Leśniewski: Logic

LesniewskiStanisław Leśniewski (1886-1939) was a Polish logician and philosopher, co-founder with his colleague Jan Łukasiewicz of one of the most active logic centers of the twentieth century: the Warsaw School of Logic. As an alternative to Whitehead’s and Russell’s Principia Mathematica, he developed his own program for the foundations of mathematics on the basis of three systems. The first, called ‘Protothetic’, is a quantified propositional logic. The second, called ‘Ontology’, is a modernized, higher-order version of term logic. The last and most famous one is a general theory of parts and wholes, called ‘Mereology’. His concern for rigor in analysis and formalization led him to a logical work remarkable in its generality and precision. As a nominalist, he developed one of the major attempts to provide nominalistically acceptable foundations of mathematics. Although his logical systems have not been widely adopted and remain on the margins of standard logic, many of his views and innovations have greatly influenced the progress of logic: his conception of higher-order quantification, his development of a free and plural logic, his outline of natural deduction, his concern for the distinctions between use and mention and between language and meta-language, his canons of good definition, his formalization of the theory of parts and wholes. All this makes him one of the key figures of twentieth-century logic.

Table of Contents

  1. Life and Work
  2. Logical Systems
    1. Protothetic (Propositional Logic)
      1. A Quantified Propositional Logic
      2. Definition as a Rule
      3. Bivalency and Extensionality
      4. Semantic Categories and Contextual Syntax
    2. Ontology (Term Logic)
      1. Names and Copula
      2. The Axiomatic System
      3. Higher Orders
    3. Mereology (Part-Whole Theory)
      1. Mereology and Russell’s Paradox
      2. The Axiomatic System
  3. Foundations of Mathematics
    1. Mereology and Set Theory
    2. Ontology and Arithmetic
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Life and Work

Stanisław Leśniewski was born on March 30, 1886, to Polish parents in Serpukhov, a small Russian town near Moscow. His father, a railway engineer, led the family to various construction sites, guiding young Leśniewski to attend the Gymnasium in the Siberian city of Irkutsk. Between 1904 and 1910, he pursued studies in mathematics and philosophy in St. Petersburg, as well as in different German-speaking universities in Leipzig, Heidelberg, Zurich, and Munich. Transitioning in 1910 to the University of Lvov—then a Polish city in Austria-Hungary, later known as Lviv in Ukraine—he obtained his doctorate in two years under the supervision of Kazimierz Twardowski, with a dissertation on the analysis of existential propositions.

Like many Polish philosophers of his time, Leśniewski was deeply influenced by Twardowski. Though he would later diverge from his master’s philosophical views, the rigorous spirit and quest for the greatest linguistic precision instilled by Twardowski, inherited from Brentano, permeated Leśniewski’s entire body of work. A pivotal moment in Leśniewski’s intellectual development occurred in 1911, when he encountered symbolic logic and Russell’s paradox through Jan Łukasiewicz’s book, On the Principle of Contradiction in Aristotle. In the ensuing years, Leśniewski published several papers, mainly devoted to the analysis of existential propositions, to the excluded middle and to the principle of contradiction.

At the outbreak of World War I, Poland found itself in the midst of the conflict, prompting Leśniewski decision to return to Russia. There, he took up teaching positions in Polish schools located in Moscow. It was during this period that he published his initial analysis of Russell’s paradox (1914) and formulated the first version of his Mereology (1916). Leśniewski’s Mereology is a theory of parts and wholes. It introduces the notion of collective class, a concrete notion of class elaborated by Leśniewski directly against Cantor’s sets, Frege’s extensions of concepts and Russell’s and Whitehead’s classes as incomplete symbols. Constituting the initial phase of his work, all the papers from 1911 to 1916 were characterized by an informal style, almost devoid of symbolic notation.

With the advent of the Bolshevik Revolution, Leśniewski departed Russia and permanently settled in Poland. After an initial attempt to obtain his habilitation in Lvov, he eventually attained it in 1918 at the University of Warsaw. During the years 1919-1921, Leśniewski played a role as a code breaker in Poland’s efforts to thwart the Red Army’s advance on the newly independent nation. By the war’s end, Warsaw University had emerged as a significant center for mathematics. In 1919, Leśniewski accepted a chair especially established for him, dedicated to the foundations of mathematics. Together with his colleague Jan Łukasiewicz, he co-founded the Warsaw School of Logic, which was to be the most important center for symbolic logic during the interwar period. Leśniewski and Łukasiewicz attracted exceptionally talented students, including the young Alfred Tarski, who would be Leśniewski’s sole doctoral student throughout his career.

From 1919 until his passing in 1939, Leśniewski consistently taught and refined his principal logical achievements: the three systems known as ‘Protothetic’ (a generalized version of propositional logic, encompassing quantification), ‘Ontology’ (a modern version of term logic), and ‘Mereology’. However, Leśniewski’s perfectionism hindered him from promptly publishing his results, as he insisted on attaining the utmost precision. His decision to employ logical formal tools stemmed from the desire to express his philosophical intuitions with exceptional rigor. Dissatisfied with the prevailing logical works of his time, he found in particular Whitehead’s and Russell’s Principia Mathematica lacking the requisite precision and rigor. Frege’s work was closer to his methodological requirements, although he criticized his Platonist leanings and perceived his logic as overly influenced by mathematical objectives. Leśniewski endeavored to establish an organon wherein principles were not adopted to ensure a consistent account of mathematics, but rather to faithfully express our general logical intuitions. Despite his exacting standards, which often left him dissatisfied with his own output, he resumed publishing from 1927 onward. Notably, he authored a series of eleven papers titled On the Foundations of Mathematics. During this phase of publication, Leśniewski abandoned the informal style of his earlier writings in favor of a formal discussion of his three systems.

Tragically, he died of thyroid cancer on May 13, 1939, aged 53. He left behind a substantial collection of notes and manuscripts entrusted to his pupil Bolesław Sobociński. Regrettably, this material was lost during the Nazi destruction of Warsaw in 1944. Since its publication in 1991, scholars primarily access Leśniewski’s work through the English edition of his Collected Works. Furthermore, there is a volume of lecture notes from Leśniewski’s students compiled and published in English in 1988. Testimonies and reconstructions provided by members of the Warsaw School, notably Bolesław Sobociński, Jerzy Słupecki, Cesław Lejewski, and to a lesser extent, Alfred Tarski, shed light on the lost aspects of his oeuvre. Comprehensive presentations of Leśniewski’s work can be found in works by Luschei (1962), Miéville (1984), Urbaniak (2014), and in a series of six special issues of the Swiss journal Travaux de Logique (2001-2009). Additionally, significant articles on Leśniewski’s systems are featured in collections edited by Srzednicki and Rickey (1984), Miéville and Vernant (1996), and Srzednicki and Stachniak (1998). Rickey’s annotated bibliography, available online, offers a comprehensive reference guide to Leśniewski’s work and related topics.

2. Logical Systems

Becoming skeptical about expressing his research in natural language, as he had done in his early writings, Leśniewski was persuaded in the early 1920s to adopt a symbolic language, despite his reservations toward the symbolic logic works of his time. Consequently, he chose to present his Mereology using a new symbolic language that aligned with his linguistic intuitions. By 1916, Mereology had already been axiomatized, albeit using expressions like ‘A is B’, ‘A is a part of B’ or ‘If an object A is a, then there exists an object B which is a class of the objects a’—expressions which, as Leśniewski recognized, lack precision. He then embarked on constructing a logical calculus capable of incorporating the specific terms of Mereology, such as ‘class’ and ‘part’. This calculus was designed to make explicit his interpretation of the copula ‘is’. Initially, Leśniewski focused on the analysis of singular propositions of the form ‘a is b’, which he symbolized as ‘a ε b’. This emphasis on the copula ‘is’ led Leśniewski to name his system ‘Ontology’. He believed that he could express all the intended meanings using only propositions of the form ‘a ε b’, along with a general logical framework incorporating propositional logic and quantification theory. Ontology emerged then as a term logic grounded in a more fundamental calculus that Leśniewski called ‘Protothetic’ (literally, the theory of first theses). Protothetic is the most basic system, with Ontology and Mereology being subsequent expansions of it, even though Leśniewski created the three systems in reverse order, starting from the applied theory of Mereology, progressing to the purely logical system of Ontology, and finally arriving at Protothetic. This underscores his use of formalization as a tool for the accurate expression of his intuitions. He did not adhere to a formalist conception of logic. The formalist idea of a pure syntax, subject to various subsequent interpretations is completely foreign to Leśniewski. In his systems, all formulas are intended to be meaningful from the outset. The primitive constants do not get their value from axioms and rules; rather, it is the meaning of the primitive constants that makes the axioms true, and the rules correct.

As a nominalist, he rejected the existence of general entities, a stance that significantly influenced his conception of formal languages and systems. Leśniewski rejected abstract types of expressions and infinite sets of formulas provided from the outset by formal definitions. To him, a theorem within a system is the final entry in a tangible list of explicitly written inscriptions, with axioms preceding it and subsequent entries obtained through the application of explicit rules to previous inscriptions. This perspective views a logical system as a concrete complex of meaningful inscriptions, inherently situated within space and time. Each system is thus composed of a finite list of inscriptions, yet it remains open to the inscription of new theorems. One significant implication of this unusual conception of formal systems is the absence of a predetermined and definitive definition of what constitutes a well-formed formula. Leśniewski had to formulate his rules in a way that ensured both logical validity and grammatical conformity. This nominalist approach to formal syntax empowered Leśniewski to develop a logic where the characterization of the rules reached an extraordinary level of precision. However, it is worth emphasizing that adopting his logic does not require endorsing his nominalist convictions. His systems are equally suitable for reasoning about both concrete and abstract entities.

a. Protothetic (Propositional Logic)

The distinctiveness of Protothetic emerges when contrasted with a more usual deductive system for propositional logic, such as the following:

System L

(1) Formal language of L

Let A={p,q,r,…} ∪ {⊃,~} ∪ {( , )}  be the set of symbols.

Let F the set of formulas, defined as the smallest set E such that

(i) {p,q,r,…} ⊂ E

(ii) If α,β ∈ E, then ~α ∈ E and (α ⊃ β) ∈ E

(2) Axioms of L

AxL1: (p ⊃ (q ⊃ p))

AxL2: ((p ⊃ (q ⊃ r)) ⊃ ((p ⊃ q) ⊃ (p ⊃ r)))

AxL3: ((~p ⊃ ~q) ⊃ ((~p ⊃ q) ⊃ p))

(3) Rules of inference of L

Modus ponens


Such a system is closed, in the sense that the sets of symbols and formulas are given once and for all, and the set of theorems is fully determined from the outset as the closure of the set of axioms under the rules of inference. It is known to be an adequate axiomatization of the classical bivalent propositional calculus, possessing essential properties such as soundness, consistency, and completeness. Moreover, its concise set of connectives (two symbols interpreted as negation and conditional) is adequate for the expression of all bivalent truth-functions. This last feature allows for the introduction of additional connectives through definition, for example:

Conjunction: α ∧ β ≝ ~(α ⊃ ~β)

Disjunction: α ∨ β ≝ ~α ⊃ β

Biconditional: α ≡ β ≝ (~α ⊃ β) ⊃ ~(α ⊃ ~β)

Although it seems that the sets of formulas and theorems of L can be extended to certain expressions containing the defined connectives, these new expressions are not official formulas of the system L. We can use them in our proofs and deductions, but only as convenient metalinguistic abbreviations of official formulas. For Leśniewski, a system involving only a few primitive constants, and in which defined constants have no status and can only be used in the metalanguage was unacceptable. In his view, a complete system for propositional logic should make it possible to express any truth-functional meaning with an official constant of its own formal language. In the standard perspective, if we want a system with the defined constants as official ones, we must proceed to the construction of a suitable expansion L* of L. For that purpose, the sets of symbols and formulas must be increased, and the set of axioms must also be completed, with suitable additional axioms. This must be done preserving in L* soundness, consistency and completeness. In principle, our former definitions should be used to provide the expected additional axioms, but additional axioms must be formulas of the object language of L*. There are thus two obvious reasons why these definitions cannot be taken as axioms in their current form. Firstly, they are schematic expressions, so the metavariables they contain must be replaced by object language variables. Secondly, they contain the special definition symbol ‘‘, which is used in order to stipulate a logical equivalence between the definiendum and the definiens. Transforming the definitions into axioms requires the use of object language symbols able to express the same equivalence between the two constituents of the expressions. An obvious solution is the use of biconditional formulas. For instance, the additional axiom devoted to conjunction would then be:

(p ∧ q) ≡ ~(p ⊃ ~q)

However, for the introduction of biconditional itself, this solution would obviously be circular. Another solution for the construction of the expansion L* would be to replace the definition sign by the exclusive use of the primitive constants of the original system L. Instead of adding a single biconditional axiom, Tarski suggested adding a pair of conditional expressions. In the case of conjunction, we would then have to add this pair of axioms:

(p ∧ q) ⊃ ~(p ⊃ ~q)

~(p ⊃ ~q) ⊃ (p ∧ q)

This is perfectly suitable and would also be convenient for the introduction of biconditional. But Leśniewski was more demanding. For him, the most natural solution for the introduction of a new constant was by the way of a single biconditional expression. He turned then to the idea that an initial system for propositional logic must involve biconditional among its primitive constants. Since he attached great importance to the question of parsimony, he sought to elaborate an initial system for his future Protothetic containing biconditional as the only primitive propositional connective.

i. A Quantified Propositional Logic

In the early 1920s, it was already known that in classical logic the Sheffer stroke, like its dual connective, could serve as the unique primitive connective to express all the truth functions. Moreover, Leśniewski also knew another result which was published by Russell in his Principles of Mathematics (1903). Russell indeed showed in this early work that it is possible to conceive a complete system for propositional logic with conditional as the single primitive connective, provided that the propositional variables could be universally quantified. His definition of negation is the following: “not-p is equivalent to the assertion that p implies all propositions” (1903: 18). We can express this definition by the symbolic expression:

~p ≝ p ⊃ (∀r)r

Leśniewski knew that a similar solution holds for the definition of negation in term of biconditional:

~p ≝ p ≡ (∀r)r

However, with the biconditional solution, difficulties remain for the expression of other connectives. For example, conjunction and disjunction are not expressible by a simple combination of biconditional and negation. A brilliant solution to this issue has been discovered by the young Alfred Tarski. In 1923, he established in his PhD thesis, written under the supervision of Leśniewski, that a quantified system of propositional logic with biconditional as its single primitive connective allows the expression of all truth functions. In the introduction of this work, Tarski exposed the issue, and the way it is related to his adviser’s project is clear:

The problem of which I here offer a solution […] seems to me to be interesting for the following reason. We know that it is possible to construct the system of logistic by means of a single primitive term, employing for this purpose either the sign of implication [conditional], if we wish to follow the example of Russell, or by making use of the idea of Sheffer, who adopts as the primitive term the sign of incompatibility, especially introduced for this purpose. Now in order to really attain our goal, it is necessary to guard against the entry of any constant special term into the wording of the definitions involved, if this special term is at the same time distinct from the primitive term adopted, from terms previously defined, and from the term to be defined. The sign of equivalence [biconditional], if we employ it as our primitive term, presents from this standpoint the advantage that it permits to observe the above rule quite strictly and as the same time to give to our definitions a form as natural as it is convenient, that is to say the form of equivalences.

The theorem which is proved in §1 of this article,

(∀pq)((p ∧ q) ≡ (∀f)(p ≡ ((∀r)(p ≡ f(r)) ≡ (∀r)(q ≡ f(r))))) [modified notation]

constitutes a positive answer to the question raised above. In fact, it can serve as a definition of the symbol of logical product [conjunction] in terms of the equivalence symbol and the universal quantifier; and as soon as we are able to use the symbol of logical product, the definitions of other terms of logistic do not present any difficulty, […] (Tarski, 1923: pp. 1-2).

This result by Tarski was a cornerstone of the future Protothetic. But it was not sufficient to overcome all the obstacles. The complete biconditional fragment of propositional logic was already known in the Warsaw School, but using Tarski’s solution required a version of this fragment allowing quantifiers to bind not only propositional variables, but also variables for propositional connectives. For the axiomatization of this extended biconditional fragment, Leśniewski’s idea was to work first on the basis of the universal closure of two axioms known to form a good basis for the unextended fragment:

AxP1: (∀pqr)(((p ≡ r) ≡ (q ≡ p)) ≡ (r ≡ q))

AxP2: (∀pqr)(((p ≡ q) ≡ r) ≡ (p ≡ (q ≡ r)))

As for the inference rules, they had to include a detachment rule for biconditional expressions, as well as two rules for taking advantage of quantified expressions:

Detachment Rule (Det): Φ ≡ Ψ ,Φ ⊢ Ψ

Substitution Rule (Sub): (∀α1 α2⋯αn)Φ ⊢ (∀β1⋯βm α2⋯αn)Φ[α1 / Ψ(β1⋯βm)]

Distribution Rule (Dis): (∀α1 α2⋯αn)(Φ ≡ Ψ) (∀α2⋯αn)((∀α1)Φ ≡ (∀α1)Ψ)

Without going into a detailed and rigorous characterization of the system S1 based on the above described axioms and rules, let us consider as an illustration how to prove a few theorems:

  Theorems Justifications
AxP1: (∀pqr)(((p ≡ r) ≡ (q ≡ p)) ≡ (r ≡ q)) Ax
AxP2: (∀pqr)((p ≡ (q ≡ r)) ≡ ((p ≡ q) ≡ r)) Ax
P1: (∀pqr)(((p ≡ r) ≡ ((p ≡ q) ≡ p)) ≡ (r ≡ (p ≡ q))) AxP1, Sub, q⁄p ≡ q
P2: (∀pq)(((p ≡ (q ≡ p)) ≡ ((p ≡ q) ≡ p)) ≡ ((q ≡ p) ≡ (p ≡ q))) P1, Sub, r⁄q ≡ p
P3: (∀p)((∀q)((p ≡ (q ≡ p)) ≡ ((p ≡ q) ≡ p)) ≡ (∀q)((q ≡ p) ≡ (p ≡ q))) P2, Dis, q
P4: (∀pq)((p ≡ (q ≡ p)) ≡ ((p ≡ q) ≡ p)) ≡ (∀pq)((q ≡ p) ≡ (p ≡ q)) P3, Dis, p
P5: (∀pq)((p ≡ (q ≡ p)) ≡ ((p ≡ q) ≡ p)) AxP2, Sub, r⁄p
P6: (∀pq)((q ≡ p) ≡ (p ≡ q)) P4, P5, Det

These few examples show how the rules apply in S1.. One sees how Sub and Dis always keep the quantifiers saturated, so that there are never free variables in theorems. It is worth noting that Sub and Dis are formulated to maintain quantifier saturation, ensuring that there are no free variables in the theorems. With a bivalent interpretation of the variables, the standard truth-table for the single connective and the quantifier understood as expressing “whatever the values of …”, it is easy to show that S1 is sound. Moreover, the closure of any biconditional tautology is provable in this system. Nevertheless, S1 is not complete. For instance, the following formulas, which are obviously valid in the intended interpretation, remain unprovable:

(∀p)p ≡ (∀r)r        (not provable in S1)
(∀p)((∀q)(p ≡ q) ≡ (∀r)(p ≡ r))        (not provable in S1)

Before examining this limitation, let us explore how Leśniewski reinforced the system by introducing a new rule for the introduction of definitions. The resulting system, S2, features a formal language that can be expanded step by step through the official admission of defined constants. Within such a system, the notions of formula and theorem are no longer absolute ones. They become relative to what will be called ‘the developments of the system’. A development is a finite ordered sequence of explicitly written expressions, which are the theorems of that development. The first theorems of a development are necessarily the axioms. Every further theorem must have been explicitly written, applying one of the inference rules on previously written theorems. As a result, each time we write a new theorem, we get a new development. The above written sequence of theorems of S1 is a development in S2 (say the development P6, using the label of its last theorem). We can now get new developments by writing for example the following additional theorems:

P7: (∀p)(((p ≡ p) ≡ (p ≡ p)) ≡ (p ≡ p)) AxP1, Sub, q⁄p,r⁄p
P8: (∀p)((p ≡ p) ≡ (p ≡ p)) ≡ (∀p)(p ≡ p) P7, Dis, p
P9: (∀p)((p ≡ p) ≡ (p ≡ p)) P6, Sub, q⁄p
P10: (∀p)(p ≡ p) P8, P9, Det
P11: (∀r)r ≡ (∀r)r P10, Sub, p⁄(∀r)r

At first glance, developments seem to be exactly like proofs, but there are important differences. First, there are only developments that have been explicitly written. Developments are indeed concrete objects. Moreover, every time a definition is stated, the language available in further developments is increased. As a result, it is possible that a theorem in a certain development is not even a well-formed formula in another one.

ii. Definition as a Rule

Now let us consider how a new theorem can be written in S2 by applying the additional rule for stating definitions:

Definition Rule (Def-S2):


In a given development Pn, an expression D can be written as theorem Pn+1 with the rule Def-S2 if and only if D is a closed biconditional formula of the form:

     or      (when )


1. are different variables belonging to categories already available in the development Pn;

2. the expression Dum (the definiendum) is of the form or (when ), being a new constant symbol (not already present in the development Pn);

3. the expression Diens (the definiens) is a formula well formed in accordance with categories and syntactic contexts available in the development Pn;

4. the expressions Dum and Diens have exactly the same free variables (if any).


This formulation lacks plain rigor, as it refers to categories and syntactic contexts available in a certain development. It serves here as a suggestive presentation, summarizing the meticulous and long explanations Leśniewski provided in order to fully precise the conditions under which an expression can be written as resulting from the application of the definition rule. Without going here into this formal precision, let us instead examine how new developments can be written in S2.


P12:                                                    Def-S2

P13:  P10, Sub,

P14:                                                                                    P12, P13, Det

Theorem P12 is an example of definition in which the definiendum has no variable. It introduces the first propositional constant (constant of category S). As the definiens can be shown to be a theorem (P13), the new constant can be written as a theorem (P14) and can be understood as the constant true. Now consider how the constant false can also be introduced, using for its definiens an explosive expression (an expression from which every available formula would be derivable by Sub).

P15:                                                      Def-S2

P16:   P10, Sub,

P17:                           Def-S2

P18:                                        P17, Sub,

P19:                                                                P16, P18, Det


Using the newly defined constant false, P17 introduces classical negation by definition. It is worth noting that this definition also introduces for the first time the category of unary connectives (or the category labeled S/S, that is, the category of functors taking a unique sentence as their argument and resulting in a sentence). P19 expresses that the negation of false is a theorem. Now come three definitions of binary connectives (category S/SS, that is of functors which give a sentence from two sentences):


P20: Def-S2
P21: Def-S2
P22: Def-S2

It is worth noting that none of these definitions could have been formulated without the prior definition of negation in P17. This is obvious with P20 and P22 which explicitly include negation in their definiens. In the case of P21 (Tarski’s definition of conjunction), negation is not specifically needed. However, the definiens of P21 involves bound variables for unary connectives. As a principle of constructing developments, the use of variables from a specific category (in this case, S/S) is permissible only if this category either is already included in the axioms or has been introduced through a preceding definition.


P23: Def-S2
P24: P23, Sub, f/≡
P25: P6, P24, Det

Definition P23 still introduces a constant of a new category: S/(S/SS). Theorem P25 expresses that biconditional is a commutative binary connective.


Although the definitional machinery is powerful in S2, it still has a limitation that Leśniewski wanted to overcome. It is indeed impossible to define in S2 operations on connectives, such as “the dual of …” or “the composition of…and…”. All the categories that can be introduced in S2 give a result of category S. In order to reach more complex categories, the definition rule has to be reinforced. Let us call ‘S3‘ the system in which the definition rule is modified as follows:


Definition Rule (Def-Proto):


The rule is like Def-S2, except for condition 2, which is replaced by the following one:


2′. the expression Dum is of the form or (in case ), being a new constant symbol (not already present in the development Pn).


The only difference in this new version is that variables in Dum can be distributed in several successive pairs of brackets. Let us have a look on two examples:


P26:  Def-Proto

P27:  Def-Proto

Definition P26 introduces the operation which gives the dual of a binary connective. The new constant is of category (S/SS)/(S/SS). P27 introduces the composition or logical product of two binary connectives. The category of the defined constant is then (S/SS)/(S/SS)(S/SS). When the definiens has more than one pair of brackets, the result of the application of the new functor is again a functor. The numerator of its category index is itself a fraction, so that the introduced constant is a functor-forming functor (or a many-link functor), which was not possible to define with Def-S2.


These few examples sufficiently show how powerful the definition machinery can be in S2 and S3. Nevertheless, we must go back here to the limitations of S1. Let us remember that valid formulas as the following one where not provable in this system:


     (not provable in S1) 

Inevitably, these limitations also affect S2 and S3. Lesniewski understood early that systems like S1S3 suffered from a too weak characterization of quantification. In the early 1920s, he realized that this weakness could be overcome if the axiomatic basis enforces explicitly propositional bivalency and extensionality.

iii. Bivalency and Extensionality

In a quantified system of propositional logic, propositional bivalency and extensionality can be expressed by the following formulas:


Bivalency for category S:

(Something holds for all propositions iff it holds for true and false)


Extensionality for category S:

(Two propositions are equivalent iff everything that holds for one, holds for the other)


Leśniewski wanted these formulas to be provable in his Protothetic. In 1922, he was able, with Tarski, to establish that in a system with all the usual laws of quantifiers, these two formulas were equivalent. Subsequently, Leśniewski found that in a system like S3, assuming only bivalency was sufficient to reinforce quantification adequately and thereby achieve extensionality for S. However, he could not simply adopt the formula for bivalency as an additional axiom. He had first to eliminate the defined terms in the formula. This could be done by applying the following transformations:



(bivalency, with change of letters)




(elimination of and )

 (elimination of )


In order to avoid the introduction of an additional category in the axiomatic basis, he still had to transform the resulting formula, using variables for binary connectives instead of unary ones. He reached then the following third axiom, the addition of which strengthened quantification and allowed to derive both bivalency and extensionality for the category S of sentences:


AxP3: {



The system S4, based on the three axioms AxP1-AxP3 and the four rules Det, Sub, Dis, and Def-Proto is strong enough to reach at least a full classical calculus of all possible truth-functional unary and binary connectives. But Leśniewski still did not consider a system like S4 to be satisfactory. He wanted extensionality formulas to be provable not only for sentences, but also for all the categories that could potentially be introduced by definitions. In other words, he wanted his axiomatic basis to enforce extensionality for all the potentially definable functors (not only connectives or functors with propositional arguments, but also functors of which arguments are functors, like for instance those introduced by definitions P26 and P27). This goal could not be achieved by adding once again additional axioms. An infinity of axioms would have been necessary and each of them would have required specific categories for its formulation.


Leśniewski’s solution was to add a fifth rule of inference. In a given development Pn, the Rule of Extensionality (Ext) allows one to write a new theorem expressing extensionality for a category C, provided the development Pn already contains a definition of a constant of category C as well as one constant of category S/C. A general description of this rule would be too long here. It will only be illustrated by a couple of examples.


As a first example, definition P20 introduces a constant of category S/SS and P23 a constant of category S/(S/SS). The rule Ext allows then to write as a new theorem the following formula expressing extensionality for the category S/SS:



P20, P23, Ext

Definition P26 gives us our second example. It introduces a constant of category (S/SS)/(S/SS). However, in order to apply Ext for this category, we still need to introduce a definition of a constant of category S/((S/SS)/(S/SS)). The following definition would be adequate for that purpose:




Now the conditions are satisfied to get by Ext an extensionality theorem for (S/SS)/(S/SS):



P26, P29, Ext

Lesniewsk’s full Protothetic is the system based on the three axioms AxP1-AxP3 and the five inference rules Det, Sub, Dis, Def-Proto, and Ext. Leśniewski labeled this version of his Protothetic Ϭ5. To get an insight into the expressive power of Ϭ5, consider a few theorems expressing important properties of the category of unary connectives (these theorems are presented here without proof):



 This theorem expresses extensionality for the category S/S.


This is known as the law of development for category S/S.



This theorem is known as the law of the number of functions for the category S/S, the four constants occurring in the formula (‘~’, ‘Ass’, ‘Fal’, and ‘Ver’) being the four non-equivalent constants that can be defined for the four unary truth functions.

Leśniewski has shown that for every category to be introduced in the language, it is always possible to construct a development involving theorems analogous to P31-33 and to determine precisely which and how much non-equivalent constants can be defined in this category. The main interest of that result is that it is always possible, for any category, to eliminate from expressions quantifiers binding variables of that category. In the case of
S, the theorem for bivalency expresses this fact. In the case of S/S, it is the following theorem, which could be called ‘quadrivalency of S/S’:



On the basis of P34 and analogous results for other categories (for example, theorems of 16-valency for S/SS, of 216-valency for S/(S/SS), and so on), it is always possible to make explicit the precise meaning of a quantified expression by a finite process. As Luschei wrote, “Protothetic is Leśniewski’s indefinitely extensible logic of propositions, connectors, connector-forming functors, higher-level functor-forming functors—indeed of constants and variables of any semantic category in the unbounded hierarchies constructible on the basis of propositional expressions” (1962: 143).


The question of the completeness of Protothetic has also been discussed by Leśniewski and his followers. Leśniewski considered full Protothetic to be strongly complete (which means that if α is a closed well-formed formula of a given development, then either α or its negation is provable from that development), even though he did not have the time to give a demonstration of that result. Słupecki (1953) gave a partial demonstration of the strong completeness of the large sub-system of Protothetic where only functors of sentence-forming categories are available.


In 1926, Leśniewski discovered that his Protothetic could be based on a single biconditional axiom. Sobociński was able to improve Leśniewski’s result by working out the following single axiom, which is the shortest known one:




iv. Semantic Categories and Contextual Syntax

In the language of Protothetic, like in other interpreted systems of logic, symbols and expressions divide in different mutually disjoint types or categories according to their syntactic role and the way they contribute to the meaning of the formulas in which they occur. Developing in the 1920s his notion of semantic category, Leśniewski’s inspiration was in the traditional grammatical theory of parts of speech and in Husserl’s notion of Bedeutungskategorie. In fact, Leśniewski never gave an explicit theory of semantic categories, being content to use the notion in his logical constructions. Later popularized in an explicit theoretical formulation by Ajdukiewicz (1935), the notion of category has also been applied to natural languages, opening the development of categorial grammars (Bar-Hillel, Montague and Lambek being the most representative authors in this field). Ajdukiewicz introduced a convenient notation which permits the indication, through a simple index, of all that is characteristic of a certain category. A single letter is used for the index of a basic category. In Leśniewski’s languages there are only two basic categories: the category of propositions (labeled S) and the category of names (labeled N). In the propositional language of Protothetic, only the former is used. The latter will be added in the language of further theories, namely Ontology and Mereology. Naturally, languages also contain categories for different combining symbols or expressions which are called ‘functors’: connectives, operators, relators, predicates, and so on. All these combining expressions range in derived categories. The category of a functor is determined by three pieces of information: (1) the number of the arguments it needs, (2) the respective categories of these arguments, and (3) the category of the whole generated by the application of the functor to its arguments. Ajdukiewicz’s notation gathers all this information in a single suggestive index. For example, the category of the biconditional connective is labeled S/SS, since it builds a proposition when it applies to two propositional arguments. The (S/SS)/(S/S)(S/SS) index would be that of the category of functors operating on a unary connective (S/S) on the one hand, a binary connective (S/SS) on the other hand, and generating a binary connective (S/SS). In his 1935 paper, Ajdukiewicz developed a procedure for showing grammatical well-formedness of expressions using this categorial notation and a rule for categorial simplification. However, Ajdukiewicz’s procedure requires the category of each of the signs in an expression to be known in advance. This was not possible in Protothetic. Due to its evolutive nature, the system does not fit with a conception of formal language in which all the required categorial information would have been determined from the outset. Obviously, no such language would have been rich enough for all the definitions that can be stated in the successive developments.


Leśniewski developed a new concept of formal syntax, often referred to as ‘inscriptional syntax’, though it is more aptly named ‘contextual syntax’. In Leśniewski’s syntax, the role and the category of a symbol are not indicated by its belonging to a certain previously established list of signs, but by the specific context in which it occurs. For such a syntax, Leśniewski needed a specific notation and an adequate way to warrant his formulas to be well formed. Consider for example the above given first axiom of Protothetic (written in a standard notation):


AxP1:    (in standard notation)

The usual analysis of the grammaticality of such a formula goes recursively from simple constituents to more complex expressions: starting from the letters, which are in the list of symbols for propositional variables, we can get the expression by successive applications of the biconditional formation rule and one application of the quantifier formation rule. In a contextual syntax, on the contrary, it is the form of the complete expression that determines the nature and categories of its constituents. In Leśniewski’s notation, AxP1 would have been written as:


AxP1:   (in Leśniewski-style notation)

As in Łukasiewicz’s well-known notation, Leśniewski’s notation is a prefixed one: every functor is followed by the list of its arguments, but contrary to Łukasiewicz’s notation, parentheses are not removed. So instead of , we get . As for the quantifier, it is always indicated by the use of specialized lower and upper square brackets: instead of , we get . Like every theorem, the whole formula of AxP1 is an expression of the basic category S. Its general form is that of a quantified expression. This implies that the expression within the upper corner brackets also belongs to category S. This last expression is of the general form . As both positions within the round brackets are again occupied by expressions of the form , this means that is here the symbol of a functor of the category S/SS. By carrying out the analysis down to the last constituents of the formula, it can be determined that the letters p, q, r are here symbols of the category S, for they occur in the positions of arguments of the context . The construction of the system’s developments adheres to this principle: upon the initial introduction of a category, its associated context must remain exclusive to symbols or expressions within that category throughout subsequent developments, ensuring no use of symbols or expressions from any other category. In other words, parentheses of the same shape, delimiting the same number of arguments, must not be associated with functors of different categories. Parentheses are then no longer used to delimit the scope of functors, but to indicate their categories. Let us examine three examples extracted from the previously provided definitions (written here in Leśniewski-compliant versions):



P23: ⌊f⌋ ⌈≡ (Comf⟩⌊pq⌋⌈≡(f(qp)f(pq))⌉) ⌉



Definition P17 is the first to introduce a unary functor S/S in the developments. It must then be associated with a new context. The analysis of the definiens shows that the letter p is here of category S, for it occurs in the first place of a context . Therefore, the new constant is of category S/S. The choice of for the new context is suitable and introduces no confusion, for it differs from  by the number of argument places.

Definition P23 introduces another unary functor. In the definiens, its argument f is of category S/SS (for f occurs just before a context). The category of the defined functor Com is then S/(S/SS). This category is a new one in the development. So, it must again be associated with a new context. This time round brackets are excluded, for such a choice would introduce ambiguity and would make indistinct the categories S/S and S/(S/SS).

Definition P27 is a more complex example. The defined constant applies to two arguments f and g of category S/SS (as it is clear in the definiens). The result of this application is the expression . But this expression, once again, applies to a pair of arguments, leading to the expression . The use of the context for the second application indicates that the expression is of category S/SS. So applying to two S/SS arguments, the defined constant gives a S/SS expression as a result. The category of the defined constant is thus (S/SS)/(S/SS)(S/SS), and its context is from now on .

In such a syntax, grammaticality does not depend on the choice of letters and symbols for this or that variable. Only the arrangement of the categories indicated by the contexts formed by specific brackets determines whether an expression is well formed or not. On a theoretical point of view, a definition as P27 could perfectly well have been written using one of the following two alternative expressions:


The choice of the letters p and q for the propositional variables, f and g for the connector variables in P27 has no other reason than to avoid offending the reader’s habits. As for brackets and symbols for constants, their choice is free at the time of their first occurrence. However, the choices must respect the differentiation of contexts and be respected throughout the developments.


Finally, it is important to recognize that the differentiation between constants and variables is contextual as well. Since all the axioms and theorems are closed expressions, all the symbols which are bound by a quantifier are variables, whereas the other symbols—apart from brackets—are necessarily constants. This section gives only an outline of the principles of contextual syntax. Leśniewski provides a detailed and scrupulously complete description of them through what he called his ‘terminological explanations’. In this way, he demonstrates how contextuality and the application of the notion of semantic category make it possible to have a rigorous formal language which, like ordinary language and the usual notations of science, remains continuously open to enrichment and novelty. This part of Leśniewski’s work is a masterpiece in the philosophy of notation.


The inherent openness of Leśniewski’s systems requires such a notation that unequivocally and contextually determines the categories of symbols and expressions. This aspect, combined with Leśniewski’s meticulous axiomatic presentations of his systems, makes them challenging for 21st century logicians to apprehend. But this difficulty similarly arises with the original works of Frege, Peirce, or Hilbert. It is largely due to the age of the systems and to the evolution of logicians’ habits. However, it is known that Leśniewski used his contextual syntax only where ambiguities could arise. In his everyday practice, he also formulated his proofs using a form of a natural deduction method. This method was common among the members of the Warsaw School. It was only codified later by Jaśkowski. Surprisingly, this codification was not applied to Leśniewski’s systems. A natural deduction system for Protothetic, close to twenty-first century streamlined methods of logic, is available in Joray (2020).


b. Ontology (Term Logic)

Like standard predicate logic, which is built on the basis of a propositional calculus, Leśniewski’s system called ‘Ontology’ is an expansion of Protothetic. The aim of Ontology is mainly to enlarge propositional deductive logic to the analysis and expression of predication. In spite of these similarities, there are important differences between Ontology and standard predicate logic. Firstly, Ontology is not a theory of quantification. The system indeed inherits quantification from Protothetic. Secondly, the language of Ontology makes no distinction of category between singular and conceptual terms. Instead of having a first category for singular names and another for predicates, Ontology has only a wide category of names. In this respect, Ontology is closer to traditional term logic than it is to predicate logic. Ontology extends then Protothetic by introducing a second basic category, the category of names, labeled N, and a copula as a new primitive constant. It is known as an extensional calculus of names, which constitutes a free and plural logic.


i. Names and Copula

Leśniewski’s notion of name is considerably broader than it is in the Russellian tradition. For him, not only simple singular terms like ‘Socrates’ are names, but also complex referring expressions like ‘Plato’s master’ and terms or expressions that refer to more than one object, like ‘planet’ or ‘author of the Principia Mathematica’. Whether simple or composed, a name may be singular, plural or even empty if there is no object to which it refers, as it is the case with ‘unicorn’ or ‘square circle’. In a sentence like ‘Socrates is Greek’, there are two names according to Leśniewski. ‘Socrates’ is a singular one because it refers to one individual, and ‘Greek’ is a plural one because it refers to many individuals. It should be noticed that there is no way in Leśniewski’s nominalist conception of names to interpret plural names as denoting any single abstract totality (like a set, a class, or a collection) which would have the signified objects as members. A plural name simply refers directly to these objects. Like Protothetic, Ontology is an interpreted system. It is in no way a pure syntax waiting for interpretation. It has then an intuitive semantics from the beginning. All names in Ontology belong to the same category N. In the intended semantics, they can be of three sorts: singular, plural, or empty. In order to represent these three possibilities, Lejewski (1958) proposed to use suggestive diagrams. In the following figure I, the diagrams represent the three possibilities for a name ‘a’: singular (I.1), plural (I.2), or empty (I.3):


Figure II shows 16 diagrams representing the possible situations in which two names ‘
a’ and ‘b’ can stand in relation to each other.



















In (II.1) both names are singular, and they denote the same object. In (II.2), both are singular, but denote different objects. In (II.3)

‘a’ denotes one object which is among the objects denoted by the plural name ‘b’. From (II.9) to (II.13), both names are plural. They denote, for example, exactly the same objects in (II.9), and the objects denoted by ‘a’ are strictly among those denoted by ‘b’ in (II.10). The main interest of these diagrams is that they make it possible to explain in a rather precise way the meaning with which Leśniewski proposed to use the only primitive term of Ontology, namely the epsilon copula. This copula ‘ applies to two names (two arguments of category N) and results in a proposition (category S). It is then of category S/NN. Expressions of the form


           (often written with the simplified form ‘)


are called ‘elementary propositions’ of Ontology. Their truth conditions in the intended semantics can be explained in the following way: an elementary proposition ‘ is true if and only if the two arguments ‘a’ and ‘b’ stand either in situation (II.1) or in situation (II.3) of Lejewski’s Figure II. In ordinary language, the meaning of such an elementary proposition can be approximated by “The object denoted by ‘a’ is the object, or one of the objects, denoted by “b”. For convenience, it is often read “a is among the b’s” or even “a is a b”.


It should be stressed that, unlike syllogistic, where a singular term can never occur in a predicate position, there is no restriction in Ontology as to the sort of names that may serve as arguments in an elementary proposition. Any name, whether singular, plural or empty, may occur either in the first argument position (say as subject) or in the second position (say as predicate) in an elementary proposition. In all the sixteen situations of Lejewski’s Figure II, we would get a well-formed proposition. This proposition, of course, would only be true in cases (II.1) and (II.3). In all other situations, it would be false, but meaningful and perfectly well-formed.


ii. The Axiomatic System

Drawing on his intuitive semantics, Leśniewski formulated in 1920 a single axiom for Ontology. This axiom is presented here both in a Leśniewski-compliant form and in a more usual notation:





By introducing the elementary proposition ‘ in the left-hand side of the biconditional expression, with  as a new context, the axiom presents a formal similarity with a definition of Protothetic. However, the new symbol also occurs in the right-hand argument, and the axiom is then like an implicit definition, introducing the new symbol ‘ with a formal characterization that fits the intended truth conditions of the elementary proposition:


For all a, b,
a is a b           if and only if
1. at least one thing is an a   and
2. at most one thing is an a   and
3. all that is an a is also a b.

This axiom shows a striking analogy between Leśniewski’s analysis of singular propositions and Russell’s theory of definite descriptions. Despite numerous oppositions between the two logicians, Leśniewski acknowledged that Ontology has certain similarities with Russell’s work, for example its formal proximity with simple type theory.


Concerning the rules of inference, Ontology inherits adapted forms of the rules of Protothetic. In addition, it also has new versions of the rules for definition and for extensionality. With only the protothetical rules, one can already establish significant theorems concerning the constant epsilon, notably the following:


T1: (epsilon is transitive)
T2: (one of the most characteristic properties of epsilon)

These three theorems sufficiently indicate that Leśniewski’s epsilon is formally very different from the epsilon of set theory. Theorem T3 rather shows similarities between Ontology and Aristotle’s syllogistic. In one direction, the biconditional expression is analogous to the Barbara syllogism, while in the other direction it bears formal resemblance to what Aristotle termed ‘ecthesis’. Resting on results due to Tarski and Sobociński, Leśniewski has shown that T3 can be adopted as a shorter single axiom of Ontology.


Using only the protothetical rules, it is also possible to state some interesting definitions, such as those of relators of the same category as epsilon (S/NN):



Def-Proto (nominal inclusion)


Def-Proto (nominal co-extensionality)


Def-Proto (singular identity)


Other definitions are still possible with Def-Proto, for instance those of the three following S/N functors, expressing properties of names, and also a definition of a relation between such properties (category S/(S/N)(S/N)):





Def-Proto (S/N-functors co-extensionality)


From AxOnto, definitions T4 and T8, it is easy to derive the following theorem:




The introduction of nominal co-extensionality in T5 gives the opportunity to define an interesting many-link functor:




From   (‘a’ and ‘b’ denote the same objects), the definition abstracts the second argument ‘b’, resulting in, which belongs to the category S/N and expresses a property of names (to denote the same objects as ‘a’). The functor ‘Ext’ is then a many-link functor of category (S/N)/N. It is tempting to interpret ‘ as denoting the extension ofa’. This is however merely a façon de parler, for ‘ is not the name of an object, but rather the expression of a function. Nevertheless, it is worth noting that from T5, T10 and T12, a formal analogue of Frege’s famous Basic Law V can be derived:




Contrary to Frege’s law, this theorem is perfectly harmless in Ontology, for ‘ is a function, not an object that could be among the denotations of ‘a’.


In addition to defining nominal properties and relations, Boolean operations on names can also be introduced. However, these operations necessitate the application of an Ontology-specific definition rule. Instead of using, like in Protothetic, the following general form (with a definiendum of category S):




the new rule allows definitions of the following form, with a definiendum of category N:




The formal conditions for a well-formed definition are pretty much the same in the new version. It is worth noting that including the expression ‘ on the right-hand side of the biconditional is to ensure that the name ‘a’ is singular. In practice, this addition is unnecessary when the definiens alone already ensures that ‘a’ denotes exactly one object. Here are some examples, including the elementary Boolean operations:


T14:  Def-Onto (nominal union)

T15:  Def-Onto (nominal intersection)

T16:  Def-Onto (nominal difference)

T17:  Def-Onto (empty name)


Def-Onto (universal name)


iii. Higher Orders

Like Protothetic, Ontology is a higher-order logic. Where the Principia Mathematica are based on an unbounded hierarchy of logical types, Ontology is based on a potentially infinite hierarchy of semantic categories. Each time a constant of a new category of this hierarchy is defined in a development, variables of that category and quantifiers binding those variables become available in the language of the development in question. At the root of the hierarchy, the category N includes names, which have the semantic role of designating extra-linguistic objects. Moving up into the hierarchy, one first comes across categories that take names as arguments: N/N, N/NN, and so on (categories which allow to operate on names), and S/N, S/NN, and so on (categories which allow assertions about names). Operators and functors of these categories can in turn serve as arguments for new operators and functors from categories higher up in the hierarchy. This ascent can go on, step by step, without limit of complexity. This increase in complexity must nevertheless be put in perspective. Firstly, a specific extensionality rule enables the derivation of extensionality theorems for each of the new categories that can be reached in Ontology. These theorems are analogous to the following theorem, which expresses extensionality for the basic category N:




Secondly, there exists a structural analogy within Ontology among the various levels of the category hierarchy. For example, from a semantic perspective, the way a name has meaning (by denoting one object, a plurality of objects or no object at all) parallels the way a S/N functor conveys meaning (by being satisfied by one nominal meaning, multiple nominal meanings or none at all). From a syntactic perspective, it is possible to define in each category an analogue of the primitive epsilon (called a ‘higher epsilon’) and then to derive a structural analogue of the axiom of Ontology. For example, in the category S/N, the following definition of a S/(S/N)(S/N)-epsilon is adequate for that purpose:


T20: (∀αβ)[αεβ ≡.


Using this definition, Miéville (1984: 334-7) has given a proof of the following
S/N-analogue of the axiom of Ontology:






Ontology presents a systematic analogy between categories that is similar to the analogy between types in the Principia Mathematica. Using homonyms of different categories, it offers the possibility to speak about functions or incomplete meanings (like for instance properties, relations, extensions, numbers, and so on) as if they were objects, but without any reification. On this point, Ontology attains the same ends as the Principia Mathematica. It constitutes a powerful logic as strong as type theory. But contrary to Whitehead and Russell, Leśniewski attains this result with means which are strictly regulated by his axiomatic system, without resorting either to any external convention of systematic ambiguity or to the non-explicit definitions of logical fictions, like that of classes in the Principia Mathematica.


c. Mereology (Part-Whole Theory)

While Mereology is chronologically the first system elaborated by Leśniewski, it is theoretically the last one, as it is based on both Protothetic and Ontology. Unlike these two deductive systems, Mereology is not a purely logical system. Dealing with the relations between parts and wholes, it contains non-logical proper terms like ‘class’, ‘element of’, or ‘part of’. Although it was considered by Leśniewski as a class theory—a nominalistically acceptable alternative to set theory—it has come to be widely regarded as a powerful formal theory of parts, wholes and related concepts.


At the time he discovered formal logic, Leśniewski planned to provide an alternative way into the issue of the foundations of mathematics. In this matter, the main points of disagreement with his contemporaries were about the ways to analyze and solve the paradoxes which appeared with the pre-theoretical notions of set, class or extension, especially Russell’s paradox. For Leśniewski, the solutions available at that time (in particular those of Frege, Russell and a bit later Zermelo’s one) were only ad hoc means. In his view, their only justification was to avoid contradictions in their systems. He did not find in these solutions a satisfactory analysis of the root causes of the contradictions, which were, according to him, based on a confusion between what he called the distributive and the collective conceptions of classes. From Cantor’s early approach, Leśniewski retained the basic idea that a set is literally made up of its elements. But this basic idea was for him incompatible with the existence of an empty set and with the distinction between an object and the set having this object as its unique element.


The difference between distributive and collective views of sets or classes can be easily grasped by means of a geometrical example such as the following figure:








It is common to conceive such a figure as being a class of certain points. It can also be conceived as a class of certain line segments or even as a class of certain triangles. All these possibilities have different theoretical advantages. But if the notion of class is understood in a distributive sense (for example as a set in a standard sense), the same figure cannot be at the same time a class of points, a class of segments, and a class of triangles. A set or a distributive class of points has only points as elements, whereas a mereological or collective class of points may perfectly have also other objects as elements. A single figure can be at the same time a mereological class of points, a class of segments and a class of triangles. In the collective conception, the three classes are the same object, namely the figure in question.


i. Mereology and Russell’s Paradox

Leśniewski gave a famous analysis of Russell’s paradox. During his lifetime, he did not publish the final state of this analysis, which was reconstructed by his pupil Boleslaw Sobociński in 1949. Taking up Russell’s approach, Leśniewski’s analysis begins with a proof that the principles of comprehension and extensionality of class theory are indeed incompatible. To this end, the following ‘Ontological’ definition of the concept ℜ is introduced (that is, the concept of object which is not a class that falls under a concept of which it is the class):




The term Cl(-), which occurs in the definiens, must be considered here as a primitive constant satisfying the two principles of comprehension and extensionality (here expressed in the language of Ontology):


Class Comprehension Principle (CCP): 

(For all conceptual terms a, there is an object which is a class of the a’s.)


 Class Extensionality Principle (CEP):

 (For all conceptual terms a and b, if one and the same object is both a class of the a’s and a class of the b’s, then the a’s and the b’s are exactly the same objects.)


Taking these elements as granted, Leśniewski easily shows that we get the following contradiction:


     (Nothing is a class of the ℜ’s)

        (Something is a class of the ℜ’s)


For Leśniewski, a contradiction acquires the value of an antinomy only if it logically follows from principles in which we undoubtedly believe. In his view, this was not the case with the contradiction encountered in this context. In the intuitive conception of classes or sets, CCP is not free from doubt. Indeed, what this principle expresses is at least doubtful in the case of empty concepts. If a is an empty conceptual term, there is no intuitive reason to decide whether or not there is an object which is a class of a. The reasons for adopting CCP lie in the goals we set for set or class theory, not in our intuitive conceptions of sets or classes. In order to uncover the genuine antinomy behind Russell’s paradox, the analysis must not address the incompatibility between CEP and CCP. It must deal with what would happen to a theory that admits among its principles CEP and the doubtless part of what is expressed by CCP, namely the following weakened principle:

Weak Class Comprehension Principle (WCCP)

(For all non-empty conceptual term a, there is an object which is a class of the a’s.)


With the primitive term Cl(-) satisfying now CEP and the revised principle WCCP, clearly only the first horn of the previous contradiction remains:


        (Nothing is a class of the ℜ’s)


But WCCP then imposes that ℜ is an empty term:




This means (by definition of ℜ) that every object is a class that falls under a concept of which it is the class:




Leśniewski shows then that this class is precisely the class of the term in question:


      (Every object is a class of itself)


From these first results, he then draws an unexpected consequence:


      (There is at most one object)


The demonstration can be informally sketched as follows:


Assume (a and b are individual objects).

Let then be the conceptual term under which exactly the objects a and b fall.

The term is not empty.

By WCCP, it follows that there is an object c which is a class of .

But, like every object, c is also a class of itself.

So we have: .

By CEP, we then get:   (exactly the same objects fall under and c).

For c is a singular term, so is also .

The only way for to be a singular term is that .


The joint adoption of CEP and WCCP results then in the existence of at most one object in the universe. Although such a statement could not be refuted on a purely logical basis, Leśniewski considered that no set or class theorist could tolerate it and that they should indisputably believe in its negation. This had for him the value of a genuine antinomy.


Sobociński’s reconstruction of the analysis does not fully clarify why Leśniewski considered that the root causes of this antinomy lay in a confusion between what he called the distributive view and the collective view of classes. It could be argued that, for him, WCCP constituted an unquestionable belief only with a collective view, whereas a doubtless belief in CEP could only result from a distributive view. In any case, his solution to the antinomy was to expurgate from CEP what is only acceptable from a distributive view of classes. Introducing the notion of element with the following definition:




he showed that CEP is logically equivalent to the conjunction of the following two expressions:




(All the objects that fall under a concept are elements of the class of that concept.)



 (All the elements of the class of a concept fall under that concept.)


Unlike CEP1, which is undoubtedly true under both intuitive understandings of ‘class’, CEP2 can only appear to be true to one who adopts a distributive view. For Leśniewski, whoever relies on Cantor’s opening idea that a set or a class is a real object that gathers into a whole the elements that literally constitute it faces an antinomy when confusingly admitting the truth of CEP2. His nominalist tendency was to lead him to consider the mereological approach to classes as the only acceptable one, whereas any theoretical approach aiming at saving CEP2 led, according to him, to make classes either fictions (as in Russell’s no-class theory) or disputable abstract entities subject to ad hoc criteria of existence (as in Zermelo’s approach).


ii. The Axiomatic System

Between 1916 and 1921, Leśniewski developed four axiomatizations of his Mereology taking different terms as a unique primitive. The first two were based on the term ‘part’ (Leśniewski’s word for the somewhat more usual ‘proper part’), the third on ‘ingredient’ (a synonym for ‘element’) and the last on ‘exterior of’ (Leśniewski’s term for ‘disjoint’). When taking ‘element’ (or ‘ingredient’) as primitive, Leśniewski gives the following definitions of other important mereological terms:

(a is a part of b when it is a strict element of b, that is, an element of b different from b itself.)


 (a is an external of b when it has no element in common with b.)






This last definition introduces the notion of mereological class. In order to be the class of the b’s, a certain a must meet the three conditions stipulated in the definition:


1. a must be an object;

2. all the b’s must be elements of a;

3. every element of a must itself have at least one element in common with one of the b’s.


This is worth clarifying. Let us take as an illustration the mereological class of Swiss people. From condition 2, every Swiss person is an element of this class. But the class is intended to have many other elements. For example, sub-classes of Swiss people are also elements of that class (like the class of Swiss people living in Lugano, that of French-speaking Swiss people, or that of Swiss people who practice yodeling). There are also elements of the class of Swiss people that are neither Swiss persons nor sub-classes of them: for example, an element of a Swiss person (such as the nose of the President of the Confederation) or a class of such elements (such as the class of the feet of Swiss people who have climbed the Matterhorn). Condition 3, however, precisely limits this wealth of elements. It requires that each element itself has at least something (an element) in common with a Swiss person. The Swiss people sub-classes clearly meet this requirement and so do the President’s nose and the Swiss mountaineers’ feet class. In contrast, the class of the noses of all European leaders will not be retained as an element of the Swiss people class because there is at least one element of this class of noses (for example, the nose of the Italian president) which has nothing (no element) in common with a Swiss person.


This illustration highlights that the mereological class corresponds to what is better known as the mereological sum. It also makes it clear that, for the three conditions of Leśniewski’s definition to actually reach what is expected from mereological classes, it is necessary for the term ‘element’ to be characterized in an appropriate way (for example, it is pretty clear that for condition 3 to be relevant, the relation element of must be transitive). This characterization is what Leśniewski does with the following axiomatization of 1920, using ‘element’ (originally ‘ingredient’) as the sole primitive term:












The first two axioms are rather simple. AxM1 is the contraction of the following two formulas:


  (only objects have elements)



(element of is an antisymmetric relation)


The second axiom is literally:



(element of is a transitive relation)


Furthermore, Leśniewski shows that AxM1 et AxM2 imply the following formula:


 (element of is a reflexive relation on the object domain)


The first two axioms thus make element of a non-strict partial order relation on the object domain.


The last two axioms are more difficult to grasp. However, when examined in light of the definition of class, it becomes apparent that they respectively embody a principle of class uniqueness and a principle of class existence (the latter being nothing but WCCP):



(a class of a certain term is unique)



(There is a class for every nonempty term)

Leśniewski and his followers devoted much effort to finding the shortest and most economical system of axioms for Mereology. But this could only be achieved at a certain expense of intuitive clarity. The axiomatization of 1920 is in an intermediate position in this respect. To one who is concerned neither with having a single primitive, nor with the independence of the axioms, the adoption of the two terms
El(-) and Cl(-) as primitives, together with the six axioms (i)-(vi) plus the defining formula for ‘class’ taken as the seventh axiom, would constitute a rather clear axiomatization. The only remaining difficulty lies in the effort to grasp this definition of class (especially with regard to the third condition of the definiens, which gives the mereological class its specificity). This definition of class, elaborated by Leśniewski from the very beginning of his research, can certainly be considered as one of the touchstones of his mereology.


All of Leśniewski’s axiomatizations have been proved to be equivalent. The consistency of his Mereology has also been established. Clay gave in 1968 a model of Mereology in the arithmetic of real numbers, and later a proof of consistency relative to topology. But the most significant proof is that of Lejewski, who showed in 1969 that both Mereology and its underlying logic (namely Ontology) are consistent relative to an elementary sub-system of Protothetic.


3. Foundations of Mathematics

With Leśniewski’s untimely death in 1939, the picture he left us of his program for the foundations of mathematics remains unfortunately unfinished and in some respects ambivalent. Developed in connection with his analysis of Russell’s paradox, his Mereology continues today to be widely studied and developed as a rich applied theory of the part-whole relation. However, Leśniewski intended his Mereology to be a nominalistically acceptable alternative to set theory. One of his purposes was to show that Mereology could be used to provide a foundation for mathematics that would not postulate the existence of questionable abstract entities. On the other hand, he did not deny the relevance of the distributive intuition about classes. He nevertheless considered that an expression like ‘the class of the b’s’ taken in the distributive sense could only be an apparent name that should be eliminated in favor of a language of pure logic. Thus, to assert in the distributive sense a sentence like ‘a is an element of the class of the b’s’ was only for him a façon de parler that amounts to asserting that a is one of the b’s, precisely what is expressed by ‘ in his Ontology. This eliminativist conception of distributive classes could arguably have led Leśniewski to consider, as several of his followers did, that the core notions of arithmetic (in particular, that of cardinal number) should find their foundations not in mereology, but directly in the purely logical system of Ontology.

a. Mereology and Set Theory

In order to determine to what extent Mereology could be an alternative to set theory, Leśniewski set out to prove numerous theorems that he considered to be analogues of important results of set theory. Unfortunately, this task remained unfinished. Perhaps the most interesting proof he gave was the mereological analogue of Cantor’s theorem on the cardinality of power sets. The problem with mereological classes is that they do not generally carry a specific cardinality. As Frege already remarked about aggregates (his naive notion for mereological classes), firstly there is no aggregate that consists of zero object, and secondly an aggregate can only have a cardinal number when it is conceived through a concept. To overcome this last difficulty, Leśniewski introduces two notions: the notion of mereological collection and the notion of discrete name. These notions can be defined as follows:




For any non-empty term b (like ‘Swiss people’), we have seen that there is exactly one class of the b’s. With D4, collections of b’s are all those classes that are generated either by all the b’s (so the class of Swiss people is a collection of Swiss people), or by only certain b’s (the class of Swiss people living in Lugano is also a collection of Swiss people), or even by only one b (Roger Federer is then also a collection of Swiss People). At first glance, it seems there must be collections of b’s, where n is the number of objects that fall under the name ‘b’. But this is only correct provided the b’s are disconnected objects (objects that are all mereologically external to each other, that is, with no element in common). In other words, using D5, one can say that the result is correct only when ‘b’ is a discrete name. Leśniewski proved then what he considered to be the mereological analogue of Cantor’s theorem:



(If ‘b’ is a plural discrete name, then there are strictly more collections of b’s than there are b’s themselves.)


The analogy is quite clear. With this result, Leśniewski could have tried to establish other important analogous results (for example, the existence of an endless hierarchy of increasingly large infinite cardinals in a Mereology supplemented with an axiom of infinity). Unfortunately, he did not have time to develop his efforts in such a direction, and no subsequent work has been able to show that Mereology is strong enough to achieve such goals while respecting the nominalistic requirements of Leśniewski.


In the Leśniewskian perspective, however, an important difference with the set-theoretic approach must be emphasized. Whereas in Cantor’s theorem, the cardinalities to be compared are those of sets (a set and its power set), in Leśniewski’s analogue, it is not mereological classes that carry a cardinality, but names (a name ‘b’ on the one hand and the name ‘Coll(b)’ on the other hand). What is compared in the mereological analogue is not the number of the elements of different classes, but the number of objects falling under certain names. This observation leads to two remarks. First, even if the Leśniewskian approach does not introduce any ambiguity or confusion, it still mixes both the collective and distributive views on pluralities. Secondly, the notion of cardinality introduced in this context clearly belongs to the underlying logic (Ontology), and not specifically to Mereology. This provides a rather decisive reason to favor a foundational approach to arithmetic from Ontology and not from Mereology.

b. Ontology and Arithmetic

Although he did not explicitly give clear philosophical reasons against the idea of a logicist approach to arithmetic, Leśniewski made no attempt to reduce arithmetic to his Ontology. Instead, he merely developed in the language of Ontology an axiomatization of arithmetic that is more or less a translation of Peano’s second-order arithmetic. In view of the great wealth of his systems, this is still a disappointing result, which should have been just a stage in the mind of the Polish logician. In any case, Canty showed in 1967 in his PhD thesis that the arithmetic of the Principia Mathematica could be fully reconstructed within Ontology. By exploiting several of Canty’s techniques, Gessler, Joray, and Degrange set up in 2005 a logicist program in which they show that second-order Peano’s arithmetic can be reduced to Ontology, using only a single non-logical axiom (an axiom of infinity) that can be stated as follows in the primitive language of Ontology:



(There is an object a for which there is a one-one relation such that every object is in its domain and every object except a is in its codomain.)


With suitable definitions of ‘one-one relation’, ‘domain’ and ‘codomain’, the logicist construction of Peano’s arithmetic can then be obtained resting on the definition of nominal equinumerosity and an associated definition of the many-link functor ‘Card’:


 This last definition immediately leads to the perfectly predicative Leśniewskian analogue of Frege’s renowned law, now commonly referred to as Hume’s Principle:




From here on, cardinal numbers are introduced as those S/N-functors which satisfy the following definition:




and natural numbers as those cardinal numbers which are inductive in the sense of Frege:




Completing this in a manner very similar to Frege’s (in particular by making explicit the definitions of ‘zero’, ‘successor’, and of inductivity), one obtains a development of infinite Ontology in which the axioms of Peano’s second-order arithmetic are provable. This construction simplifies and substantially improves that found in the Principia Mathematica. But, as with Whitehead and Russell, it leads to an arithmetic that has to be duplicated in higher orders if its numbers are to be applied not only to the counting of objects, but also to the counting of properties, functions, relations, and so on. This might explain why Leśniewski did not investigate in this direction and why he engaged in a foundational attempt based on his Mereology. Without textual evidence or decisive testimony on that subject, this unfortunately remains a matter of speculation.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Ajdukiewicz, K. “Die Syntaktische Konnexität.” Studia Philosophica 1 (1935): 1-27. (English translation in S. McCall, ed. Polish Logic 1920-1939. Oxford: Clarendon, 1967: 207-231.)
  • Canty, J. T. Leśniewski’s Ontology and Gödel’s Incompleteness Theorem. PhD Thesis of the University of Notre Dame, 1967.
  • Canty, J. T. “The Numerical Epsilon.” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 10 (1969): 47-63.
  • Clay, R. E. “The Relation of Weakly Discrete to Set and Equinumerosity in Mereology.” Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 6 (1965): 325-340.
  • Clay, R. E. “The Consistency of Leśniewski’s Mereology Relative to the Real Numbers.” Journal of Symbolic Logic 33 (1968): 251-257.
  • Gessler, N., Joray, P., and Degrange, C. Le logicisme catégoriel. Travaux de Logique (Neuchâtel University) 16 (2005): 1-143.
  • Joray, P. “Logicism in Leśniewski’s Ontology.” Logica Tranguli 6 (2002): 3-20.
  • Joray, P. “A New Path to the Logicist Construction of Numbers.” Travaux de Logique (Neuchâtel University) 18 (2007): 147-165.
  • Joray, P. “Un système de déduction naturelle pour la Protothétique de Leśniewski.” Argumentum 18 (2020): 45-65.
  • Küng, G. “The Meaning of the Quantifiers in the Logic of Leśniewski.” Studia Logica 26 (1977): 309-322.
  • Lejewski, C. “Logic and Existence.” British Journal of the Philosophy of Science 5 (1954): 104-119.
  • Lejewski, C. “On Leśniewski’s Ontology.” Ratio 1 (1958): 150-176.
  • Lejewski, C. “Consistency of Leśniewski’s Mereology.” Journal of Symbolic Logic 34 (1969): 321-328.
  • Leśniewski, S. “Introductory Remarks to the Continuation of my Article ‘Grundzüge eines neuen Systems der Grundlagen der Mathematik’.” in S. McCall (ed.) Polish Logic 1920-1939. Oxford: Clarendon, 1967: 116-169.
  • Leśniewski, S. “On Definitions in the So-called Theory of Dedution.” in S. McCall (ed.) Polish Logic 1920-1939. Oxford: Clarendon, 1967: 170-187.
  • Leśniewski, S. “On the Foundations of Mathematics.” Topoi 2 (1983): 7-52.
  • Leśniewski, S. S. Leśniewski’s Lectures Notes in Logic. edited by J. T. J. Srzednicki and Z. Stachniak, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1988.
  • Leśniewski, S. Collected Works. edited by S. J. Surma, J. T. J. Srzednicki, J. D. Barnett, and V. F. Rickey, 2 vols, Dordrecht: Kluwer / Warszawa: PWN Polish Scientific Publishers, 1992.
  • Łukasiewicz, J. The Principle of Contradiction in Aristotle. A Critical Study. (1910), English translation by H. R. Heine, Honolulu: Topos Books, 2021.
  • Luschei, E. C. The Logical Systems of Leśniewski. Amsterdam: North Holland, 1962.
  • Miéville, D. Un développement des systèmes logiques de Stanisław Leśniewski. Protothétique-Ontologie-Méréologie. Bern: Peter Lang, 1984.
  • Miéville, D. and Vernant, D. (eds.) Stanisław Leśniewski Aujourd’hui. Grenoble: Groupe de Recherche sur la Philosophie et le Langage, 1996.
  • Miéville, D., Gessler, D., and Peeters, M. Introduction à l’oeuvre de S. Leśniewski. Vols I-VI. Series of special issues of Travaux de Logique (Neuchâtel University), 2001-09.
  • Rickey, V. F. “Interpretations of Leśniewski’s Ontology.” Dialectica 39 (1985): 182-192.
  • Rickey, V. F. “An Annotated Leśniewski Bibliography.” First version 1972, last version 2019, available at https://lesniewski.info/.
  • Russell, B. Principles of Mathematics. London: Allen and Unwin, 1903.
  • Simons, P. “A Semantics for Ontology.” Dialectica 39 (1985): 193-216.
  • Simons, P. “Stanisław Leśniewski.” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (2015).
  • Słupecki, J. “St. Leśniewski’s Protothetics.” Studia Logica 1 (1953): 44-112.
  • Słupecki, J. “Leśniewski’s Calculus of Names.” Studia Logica 3 (1955): 7-72.
  • Sobociński, B. “L’analyse de l’antinomie russellienne par Leśniewski.” Methodos 1 (1949): 94-107, 220-228, 308-316 and Methodos 2 (1950): 237-257. (English Translation in Srzednicki, J. T. J. and Rickey, V. F. eds, 1984: 11-44.)
  • Srzednicki, J. T. J. and Rickey, V. F. (eds.) Leśniewski’s Systems: Ontology and Mereology. The Hague: Nijhoff / Wrocław: Ossolineum, 1984.
  • Srzednicki, J. T. J. and Stachniak, Z. (eds.) Leśniewski’s Systems: Protothetic. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1998.
  • Stachniak, Z. Introduction to Model Theory for Leśniewski’s Ontology. Wrocław: Wydawnictwo Universitetu Wrocławskiego, 1981.
  • Tarski, A. “On the Primitive Term of Logistic.” (1923), in Logic, Semantics, Metamathematics. Papers from 1923-1938 by Alfred Tarski. Oxford: Clarendon, 1956, 1-23.
  • Urbaniak, R. Leśniewski’s Systems of Logic and Foundations of Mathematics. Cham: Springer, 2014.
  • Whitehead, A. N. and Russell, B. Principia Mathematica. 2nd ed. Cambridge University Press, 1927.


Author Information

Pierre Joray
Email: pierre.joray@univ-rennes.fr
University of Rennes