Clarence Irving Lewis (1883—1964)

C. I. Lewis was a major American pragmatist. He was educated at Harvard,  taught at the University of California from 1911 to 1919 and at Harvard from 1920 until his retirement in 1953. Known as the father of modern modal logic and as a proponent of the given in epistemology, he also was an influential figure in value theory and ethics.

Lewis’s philosophy as a whole reveals a systematic unity in which logic, epistemology, value theory and ethics all take their place as forms of rational conduct in its broadest sense of self-directed agency. In his first major work, Mind and the World Order (MWO), published in 1929, Lewis put forward a position he called “conceptualistic pragmatism” according to which empirical knowledge depends upon a sensuous ‘given’, the constructive activity of a mind and a set of a priori concepts which the agent brings to, and thereby interprets, the given. These concepts are the product of the agent’s social heritage and cognitive interests, so they are not a priori in the sense of being given absolutely: they are pragmatically a priori. They admit of alternatives and the choice among them rests on pragmatic considerations pertaining to cognitive success.

His 1932 Symbolic Logic presented his system of strict implication and a set of successively stronger modal logics, the S systems. He showed that there are many alternative systems of logic, each self-evident in its own way, a fact which undermines the traditional rationalistic view of metaphysical first principles as being logically undeniable. As a result, he concluded that the choice of first principles and of deductive systems must be grounded in extra-logical or pragmatic considerations.

Table of Contents

  1. Introduction
  2. The Early Years
  3. Logical Investigations
  4. Mind and the World Order
  5. The Conversation with Positivism
  6. Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation
  7. Valuation and Rightness
  8. The Late Ethics
  9. References and Further Reading
    1. Major Works by Lewis
    2. Secondary Sources

1. Introduction

Lewis’s philosophy as a whole reveals a systematic unity in which logic, epistemology, value theory and ethics all take their place as forms of rational conduct in its broadest sense of self-directed agency. In his first major work, Mind and the World Order (MWO), published in 1929, Lewis put forward a position he called “conceptualistic pragmatism” according to which empirical knowledge depends upon a sensuous ‘given’, the constructive activity of a mind and a set of a priori concepts which the agent brings to, and thereby interprets, the given. These concepts are the product of the agent’s social heritage and cognitive interests, so they are not a priori in the sense of being given absolutely: they are pragmatically a priori. They admit of alternatives and the choice among them rests on pragmatic considerations pertaining to cognitive success.

His 1932 Symbolic Logic presented his system of strict implication and a set of successively stronger modal logics, the S systems. He showed that there are many alternative systems of logic, each self- evident in its own way, a fact which undermines the traditional rationalistic view of metaphysical first principles as being logically undeniable. As a result, he concluded that the choice of first principles and of deductive systems must be grounded in extra-logical or pragmatic considerations.

After the War his work played an important part in giving shape to academic philosophy as a profession. His 1946 Carus Lectures, An Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation (AKV) which represents a refinement of the doctrines of MWO and their extension to a theory of value, set the issues of postwar epistemology. The thoroughness of his discussion, and the technicalities of his writing were important models for postwar analytic philosophy. A student of Josiah Royce, William James and Ralph Barton Perry, a contemporary of Reichenbach, Carnap and the logical empiricists of the 30’s and 40’s, and the teacher of Quine, Frankena, Goodman, Chisholm, Firth and others, C.I. Lewis played a pivotal role in shaping the marriage between pragmatism and empiricism which has come to dominate much of current analytic philosophy.

After AKV, Lewis directed the final 20 years of his life to the foundation of ethics, giving numerous public lectures. He died in 1964 leaving a vast collection of unpublished manuscripts on ethical theory which are housed at the Stanford University Library.

2. The Early Years

Lewis was born on April 12, 1883, in relative poverty at Stoneham, Massachusetts. He enrolled in Harvard in 1902 , working part time as a tutor and a waiter, and received his B.A. degree three years later, taking an appointment to teach high school English in Quincy, Massachusetts. The following year he was appointed Instructor in English at the University of Colorado, moved to Boulder, and that winter married his high school sweetheart, Mabel Maxwell Graves. They stayed in Boulder for two years and in 1908 he enrolled in the PhD program, receiving his degree two years later in 1910, in part because financial concerns precluded a more leisurely pace. His thesis, The Place of Intuition in Knowledge prefigured important themes in his later work.

As an undergraduate, Lewis’s principal influences were James and Royce. When he returned to Harvard as a graduate student, James had retired, and the absolute idealism of Royce and Bradley was under attack by the New Realism of Moore and Russell in Great Britain and of W.P. Montague and Ralph Barton Perry at Harvard. The debate between Royce and James over monism and pluralism had been replaced by a debate between Royce and Perry over realism and idealism. Lewis studied metaphysics with Royce, and he studied Kant and epistemology with Perry. The debate between Royce and Perry framed Lewis’s dissertation and in it he attempted to forge a neo-Kantian middle road.

It is worth briefly discussing his dissertation because in many way it prefigures his later views. In his dissertation Lewis argued that the possibility of valid, justified, knowledge requires both givenness (or intuition) and the mind’s legislative or constructive activity. Lewis used the egocentric predicament in a dialectical argument against both the realist and idealist solutions to the problem of knowledge. Against Perry’s direct realism, he argued that what is known transcends what is present to the mind in the act of knowledge and that the real object is thus never given in consciousness; since knowledge requires that what is given to the mind be interpreted by our purposeful activity the real object of knowledge is made instead of given.

Against Royce, Lewis asserted the necessity of a given sensuous element that is neither a product of willing nor necessarily implicit in the cognitive aim of ideas. The mind’s activity is not constitutive of the known object because it does not make the given. Its purpose is rather to understand, or interpret, the given by referring it to an object which is real in some category or another. To be real is a matter of classification and only future experience will confirm or disconfirm the correctness of our classification, but some classification of the given will necessarily be correct. Whatever is unreal is so only relative to a certain way of understanding it Relative to some other purpose of understanding it will be real; the contents of a dream, for example are unreal only relative to a misclassification of them as a veridical perception. All knowledge contains a given element which shapes possible interpretation but the object known also transcends present experience.

It is remarkable how many themes in his mature work are already mobilized in his dissertation. Lewis’s solution to the problem of knowledge had both realist and idealist elements in an unstable equilibrium and his position would change several times over the next few years. Under the influence of Royce and Hume’s skepticism, Lewis came to believe that no realist answer to the problem of knowledge could work, and only an idealist solution would suffice. “How could the given be intelligible to the mind if it were independent of its interpretive activity?” This is a question which Lewis would not solve to his satisfaction until much later when he read Peirce. There is no doubt, however, that Lewis saw that a realist of Perry’s sort had no answer to it. At this point Lewis clearly had neither proof nor account of the relation of knowledge to independent reality. The synthesis of his dissertation had raised deep problems which were only to be answered by the mature system in MWO . “How can the given be intelligible if it is independent of the mind?” “If the mind does not shape or condition what is given to it how could valid knowledge be possible?” It seemed clear to Lewis that if justified knowledge were possible at all, then realism must be wrong. But idealism, as Lewis understood it, appealed to a necessary agreement between human will and the absolute in knowledge which was also unjustifiable.

3. Logical Investigations

Lewis received his PhD in 1910 but there were no jobs. This was a bitter disappointment for Lewis, who with a wife and small child, had hoped the financial difficulties of the past two years would be over. After a summer at his uncle’s farm the Lewises returned to Cambridge where Lewis spent the year tutoring and serving as an assistant in Royce’s logic class. Royce was one of America’s premier logicians during the time that Lewis was studying at Harvard and he introduced Lewis to Volume 1 of Russell and Whitehead’s Principia Mathematica which had just been published.

In the fall of 1911, Lewis went to the University of California at Berkeley as an instructor where, except for a stint in the army during World War I, he was to stay until his return to Harvard in 1920. During this period, Lewis worked primarily on epistemology and logic and, finding no logic texts available, was soon at work on a text on symbolic logic. This work would appear at the end of the war in 1918 as A Survey of Symbolic Logic the first history of the subject in English — and would form the basis of his better known Symbolic Logic , written together with C. H. Langford and published in 1932. Lewis’s work on logic was dictated in part by the need for a good text book and in part by objections to the paradoxes of material implication in Principia Mathematica and his desire to develop an account of inference more reflective of human reasoning. However, Lewis was still exercised by the problem of knowledge from his dissertation and was increasingly unhappy with the quasi-idealist solution he had explored there. In fact, Lewis’s study of logic during this period was at least in part directed towards examining important idealist assumptions about logic, which he would come to reject.

To solve the problem of knowledge the idealist needed logical truth to be absolute, for if the categorial form of our constructive will could vary then we would have no reason to take our interpretations to be true of the world. Lewis would attack the idealist assumptions in four related ways. First, he would argue that the coherence of a system of propositions depends upon the consistency of the propositions with each other and not on their dependence upon a set of absolute or self-evident truths. Secondly, he argued that a system rich enough to capture the notion of a world, or system of facts, is necessarily pluralistic in the sense that it must contain elements which are logically independent of each other. Thirdly, he argued that the existence of alternative deductive systems completely undermines the rationalistic view that metaphysical first principles can be shown to be logically necessary through the argument of ‘reaffirmation through denial’ (where in the attempt to deny a logical principle we necessarily presuppose its truth). Finally, he concluded that given the existence of alternative systems of logic, the choice of first principles and of deductive systems must be grounded in extra-logical, pragmatic considerations.

Lewis’s work in logic was also guided in part by concerns about Russell’s choice of material implication as a paradigm of logical deduction. Lewis constructed his own logical calculus based on relations in intention and strict implication, which he saw as a more adequate model of actual inference. Material implication has the property that a false proposition implies everything and so argued Lewis it is useless as a model of real inference. What we want to know is what would follow from a proposition if it were true and for Lewis this amounts to saying that the real basis of the inference is the strict implication where ‘A strictly implies B’ means that ‘The truth of A is inconsistent with the falsity of B.’ Lewis saw his account of strict implication to have important consequences for metaphysics and for the normative in general. He argued that the line dividing propositions corroborated or refuted by logic alone (necessary or logically impossible propositions) from the class of empirical truths or falsehood was of first importance of the theory of knowledge. The categories of possible and impossible, contingent and necessary, consistent and inconsistent are all independent of material truth and are founded on logic itself.

In 1920 Lewis was invited to return to Harvard to take up a one year position as Lecturer in Philosophy and was to remain for over 30 years until his retirement in 1953. There Lewis was reintroduced to Peirce and the last piece of his account of knowledge would fall into place, THE PRAGMATIC a priori.

After Peirce’s death Royce had arranged for the Peirce manuscripts to be brought to Harvard, and at the time of Lewis’s appointment the department was concerned that the manuscript remains, consisting of thousands of pages of apparently unorganized material, be catalogued. Lewis was given the job and although the task of arranging and cataloguing the papers ultimately passed to others, the two years he spent on that task gave Lewis the final building blocks for his mature epistemological position which he would call conceptualistic pragmatism. Lewis would find in Peirce’s “conceptual pragmatism,” with its emphasis upon the instrumental and empirical significance of concepts rather than upon any non-absolute character of truth, a resonance with his logical investigations.

Lewis in effect would turn the idealist thesis that mind determined the structure of reality on its head without giving up the idealist view of the legislative power of the mind. The mind interprets the given by way of concepts: the real, ultimately, becomes a matter of criterial commitment. The mind does not thereby manufacture what is given to it, but meets the independent given with interpretive structures which it brings to the encounter. In his dissertation Lewis had argued that the possibility of valid, justified, knowledge requires both givenness and the mind’s legislative or constructive activity. The epistemological view Lewis would now develop retained this basic structure but embedded it in a richer, psycho-biological model of inquiry and a more adequate account of the role of a priori concepts in knowledge. In the early 20’s Lewis would publish two seminal articles, “A Pragmatic Conception of The a priori,” and “The Pragmatic Element in Knowledge.” These two papers laid out the core of Lewis’s pragmatic theory of knowledge, which would be developed more richly in Mind and the World Order (MWO).

In “A Pragmatic Conception of the a priori,” Lewis rejected traditional concepts of the a priori arguing that, “The thought which both rationalism and empiricism have missed is that there are principles, representing the initiative of mind, which impose upon experience no limitations whatever, but that such conceptions are still subject to alternation on pragmatic grounds when the expanding boundaries of experience reveal their felicity as intellectual instruments.” What is important about an hypothesis is that it is a “concept” — a purely logical meaning — which can be brought to bear on experience. The concepts we formulate are in part determined by our pragmatic interests and in part by the nature of experience. Fundamental scientific laws are a priori because they order experience so that it can be investigated. The same is true of our more fundamental categorial notions. The given contains both the real and illusion, dream and fantasy. Our categorial concepts allow us to sort experience so that it can be interrogated. Thus the fact that we must fix our meanings before we can apply them productively in experience, is entirely compatible with their historical alteration or even abandonment.

In “The Pragmatic Element in Knowledge”, Lewis extended his pragmatism about the a priori to the theory of knowledge. Here, following Peirce and Royce, he identifies three elements in knowledge which are separable only by analysis: the element of experience which is given to an agent, the structure of concepts with which the agent interprets what is given, and the agent’s act of interpreting what is given by means of those concepts. The distinctively pragmatic character of this theory lies both in the fact that knowledge is activity or interpretation and that the concepts with which the mind interrogates experience reflect fallible and revisable commitments to future experiential consequences. Knowledge is an interpretation of the experiential significance for an agent with certain interests of what is given in experience; a significance testable by its consequences for action.

A priori truth is independent of experience because it is purely analytic of our concepts and can dictate nothing to the given. The formal sciences depend on nothing which is empirically given, depending purely on logical analysis for their content. So a priori truth is not assertive of fact but is instead definitive. There is logical order arising from our definitions in all knowledge. Ordinarily we do not separate out this logical order, but it is always possible to do so, and it is this element which minds must have in common if they are to understand each other. As Lewis puts it, “At the end of an hour which feels very long to you and short to me, we can meet by agreement, because our common understanding of that hour is not a feeling of tedium or vivacity, but means sixty minutes, one round of the clock…”. In short, shared concepts do not depend upon the identity of sense feeling, but in their objective significance for action.

The concept, the purely logical pattern of meaning, is an abstraction from the richness of actual experience. It represents what the mind brings to experience in the act of interpretation. The other element, that which the mind finds , or what is independent of thought, is the given. The given is also an abstraction, but it cannot be expressed in language because language implies concepts and because the given is that aspect of experience which concepts do not convey. Knowledge is the significance which experience has for possible action and the further experience to which such action would lead.

4. Mind and the World Order

Lewis first major book, Mind and the World Order (MWO) develops these results in three principal theses: first, a priori truth is definitive and offers criteria by means of which experience can be discriminated; second, the application of concepts to any particular experience is hypothetical and the choice of conceptual system meets pragmatic needs; and third, the susceptibility of experience to conceptual interpretation requires no particular metaphysical assumption about the conformity of experience to the mind or its categories. These principles allow Lewis to present the traditional problem of knowledge as resting on a mistake. There is no contradiction between the relativity of knowledge to the knowing mind and the independence of its object. The assumption that there is, is the product of Cartesian representationalism, the ‘copy theory’ of thought, in which knowledge of an object is taken to be qualitative coincidence between the idea in the mind and the external real object. For Lewis knowledge does not copy anything but concerns the relation between this experience and other possible experiences of which this experience is a sign. Knowledge is expressible not because we share the same data of sense but because we share concepts and categorial commitments.

All knowledge is conceptual; the given, having no conceptual structure of its own, is not even a possible object of knowledge. Foundationalism of the classical empiricist sort is thus directly precluded. Lewis’s task for MWO is in effect a pragmatic solution to Hume’s problem of induction: an account of the order we bring to experience which renders knowledge possible but makes no appeal to anything lying outside of experience. Prefiguring contemporary externalist accounts of representation, Lewis argues that both representative realism and phenomenalism are incoherent. Knowledge as correct interpretation is independent of whether the phenomenal character of experience is a “likeness” of the real object known, because the phenomenal character of experience only receives its function as a sign from its conceptual interpretation, that is, from its significance for future experience and action. The question of the validity of knowledge claims is thus for Lewis fundamentally the question of the normative significance of our empirical assessments for action.

Lewis argued that our spontaneous interpretation of experience by way of concepts that have objective significance for future experience constitutes a kind of diagnosis of appearance . If we could not recognize a sensuous content in our classification of it with qualitatively similar ones which have acquired predictive significance in the past, interpretation would be impossible. Despite the fact that such recognition is spontaneous and unconsidered it has the logical character of a generalization. To recognize an object — “this is a round penny” — is to make a fallible empirical claim, but to recognize the appearance is to classify it with other qualitatively similar appearances. The basis of the empirical judgment lies in the fact that past instances of such classification have been successful. Our empirical knowledge claims are dependent for their justification upon this body of conceptual interpretations in two ways. First, the world, in the form of future events implicitly predicted (or not) by our empirical judgments, will confirm or disconfirm those judgments: all empirical knowledge is thus merely probable. But secondly, the classification of immediate apprehensions by way of concepts justifying particular empirical judgments is itself generalization even when those concepts have come to function as a criterion of sense meaning. Concepts become criteria of classification because they allow us to make empirically valid judgments, and because they fit usefully in the larger structure of our concepts.

This structure, looked at apart from experience is an a priori system of concepts. The application of one of its constituent concepts to any particular is a matter of probability but the question of applying the system in general is a matter of the choice of an abstract system and can only be determined by pragmatic considerations. The implications of a concept within a system become criteria of its applicability in that system. If later experience does not accord with the logical implications of our application of a concept to a particular, we will withdraw the application of the concept. Persistent failure of individual concepts to apply fruitfully to experience will lead us to readjust the system as a whole. Our conceptual interpretations form a hierarchy in which some are more fundamental than others; abandoning them will have more radical consequences than abandoning others. Lewis’s account of inquiry offers both a non-metaphysical account of induction and an early version of the so called ‘theory-ladenness of observation terms’. There is no need for synthetic a priori or metaphysical truths to bridge the gap between abstract concepts in the mind and the reality presented in experience. Lewis offers a kind of ‘Kantian deduction of the categories’ providing a pragmatic vindication of induction but without Kant’s assumption that experience is limited by the modes of intuition and fixed forms of thought. Without a system of conceptual interpretation, no experience is possible, but which system of interpretation we use is a matter of choice and what we experience is given to us by reality. The importance of the given in this story is its independence . Our conceptual system can at best specify a system of possible worlds; within it the actual is not to be deduced but acknowledged. In short, Lewis’s theory of knowledge in MWO is a pragmatic theory of inquiry which combines rationalist and naturalistic elements to make knowledge of the real both fallible and progressive without recourse to transcendental guarantees.

5. The Conversation with Positivism

MWO was published in 1929 during a time of tragedy for Lewis and his family. MWO was very well received and Lewis’s career was now secure; he was elected to the American Academy of Arts and Sciences in May of 1929 and made a full professor at Harvard in 1930. But his daughter died that year after two years of a mysterious ailment and a few years later Lewis suffered a heart attack due to overwork. Despite life’s trials, the period between MWO and AKV was a period of intellectual expansion for Lewis. Lewis began to explore the consequences of his views for value theory and ethics. At the same time his logical interests shifted. While technical issues continued to occupy his attention for the next few years, largely in the form of replies to responses to his work in Symbolic Logic , his thinking shifted decisively away from technicalities and towards the experiential structure of meaning and its relation to value and knowledge. There were several reasons for this.

The period was a time of decisive change in philosophy in America generally. The influx of British and German philosophy into the United States during the thirties and the increasing professionalization of the universities, posed deep and ambiguous problems for American philosophers with a naturalistic or pragmatic orientation, and for Lewis in particular. Logical empiricism, with its emphasis on scientific models of knowledge and on the logical analysis of meaning claims was emerging as the most pervasive tendency in American philosophy in the thirties and forties, and Lewis was strongly identified with that movement. But Lewis was never completely comfortable in this company. For Lewis, experience was always at the center of the cognitive enterprise. The rapid abandonment of experiential analysis in favor of physicalism by the major positivists and their rejection of value as lacking cognitive significance both struck him as particularly unfortunate. Indeed his own deepening conversation with the pragmatic tradition led him in the opposite direction. It is only within experience that anything could have significance for anything, and Lewis came to see that rather than lacking cognitive significance, value is one way of representing the significance which knowledge has for future conduct. Attempting to work out these convictions led him to reflect on the differences between pragmatism and positivism, and to begin to investigate the cognitive structure of value experiences.

The pragmatist, Lewis holds, is committed to the Peircean pragmatic test of significance. But, as he notes in his 1930 essay, “Pragmatism and Current Thought,” this dictum can be taken in either of two directions. On the one hand, its emphasis on experience could be developed in a psychologistic direction and promote a form of subjectivism. On the other, the fact that the Peircean test limits meaning to that which makes a verifiable difference in experience takes it in the direction which he developed in MWO, to a view of concepts as abstractions in which “the immediate is precisely that element which must be left out.” But this claim must be correctly understood. An operational account of concepts empties them only of what is ineffable in experience. “If your hours are felt as twice as long as mine, your pounds twice as heavy, that makes no difference, which can be tested, in our assignment of physical properties to things.” A concept is thus merely a relational pattern. But it does not follow from this that the world as it is experienced is thrown out the window. “In one sense that of connotation a concept strictly comprises nothing but an abstract configuration of relations. In another sense its denotation or empirical application this meaning is vested in a process which characteristically begins with something given and ends with something done in the operation which translates a presented datum into an instrument of prediction and control.” Knowledge is a matter of two moments, beginning and ending in experience although it does not end in the same experience in which it begins. Knowledge of something requires that the experience which is anticipated or envisaged as verifying it is actually met with. Thus, the appeal to an operational definition or test of verifiability as the empirical meaning of a statement is, for the pragmatist, the requirement that the speaker know how to apply or refuse to apply the statement in question and to trace its consequences in the case of presented or imagined situations.

In his 1933 presidential address to the American Philosophical Association, “Experience and Meaning”, Lewis dealt with the question of verifiable significance in a very general way emphasizing both the points of agreement and difference between pragmatism and logical positivism. Lewis framed the discussion of meaning in terms of the distinction between immediacy and transcendence, sketching arguments against both phenomenalism and representational realism. What remains, the third way, is a view of meaning common to absolute idealism, logical positivism and pragmatism. Meaning is a relation of verifiability or signification between present and possible future experience.

In “Logical Positivism and Pragmatism”, Lewis compared his pragmatic conception of empirical meaning with the verificationism of logical positivism in a sharply critical way. Both movements, he argued, are forms of empiricism and hold conceptions of empirical meaning as verifiable ultimately by reference to empirical eventualities. The pragmatic conception of meaning looks superficially very much like the logical- positivist theory of verification despite its different formulation and its focus on action. But, argues Lewis, there is a deep difference. Whereas the pragmatic account rests meaning ultimately upon conceivable experience, the positivist account logicizes the relation. Lewis’s complaint is that this results in a conception of meaning which omits precisely what a pragmatist would count as the empirical meaning. Specifying which observation sentences are consequences of a given sentence helps us know the empirical meaning of a sentences only if the observation sentences themselves have an already understood empirical meaning in terms of the specific qualities of experience to which the observations predicates of the statement apply. Thus for Lewis the logical positivist fails to distinguish between linguistic meaning, which concerns logical relations with other terms, and empirical meaning, which concerns the relation expressions have to what may be given in experience, and as a result, leaves out precisely the thing which actually confirms a statement, namely the content of experience.

The emphasis on the experience of the knower points to a yet larger contrast between positivism and pragmatism regarding the difference between judgments of value and judgments of fact. Lewis was entirely opposed to the positivist conception of value statements as devoid of cognitive content, as merely expressive. For the pragmatist all judgments are, implicitly, judgments of value. Lewis would develop both the conception of sense meaning and the thesis that valuation is a form of empirical cognition in AKV .

6. Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation

In 1946 The Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation (AKV) was published, and Lewis was awarded the Edgar Pierce Professorship at Harvard, the chair which had been held by Perry and would be held by Quine after Lewis. AKV was the most widely discussed book of its day.

The pragmatic psycho-biological model of inquiry which Lewis adopted from Peirce and James is even more visibly a part of AKV than it was in MWO. Knowledge, action and evaluation are essentially connected animal adaptive responses. Cognition, as a vital function, is a response to the significance which items in an organism’s experiential environment have for that organism. Any psychological attitude which carries cognitive significance as a response will exhibit some value character of utility or disutility which can ground the correctness or incorrectness of that response as knowledge. Cognitively guided behavior is a kind of adaptive response, and the correctness of behavior guiding experience, to the extent that it carries cognitive significance, depends simply on whether the expectations lodged in it come about as the result of action. Meaning, in this sense is anticipation of further experience associated with present content and the truth of it concerns the verifiability of expected consequences of action. It is because of this that sense-apprehension is basic and underlies other forms of empirical cognition. Perceptual cognition involves a sign-function connecting present experience and possible future eventualities grounded in some mode of action which, pervading the experience in its immediacy, gives it its cognitive content.

The signifying character of the expectancies lodged in immediate experience is enormously expanded by the web of concepts we inherit as language users. Lewis did not, however, identify meaning with linguistic signs. Linguistic signs are secondary to something more basic in our experience which we share with animals generally and which occurs when something within our experience stands for something else as a sign. When the cat comes running because she hears you opening a can and takes it as a sign of dinner, she is responding to the meaning of her experience. While this meaning is independent of whether or not you are opening a can of cat food her expectation will be confirmed if the can contains cat food and disconfirmed if it doesn’t.

Meaning in this sense of empirical significance could only be available to a creature who can act in anticipation of events to be realized or avoided. Accordingly, the possible is epistemologically prior to the actual. Only an agent, for whom experience could have anticipatory significance, could have a concept of objective reality as that which is possible to verify or change. In addition to meaning as empirical significance Lewis distinguished the kind of meaning involved in the apprehension of our concepts. A definition represents a mode of classification, and although alternative modes of classification can be more or less useful, classification cannot be determined by that which is to be classified. Knowledge of meanings in this sense is analytic.

In AKV, Lewis distinguishes between four modes of meaning: (1) the denotation or extension of a term is the class of actual things to which the terms applies; (2) the comprehension of a term is the class of all possible things to which the term would correctly apply; (3) the signification of a term is the character of things the presence or absence of which determines the comprehension of the term; (4) the intension of a term is the conjunction of all the other terms which must be correctly applicable to anything to which the term correctly applies. A proposition is a term capable of signifying a state of affairs; it comprehends any possible world which would contain the state of affairs it signifies. The intension of a proposition includes whatever the proposition entails and thus comprises whatever must be true of any possible world for that proposition to be true of it.

Intentional and denotational modes of meaning are two aspects of cognitive apprehension in general, the denotational being that aspect of apprehension which, given our classifications, is dependent upon how experience turns out, and the intentional being that aspect of apprehension which reflects the classifications or definitions we have made and is thus independent of experience. Our choice of classification is essentially pragmatic, however, so what may count as an empirical matter in one context may count legislatively in another, generalizations may be corrected by future experience and our definitions replaced on the grounds of inadequacy. The analytic element in knowledge is indispensable because unless our intensions are fixed our terms have no denotation, but nothing determines how we shall fix our intensions save the superior utility of one set of terms over others.

While intensional meaning is primary for him, Lewis distinguishes between two different ways in which we can think of it. First, linguistic meaning is intension as constituted by the pattern of definitions of our terms. Secondly, sense meaning is intension as the criterion in terms of sense by which the application of terms to experience is determined. Sense meaning is more fundamental. Learning involves the extension of generalizations to unobserved cases and correlatively recognizing in new experiences the correct applicability of our terms. The sense meaning of a term is our criterion for applying the term correctly. In a thought experiment anticipating Searle’s “Chinese Room,” Lewis imagines a person who somehow learns Arabic using only an Arabic dictionary thus learning all the linguistic patterns in the language. This person would grasp the linguistic meanings of all the terms in Arabic but might nonetheless not know the meaning of any of the terms in the sense of knowing their application to the world. The language would remain a meaningless and arbitrary system of syntactic relationships. Linguistic meaning is nonetheless central in communication because what can be shared is conceptual structure. Understanding between two minds depends not on postulated identity of imagery or sensation but on shared definitions and concepts.

The validation of empirical knowledge has two dimensions, its verification and its justification. Verification is predictive and formulates our expectations for verification or falsification. Justification looks to the rational credibility of those expectations prior to their verification. In the acquisition of knowledge these dimensions support each other. The warrant which our present beliefs have is shaped by the history of past verifications of similar beliefs. Reflection on the warranted expectancies in our present beliefs leads us to formulate new generalizations and normative principles we can subject to tests. The common stock of concepts in our language embeds such principles and empirical generalizations in the intensions of terms. As a result our use of terms decisively shapes what is warranted and verifiable for us.

Lewis distinguishes between three classes of empirical statements. First, there are what he calls expressive statements which attempt to express what is presently given in experience. An ordinary perceptual judgment, say seeing my cat by the fridge, outstrips what is presently evident. This added content is carried by the intensions of the concepts in the judgment insofar as they convey the expectancies found in the experience. These expectancies, although partly a function of past learning and knowledge of the intension of terms, are simply given in the experience, they are the part we do not invent and cannot change but merely find. Lewis suggests that we can use language expressively to capture this presentational content by stripping our meaning of its ordinary implication of objective content. Secondly, there are statements which formulate predictions. The judgment that if I do action A the outcome will include E, where E indicates an aspect of experience expressively characterized, is one which can be completely verified by putting it to the test. Upon acting the content E will either be given or it will not. Lewis calls empirical judgments of this sort terminating judgments. Finally, there are judgments which assert the actuality of some state of affairs. Although they can be rendered increasingly probable by tests, no set of eventualities envisioned can exhaust their significance. Lewis calls these judgments non-terminating because there are indefinitely many further tests which could, theoretically speaking, falsify the prediction and any actual verification can be no more than partial.

The ground of empirical judgments is past experience of like cases. At bottom those experiences have a warrant-producing character for a particular response because of the directly apprehended qualitative character of the signal combined with the expectations due to similar experiences in the past. In short, an empirical judgment is justified by its relation to past experiences of like cases. The warrant producing character of those experiences for a particular judgment depends upon the recognition of the presentation as classifiable with other qualitatively similar appearances as significant of future experience, and the character of the passages of experience attending past instances of the judgment. Epistemic warrant at its bottom level is the animal’s recognition of future objectivity lodged in present experience; present experience is a sign of experience to come. A multi-storied interpretive structure of concepts is built upon this adaptive responsiveness. Concepts become criteria of classification because they allow us to make empirically valid judgments, and because they fit usefully in the larger structure of our concepts. The structure, viewed apart from experience, is an a priori system of concepts, but looked at in terms of experience it is a network of sense meanings. The concept of probability plays a more prominent role in AKV than it does in MWO, but it is not a role of a different kind.

Perceptual knowledge has two aspects: the givenness of the experience and the objective interpretation which, in light of past experience, we put on it. But these are both abstractions and only distinguishable by analysis. What is given in experience as spontaneously arising expectancies is already conceptually structured, to recognize the given is to classify it with qualitatively similar cases and that recognition, although spontaneous, has the logical character as a generalization. The system of concepts within which our judgments are formulated and the pyramidal structure of empirical beliefs which intend a set of possible worlds of which ours is but one, by themselves suggest a coherence theory of justification. But here, as in MWO, Lewis resists this idealist alternative. Lewis takes the given to be essential for a series of interrelated reasons. Mere coherence of a system of statements does not even give meaning; the student of Arabic mentioned earlier does not know what any of the terms mean and cannot even use a statement to express a judgment. The given thus plays the role of fixing what beliefs mean because it lodges the actual world among the various possible worlds which are compatible with my knowledge: whichever world I am in it is this one. A merely hypothetical system of congruent and consistent statements could be fabricated out of whole cloth, as a novelist does, but however richly developed, the congruence and coherence of the system would be no evidence of fact at all. Independently given facts are indispensable and they are the actually given expectancies whose objective intent we then can evaluate for their mutual congruence and coherence.

Lewis’s emphasis on the given has been taken by many contemporary philosophers to be an instance of classical foundationalism. As we saw in the discussion of MWO Lewis considered the very idea of sense data to be incoherent. There is, however, a debate about whether his views changed between that book and AKV. Christopher Gowans (in “Two Concepts of the Given in C.I. Lewis, Realism and Foundationalism”) has argued that Lewis had two different conceptions of the given but failed to recognize the difference between them. On this view, while Lewis was an anti-foundationalist in MWO he embraced foundationalism in AKV and his later thinking. Determining Lewis’s position is, of course, a matter of interpretation. I think that a non-foundationalist position is dictated by the larger structure of his thought. He was certainly not a foundationalist in the British empiricist sense of the word.

7. Valuation and Rightness

Lewis rejected the “scandal” of emotivism and noncognitivism and directed much of his late thinking to two tasks: demonstrating that valuation is a species of empirical knowledge and establishing that there are valid nonrepudiable imperatives or principles of rightness. Lewis’s acceptance of the psycho-biological model of inquiry and it’s emphasis on the evolutionary and biological ground of cognition in animal adaptive response, committed him to the ineliminability of value in knowledge. Inquiry directed towards epistemic goals is, he argued, no less a species of conduct than practical and moral inquiry. Conduct of any sort will be directed towards ends appropriate to it and in light of which both its success can be measured and its aim be critiqued as reasonable or unreasonable. Lewis argued that evaluations are a form of empirical knowledge no different fundamentally from other forms of empirical knowledge regarding the determination of their truth or falsity, or of their validity or justification.

Much of Lewis’s discussion takes the form of an analysis of the concepts surrounding rational agency. Purposeful activity intrinsically involves rational cognitive appraisal. Action is behavior which is deliberate in the sense of being subject to critique and alterable upon reflection. It is behavior for the sake of realizing something to which a positive value is ascribed. He characterizes an action as sensible just in case the result or its intent, is ascribed comparative value. The purpose of an act, by which he means that part of the intent of an act for the sake of which it is adopted, can also be said to be sensible because what is purposed is something to which comparative value is ascribed. An act is successful in the circumstance that it is adopted for a sensible purpose which is realized in the result.

The verification of success will depend upon the purpose for which the act is done. The success of an action aimed at an enjoyable experience can be decisively verified if that experience is attained, but typically the purpose of an act will be to bring about a state of affairs whose value-consequences extend into the future and will thus be affected by other states of affairs, and so the success of the act may never be fully verified. In addition, an act may fail of its purpose in two ways: the expected result may fail to follow or it may be realized but fail to have the value ascribed to it.

Just as there are two aspects to the validation of empirical belief, verification and justification, Lewis distinguishes the success (or verification) of an action from its practical justification, which is the character belonging to a belief just in case its intent is an expectation which is a warranted empirical belief. Given these distinctions, Lewis argues that unless values were truth-apt in the sense of being genuine empirical cognitions capable of confirmation or disconfirmation, no intention or purpose could be serious and hence no action could be justified or attain success. The enterprise of human life can only prosper, he says, if there are value judgments which are true. Those who deny it fall into a kind of practical contradiction similar to that of Epimenides the Cretan who said that all Cretans are liars. Making a judgment, framing an argument, and deciding to take an action, are all activities which involve bringing to bear cognitive criteria of classification, inference and cogency on the matter at hand. Thinking is an activity which presupposes selective and intelligent choice concerning the path of thought. Repudiation of the rational imperativeness of so selectively choosing is thus nothing less than a repudiation of the cognitive aim of thinking. All the different forms of imperatives, the epistemic and logical imperatives, the technical, prudential and moral imperatives, are of a piece: they are principles of right intellectual conduct, in short, principles of intelligent practice. The notions of correctness, conduct, objectivity and reality are all forged within the system of communal practices which give these concepts ground. Our conceptual framework is not merely a set of common concepts but also a set of communal norms regulating our conduct. We can reject these norms only by repudiating our conceptual framework, but there is no other ground of rational choice which could provide a warrant for an act of repudiation, so that the act of repudiating norms tacitly presupposes the warrant which norms provide. The skeptic’s own claims constitute a reductio ad absurdum against his position.

As we saw, Lewis distinguished between three classes of empirical statement, expressive, terminating and non-terminating statements. Since valuation is a species of empirical knowledge Lewis distinguishes between three kinds of value-predications. First, there are expressive statements of found value quality as directly experienced. Such predications require no verification as they make no claim which could be subjected to test. Secondly, there are terminating evaluations which predict the success of an action aimed at some value experience as result. These can be put to test by so acting and thus are directly verifiable. Finally there are non-terminating evaluations which ascribe an objective value property to an object or state of affairs. Like any other judgment of objective empirical fact such claims are always fallible though some may attain practical certainty.

Since the aim of sensible action is the realization of some positive value in experience, only what is immediately valuable can be valuable for its own sake or intrinsically valuable. Extrinsic values divide into values which are instrumental for some thing else and values found to be inherent in objects, situations or states of affairs. Value, Lewis argues, is not a kind of quality but a dimension-like orientational mode pervading all experience. To live and to act is necessarily to be subject to imperatives, to recognize the validity of norms. The good which we seek in action is not this or that presently given value experience but a life which is good on the whole. That is something which cannot be immediately disclosed in present experience but can only be comprehended by some imaginative or synthetic envisagement of its on- the-whole quality. We are subject to imperatives because future possibilities are present in our experience only as signs of the significance which that experience has for the future if we decide to act one way rather than another. Since we are free to act or not we must move ourselves in accordance with the directive import of our experience to realize future goods. Life is not an aggregate of separate moments but a synthetic whole in which no single experience momentarily given says the last word about itself: each moment has its own fixed and unalterable character but the significance of that character for the whole, like the significance of a note within a piece of music, depends upon the character of other experiences to which it stands in relation. The value assessment of experiential wholes can never be directly certain nor decisively verified in any experience because what is to be assessed is a whole of experiences as it is experienced, and there is no moment in which this experiential whole is present. The value of experiential wholes thus essentially involves memory and narrative interpretation.

8. The Late Ethics

A discussion of Lewis’s philosophy would not be complete without a discussion of his late work in ethics. Lewis’s ethics, toward which the whole of his mature philosophical work aimed, is a richly developed foundation for a common sense reflective morality, broadly within the American pragmatic naturalistic tradition. No one can cogently repudiate the ethical task and it is not the special mission of any discipline. At the center of Lewis’s theory of practical reason is the rational imperative. While a naturalist with respect to values, he held practical thinking in all its forms to rest for its cogency on categorically valid principles of right. Ethics, epistemology and logic are all inquiries into species of right conduct. They are kinds of thinking, subject to our deliberate self-government and thus to normative critique, and as a consequence they are all forms of practical reason.

Under the influence of Kant, he held that imperatives are rational constraints put on our thinking by our nature as rational beings. He offered several arguments including a pragmatic ‘Kantian deduction’ of the principles of practice, arguing that without universally valid principles of practice, our experience of ourselves as agents would be impossible. He also offered a reductio ad absurdum against the skeptic. The denial of moral imperatives is pragmatically incoherent because it in effect attempts to mount a valid argument to the conclusion that there is no such thing as validity in argument; the skeptic’s attempt to deny the universal validity of such imperatives involves him in what Lewis called a pragmatic contradiction and leads by a reductio ad absurdum to the confirmation of their validity. By implicitly asking us to weigh and consider his reasons, the skeptic appeals to reasons and argument as things which should constrain us in our beliefs and decisions, whether we like it or not and thus acknowledges their force in his practice. Imperatives are not arbitrary commands or recommendations to the self; they are directly and cognitively present in the agent’s experience.

Rational imperatives must underlie all forms of rational self-regulation, of which ethics proper is only one department. Arguing, concluding, believing are also forms of self-governed conduct and it is to these forms that his argument first turns. Experience itself is for Lewis dynamically shaped by our classifications and judgments; as a temporal process its present moments are pervaded by implicit judgments, expectations and valuations, grounded in past expectations and confirmations. Permeated with value and active assessment, experience is a weave of givenness and conduct, of doing and suffering. Value qualities are verifiably found in experience; objective valuations are both fallible and corrigible. They are judgments which reflect the justified expectation of good (or unfavorable) consequences on the assumption of actions envisaged. Accordingly, the evaluative ought the rational imperative is at the heart of human experience. At the beginning his 1954 Woodbridge Lectures, as The Ground and Nature of the Right , he argues “To say that a thing is right is simply to characterize it as representing the desiderated commitment of choice in any situation calling for deliberate decision. What is right is thus the question of all questions; and the distinction of right and wrong extends to every topic or reflection and to all that human self-determination of act or attitude may affect.”

Despite the critical priority of the right it is in the service of the good; and Lewis’s account of both reflects a single commitment to the pragmatic structure of inquiry. Ethics grows out of the fact that human beings are active creatures who enter into the process of reality in order to change it. We are also social creatures whose experience and needs are taken up thematically in the categories and organized practices which make up our social inheritance. For Lewis both what is judged justifiably to be good and what ways of achieving it are validly imperative are fallibly grounded in human experience; skepticism about either the right or the good is ultimately a failure to acknowledge that fact. Since we are endowed with the capacity to do by choosing we are obligated to exercise it. We must decide even if we choose to do nothing, and the world will be different depending on how we decide

To say that human beings are self-conscious and self-governing creatures means, for Lewis, that they perceive their environment in terms of predictively hypothetical imperatives between which they are able to choose. Beliefs and imperatives are thus only modally distinct; they contain the same information. What Lewis calls the “Law of Objectivity” is governing oneself by the advice of cognition, in contravention if necessary to our impulses and inclination. Directives of doing, determined by the good or bad results of conforming to them, fall into various modes, principally the technical, the prudential and the moral and the logical. The imperative force of technical rules presumes as antecedently determined some class of ends; they justify actions only on the assumption of the justification of those ends. The rules of technique are thus hypothetical imperatives. By contrast, the rules of the critique of consistence and cogency, of prudence and of the moral are non-repudiable; they are categorical.

In his final years Lewis worked on a book on the foundations of ethics. It is clear from his manuscripts and letters that the ethics book occupied Lewis’s attention in the early forties and for the rest of his life. While it is difficult to understand why Lewis was unable to work the material into a form which satisfied him, I think that it had come to have an importance in his mind, a finality, which combined with his declining health, prevented a final satisfactory version being written for he continued to work on his ethics book writing almost daily until his death in February of 1964.

9. References and Further Reading

a. Major Works by Lewis

  • Lewis, C.I., 1929. Mind and The World Order: an Outline of a Theory of Knowledge . Charles Scribner’s Sons, New York, 1929, reprinted in paperback by Dover Publications, Inc. New York, 1956.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1932a. Symbolic Logic (with C.H. Langford). New York: The Appleton-Century Company, 1932 pp. xii +506, reprinted in paperback by New York: Dover Publications, 1951.
  • Lewis,C. I., 1946. An Analysis of Knowledge and Valuation , (The Paul Carus Lectures, Series 8, 1946) Open Court, La Salle, 1946.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1955a. The Ground and Nature of the Right , The Woodbridge Lectures, V, delivered at Columbia University in November 1954, New York, Columbia University Press, 1955.
  • Lewis, C.I., 1957a. Our Social Inheritance , Mahlon Powell Lectures at University of Indiana, 1956, Bloomington, Indiana, Indiana University Press, 1957.
  • Collected Papers of Clarence Irving Lewis , ed. John D. Goheen and John L. Mothershead, Jr., Stanford University Press, Stanford, 1970.
    • Includes most of Lewis’s most important articles.
  • Values and Imperatives, Studies in Ethics , ed. John Lange, Stanford University Press, Stanford, California, 1969.
    • Includes a number of Lewis’s late, unpublished talks on ethics.

b. Secondary Sources

  • Dayton, Eric. AC I Lewis And The Given@, Transactions of the Charles S . Peirce Society , 31(2), Spr 1995, pp. 254-284.
  • Flower, Elizabeth and Murphey, Murray G. A History of Philosophy in America , New York, G.P. Putnam’s Sons, 1977, Chapter 15. pp.892-958.
  • Gowans, Christopher W. ATwo Concepts Of The Given In C I Lewis: Realism And Foundationalism@. The Journal of the History of Philosophy , 27(4), 1989, pp. 573-590.
  • Haack, Susan. “C I Lewis” In American Philosophy , Singer, Marcus G (Ed), Cambridge, Cambridge University Press, 1986, pp. 215-238.
  • Hill, Thomas English. Contemporary Theories of Knowledge , The Ronald Press Co., New York, 1961, chapter 12, pp. 362-387.
  • Kuklick, Bruce. The Rise of American Philosophy, New Haven, Yale University Press, 1977, chapter 28, pp. 533-562.
  • Reck, Andrew J. The New American Philosophers , Louisiana State University Press, Baton Rouge, 1968, pp. 3-43.
  • Rosenthal, Sandra B. The Pragmatic a priori: Study In The Epistemology Of C I Lewis . St Louis, Green, 1976.
  • Schilpp, Paul Arthur (Ed). The Philosophy Of C I Lewis . La Salle Il Open Court, 1968.
  • Thayer, H S. Meaning And Action: A Critical History Of Pragmatism. Indianapolis Bobbs-Merrill, 1968, chapter 4, pp.205-231.


Author Information

Eric Dayton
University of Saskatchewan