History of Love

What is love? We all wish to have the answer to one of the most universal, mysterious, and all-permeating phenomena on this planet. And even if we perhaps have a special feeling and intuitive insight that love “is related to everything else, but near things are more related than distant things,” as Waldo Tobler said, we still have not found and offered a full or finite definition of this multifaceted, dynamic, creative and all-encompassing phenomenon that is love. Another view, held by Spinoza, is that love elevates us up to an expansive love of all nature. For him, an act of love is an ontological event that ruptures existing being and creates new being.

However, since love is an ontological event, creation of new being also coincides with different concepts throughout history, since each period brings a new way of being and living. Thus, each period in history offers a prevailing concept of love: in ancient, pre-Socratic times, we have Empedocles’ Love (Philotes) and Strife (Neikos); in Socratic times, Plato’s Eros and Aristotle’s Philia; in the middle ages, St. Paul’s Agape and St. Augustine’s Caritas; in the Renaissance, Rousseau’s notion of a modern romantic pair of Emile and Sophie; in modern times, Freud’s love as transference; and finally, in postmodern times we tackle the notion of duties to children. These concepts of love are not always independent of one another, as later philosophers often implement earlier conceptions into their own interpretations.

Table of Contents

  1. Presocratic Period
    1. Empedocles
  2. The Classical (Socratic) Period
    1. Plato
    2. Aristotle
  3. Christian Period
    1. St. Paul
    2. St. Augustine of Hippo
  4. The Enlightenment Period
    1. Rousseau
  5. The Modern and Postmodern Periods
    1. Sigmund Freud
    2. Duties to Children
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Presocratic Period

a. Empedocles

Empedocles was a Sicilian, a high-born citizen of Acragas and a pre-Socratic philosopher, among whom were also Heraclitus and Parmenides. Empedocles is the last Greek philosopher who wrote in verse, which suggests that he knew the work of Parmenides, who also wrote in verse. Empedocles’ work should be understood in relation not only to Parmenides’ but also to Pythagoras’’ and the Sensualists, who emphasized the importance of our senses. On the other hand, Empedocles’ notion of Love and Strife being fundamental cosmic forces on which his cosmology and ethics lie is an  original thesis that no other philosopher afterwards continued (in some ways Freud was the only one who used Empedocles’ notions of Love and Strife in his writings on Eros and Thanatos).

In Empedocles’ cosmology, Love stands as a cosmic, consistent principle due to which the world exists through mixing of the elements (earth, air, fire, and water), or as he says:

From these [Elements] come all things that were and are and will be; and trees spring up, and men and women, and beasts and birds and water-nurtured fish, and even the long-lived gods who are highest in honour. For these [Elements] alone exist, but by running through one another they become different; to such a degree does mixing change them. (Fragment 21)

For Empedocles, elements are like letters in an alphabet, which emphasizes the ability of elements to form different types of matter in the same way a limited number of letters can form different words through combinations of letters, or basic colours can be used to create different hues and patterns. The cause of this mixture and of these combinations are the cosmic forces of Love (Philotes)—the force of attraction and combination, and Strife (Neikos)—the force of repulsion and fragmentation. These two forces are engaged in the eternal dialectic and they each prevail in turn in an endless cosmic cycle:

I shall tell thee a twofold tale. At one time, it grew to be one only out of many; at another, it divided up to be many instead of one. There is a double becoming of perishable things and a double passing away. The coming together of all things brings one generation into being and destroys it; the other grows up and is scattered as things become divided. And these things never cease continually changing places, at one time all uniting in one through Love, at another each borne in different directions by the repulsion of Strife. (Fragment 17)

This cycle of love-strife consists of four phases in a Sphere: two full phases, one governed by Love and another by strife, and two transitional phases: a phase from Strife to Love, and a phase from Love to Strife. In the beginning, the Sphere was filled with love and the four elements were so close together that we could not discern them. After some time, however, Strife came into the Sphere and Love started to outflow from it. When Strife gained enough concentration in the Sphere, it resulted in the movement and fragmentation of the four elements into separate forms.

But it seems that Empedocles needed “evolution” (development) in his cosmology and the ensuing dynamic movement of the cosmos, so he introduced movement through two transitional phases: phases from Love to Strife and from Strife to Love. In this way, he got a third phase in which, as a consequence of the previous phases, Love regains power through coming into the centre of the Sphere, while Strife moves to its margin. And then, in the fourth and last phase of the cycle, Strife returns to the centre, and Love moves to the margin. This process then repeats over and over again. The idea of Love and Strife moving in and out of the Sphere may be an echo of Empedocles’ medical knowledge (he was a well-known physician), especially of the function of the heart. Thus, according to Empedocles, the world exists in continuous movement through different phases of a cycle, in which a certain type of stability exists in eternal elements. And it is precisely this continuous movement of the elements which produces a continuous state of organic evolution and from which all beings originate.

2. The Classical (Socratic) Period

a. Plato

Plato, born a nobleman in an aristocratic family, was not only a philosopher but also a mathematician, a student of Socrates, and later, a teacher of Aristotle. He was the first to lay the foundation of the Western philosophy and science. He also founded the first known academy, which can be considered the first institution of higher education in the Western world.

Plato’s most important works on love are presented in Symposium (although he changed his abstract outlook on love as universal Ideas (of Truth, Beauty and Goodness) later in Pheadrus to meet also the erotic and “subjective” aspects of the ideal Love.) In Symposium, meaning a feast, he presents seven speeches about love going from speaker to speaker as they sit at the table. He introduces seven speakers represent five types of love known at that time, with Socrates offering a unique and new philosophical concept of love he learned from Diotima, and concluding with Alcibiades, the final speaker, presenting his own love experience with Socrates.

Phaedrus, who is the “father” of the idea of talking about love, claims that Love is a God, and is one of the most ancient Gods. According to Hesiod, Love was born to Chaos and Earth. Love gives us the greatest goods and guidance. Phaedrus prefers love between an older man (erast) and a young boy (eromenos) because it encourages a sense for honour and dishonour (shame), two necessary virtues of citizenship, for love will convert the coward into an inspired hero who will, for instance, die for his beloved.

Pausanias, who was sitting next, speaks next. He says that Phaedrus should have distinguished heavenly and earthly loves. The first has a noble purpose, delights only in the spiritual nature of man, and does not act on lust. The second one is the love of the body, and is of women and boys as well as men. And when we are in the domain of earthly love, which operates on lust, we can see the powerful influence that pursuing sexual pleasure has on a person’s actions and life: we become slaves to our passions and subservient to others, a distinct threat to freedom and thus a happy life.

Aristophanes comes next, but he has the hiccups and requests that Eryximachus the physician either cure him or speak in his turn. Eryximachus does both, and after prescribing for the hiccups, speaks as follows: he agrees with Pausanias that there are two kinds of love; furthermore, he concludes that this double love extends over all things— animals and plants, as well as humans. In the human body lies both good and bad love, and medicine is the art of showing the body how to distinguish the two.

Aristophanes is the next speaker. He argues that “original” humans used to be beings with two faces and four arms and legs, but we were cut into two by Zeus due to our arrogance and disobedience of the Gods. Since then people go around the world seeking their missing half. Eros, the God of love, is here to assist us in finding this missing half, who is our spiritual kin. Aristophanes also claims there were three genders of the original human beings: male (two males), female (two females), and androgynous (male-female). Males were descended from the sun, females from the earth, and androgynes from the moon. Thus, Eros’ task is to make our race happy again through our completion and regression to the original state. However, making us complete again is not as easy task as we would expect. When Zeus cut people in half, they were at first cut in such a way that the halves could not sexually merge; they were able to just kiss and hug and were kept in this unsatisfied situation until they died. For this reason, Zeus gave them sexual organs. Sexual organs enabled the halves to merge in coitus and, at least for a little while, release the halves from their tension of desire for each other. Martha Nussbaum, however, has observed that this option pushes people to live within a domain of repetitive needs and desires which distract them from other businesses in life. It is very difficult to meet such halves, and an even bigger puzzle is how we would recognize them (what are the signs of meeting the right half?) (Nussbaum, 2001).

Socrates, being aware of this problem of Aristhopanes’ Eros, offered a response to Aristophanes and claims that a) “love is neither love for the half nor the whole, if one or the other has not some good, beauty and truth” (Plato, 1960, p. 94); and b) love, or Eros, is primarily a relationship between a knowledge-lover (philosopher) and ultimate knowledge/wisdom (Love which is Goodness/Beauty/Truth and part of the Heaven/Angelic domain). Thus, our love is based on the notion that the aim of love is not a person but something immaterial (the ultimate Heavenly Ideas of Goodness/Beauty/Truth), which enables an anchor within ourselves. And how can we achieve this? The next four steps up the ladder from the material towards the immaterial will show us. But before we introduce the four steps upwards into the angelic domain, we must say that the originator of the theory of Eros is not Socrates, but the Greek priestess Diotima. Socrates says that he merely repeats what he was told by her, and that is

(a) the general description of Eros or love is a desire for something that we do not have—we desire what we lack. And what do we lack? We desire beauty, goodness, and truth. But if we desire something that we do not have—does that mean Eros is ugly, bad, and foul? Eros is neither beautiful nor ugly, neither good nor bad, neither wise nor stupid, neither God nor mortal: Eros is something in between: Eros is an intermediary power, transferring prayers from men to gods and commands from gods to men. We must also distinguish Eros from a beloved one, because Eros is the loving one. And such a notion of Eros resembles the position of a philosopher: “Sophia (wisdom) is one of the most beautiful things in the world. Sophia is the love of wisdom; therefore Eros must be a philosopher, that is a lover of wisdom who stands in between the fair and the foul, the good and the bad, the ugly and the beautiful.” (Plato, 1960, p. 96).

(b) If Eros desires the beautiful, then the question arises: What does Eros desire of the beautiful? He desires possession of the beautiful which, if we substitute it with the good, means desire to possess happiness. And when something makes us happy, we wish to have the everlasting possession of the good. And how do we achieve that? By reproducing it. This is the reason men and women at a certain age desire to produce offspring, as with birth comes beauty and mortal men and women reach immortality.

(c) Eros, as desire of the good and beauty, brings forth a desire for immortality; this principle extends not only to men but also to animals. This is also why parents love their children—for the sake of their own immortality—and why men love the immortality of fame. Intellectuals and artists do not ‘create children; instead, they conceive concepts of wisdom, virtue, and legislation.

(d) Thus, men who are concerned more with the physical level take care of children and love a woman, and those who are concerned about the spiritual level take an interest in justice, virtue, and philosophy (world of ideas of Goodness/Beauty/Truth per se), and love Man (as mankind). And how do we get to this Goodness/Beauty/Truth? Love starts with loving beautiful forms, and proceeds to beautiful minds. From minds, one can learn to love laws and institutions, then sciences; he sees that there is a single science uniting all of nature’s beauty. In knowing this, he can perceive beauty with the mind’s eye, not the body’s eye, and will know true wisdom and the friendship of God.

The last speech is by Alcibiades. We learn that Alcibiades (who is stunningly beautiful, an acclaimed war and strategic leader, winner of many prestigious awards, and praised and adored by many Athenians) is in love with Socrates. He fell in love because as he said: “I have heard Pericles and other great orators, and I thought that they spoke well, but I never had any similar feeling…. He is the great speaker and enchanter who ravishes the souls of men; the convincer of hearts, too” (Plato, 1960, p.104). So Alcibiades was surprised that beneath an ugly and neglected appearance there was great treasure, and he explains his love for Socrates by first comparing him to the busts of Silenus, and secondly, to Marsyas the flute-player. “For Socrates produces the same effect with the voice which Marsyas did with the flute—he uses the commonest words as the outward mask of the divinest truths with which he touches the soul” (Plato, 1960, p. 105). Then he proceeds: “Socrates is exactly like the busts of Silenus, which are set up in the statuaries and shops, holding pipes and flutes in their mouths; and they are made to open in the middle, and have images of gods inside them … and we will learn that his words hold the light of truth, and even more, that they are divine.” (Plato, 1960, p. 106).

This uniqueness of Socrates is his main attraction. According to Lacan, however, we should consider a bust as an agalma—a source (or rather an object) of a lover’s desire or desire of (his) love.

A particular agalma someone sees in the other is that something he desires in this and not in the other person. Desire as such points towards a peculiar object (of desire) because it emphasizes and chooses exactly this and not any other object and makes it incomparable and incommensurable with the others. (Lacan, 1994, p. 16)

And that desire aims strictly for a subjective and particular choice (or projection), maybe not reflecting something real in the person at all, as Socrates reveals with his “mysterious” reply to Alcibiades: “But look again sweet friend, and see whether you are not deceived in me. The mind begins to grow critical when the bodily eyes fail and it will be a long time before you get old” (Plato, 1960, p. 107). So, Socrates wanted to show Alcibiades that what he has sought and loved in him is actually in himself as well. Discovering your true self gives you the greatest self-satisfaction and, at the same time, knowledge of how to become a better person; and this treasure can be shared with others, too, becoming good, beautiful, and truthful—something Socrates did by calling his endeavour a midwifery, that is, helping others bring forth into the light what was already in themselves.

In Plato’s second work on love, Phaedrus, he discusses another notion of love. He begins this work by denying the good of any love because he connects it with irrational behaviour conditioned by lust and desire. Sometimes a lover acts against the good of the beloved because of his desire, jealousy, possessiveness, and envy, and sometimes he acts even against himself when, as a rejected lover in the worse-case scenario, he takes his own life. For these reasons, Socrates favours a friend over a lover. Socrates thinks that if a lover behaves against his or his beloved’s goodness, then Eros must not be God. After all, God should do Men good and should uplift lovers into the realms of Heavenly bliss. Socrates, however, a little later on, changes his mind and says that he was wrong by stating that Eros is not a God. In fact, Eros is connected with the true love(r). “The ‘’true lover’’ has a mania for the good, and this kind of mania, coming from the divine, is superior to human self-control of irrational passions … and is an expression of the desire of the immortal soul, which has experienced the supreme good/beauty of the divine and wants to reclaim it.” (A. H. Kissel).

The soul, however, has the elements of the rational, harmonious, good and the disharmonious, aggressive, bad which are like the “good horse” (metaphorically presented as a white horse) and the ”bad horse” (metaphorically presented as a black horse) that must be driven in concord; when these elements are disordered, the soul loses its wings and adds a mortal body (Plato, 1963). “The goal of the incarnated soul is to learn how to manage the ‘bad horse’ through habitual reining-in, in order that its wings grow again; the soul must regain self-control and true knowledge” (A. H. Kissel. But many souls mistake “their own opinions for true knowledge” (Plato, 1963, 248b). Souls which have better and deeper knowledge and understanding of our heavenly origins and are in better accord with their heavenly nature are incarnated as better beings. According to this, the true lover of wisdom and the good, that is, the philosopher, is on the top of all Man. The same holds for an artist (the true lover of beauty). Others follow in the next order: the just king, the statesman, the doctor, the prophet and priest, the representational artist (poet), the manual labourer, the sophist, and last, the tyrant. The just are reincarnated to a higher level, and the unjust to a lower level, until the wings grow back and heaven is regained. True and divine love occurs when a lover meets his lover on the same level (as lovers are like mirrors to each other) which is why Socrates states that people who attract one another do so because they are the followers of a certain deity who help each other to ascend. (That is the reason why, for instance, people who love wisdom and justice follow Zeus, the ones who love royal treats follow Apollo, the ones who like to fight follow Ares, and so on.) But most importantly, a “true love is a divine one as far as it is connected with virtue, justice, modesty, inspiration, enthusiasm and self-control, and it only occurs when lovers bring of each other their best godlike qualities” (Plato, 1963, 253b).

In the last part of the Pheadrus, Socrates states that those who know divine love also know how to discern a good speech that conveys truth, goodness, and beauty from a false one by drawing on analogy of irrational and true love as stated above. “Writing speeches is not in itself a shameful thing. It’s not speaking or writing well that’s shameful; what’s really shameful is to engage in either of them shamefully or badly” (ibid., 258d).

b. Aristotle

Upon Plato’s death, Aristotle left for Assos in Mysia (today known as Turkey), where he and Xenocrates (c. 396 B.C.E.-c. 314 B.C.E.) joined a small circle of Platonists who had already settled there under Hermias, the ruler of Atarneus. Under the protection of Antipater, Alexander’s representative in Athens, Aristotle established a philosophical school of his own, the Lyceum, also known as the Peripatetic School due to its colonnaded walk.

Aristotle speaks about love mostly in Nicomachean Ethics, books VIII and IX. He speaks about Philia (friendship-like love) as the highest form of spiritual love and having the highest spiritual value. This kind of friendship is friendship of the same and not based on any external benefits. It is led by reciprocal sympathy, support and encouragement of virtues, emotions, intellectual aspirations, and spirit. “For all friendship is for the sake of good or of pleasure-good … and is based on a certain resemblance; and to a friendship of good men all the qualities we have named belong in virtue of the nature of the friends themselves….” (VIII:3, 1156b, trans. Ross). We can’t have many such friends, however, because our time is limited.

But when Aristotle says that a person needs to abandon his Philia for a friend if he changes or becomes vicious, this does not mean that he terminates friendship due to his own interest. He means that it happens because one of the friends realizes that he can’t do anything to contribute to the goodness of the other. He describes an example when we cannot talk of a true honest friendship any longer—when friendship is based only on pleasure and benefit. In the case of friendship based on benefits, friends are used only as a means to achieve a certain purpose (some goods, whether symbolic or material) and those who are together with others only for pleasure do not love the friend for his own sake but for their own pleasure. Such friendships cannot last long because when the reasons for friendship vanish, the friendship itself disappears. Friendships formed on the basis of pleasure or benefit can be formed between two bad people or between good and bad people, but true friendship can be formed only between two good people. Good people are friends because they themselves are good. Bad people do not feel any pleasant feelings towards a friend unless he offers some kind of benefit. According to Aristotle, friendship does not show only the values and preferences of the society and the country, but also, more importantly, the moral character of a person.

Friends who love each other love in them what they themselves believe to be of value:

We love in friends that which represents a value for us—a friend is a representation of a certain value. Thus, when a good person becomes our friend he himself is of value to us. Friends receive and give the same amount of good wishes and time, and feel the same joy or happiness in each other. True friendship is equality in all aspects, as a true friend is another self. (VIII:3, 1166a–­1172)

And what does Aristotle say on the relationship between man and woman, as seen in Book VIII? Friendship between men and women, in his eyes, seems to exist by nature and humans are tend to form couples more than they form cities, as the household came earlier and is just as necessary as the city. Other animals unite only for the purpose of reproduction, but human beings live together also for other purposes of life. However, Aristotle still thought a lot within the biological domain, meaning that for him

… from the start the functions are divided, and those of man and woman are different; so they help each other by throwing their peculiar gifts into the common stock. It is for these reasons that both utility and pleasure seem to be found in this kind of friendship. But this friendship may be based also on virtue, if the parties are good; for each has its own virtue and they will delight in the fact. (VIII:12, 1162a)

And children seem to be a bond of union; for “children are a good common to both, and what is common holds them together” (VIII:12, 1162a, 14–31). Parents love their children as they love themselves, and children love their parents because their being comes from them. Siblings love each other because of their common parentage. The friendship between siblings and kinsmen is like being comrades. The friendship between parents and children is much more pleasurable than other friendships due to the long sharing of lives. However, friendship between parents and children is not equal, as they have contributed different things to the relationship and the parents hold a superior position. The same, Aristotle thinks, holds for man (husband) being superior to woman (wife). However, even Stoics a little later on thought of man and woman, husband and wife, as equal since we are all endowed with a divine mind/spirit. Being loved is desirable in itself, preferable even to being honoured.

3. Christian Period

a. St. Paul

St. Paul is the most important of the Apostles who taught the Gospel of Christ in the first century. Fourteen epistles in the New Testament have been credited to Paul. Seven are considered to be genuine (Romans, First Corinthians, Second Corinthians, Galatians, Philippians, First Thessalonians, and Philemon), three are doubtful, and the final four are believed not to have been written by him. Paul’s works contain the first written account of what it means to be a Christian and thus the first account of Christian spirituality.

St. Paul is most known by his letters to Romans and Corinthians. In the Letter to the Romans he says: “For with the heart, one believes resulting in righteousness; and with the mouth confession is made resulting in salvation” (Romans 10:10, World English Bible). One who speaks about faith in God makes others happy, offers consolation, and invites other people on the path of Jesus Christ, and secondly, one who talks about God and His revelation, recognition, prophecy, and teaching, is building a church of God. Through annunciation of the holy wisdom he addresses those ready to be redeemed and consecrated into eternal life through love, hope, and faith and by leaving behind their carnal body. According to St. Paul there exist two bodies: the carnal (lustful) and the heavenly (pure) within a unity called God’s temple or the Holy Spirit.

But what is spiritual and heavenly cannot be seen with the eyes nor heard with the ears. “However, we acquire a spiritual body only through the death of the carnal, sensual body. We have a carnal body which needs to die in order to allow a spiritual body to be born through Jesus Christ, crucified God” (Nygren, 1953, p. 203). But this raises a paradoxical question: how did we come to this transient world if there is no other God; are things flowing into the world from two different sources? We should approach the God who is (in) this world and more than this world differently from our perspective of death, law, desire, knowledge, and power. Instead, Paul talks of grace, faith, love, and hope. Jewish religion and tradition, for instance, maintains that God is a transcendence which cannot be attained by men; however, in Christianity man can reach God through becoming like Christ on the Cross. The resurrection of Christ is an event which broke the law of death and enabled a new life with God and in God through the grace of God.

And essential for this new life is unconditional love (Agape), which people were given as a gift by Jesus Christ. Christ, who sacrificed himself for all people: all we have to do is to open up to his love. And what is Agape? St. Paul in his Letter to the Corinthians says:

Love is patient and is kind; love doesn’t envy. Love doesn’t brag, is not proud, does not behave itself inappropriately … does not rejoice in unrighteousness, but rejoices with the truth; bears all things, believes all things, hopes all things, endures all things. Love never fails. (1 Corinthians 13:5)

Christ is the only source of love in the world that combines words (thoughts) and actions and gifts. If we did not experience unconditional love that was found through crucified Christ, we would not know God’s love in the Christian sense of the word. Paul sees in the Christ from the Cross an event of sacrifice, in fact God’s own sacrifice. God’s love is not one that desires but gives. With this Paul emphasizes the features of Christian Love that are spontaneous and the altruistic nature of God’s unconditional love (Agape), which manifested upon Christ’s death for the poor, weak, ill, foreigners, enemies, and atheists.

Agape, as a self-sacrificed love, is reflected in the commandments:

“You shall not commit adultery,” “You shall not murder,” “You shall not steal,” “You shall not covet,” and whatever other commandments there are, are all summed up in this saying, namely “You shall love your neighbour as yourself.” Love doesn’t harm a neighbour. Love therefore is the fulfilment of the law.” (Romans 13:09–13.11)

This law of God’s universal love, which is mapped onto the love for your neighbour as love for yourself, Paul thus defined as undivided and undefined faith with the fewest number of laws/prohibitions possible.

Concrete implications of God’s unconditional love can be seen also in the relationship between man and woman. According to Paul, women are mysterious, dark, and penetrable, while men are open, light, and penetrating, but in the face of God all people and beings are equal: men, women, Jews, Greeks, Christians. “Let the husband give his wife the affection owed her, and likewise also the wife her husband. The wife doesn’t have authority over her own body, but the husband. Likewise, also the husband doesn’t have authority over his own body, but the wife” (1 Corinthians 7:3–7:5).

God in general prefers asceticism and celibacy. However, good Christians need to give these up if they wish to marry and have children. Thus, God allows sexual intercourse but only for having children, because reproduction serves to continue the human species and does not encourage sin and desire for pleasure of flesh. On the other hand, Christianity produced the difference between men and women by stating that man is better and above woman: “But I would have you know that the head of every man is Christ, and the head of the woman is man, and the head of Christ is God.” Corinthians 11:3). It is obvious that in this view woman and man are not equal as stated, and this led to a long road of female subjugation, injustice, and suffering.

b. St. Augustine

St. Augustine was an early Christian theologian whose writings were very influential in the development of Western Christianity and Western philosophy. He was on one hand Plato’s follower, and his critic in the light of neoplatonism, and on the other hand he was an interpreter of Christian teachings, especially those of St. Paul and other apostles. He was the first to create and establish a concept of love that included Eros and Agape in the form of Caritas.

Greatly influenced by Neoplatonist versions of Symposium and his studies of Agape, St. Augustine in his early period described a positive paradigm of Christian life, in the sense of Agape through different stages, in works such as De Quantitate Animae and De Genesi contra Manicheos. In these works, he fights against the teachings of the Manicheans who were inspired by Mani (3rd cn. C.E. in Babylonia). Later on, however, he refutes this kind of Platonic ascension and develops his own kind of Christian Agape and platonic Eros, which is neither Eros nor Agape, but Caritas. What is the reason for Augustine’s combination of Eros and Agape? Where does he see a flaw in Eros that must be repaired by Agape? The answer lies in pride (superbia), which is connected with Eros.

He writes in Confessions: “When the soul ascends higher and higher into the spiritual realm, person starts getting a feeling of pride and self-sufficiency which makes that person stay within himself instead of reaching beyond the self towards the heavenly.” (Augustine, 1960, p. 39). This is because man cannot reach heaven by himself. Although Platonic Eros presents love built on human will, power, and knowledge (which will bring us to heavenly domain of the Ideas), to Augustine this is false, and only God himself can free and redeem us as Augustine states in his famous work City of God: “In order to heal human pride, God’s son descended to show the way to became humble” (Augustine, 1994a, p. 273: VIII:7, ) and continues: “… pride is the beginning of the sin … Therefore, humbleness is highly advised in the city of God.” (XIV:13). This is the reason why Christian spirit emphasizes humbleness (humilitas), which is Jesus Christ. Augustine saw the remedy for Eros’s pride and self-sufficiency, preventing Eros reaching its goal, as God’s love or Caritas.

And what is God?

All people see God as the highest, most beautiful, the brightest, eternal, wise, good, true and truthful entity who ever existed at all. No one on the Earth possesses the features God has. He is life itself, pure love and the origin of everything that is: God … gives preference to that which lives before to that which is dead and he is the highest Good (Summum Bonum). (Augustine, 1994a, p. 524, note 1).

Even more, death is the biggest enemy of the heavenly kingdom, therefore Augustine concludes that: “… life will be truly happy when it is going to be eternal” (Augustine, 1994a, p. 25). Hannah Arendt correctly observes that such a concept of love was defined in two steps: “First, that which is good is an object of yearning, i.e. something useful which can be found in this world and we hope to get into everlasting possession. In the second, good is defined through fear of death and destruction” (Arendt, 1996, p. 12).

Augustine’s introduction of human (soul) yearning for the highest good (Summum Bonum) and eternal life reveals an additional difference between Man and God. Namely, people are, contrary to God, made creatures—and live solely through him. A man-made creature does not possess his own bonum but he needs to find it—which is achieved through love as a yearning to acquire good. Happiness is thus having this good and keeping it in our life. Desire and yearning is thus a sign of a created creature, whereas God himself is without desire and lives according to himself and through himself. Such a God is self-sufficient and autarkical. The fundamental difference between God’s made creatures and their Creator is in the metaphysical difference between eternity and time. Creatures belong to the world of transitions: created beings never fully exist (the past is gone, the future is yet to be), and they exist only in now which soon turns into the past—what truly exists is only now which is not in time, but in eternity, which is God.

However, this is not the whole story of love, because Augustine divides love into that which is good/proper/right and that which is bad/false, according to the object desired—the choice of the object is very important because we become what we love. Therefore, if a loving one chooses created and transient objects of this world, we have love called Cupiditas; if he chooses an eternal and non-created object (God), we have Caritas.

4. The Enlightenment Period

a. Rousseau

Jean Jacques Rousseau was a philosopher, pedagogue, composer, writer, and one of the first autobiographers in the world. His political ideas were highly influential for the French Revolution and later for socialism and even nationalism. In his early writings, Rousseau claimed again and again that human nature was corrupted by the habits and manners of society in the big cities, which made people shift from natural (moral, political, spiritual) values to artificial and immoral values, based only on looks, superficial talk, material goods, and civil and cultural conventions. Rousseau notices this corruption on social and personal levels in the relationships between men and women, thus he suggested a new way to form loving relationships.

In Julie, or the New Heloise, we follow a romantic and tragic love story between Saint-Preux and Julie. According to Rousseau, a man and a woman seal their love in marriage when they feel that they cannot change what they feel for each other: “We share the same picture of the world…. we have the same outlook on the world and why would I not believe that what we share in our hearts we also share in the level of our beliefs and judgements” (1984, book 1, p. 65). Another important component of true love is benevolence: “Man can resist almost anything but benevolence, and in order to get benevolence you give it” (ibid, p. 190). And there exists yet another feature of love: enthusiasm, which not only provides lovers and partners with enormous energy, but also drives them beyond themselves and towards the ideal of perfection and highest moral virtue. For Rousseau, love is goodness that works for and has its origin in a balanced nature of a person. Love originates in a good-natured person from a balanced combination of our instincts, heart, mind, and soul: what the heart feels, the mind confirms. Reason is also important for love, so that lovers know how to lead and handle their needs and desires properly.

However, what has not been said so far is that Saint-Preux was at first Julie’s teacher and, to his surprise and despite all they felt and discovered, she later married the older, wealthy, and educated de Wolmar, and they all lived on a property called Clarens. Even more interesting is that Rousseau wrote a love story in which, even after Julie gave birth to two children, she remained in love with Saint-Preux and later admitted her affair to de Wolmar, who was saddened upon learning this fact but continued to love her nonetheless. But why did Rousseau put an obstacle to Saint-Preux’s and Julie’s love, and why did Julie accepted to marry the older and wealthy de Wolmar? Jean Starobinski in his book Transparency and Obstruction provides a plausible insight:

By introducing a marriage with older, de Wolmar, and having children with him, Rousseau simply tried to include “all” into a new kind of society he envisioned, in which no one would be left out: Julie would fulfil her parent’s wishes and comply with the moral order of that time, de Wolmar would get the girl he wanted, Julie continues her pedigree and Saint-Preux and Julie remain in love: what we find again in a higher level is a new love and new society which coincide. Erotic demand and demand for order are eventually in peace with each other…. In the refreshed society benevolence and gentle sympathy rule, and this is the result of a total transparency of consciousness of the people living at Clarens. (1988, p.104)

All this sounds ideal, and we would expect that we reached the final level of true love and community. However, we are faced with yet another surprise—Julie’s death at the end. Why would Rousseau want Julie to die? Julie dies because she had fulfilled the duty of moral-social order but not her personal wish for a happy life together with the one she truly loved. The last words of Julie to Saint Preux clearly reveal this: “No, I am not leaving you, I go to wait for you. The virtue that set us apart on earth will bring us back together in the eternal home” (ibid., p. 409).

But if Rousseau showed us the tragic-passionate love in Julie, he clearly set up a description of a marriage in his famous work Emile: Or On Education where he, for the first time in Western society, describes a basis for a free romantic love, sealed in marriage without the pressure of social moral order or duty.

Rousseau in the first half of Emile presents the whole physical, emotional, rational, and spiritual upbringing of a child (Emile), according to which pedagogy as a field came into existence. This article won’t go into that, but will shortly present the fifth book of Emile and Rousseau’s opinion of the love between the pubescent Sophie and Emile. At this age they are both mature enough to meet and know each other and to seal their love in marriage. It is clear from the start that Rousseau does not promote equality of men and women, but sees them as complements to one another in the eyes of nature. And from the nature argument he infers that a man is (or should be) superior and a woman inferior, as they both serve the same end, their union and reproduction, but in different ways; each with their own means, capabilities, and contributions. And it is based on this inference that Rousseau proposes the first moral difference between genders: a man is active, bright, strong, a leader, proud, and a penetrator, and a woman is passive, dark, penetrable, weak, a follower, modest, and full of grace; a man needs to have power and will (and needs to develop musculature), and a woman needs to not offer too much resistance but instead possess grace and charm with which to seduce. A man, Rousseau says, is more of the head (reason, intelligence, knowledge) and spirit, while a woman is more in tune with the heart, body, and intuition. A man is made for ruling and the public sphere, and a woman for obeying and the domestic sphere: she needs to learn how to bring up children and please her husband as this is her task and the reason for her origin (design). Her domain is the house, children, husband, and garden, as Rousseau claims, and the husband is immersed in intellectual, creative, and spiritual matters and matters of controlling, manipulating, and maintaining his “garden.” A man also needs to learn how to please his wife, however, in order to not make her bitter and angry. Because a bitter and angry wife does not fulfil her marital duties and is not a good mother.

Rousseau knew that he assigned an unequal status to men and women, yet he stated that this was due to a higher unity called family, and that the new society is built on diversity and difference as seen in nature (which to a degree resembles Aristotle’s view). In this way we can read Emile: Or On Education as some sort of guide to marriage, which was highly influential in the 18th century. But it is still unclear why Rousseau, who was so liberal and open-minded in other areas, was so conservative in gender matters.

5. The Modern and Postmodern Periods

a. Sigmund Freud

Sigmund Freud was trained in medicine (neurophysiology) and later became the founding father of psychoanalysis. Freud set up a practice in neuropsychiatry with the help of Joseph Breuer. That is how he came to know Anna O., who was Joseph Breuer’s patient from 1880 through 1882. Eleven years later, Breuer and Freud wrote a book on hysteria in which they claimed that when a client becomes aware of the meanings of his or her symptoms (as can occur through hypnosis), unexpressed emotions find release and no longer exhibit themselves as symptoms. Breuer called this catharsis, from the Greek word for cleansing, and through catharsis, Anna lost many symptoms of her hysteria. Freud also noted that Breuer and Anna were falling in love with one another. (This later served as the basis for his idea of transference love.)

One of Freud’s most amazing achievements, however, was the discovery of the processes of the unconscious mind. Freud found out from his practice that the unconscious mind signals coded messages in the form of dreams and symptoms, which must be deciphered by the analyst. Freud’s way of provoking the unconscious mind was by using rememoration or associative language, which means speaking freely until the answer to the problem surfaces. At some point, however, associative language could not provide any more answers and the language was interrupted by what Freud called resistance and silence resulted. Freud found out that this silence serves as a birthplace not only for love, but also for our drives (Freud, 1995). Love is that which starts showing itself through language and moves to that which is beyond language—into drives.

And what is a drive that is not an animal instinct? In his famous work Three Essays on the Theory of Sexuality (1905), Freud tells us that drive presents itself without words, mostly through crying and meaningless shouts—some sort of stream of energy where there are no borders between subjects and objects. These shouts reach their limit with the use of swear words. Just after  swear words we come to the border, and when it is crossed language appears and the drive disappears. Subjectivity, reflection, and distance appear and the drive is transformed. The border can be crossed from the other side: When words are without power and the subject disappears, it makes a space for an uncontrolled stream of energy, which flashes away the distance and intermediary and enables a state that is solid and liquid at the same time.

Where does drive originate? Freud sees drives as a borderline between our body and psyche, composed of four components: on one side, we have the pair of tension and pressure and, on the other side, the pair of aim and goal. The first two have physical bases and the other two psychological bases. The overall source of drive, however, lies in our body, which is a combination of sexual organs, genes, and hormones that all form some sort of energetic tension inside the body, which can be released with heterosexual intercourse. But Belgian psychoanalyst Paul Verhaeghe in his work Love in a Time of Loneliness (1990) is against this notion of drives because, in his opinion, it ignores one of two important aspects of drives: each drive is always partial and autoerotic. Consequently, he thinks that a drive is neither heterosexual nor homosexual. When he says that a drive is partial, he means that something in particular attracts us to the other person (not necessarily of the opposite sex) and vice versa—this attraction includes different parts of the body and other activities as well, either passive or active, and does not necessarily lead to intercourse with the aim of procreation. Interestingly enough, a drive does not need the whole body, but only parts of the body, hence the different drives: oral, anal, voyeuristic, exhibitionistic, and the like. Also, all these body parts represent our contact with the external world: mouth, eyes, ears, nose, breasts, feet, genitals, and anus, which accompany activities such as smelling, watching, listening, touching, sucking, and penetration.

In the pleasure we get from our drive’s tendency to release tension, by tearing down the barriers of our ego (via sobbing, shouts, swears) and then putting them up again (via language), Freud recognizes drive’s connection to death and life. Freud named these two tendencies of each drive Thanatos and Eros, and claimed that they are intrinsically connected into a whole. The definitions of Eros and Thanatos are taken from Empedocles’s definitions of Philotes and Neikos as fundamental ontological principles. Eros carries the power of uniting different elements into a bigger unity: Eros is the union of different elements so division does not exist anymore. Thanatos is, on the contrary, a process of fragmentation, an explosion, a big bang which releases tension. According to Freud, drives aim at the pleasure of reaching the original, zero-tension, or unity of mind-spirit-body, which Lacan later calls jouissance, the energy of the highest pleasure.

Freud and, later, Lacan thought that love and successful relationships (partnership or marriage) depend on a solution of the internal conflict between drive and desire—this duality Freud saw in the division between pleasure of sexual drive and a desire for love. Other divisions are consciousness and unconscious, ego, id, and superego, and sensual, sexual, and emotional levels of our being.

Freud identifies the beginning of duality of drive and love in the mother/child relationship, with the first activity of pleasure being a child’s sucking to drink milk. Consequently, the birth of desire, love, and yearning bear witness to these lost original first years of the child’s relationship with his mother, which serves as a matrix for all subsequent relationships, in which people try either to replicate it or deny it and replace it with another better one. This kind of love that we as grownups try to repeat Freud calls, as mentioned earlier, transference love. Freud came to know this through sessions with his patients who fell in love with him, although he recognized that they were not actually in love with him but had transferred their original attachment to their father to him.

According to Freud this first relationship with our parents (especially mother) shows the following traits of totality and exclusivity (unity of mother and child), loss (the aforementioned totality is lost after the birth, especially with the introduction of language), and power (the mother and child relationship changes and starts to include giving, receiving, rejection, forgiveness, and reparation, which are constitutive of their relationship).

In addition, in Totem and Taboo: Resemblances between the Psychic Lives of Savages and Neurotics (1913), Freud uses the story of King Oedipus to create and illustrate the so-called Oedipus Complex, in which the superego (the universal law, the law of the father), uses guilt to prevent continuation of incestuously oriented relationships between mother and child. “In Western patriarchal societies, the boy learns that a solution to the manqué of the mother lies in replacing her with the father/man and his genital organ and by promising himself that someday he, likewise, will be a big and a powerful man” (p. 48).

b. Duties to Children

At one time, it was thought that children had only duties and did not have rights as well: we used to believe that children had duties to their parents, duties such as to love thy parents, obey them, and care for them when they grow old, but times change and philosophers, sociologists, anthropologists, social workers, and others started debating about the rights of children and about whether parents had duties toward their children, such as to love them, as well. For example, philosophers such as Liao, Boylan, and Feinberg in their articles present several positions regarding duties to children related to correlative claim rights, and one of the most important is to love them. But why do they take such a position, that duty must correlate with claim rights, and why do they emphasize that parents need to love their children?

It is obvious that children are the most vulnerable people on the planet and are likely to fall to poverty, illness, and death due to illnesses and violence. “Children are also very susceptible to violence and exploitation through child labor, land mines, war, sex trafficking, and other sorts of exploitation…. And … many children face dropout in the secondary school and even less of them go to college and university.” (Boylan, 2011, p. 2). All the facts listed show that children are a vulnerable group that need special care, love, understanding, and protection. Before we can take a justified position regarding the duties parents may have towards their children, however, we need to understand and define what love is in this regard. Matthew Liao, in his article “The right of children to be loved” (2006b), argues that children, as human beings, have the right to the essential goods, possibilities, and conditions necessary for human beings to pursue the good life, their own and others.

Rights are powerful tools of protection and therefore having rights to the essential conditions for a good life is of primary importance to human beings. Whatever else they may want, most human beings would want to have a good life. Children being loved is one of the most essential conditions for a good life.” (pp.424–425).

Mere provision of the structural goods necessary for as many options as possible is not the best of all possible worlds. Love and doing well for the child are also necessary.

There is something odd, however, about declaring it a duty of parents to love their children. This is because love is often considered to be under the genus of emotions. Emotions are often taken to be out of one’s direct control, and “love out of inclination cannot be commanded” (Kant, 2003, p. 161). Is this completely true, and how can we reasonably argue for parents’ duty to love their children? Again Liao, in his article “The right of children to be loved’ (2006b), presents a reasonable and favourable argument as to why parental love is a necessary component of parenting. One strong reason is that many children, despite “being well fed, have died or have suffered serious physical, social and cognitive harms as a result of lack of love. So, even granting that being fed is more urgent then being loved, we still should give the right of children to be loved a very high priority.” (p. 25). Liao thus claims that a strong sense of warmth and affection is a crucial part of the emotional aspects of parental care and love. In this way, the claim that children need to be loved is an empirical claim.

It is also argued that children need this emotional aspect of love in order to develop certain capacities necessary to pursue a good life:

Human beings need certain basic goods, such as food, water and air in order to sustain themselves corporeally. In order to be able to pursue the good life, they also need certain basic capacities such as the capacity to think, to feel, to be motivated by facts, to know, to choose and act freely (liberty), to appreciate the worth of something, to develop interpersonal relationships and to have control of the direction of their life (autonomy). Finally, in order to exercise these capacities, they need to have some opportunities for jobs, social interaction, acquiring further knowledge, evaluating and appreciating things and determining the direction of their lives.” (ibid., p. 10–11).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Arendt, Hannah (1996). Love and St. Augustine. Chicago, IL: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Augustine (1955). Treatises on marriage and other subjects. Roy J. Deferrari (Ed.). Washington, DC: Catholic University of America Press.
  • Augustine (1960). The confessions of Saint Augustine (John K. Ryan, Trans.). New York, NY: Image Books.
  • Augustine (1994a). The city of God (Marcus Dods, trans.). Peabody, MA: Hendrickson Publishers.
  • Augustine (1994b). On Christian doctrine. In Philip Schaff (Ed.), A select library of the Nicene and post-Nicene fathers. Peabody, MA: Hendrickson Publishers.
  • Boylan, Michael (2011). Duties to children. In Michael Boylan (Ed.), The morality and global justice reader (385–405). Boulder, CO: Westview.
  • Cranston, Maurice (1991). Jean-Jacques: The early life and work of Jean-Jacques Rousseau, 1712–1754. Chicago, IL: The University of Chicago Press.
  • Feinberg, M (1980). The child’s right to an open future. In W. Aiken & H. LaFollette (Eds.), Whose child? Children’s rights, parental authority, and state power (124–153). New Jersey, NJ: Littlefield, Adams, & Co.
  • Freud, Sigmund (1913). Totem und tabu: Einige übereinstimmungen im seelenleben der wilden und der neurotiker [Totem and Taboo: Resemblances between the Psychic Lives of Savages and Neurotics]. Leipzig, Germany: Hugo Heller.
  • Freud, Sigmund (1968). Moses and monotheism. Hertfordshire, United Kingdom: The Garden City Press.
  • Freud, Sigmund (1989). Totem and taboo. New York, NY: W. W. Norton & Company, Inc.
  • Freud, Sigmund (1995). Opombe o transferni ljubezni [Comments on transference love]. Problemi, 33(1–2), 53–63.
  • Freud, Sigmund (1997). Sexuality and the psychology of love. Philip Rieff (Ed.). New York, NY: Touchstone Edition.
  • Freud, Sigmund (2000). Three essays on the theory of sexuality (James Strachey, trans.). New York, NY: Basic Books.
  • Grimsley, Ronald (1973). The philosophy of Rousseau. Oxford, United Kingdom: Oxford University Press.
  • Guthrie, W. K. C. (1956). Plato: Protagoras and Meno. London, United Kingdom: Sage.
  • Kirk, Geoffrey S., & Raven, John E. (1984). The presocratic philosophers. Cambridge, United Kingdom: Cambridge University Press.
  • Kingsley, Peter (1995). Ancient philosophy, mystery, and magic: Empedocles and
  • Pythagorean tradition. Oxford, United Kingdom: Oxford University Press.
  • Kant, Immanuel (2003). Utemeljitev metafizike nravnosti [The metaphysics of morals]. Ljubljana, Slovenia: Založba ZRC.
  • Lacan, Jacques (1994). Sections from his work on transference. Filozofija skozi
  • psihoanalizo [Philosophy through psychoanalysis]. Ljubljana, Slovenia: Analecta.
  • Liao, S. Matthew (2006a). The idea of a duty to love. Journal of Value Inquiry 40(1): 1–22.
  • Liao, S. Matthew (2006b). The right of children to be loved. Journal of Political Philosophy 14(4), 420–440.
  • Liao, S. Matthew (2012). Why children need to be loved. Critical Review of International Social and Political Philosophy 15(3), 347–358.
  • Martin, Alain, & Primavesi, Oliver (1998). L’Empédocle de Strasbourg (P. Strasb. gr. Inv. 1665–1666). Berlin, Germany: Walter de Gruyter.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (1986). The fragility of goodness: Luck and ethics in Greek tragedy and philosophy. Cambridge, United Kingdom: Cambridge University Press.
  • Nussbaum, Martha (2001). Upheavals of Thought: The intelligence of emotions. New York, NY: Cambridge University Press. Nygren, Anders (1953). Agape and Eros. London, United Kingdom: S.P.C.K.
  • Plato (1960). Symposium (S. Groden, trans.). Amherst, MA: University of Massachusetts Press.
  • Plato (1963). Eutyphro and Phaedrus. In Edith Hamilton & Huntington Cairns (Eds.), The collected dialogues. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Rousseau, Jean Jacques (1979). Emile: Or on education (Allan Bloom, trans.). London, United Kingdom: Basic Books.
  • Rousseau, Jean Jacques (1997). Julie, or the new Heloise: Letters of two lovers who live in a small town at the foot of the Alps (Philip Stewart, trans.). Lebanon, NH: University Press of New England.
  • Spinoza, Baruch (1992). The Ethics (Seymour Feldman, trans.). Indianapolis, IN: Hackett.
  • Starobinski, Jean (1988). Jean-Jacques Rousseau: Transparency and obstruction. Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Tobler, Waldo (1970). A computer movie simulating urban growth in the Detroit region. Economic Geography, 46(2), 234–240.
  • Verhaeghe, Paul (1999). Love in a time of loneliness. London, United Kingdom: Rebus.


Author Information

Katarina Majerhold
Email: katarina.majerhold@gmail.com