cuique tribuere.” Live honorably, injure no one, and give every man his due. (Justinian, Institutes, 1.1.3; Digest, 1.1.10). These precepts track the Crito’s admonishments to live well, harm no one, and honor agreements so long as they are honorable. (Plato, Crito, 47e-49e). Blackstone’s Commentaries adopts these exact precepts. (Blackstone 1828, p. 27).
The law of nations is the portion of natural law that governs relations between human beings. (Justinian, Digest, 1.4). Its rules are “prescribed by natural reason for all men” and “observed by all peoples alike.” The law of nations is the source of duties to God, one’s parents, and one’s country. It recognizes human rights to life, liberty, and self-defense, and its recognition of property rights enables contracts and commerce between peoples.
The precepts of natural law provide the standard for legal validity. This standard voids any right or duty violating natural law precepts. The Institutes provides illustrative examples: Contracts created for immoral purposes, such as carrying out a homicide or a sacrilege, are not enforceable. (Justinian, Institutes, 3.19.24). Immorality invalidates wrongful profits. Anyone profiting from wrongful dominion over another’s property must disgorge those profits.(Justinian, Digest, 5.3.52).
Immorality invalidates agency relationships. Agents are not obliged to carry out immoral instructions from their principals. If they do, they are not entitled to indemnity from their principals for any liability the agents incur. (Justinian, Institutes, 3.26.7). Immorality even invalidates bequests and legacies if the bequest is contingent upon immoral conduct.(Justinian, Institutes, 2.20.36).
The Corpus’ historical dimension provides custom as a source of enforceable law. The Corpus defines legal custom as the tacit consent of a people established by long-continued habit. Since custom evidences the consent of the people, it is a higher source of law than positive or statutory law.Statutory provisions, if customarily ignored, are treated like repealed legislation. (Justinian, Digest, 1.1.3).
Legal custom establishes the autonomy of law over political rulers. Custom binds judges. A judge’s first duty is “to not judge contrary to statutes, the imperial laws, and custom.” Legal custom even controls statutory interpretation. “Custom is the best interpreter of statutes.” (Justinian, Institutes, 4.17; Digest, 1.1.37).
The Corpus’ political dimension resides in its six categories of Roman municipal law, the “statutes, plebiscites, senatusconsults, enactments of the Emperors, edicts of the magistrates, and answers of those learned in the law.” In contrast to natural law and the law of nations, Roman municipal law was unique to Rome. Its provisions were also “subject to frequent change, either by the tacit consent of the people, or by the subsequent enactment of another statute.” (Justinian, Institutes, 1.2.3, 1.2.11).
Thomas Aquinas‘ Summa Theologica recognizes all three dimensions of law as potential sources of valid law. The moral dimension wields supremacy, however, through a rigid standard of legal validity. Human laws that fail this standard are not merely unenforceable; they are “perversions of law,” “acts of violence,” and “no law at all.” (Aquinas, Summa Theologica, quest. 94 art. 4; quest. 95 art. 2).
Common law jurisprudence has never accepted Aquinas’ natural law theory. It differs in important ways from Blackstone’s natural law theory. Thomism nevertheless influenced the philosophical method taught in Roman Catholic institutions. Martin Luther King Jr. invoked Aquinas’ natural law theory in the Birmingham jail to justify civil disobedience, and Aquinas’ theory motivates contemporary opponents of abortion and euthanasia.
Question 97 establishes both God and man as lawgivers. Divine and natural law come from the rational will of God. Human law comes from the will of man, regulated by reason. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 97 art. 3).
Question 90 defines four existence conditions for law. The first condition is that law is an ordinance of reason, that law is created by a being with reason to achieve a goal. The second condition is that the law has the common good as its goal and that laws must distribute their burdens equitably and proportionately among their subjects. The third condition is a lawgiver who has care of the community because unless the lawgiver holds sufficient power to coerce obedience, the law cannot induce its subjects to virtue. The fourth condition is publication, which is required for law to have the binding force to compel obedience. Each condition is necessary for law, and together they are sufficient. Failing any condition renders a purported law an act of violence. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 1-4).
Question 91 divides law into four types. Eternal law is the set of timeless truths that govern the movement and behavior of all things in the universe, including human beings. Divine law is the word of God revealed to man to guide him to his supernatural end. God reveals divine law to operate because human reason is inadequate to discover its precepts. Natural law is that portion of the eternal law that governs the behavior of human beings. Natural law is derived from eternal law, and its precepts are discovered by reason. Human law is any law of human authorship. Man creates human law in order to implement the precepts of natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 91 art. 1-4).
Question 94 presents Aquinas’ theory of natural law. God writes natural law in the hearts of men, and man discerns the natural law using practical reason. Four natural inclinations enable man to discern the precepts of natural law. The first is an inclination to seek after good. The second is an inclination to preserve one’s own according to one’s nature. Man shares these first two inclinations with all substances. The third is an inclination to reproduce, raise, and educate one’s offspring. Man shares this inclination with animals. The fourth is an inclination “to know the truth about God and to live in society.” This inclination is unique to man. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 2).
Aquinas divides natural law into “first principles” and “secondary principles.” First principles are unchanging. They are always known by all human beings and they are binding on all human beings. They are mutually consistent, and conflict between them is impossible. They cannot be “blotted out from men’s hearts.” (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 6).
The first principles of natural law contain four precepts, each reflecting one of man’s natural inclinations. The first precept is to pursue good and avoid evil. The second is to preserve life and ward off its obstacles. The third is to reproduce, raise, and educate one’s offspring. The fourth is to pursue knowledge and to live together in society. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 2).
Secondary principles of natural law differ significantly from first principles. Secondary principles are subject to change, albeit rarely and for special causes. They are not always known by all persons and they are not always binding. These differences result from practical reason’s susceptibility to perversion by passion, evil habits, and evil dispositions. Lastly, secondary principles can be blotted out from men’s hearts through “evil persuasions,” errors in “speculative matters,” vicious customs,” and “corrupt habits.” (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 6).
Secondary principles form three categories. The first involves secondary principles that are always known by all persons and are always binding, such as “do not murder or slay the innocent.” The second category involves principles that are always binding but not always known, such as “do not steal.” Julius Caesar reports in the Gallic Wars, for example, that the Germans did not know it was wrong to steal. The third category involves principles that are not always binding, such as “goods entrusted to another should be restored.” Although usually binding, this principle does not bind the return of another’s weapons to be used against one’s country. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 94 art. 4).
Questions 95 through 97 discuss human law. Human law exists because the great variety of human affairs prevents the first principles of natural law from being applied to all men in the same way. Human reason derives human law from natural law precepts for particular matters, and this process creates a diversity of positive law among different peoples. The “force” accorded to human law depends on the method by which it is derived from natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).
Aquinas specifies two methods. The first method involves taking a “conclusion” from a premise of natural law. As in science, reason draws specific conclusions of human law by demonstration from natural law principles. Reason demonstrates the human law conclusion that “one must not kill” from the natural law principle that “one should do harm to no man.” Human laws derived by this method have some force of natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).
The second method for deriving human law involves making a “determination” from generalities of natural law. As in the arts, details are derived from general forms. A carpenter begins with the general form of a house in his mind, but he must determine the details of its construction as he builds it. Reason determines that murderers should be imprisoned for twenty years from the natural law principle that evildoers should be punished. Unlike conclusions of human law, determinations have no force of natural law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).
Question 96 provides a narrow scope for human law. Human laws should not repress all the vices forbidden by natural law. Since most people are incapable of abstaining from all vices, human law should only prohibit those vices whose suppression is essential for preserving society. Human laws should prohibit murder and theft but remain silent as to lesser vices. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 2).
The Summa provides a fully developed standard of legal validity. Question 96 provides that human laws must be just. Justice requires that human laws accomplish both divine good and human good as described below. Unjust laws are not merely unenforceable; they are perversions of law and acts of violence, and they are powerless to bind the conscience. They are, in fact, not laws at all. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).
Human laws accomplish divine good by satisfying the requirements of natural law and divine law. Purported laws that conflict with divine good, natural law or divine law should always be disobeyed. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).
Human laws accomplish human good if and only if they meet three conditions. First, the end of the law must be the common good. Second, the human lawgiver must not exceed his power in establishing the law. Third, the burdens of the law must be shared equitably and proportionately by all members of society. Failure to meet any of these conditions renders the purported law unjust. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).
Purported laws that conflict with human good are unjust and may usually be disobeyed. If the purported law fails to meet one of the standards for human good, it may be disobeyed. An exception arises, however, if disobedience results in “greater harm” or creates a scandal. The unjust human law should then be obeyed, even though it is not truly a law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 96 art. 4).
Critics often charge that Aquinas’ claim that “an unjust law is no law at all” is incoherent. This criticism seemingly disregards Aquinas’ definition of law in Question 95. Laws have “just so much of the nature of law” as they are derived from natural law. Natural law is always just. To be considered law “at all,” therefore, human laws must be just. A purported law that is unjust is not truly a law. (Aquinas, Summa, quest. 95 art. 2).
Sir William Blackstone’s Commentaries on the Laws of England is the standard statement of common law jurisprudence. Blackstone imposes two standards of legal validity, one based on custom and the other on natural law. Purported laws that fail these standards are not merely “bad law,” they are “not law.” (Blackstone 1838, p. 47).
Law’s historical dimension provides the validity standard based on custom and serves as the primary source of human law. The historical dimension also emphasizes the autonomy of custom over the will of political rulers. Law’s moral dimension provides the validity standard based on natural law. The moral dimension also establishes natural rights as limits on the will of the political ruler and protects these rights through due process. The political dimension provides only a limited source of law, and the historical and moral dimensions severely restrict the political ruler’s ability to enforce his will through legal coercion.
Law’s historical dimension dominates Blackstone’s jurisprudence. Custom is “the first ground and chief corner stone” of common law. Custom includes rules of law, such as the rule of primogeniture, which says the oldest male descendant inherits the entire estate. Custom also includes legal principles in the forms of maxims, such as “the king can do no wrong,” “no man is bound to accuse himself,” and “no man ought to benefit from his own wrong.” Law’s historical dimension is so strong in common law that approved statutes were strictly construed and interpreted whenever possible to comply with pre-existing custom. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 46, 50).
Blackstone divides customary law into three types. The first type, “general customs,” applies to the entire kingdom. The second type, “particular customs,” only apply to limited regions or specialized groups like merchants. For illustration, the “general custom” of inheritance for England is primogeniture where the eldest son inherits all. Nevertheless, the “particular custom” of gavelkind permits shared inheritance in Kent. The third type, “peculiar laws,” includes Roman civil law and Catholic canon law. These laws have no authority in England except as the people have consented to their provisions through customary observance. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 45-57).
The validity standard for custom includes seven requirements. First, the custom must “have been used so long, that the memory of man runs not to the contrary.” Proof of any time when the custom did not exist voids the custom. Second, the custom must enjoy continuous observance, interruption voids the custom. Third, the custom must enjoy peaceable observance. Custom depends upon consent, and disputed customs lack consent. Fourth, customs must be “reasonable” and must not create unnecessary hardships.Fifth, the custom must be certain. A custom that the worthiest son inherits is void because no certain standard for worthiness exists. Sixth, compliance must be mandatory. Optional customs have no coercive force. Lastly, customs must be consistent. Inconsistent customs lack mutual consent. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 53-55).
Law’s moral dimension provides a standard of legal validity based on natural law. Blackstone’s natural law founds justice on the eternal and immutable laws of good and evil to which the creator himself conforms. God is a being of infinite power, infinite wisdom, and infinite goodness. Although God endows man with reason and free will, man is still “entirely dependent” on God. Man is subject to God’s law, and God’s law is natural law. Natural law is binding over the entire globe, in all countries, and at all times. No human laws are of any validity if they conflict with natural law, and valid human laws derive all their force and authority from natural law.
Natural law precepts are discernible by reason as far as they are necessary for the conduct of human actions. Unlike Aquinas, however, Blackstone regards human reason as “frail, imperfect, and blind” since man’s fall. To overcome these defects of human reason, God reveals the precepts of natural law through direct revelation in scripture. The validity of human law depends on the two foundations of natural law and revealed law. Human laws contradicting their precepts are void.
Natural law permits acts that promote true happiness and prohibits acts that destroy it. Natural law derives from the precept “that man should pursue his own true and substantial happiness.” God created human nature so that man obtains happiness by pursuing justice. Injustice brings unhappiness.
Substantively, natural law consists of eternal immutable laws of good and evil. Blackstone adopts three precepts of natural law from Justinian’s Institutes. “Such, among others, are these principles: that we should live honestly, should hurt nobody, and should render to every one his due; to which three general precepts Justinian has reduced the whole doctrine of law.” (Blackstone 1838, pp. 27-28).
Blackstone divides jurisprudence into natural law and positive law. Positive law provisions contrary to natural law are invalid. Individuals are furthermore bound to disobey them, such as laws requiring murder. Nevertheless, natural law does not determine every legal issue. Natural law is indifferent, for example, as to whether positive law permits the export of wool. On most issues, man is at liberty to adopt positive laws that benefit society. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 28-29).
Blackstone divides rights into two types, absolute rights and relative rights. The “immutable laws of nature” vest absolute rights in individuals. Individuals enjoy absolute rights in the state of nature, prior to the formation of society. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 88, 94).
Blackstone names three absolute rights: personal security, personal liberty, and private property. The absolute right of personal security consists of the legal enjoyment of life, limb, body, health, and reputation. The absolute right of personal liberty consists of the free power of movement without imprisonment or restraint unless by due course of law. The absolute right of property consists of the free use and disposal of lawful acquisitions, without injury or illegal diminution. (Blackstone 1838, pp 93-100).
Relative rights, in contrast to absolute rights, exist only in society. Relative rights protect and maintain inviolate the three absolute rights of personal security, personal liberty, and private property. Unlike absolute rights, which are few and simple, relative rights are more numerous and more complicated. Such rights include due process protections as well as “Blackstone’s ratio,” which says it is better that ten guilty persons escape than one innocent party suffers. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 89, 102).
Law’s political dimension is severely delimited in Blackstone’s jurisprudence. Society is formed for the protection of individuals. In addition to the validity standards discussed above, Blackstone’s historical dimension dictates a near absolute standard of legal autonomy. Law wields supremacy over the will of political rulers, whether they are kings or judges. (Blackstone 1838, p. 32).
Regarding the autonomy of law over kings, the most important maxim in English history is “the law makes the king; the king does not make the law.” This maxim dates from Henry de Bracton’s 1235 treatise The Laws and Customs of the Kingdom of England. “The king must not be under man but under God and under the law, because the law makes the king … there is no king where the will and not the law has dominion.” (De Bracton 1968, p. 33).
Regarding the autonomy of law over judges, Blackstone’s “declaratory theory” prohibits judges from making new law. Judges may only find and declare existing law; they may never make law. Judge-made law unites the power to make and enforce law in one body, and this invites tyranny. The judge should determine the law according to the known laws and customs of the land, not his own private judgment. Judges are not appointed to pronounce new laws. (Blackstone 1838, p. 46, 105).
Nevertheless, since all law is subject to the standard of reason, judges may set aside common law precedents that are contrary to reason as “manifestly absurd or unjust.” Setting unreasonable precedents aside does not create new law. Instead, it vindicates the law from misrepresentation. Unreasonable rules of common law, by definition, are not law. Such precedents are not set aside because they are bad law, but because they are not law. (Blackstone 1838, pp. 46-47).
In applying statutory law, however, the judge may never exercise his discretion to set aside the will of Parliament. The only authority that can declare an act of Parliament void is Parliament itself. The judge must “interpret and obey” its mandates. Judges may never act as miniature legislatures. “In a democracy,” writes Blackstone, “the right of making laws resides in the people at large.” (Blackstone 1838, pp. 27, 33).
Legal positivism rejects law’s moral and historical dimensions as sources of law or standards of legal validity. H. L. A. Hart is the most important figure in the positivist tradition that begins with Jeremy Bentham and John Austin. Bentham was sixteen when he attended a series of private lectures by Blackstone on the common law. These lectures were later published as Blackstone’s Commentaries.
The young Bentham listened with rebel ears. Bentham’s anonymous Fragment on Government describes Blackstone’s natural law theory as “theological grimgribber” and an “excursion into the land of fancy.” Bentham describes Blackstone as “the dupe of every prejudice,” “the accomplice of every chicanery,” “the abettor of every abuse,” and “a treasury of vulgar errors.” (Bentham 1977, 10).
Bentham’s legal theory has two distinctive features. The first is Bentham’s exclusion of law’s historical dimension. Bentham’s “imperative” theory of law defines law as (1) the assemblage of signs of a sovereign’s volition, (2) directing the conduct of persons under his power, (3) accompanied by an “expectation” in such persons, that (4) motivates obedience. The sovereign’s will provides its own validity standard. Custom is excluded and the ruler wields autonomy over law. (Bentham 1970, p. 1).
Bentham’s second distinctive feature is his exclusion of law’s moral dimension. Law for Bentham has no necessary conceptual connection with morality. Bentham abandons Blackstone’s immutable standards of right and wrong for physical sensations of pleasure and pain: “Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do.” (Bentham 1907, p. 1).
Bentham’s Anarchical Fallacies argues that natural laws and natural rights are imaginary. “Natural rights is simple nonsense: natural and imprescriptable rights, nonsense upon stilts.” Positive law is the only real law. Only positive law can create real rights, and positive law requires the existence of a sovereign. There can be no rights outside the existence of a sovereign command, and no rights can exist prior to the formation of a government. In sum, the will of the sovereign provides its own standard of legal validity, unrestrained by morality, custom, or the autonomy of law. (Bentham 1843, pp. 501-05).
John Austin‘s The Province of Jurisprudence Determined defines law’s political dimension as the sole source of law and legal validity. Like Bentham’s “imperative” theory, Austin’s “command” theory of law establishes the political ruler’s will as its own standard of legal validity. The sovereign can coerce his will through law without restraint by moral principles, custom, or the autonomy of law.
Austin’s “command” theory defines law as (a) commands, (b) backed by threat of sanctions, (c) from a sovereign, (d) to whom people have a habit of obedience. A common criticism of Austin’s theory is that the command of a gun-wielding highwayman arguably satisfies Austin’s definition of law.
The “command” theory rejects law’s historical dimension. Legal customs and principles play no part in law. Law wields no autonomy over the political ruler’s will, including the will of judges. In contrast to Blackstone, Austin encourages judges to legislate from the bench. Society cannot function unless judges are free to make new law to correct the negligence and incapacity of legislatures. (Austin 2000, p. 191, 225-31).
Austin’s “command” theory rejects law’s moral dimension as well. Austin labels Blackstone’s natural law validity standard “stark nonsense.” God’s law is uncertain, and Blackstone’s natural law standard preaches anarchy. Austin writes that “the existence of law is one thing; its merit and demerit another. Whether it be or be not is one enquiry; whether it be or be not conformable to an assumed standard, is a different enquiry. A law, which actually exists, is a law, though we happen to dislike it.” (Austin 2000, p. 184).
Hart’s 1957 lecture “Positivism and the Separation of Law and Morals” emphasizes three doctrines asserted by Bentham and Austin. The first, which Hart retains, is an emphasis on “the meaning of the distinctive vocabulary of the law.” The second doctrine, which Hart retains, is the separation of law and morals. Hart holds law “as it is” distinct from law “as it ought to be.” This distinction rejects moral standards as the test for legal validity. (Hart 1958, pp. 594, 601).
The third doctrine, which Hart rejects, is Austin’s command theory of law. Hart rejects Austin’s theory for four reasons. First, Austin fails to recognize that laws generally apply to those who enact them. Second, Austin does not account for laws granting public powers, such as the power to legislate or adjudicate, or for laws granting private powers to create or modify legal relations. Third, Austin fails to account for laws that originate, not from a sovereign, but out of common custom. Fourth, Austin fails to account for the continuity of legislative authority characteristic of a modern legal system. (Hart 1994, p. 70).
Hart replaces Austin’s “command” theory with a model of law as the union of primary and secondary social rules. A primary rule is a rule that imposes an obligation or a duty. “[P]rimary rules are concerned with the actions that individuals must or must not do,” such as restrictions on “violence, theft, and deception.” A rule imposes an obligation or duty when the demand for conformity is insistent and the social pressure brought to bear upon those who deviate from the rule is great. (Hart 1994, pp. 91, 94).
In order for a system of primary rules to function effectively, Hart states that secondary rules may also be necessary to provide an authoritative statement of all the primary rules. In contrast to primary rules, which impose obligations and duties, secondary rules confer powers to introduce, to change, or to modify a primary rule. These powers may be public or private. (Hart 1994, pp. 96-97).
There are three types of secondary rules. The first type is the rule of change. This rule allows legislators to make changes in the primary rules if the primary rules are defective or inadequate. The second type is the rule of adjudication. This rule enables courts to resolve disputes regarding the interpretation and application of primary rules. The third type of secondary rule is the rule of recognition. The rule of recognition provides “a rule for conclusive identification of the primary rules of obligation.” It also provides Hart’s criterion for legal validity. A rule of law is legally valid if it conforms to the requirements of the rule of recognition. (Hart 1994, pp. 95-98, 103-05).
Hart next turns from defining the validity criteria for individual laws to defining the validity criteria for entire legal systems. System validity is determined by the attitudes of citizens and public officials toward obedience to legal rules. Hart describes two contrasting attitudes, the “external” and “internal” points of view.
The external point of view is the view of a person who feels no obligation to follow the law. He has no sense that it is right to follow the law or wrong not to do so. He rejects law as the standard of conduct for himself or others. The internal point of view, on the other hand, is the view of a person who feels obligated to follow the law. He follows the law because he thinks it is right to do so and wrong not to do so. He feels that he ought, must, and should follow the law. (Hart 1994, pp. 56-57).
The validity of a legal system depends on only two conditions. First, private citizens must generally obey the primary rules of obligation. It is sufficient that citizens take an external point of view toward primary rules. Second, public officials must adopt the rule of recognition specifying the criteria for legal validity as their “public standard of official behavior.” It is a minimum, necessary condition that officials take the internal point of view toward secondary rules. (Hart 1994, pp. 116-17).
Hart’s standard of legal validity functions solely in law’s political dimension. The will of the political rulers determines the validity of law by their adoption of a rule of recognition. The will of the political rulers determines the validity of the legal system as well. The only necessary condition for a valid legal system is the political rulers’ adoption of the internal point of view.
Hart excludes the historical dimension from his standard of legal validity. Hart omits, for example, two of the historical dimension’s traditional restraints on the will of the political ruler. The first, emphasized since Aristotle, is the autonomy of law over political rulers. Instead, Hart’s political rulers wield autonomy over law by controlling the standard of legal validity. Hart also grants judges autonomy over law by rejecting Blackstone’s declaratory theory that judges find but do not make law. If the judge determines the meaning of a legal rule to be “indeterminate or incomplete,” the judge “must exercise his discretion and make law for the case instead of merely applying already pre-existing settled law.”
The second historical restraint, emphasized by Locke and Blackstone, is the validity requirement of consent by the governed. Consent is irrelevant to Hart’s legal validity. It is sufficient that each member of the population obeys Hart’s primary rules “from any motive whatsoever.” “Any motive,” as Hart’s critics point out, includes terror and force.
Hart also excludes law’s moral dimension from his standard of legal validity. Hart accepts “morally iniquitous” laws as legally valid. “There are no necessary conceptual connections between the content of law and morality; and hence morally iniquitous provisions may be valid as legal rules or principles. One aspect of this form of the separation of law from morality is that there can be legal rights and duties which have no moral justification or force whatever.” (Hart 1994, p. 268).
Gustav Radbruch utilizes legal history to support a validity standard invoking law’s moral dimension. Radbruch, once Germany’s leading positivist, argues that the positivist separation of law and morality facilitated Hitler’s atrocities through legal means. Radbruch argues that German positivism rendered “jurists and the people alike defenseless against arbitrary, cruel, or criminal laws, however extreme they might be. In the end, the positivistic theory equates law with power; there is law only where there is power.” (Radbruch 2006b, p. 13). Positivism, in other words, operates only in law’s political dimension.
Radbruch blames the positivistic legal thinking that held sway over German jurists for rendering impotent every possible defence against the abuses of National Socialist legislation. Radbruch warns, “We must arm ourselves against the recurrence of an outlaw state like Hitler’s by fundamentally overcoming positivism.” Radbruch’s solution is a standard of legal validity invoking law’s moral dimension. (Radbruch 2006a, p. 8).
This validity standard, known as “Radbruch’s Formula,” has been applied by German courts. In cases where the discrepancy between justice and statutory law becomes “unbearable,” the statute is held void ab initio in the interest of justice. “Radbruch’s Formula” holds such statutes void ab initio because they are not truly laws.
Radbruch explains: “Where there is not even an attempt at justice, where equality, the core of justice, is deliberately betrayed in the issuance of positive law, then the statute is not merely ‘flawed law’, it lacks completely the very nature of law. For law, including positive law, cannot be otherwise defined than as a system and an institution whose very meaning is to serve justice. Measured by this standard, whole portions of National Socialist law never attained the dignity of valid law.” (Radbruch 2006a, p. 7). Radbruch thus joins Cicero, Aquinas, and Blackstone in concluding that unjust laws are not laws at all.
Hart’s separation of law from morality stimulated significant criticism in the United States. Lon Fuller’s The Morality of Law argues that law is subject to an internal morality consisting of eight principles. Laws must be enforced, for example, in a manner consistent with their wording. Legal systems that violate these principles cannot achieve social order. They destroy any moral obligation to obey the law. (Fuller 1964, pp. 33-40).
Ronald Dworkin’s “The Model of Rules” argues that Hart’s model of law is incomplete. Courts often decide difficult cases according to legal principles that provide moral justifications for case outcomes. One example is the common law maxim that no man should profit from his own wrongful conduct. These legal principles are outside Hart’s definition of primary and secondary rules. (Dworkin 1967, pp. 23-24).
Hart’s legal positivism nevertheless exerts significant influence in American jurisprudence. Four factors enhance Hart’s influence. The first occurred in 1871 when Dean Christopher Langdell of Harvard Law School dropped Blackstone’s Commentaries from Harvard’s legal curriculum. Blackstone’s jurisprudence lost influence as other schools followed.
The second enhancing factor is the erosion of law’s moral dimension. Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr. is a leading figure in this process. Holmes advocated for law without values and identified himself as a skeptic. Holmes defines truth as the majority vote of any nation that is more powerful than all the others. Holmes equates a jurist searching for validity criteria in natural law to the poor devil who must get drunk to satisfy his demand for the superlative. (Holmes 1918, p. 40).
Holmes’ “Path of the Law” presents an early form of positivism. Holmes argues for the separation of law and morality. Holmes supports banishing every word of moral significance from the law. He rejects every ethical obligation in contract law. Holmes advocates a “bad man” perspective that looks at law as a bad man who feels no obligation to obey it. This is an early statement of Hart’s “external point of view.” (Holmes 1997, pp. 991-997).
The third factor enhancing Hart’s influence is the erosion of law’s historical dimension. Dean Roscoe Pound of Harvard Law School illustrates its erosion. Pound’s “Mechanical Jurisprudence” advocates abandoning custom as a source of any law. Pound urged replacing the common law system based on custom with a civil code system based on statutes. (Pound 1908, 605-23).
The fourth factor enhancing Hart’s influence is the natural desire of judges to “make” new law. Blackstone’s “declaratory theory” forbids judge-made law, but Hart’s “penumbra doctrine” considers it an ordinary and necessary judicial function. One striking example of Hart’s influence is Griswold v. Connecticut, 281 U.S. 479 (1965). Griswold applies a penumbra analysis to imply a Constitutional right of privacy while admitting no such right appears in the language of the Constitution. The Supreme Court decided Roe v. Wade, 410 U.S. 113 (1973) based on Griswold’s implied right of privacy. The increased willingness of judges to legislate from the bench in 20th and 21st Century American courts is Hart’s most significant and controversial legacy in American jurisprudence.
Augustine‘s City of God observes that kingdoms without justice are but great bands of robbers. Robbers become rulers, not by the removal of greed, but by the addition of impunity. (Augustine 1998, p.147-48). Validity standards are the primary means by which societies deny impunity to unjust rulers. Legal validity governs the enforceability of law, and the standard of legal validity controls the ruler’s ability to enforce his will through legal coercion.
Standards of legal validity are historically cyclical, and the cycle continued in the United States during the 21st Century. American law initially embraced Blackstone’s dual validity standards based on moral principles and legal custom. Centuries of challengers have eroded those standards. Bentham, Austin, Holmes, and Hart eroded Blackstone’s moral standard by advocating the separation of law from morality. Pound eroded Blackstone’s customary standard by advocating the abandonment of common law. Legal educators dropped Blackstone from their curriculum.
These challengers eroded Blackstone’s validity standards, but they did not supplant them. A validity schism divided American jurisprudence. There was no generally accepted validity standard in American law. Academic theorists and legal educators favored Hart for his analytical clarity. Liberal judges favored Hart for increasing their power to make new law. Practitioners and conservative judges favored Blackstone for his emphasis on consent of the governed, autonomy of law, predictability of law, and morally just decisions.
Two irreconcilable bodies of precedent emerge, one formulated by traditional judges who limit themselves to finding existing law, the other by positivist judges who make new law. As judges increasingly make new law, courts become unpredictable, ex post facto rulings increase, and laws are unevenly applied. Unelected federal judges set aside democratic resolutions of political questions and decide policy issues without public input. Justices devise or limit Constitutional rights according to personal preference to achieve their desired case outcome.
Despite fifty years of debate, the opposing camps remain estranged. Each side utilizes methods its opponent will never accept. Blackstone, for example, formulates his moral precepts in terms of divine law and human reason. This formulation is unpersuasive for two reasons. First, there is no general agreement regarding the terms of divine law, and many reject its very existence. Second, Blackstone adopts inconsistent views of human reason. On one hand, human reason is too “frail, imperfect, and blind” to generate just human laws. On the other hand, human reason is sufficient to generate the precepts of natural law from revelations of divine law.
Legal positivism is unpersuasive as well, insisting on a narrow philosophical method to formulate its standard of legal validity. Hart emphasizes “a purely analytical study of legal concepts, a study of the meaning of the distinctive vocabulary of the law.” (Hart 1958, p. 601). He describes all law as consisting of only two types of rules. Hart’s simplistic model of law is inadequate for three reasons.
First, Hart’s analysis excludes law’s historical and social contexts. Hart restricts his analysis to law’s linguistic context. Law is more than linguistics. It encompasses the entirety of the great variety of human affairs. Hart’s exclusion of these indispensible contexts commits the “analytical fallacy” described by John Dewey in “Context and Thought” (Dewey 1985, pp. 5-7).
Second, Hart’s standard of legal validity ignores the content of law. Hart only considers the pedigree of the law’s creation. Hart consequently accepts the validity of “morally iniquitous laws” whose content possesses “no moral justification or force whatsoever.” (Hart 1994, p. 268).
Hart ignores the grave consequences of enforcing “morally iniquitous” laws. For example, Hart validates legal systems if two conditions are met. First, citizens may take an external point of view toward primary rules. Obedience “from any motive whatsoever” is sufficient, permitting coercion through terror. Second, officials must take an internal point of view toward secondary rules. Objectively considered, the legal systems utilized by Stalin and Hitler satisfy both conditions.
Third, Hart’s model of law as rules is incomplete. Something important is missing from a legal philosophy that validates the Soviet and Nazi legal systems. That missing element is justice, and justice is a moral concept. As Ronald Dworkin explains, courts usually decide difficult cases according to legal principles that provide moral justifications for case outcomes. Hart’s model of rules excludes these principles. (Dworkin 1967, pp. 23-24).
Hart showed how to separate law from morality, but history showed why societies should not do so. Critics contend that a fresh approach is needed.
Neither Blackstone nor Hart assign legal history a significant role in formulating their validity standards. No major jurist since Cicero has done so. Nevertheless, a historical formulation of legal validity can avoid the problems described above. Unlike Blackstone, legal history does not require belief in a divine lawgiver, and unlike Hart, legal history does not ignore the content of law.
Legal history provides a long record of legal experimentation. A scientific approach identifies three principles that recur in just and stable legal systems. Legal systems without these principles repeatedly become arbitrary, unjust, and unstable.
The first principle is the principle of reason, which addresses the validity of law’s content. The principle of reason recognizes that every subject is a rational creature with a free will. To be stable, the legal system must treat its subjects as ends in themselves, and not as a mere means to another end. The legal system must also permit rational individuals to orient their own behavior in order to achieve a society based on ordered liberty. Procedural due process protects against the punishment of the innocent and the tyranny of the majority. Substantive due process enables laws to provide dependable guideposts to individuals in orienting their behavior.
The second principle is the principle of consent, which addresses the validity of law’s creation. This principle provides that the legitimacy of law derives from the consent of those subject to its power. Common law custom, the doctrine of stare decisis, and legislation sanctioned by the subjects’ legitimate representatives are all evidence of consent.
The third principle is the principle of autonomy, which addresses both the content and the creation of law. Laws must wield supremacy over political rulers. The ruler must be under the same laws as his subjects, and the laws must not be subject to arbitrary change to reflect the ruler’s will. To paraphrase de Bracton, the law must make the king. The king must not make the law. To paraphrase Aristotle, rightly constituted laws must be the final sovereign.
These principles operate in law’s moral and historical dimensions to restrain the ruler’s ability to enforce his will through legal coercion. Legal systems become unjust and unstable in the absence of such restraints. They project the power of the political ruler, but they are not valid legal systems. The history of the Western legal tradition is the history of revolutions against such systems. (Berman 1983).
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John O. Tyler, Jr.
Houston Baptist University
U. S. A.