Lucretius (c. 99—c. 55 B.C.E.)
Lucretius (Titus Lucretius Carus) was a Roman poet and the author of the philosophical epic De Rerum Natura (On the Nature of the Universe), a comprehensive exposition of the Epicurean world-view. Very little is known of the poet’s life, though a sense of his character and personality emerges vividly from his poem. The stress and tumult of his times stands in the background of his work and partly explains his personal attraction and commitment to Epicureanism, with its elevation of intellectual pleasure and tranquility of mind and its dim view of the world of social strife and political violence. His epic is presented in six books and undertakes a full and completely naturalistic explanation of the physical origin, structure, and destiny of the universe. Included in this presentation are theories of the atomic structure of matter and the emergence and evolution of life forms – ideas that would eventually form a crucial foundation and background for the development of western science. In addition to his literary and scientific influence, Lucretius has been a major source of inspiration for a wide range of modern philosophers, including Gassendi, Bergson, Spencer, Whitehead, and Teilhard de Chardin.
Table of Contents
- References and Further Reading
Of Lucretius’ life remarkably little is known: he was an accomplished poet; he lived during the first century BC; he was devoted to the teachings of Epicurus; and he apparently died before his magnum opus, De Rerum Natura, was completed. Almost everything else we know (or think we know) about this elusive figure is a matter of conjecture, rumor, legend, or gossip.
Some scholars have imagined that this lack of information is the result of a sinister plot – a conspiracy of silence supposedly conducted by pious Roman and early Christian writers bent on suppressing the poet’s anti-religious sentiments and materialist blasphemies. Yet perhaps more vexing for our understanding of Lucretius than any conspiracy of silence has been the single lurid item about his death that appears in a fourth century chronicle history by St. Jerome:
[sic] BC. . . The poet Titus Lucretius is born. He was later driven mad by a love philtre and, having composed between bouts of insanity several books (which Cicero afterwards corrected), committed suicide at the age of 44.
Certainly the possibility that Lucretius (whose blistering, two hundred line denunciation of sexual love comprises one of the memorable highlights of the poem) may himself have fallen victim to a love potion is a superb irony. Unfortunately, there is not a shred of evidence to support the claim. Nor is it highly likely that Cicero (a skeptical-minded thinker with sympathies toward Stoicism) would have assisted to any large degree in the publication of an epic celebrating the Epicurean creed. As for the suggestion that Lucretius produced De Rerum Natura in lucid periods between intervals of raging insanity, the poem itself stands as a strong argument to the contrary. At the very least it must be considered improbable that a work of such scope and complexity, of such intellectual depth and sustained reasoning power, could have been the product of fitful composition and a diseased mind.
Fortunately, even if we dismiss Jerome’s account as little more than an edifying fable and resign ourselves to the absence of even a scrap of reliable biographical information on Lucretius, there is still one source we can turn to for valuable insights into the poet’s character, personality, and habits of mind, and that is De Rerum Natura itself. For although the poem tells us almost nothing about the day to day affairs of Lucretius the man, it nevertheless furnishes a large and revealing portrait of Lucretius the poet, philosopher, social commentator, critic of religion, and observer of the world.
Indeed one does not have to read very far into the poem to discover that not only is Lucretius a serious student of philosophy and science, but that above all he is a great poet of nature. He reveals himself as a lover of woods, fields, streams, and open spaces, acutely sensitive to the beauties of landscape and the march of seasons. He proves a keen observer of plants and animals and at least as knowledgeable and interested in crops, weather, soil, and horticulture as in the existence of gods or the motion of atoms. The preponderance of natural descriptions and images in the poem has led some readers to suppose that the author must have led some form of rural existence, perhaps as the owner of a country estate. True or not, it is clearly not the city, with its hurly-burly of commerce, money grubbing, social climbing, and political strife, but the quiet countryside with its contemplative retreats, solitude, and simple pleasures that inspires his poetry and (as was the case with his master Epicurus in his garden at Athens) his philosophical reveries.
It is generally assumed that the poet, as his name implies, was a member of the aristocratic clan of the Lucretii. On the other hand, it is also possible that he was a former slave and freedman of that same noble family. Support for the idea of his nobility comes in part from his suave command of learning and the polished mastery of his style, but mostly from the easy and natural way (friend to friend, rather than subordinate to superior) in which he addresses Memmius, his literary patron and the addressee of the poem.
Gaius Memmius was a Roman patrician who was at one time married to Sulla’s daughter, Fausta. In 54 BC (one year after Lucretius’ death), he stood for consul, but was defeated owing to an electoral violation, which he himself revealed but was afterwards condemned for. In 52 BC he went into exile at Athens, and it is unknown whether he ever returned to Rome. Lucretius dedicated his poem to him, and throughout the epic the poet is at pains to remind Memmius of the sweet rewards of the Epicurean lifestyle and the bitter tribulations of public life. No doubt it would have distressed the poet deeply to know that his chief literary sponsor, instead of following the lofty path to Epicurean tranquilitas, ended his career with a vain descent into the tarnishing world of power politics and personal ambition.
Literary tradition has supplied Lucretius with a wife, Lucilla. However, except for a line or two in the poem suggesting the author’s personal familiarity with marital discord and the bedroom practices of “our Roman wives” (4. 1277), there is no evidence that he himself was ever married.
For the most part, the forty-four years of Lucretius’ lifetime was a period of nearly non-stop violence: a time of civil wars, grueling overseas campaigns, political assassinations, massacres, revolts, conspiracies, mass executions, and social and economic chaos. Even a brief chronology of the times paints a grim picture of devastation, with each decade bearing witness to some new disturbance or uprising:
100 BC: riots erupt in the streets of Rome; two public officials, the tribune L. Appuleius Saturninus and praetor C. Servilius Glaucia, are murdered. 91 BC: the so-called Social War (between Rome and her Italian allies) breaks out. No sooner is this bitter struggle ended (88 BC) than Lucius Cornelius Sulla, a ruthless politician and renegade army commander, marches on Rome, and an even more convulsive and bloody Civil War begins. 82 BC: Sulla becomes dictator. His infamous proscription results in the arrest and execution of more than 4000 leading citizens, including 40 senators. 71 BC: Spartacus’ massive slave revolt (involving an army of 90,000 former slaves and outlaws) is finally put down by Cassius and Pompey. More than 6000 of the captured rebels are crucified and their bodies left for display along the Appian Way. 62 BC: Defeat and death of Catiline. By this point in his career this former lieutenant of Sulla had become a living plague upon Roman politics and a virtual byword for scandal, intrigue, conspiracy, demagoguery, and vain ambition.Such was Rome from the rise of Sulla to the fall of Catiline, a period of seemingly endless bloodshed and civil unrest. With such a background, it is little wonder that the precepts of Epicurus – with their emphasis on contemplative pursuits and quiet pleasures and severe strictures against ambition, fame, and the world of politics – struck a responsive chord in the heart of a young Roman poet. To a sensitive intellectual like Lucretius, the teachings of Epicurus must have had the force of a philosophical revelation. In this respect, it is noteworthy (and ironic) that throughout De Rerum Natura whenever the poet writes about Epicurus he praises him not simply as a great teacher and brilliant philosopher, but virtually as a kind of oracle and even a god. Meanwhile, he seems to have viewed his own role as that of an Epicurean evangelist: he is a poetic apostle dedicated to spreading the master’s gospel of liberation from the bondage of superstition and error, of inner peace attained through the study of philosophy and the enjoyment of modest pleasures.
Unlike his hero Epicurus, who had a reputation for being gentle and self-effacing, Lucretius’ excitable personality springs vividly from his pages. Though naturally passionate and intellectually contentious, he also reveals himself as reflective and prone to melancholy. Like his master, he detests war, strife, and social tumult and favors a life quietly devoted to sweet friendship (suavis amicitia) and intellectual pleasures.
At the beginning of Book 2 of his poem, the poet compares the prospect of a person armed with the insights of Epicurus to that of a secure spectator looking down upon a scene of strife:
Pleasant it is, when over the great sea the winds shake the waters,
To gaze down from shore on the trials of others;
Not because seeing other people struggle is sweet to us,
But because the fact that we ourselves are free from such ills strikes us as pleasant.
Pleasant it is also to behold great armies battling on a plain,
When we ourselves have no part in their peril.
But nothing is sweeter than to occupy a lofty sanctuary of the mind,
Well fortified with the teachings of the wise,
Where we may look down on others as they stumble along,
Vainly searching for the true path of life. . . . (2. 1-10)
This idea of philosophy as a private citadel or quiet refuge in a world of anxiety and turmoil, or of some form of contemplation as the true path to enlightenment, has been a recurrent theme in world literature from the Buddha to Boethius, from Socrates to Schopenhauer. The idea is a central component of Epicurean doctrine and a favorite theme and image of Lucretius, whose characteristic vantage point throughout the poem is that of a critical observer above the fray. As narrator, he stands aloof, a scornful yet at the same time sympathetic witness to mankind’s dark strivings and tribulations:
Lo, see them: contending with their wits, fighting for precedence,
Struggling night and day with unending effort,Climbing, clawing their way up the pinnacles of wealth and power.
O miserable minds of men! O blind hearts!
In what darkness, among how many perils,
You pass your short lives! Do you not see
That our nature requires only this:
A body free from pain, and a mind, released from worry and fear,
Free to enjoy feelings of delight? (2. 11-19.)
Like his master, Lucretius obviously feels that the true purpose of moral philosophy is not merely to diagnose human miseries; but to heal them.
From the very start of the poem, and especially in the opening lines of Book 3 (a ringing tribute to Epicurus), Lucretius makes it clear that his main purpose is not so much to display his own talents as to render accurately in a suitably sublime style the glorious philosophy of his master:
O you who out of the vast darkness were the first to raise
A shining light, illuminating the blessings of life,
O glory of the Grecian race, it is you I follow,
Tracing in your clearly marked footprints my own firm steps,
Not as a contending rival, but out of love, for I yearn to imitate you.
For why should the swallow vie with the swan?
Why should a young kid on spindly limbs
Dare to match strides with a mighty steed? (3. 1-8.)
The poetry, Lucretius keeps reminding his readers, is secondary, a sugar coating to sweeten Epicurus’ healing medicine. The Epicurean system is what is important, and the poet pledges all his skill to presenting it as clearly, as faithfully, and as persuasively as possible. In his view nothing less than universal enlightenment and the liberation of mankind is at stake.
Epicurus was born at Samos, an Athenian colony, in 341 BC. Reduced to its simplest level, the goal of his teaching was to free humanity from needless cares and anxieties (especially the fear of death) . By furnishing a complete explanation of the origin and structure of the universe, he sought to open men’s eyes to a true understanding of their condition and liberate them from ignorant fears and superstitions. Though by all accounts he was a voluminous writer, only a tiny fraction of his original output has survived, with the result that Lucretius’ poem has served as one of the primary vehicles for conveying his thought.
The Epicurean system consists of three linked components: Physics, Ethics, and Canonic. These three elements are designed to be interdependent, each one supposedly uniting with and reinforcing the other two. (To cite just one example, Epicurus’ physics supposedly validates both the existence of free will and the fact that the soul disintegrates with the body, ideas that are crucial to Epicurean ethics. The canonic claims to validate the authority and reliability of sensation, which in turn serves as a basis for Epicurean physical theories and ethical views relating to pleasure and pain.) In actual fact, however, the three components are quite separable, and it is certainly possible, for example, to accept Epicurus’ ethical doctrines while entirely denying his canonic teachings and physics.
One of the great achievements of the scientific imagination, the Epicurean cosmos is based on three fundamental principles: materialism, mechanism, and atomism. According to Epicurus the universe covers an infinitude of space and consists entirely of matter and void. For the most part the philosopher upholds Democritus’ theory that all matter is composed of imperishable atoms, tiny indivisible particles that can neither be created or destroyed. He also shares Democritus’ view that the atoms are infinite in number and homogenous in substance, while differing in shape and size. However, whereas Democritus held that the number of atomic sizes and shapes is infinite, Epicurus argued that their number, while large, is nevertheless finite. (As Lucretius notes, if atoms could be any size, some would be visible, and possibly even immense.) As for atomic motion, Democritus had claimed that the atoms move in straight lines in all directions and always in accordance with the iron laws of “necessity” (anangke). Epicurus, on the other hand, contends that their natural motion is to travel straight downwards at a uniform high velocity. At random and unpredictable moments, moreover, they deviate ever so slightly from their regular course, their resulting collisions thus occurring not by strict necessity but always with some element of chance. This theory of atomic “swerve” or clinamen is a crucial feature of the Epicurean world-view, providing (so Lucretius and other adherents believed) a firm physical foundation supporting the existence of free will.
Armed with these basic principles, Epicurus is able to explain the universe as an ongoing cosmic event – a never-ending binding and unbinding of atoms resulting in the gradual emergence of entire new worlds and the gradual disintegration of old ones. Our world, our bodies, our minds are but atoms in motion. They did not occur because of some purpose or final cause. Nor were they created by some god for our special use and benefit. They simply happened, more or less randomly and entirely naturally, through the effective operation of immutable and eternal physical laws.
Here it should be noted that Epicurus is a materialist, not an atheist. Although he argues that not only our earth and all its life forms, but also all human civilizations and arts came into being and evolved without any aid or sponsorship from the gods, he does not deny their existence. He merely denies that they have any knowledge of or interest in human affairs. They live on immune to destruction in their perfectly compounded material bodies in the serene and cloudless spaces between the worlds (intermundia), perfectly oblivious of human anxieties and cares. Lucretius imagines that Epicurus rivaled them in their divine tranquility.
The so-called canonic teachings of Epicurus (from the Greek kanon, “rule”) include his epistemological theories and especially his theories of sensation and perception. In certain respects, these theories represent Epicurus’ thought at its most original and prescient – and in one or two instances at its most fanciful and absurd.
The central principle of the canonic is that our sense data provide a true and accurate picture of external reality. Sensation is the ultimate source and criterion of truth, and its testimony is incontrovertible. Epicurus considered the reliability of the senses a bulwark of his philosophy, and Lucretius refers to trust in sensation as a “holdfast,” describing it as the only thing preventing our slide into the abyss of skepticism (4. 502-512).
But if our sensory input is always true and dependable, how are we to account for hallucinations, fantasies, dreams, delusions, and other forms of perceptual error? According to Epicurus, such errors are always due to some higher mental process. They arise, for example, when we apply judgment or reasoning or some confused product of memory to the actual data presented to us by sensation. As Lucretius remarks, we deceive ourselves because we tend to “see some things with our mind that have not been seen by the senses”:
For nothing is harder than to distinguish the real things of sense
From those doubtful versions of them that the mind readily supplies. (4. 466-468.)
Epicurus’ theory of sensory perception is consistent with and follows from his materialism and atomism. Like Democritus, he postulates that external objects send off emanations or “idols” (eidola) of themselves that travel through the air and impinge upon our senses. In effect, these subtle atomic images or films imprint themselves on the senses, leaving behind trace versions of the external world (auditory and olfactory as well as visual) that can be apprehended and stored in memory. Once again, perceptual errors can occur in this process, but not because of any inherent problem with sensation itself. Instead, mistakes arise due either to the contamination of the “idols” by other atoms or because of the “false opinions” that we ourselves, through defects in our higher mental operations, introduce.
In short, unless it is distorted by some form of external “noise” or by some processing error attributable to reason, all information conveyed through the senses is true. This is Epicurus’ core canonic teaching. Unfortunately, this belief in the infallibility of sense perception and the unreliability of logic and reason led him and his followers (including Lucretius) into a number of strange conclusions – such as the absurd claim that the sun, moon, and stars are exactly the size and shape that they appear to be to our naked eye. Thus (as strict Epicurean doctrine would have it) the moon truly is a small, silver disc, the sun is a slightly larger golden fire, and the stars are but tiny points of light.
Epicurus’ ethics represents the true goal and raison d’etre of his philosophical mission, the capstone atop the impressive (though hardly flawless) pillars of his physics and epistemology. Like Socrates, he considered moral questions (What is virtue? What is happiness?) rather than cosmological speculations to be the ultimate concerns of philosophical inquiry.
As mentioned earlier, it is possible to accept one component of the Epicurean system without necessarily subscribing to the others. But from Epicurus’ (and Lucretius’) point of view, it is the ethical component that is of vital importance.
As many commentators have noted, the term “Epicure” (in the sense of a self-indulgent bon vivant or luxurious pleasure-seeker) is entirely out of place when applied to Epicureanism in general and to its founder in particular. By all accounts, Epicurus’ own living habits were virtually Spartan, and it is said that he attracted many of his disciples more by his solid character and agreeable temper than by his philosophical arguments. His moral philosophy is a form of hedonism, meaning that it is a system based on the pursuit of pleasure (Gr. ‘ēdonewhich it identifies as the greatest good. But Epicurean hedonism is hardly synonymous with sensual extravagance; nor is it a matter (in St. Paul’s disparaging terms) of “let us eat and drink; for tomorrow we die.” It is instead a system that requires severe self-denial and moral discipline. For Epicurus places a much greater emphasis on the avoidance of pain than on the pursuit of pleasure, and he favors intellectual pleasures (which are long-lasting and never cloying) over physical ones (which are short-lived and lead to excess). As for self-indulgence, he argued that it is better to abstain from coarse or trivial pleasures if they prevent our enjoyment of richer, more satisfying ones.
In Epicurean ethics physical pain is the great enemy of happiness and is to be avoided in almost all cases. Mental anguish is even more threatening and potentially debilitating. It follows that the fear of death – and especially the superstitious belief in an after-life of eternal torment – can be particularly devastating source of anxiety and take a terrible toll on humanity, which is why Epicurus sets out so determinedly to crush it.
De Rerum Natura is an epic in six books and is expertly organized to provide both expository clarity as well as powerful narrative and lyric effects. In one respect, the poem represents the unfolding of a complex philosophical argument, and in many places the poet is challenged to explain abstract and often extremely prosaic technical material in a lucid and lively way. (At times during the poem he complains about the relative poverty of Latin as a philosophical medium compared to the technical richness of Greek.) At the same time, he must be careful not to overwhelm or upstage his philosophical presentation with a surplus of brilliant literary devices and gaudy stylistic displays. The basic organization is as follows:
Book 1: The poem begins with a justly famous invocation to Venus (the poet’s symbol for the forces of cohesion, integration, and creative energy in the universe). Presented as a kind of life principle, the Lucretian Venus is associated with the figure of Love (Gr. philia, the unifying or binding force in the philosophy of Empedocles, and also identified with her mythical role as Venus Genetrix, the patron goddess and mother of the Roman people. In the remainder of the book the poet begins the work of explaining the Epicurean system and refuting the systems of other philosophers. He starts by setting forth the major principles of Epicurean physics and cosmology, including atomism, the infinity of the universe, and the existence of matter and void.
Book 2. This book begins with a lyric passage celebrating the “serene sanctuaries” of philosophy and lamenting the condition of those poor human beings who struggle vainly outside its protective walls. The poet explains atomic motion and shapes and argues that the atoms do not have secondary qualities (color, smell, heat, moisture, etc.).
Book 3. After a glowing opening apostrophe to Epicurus (“O glory of the Greeks!”), the poet proceeds with an extended explanation and proof of the materiality – and mortality – of the mind and soul. This explanation culminates in the climactic declaration, “Nil igitur mors est ad nos. . .” (“Therefore death is nothing to us.”), a stark, simple statement which effectively epitomizes the main message and central doctrine of Epicureanism.
Book 4. Following introductory verses on the art of didactic poetry, this book begins with a full account of Epicurus’ theory of vision and sensation. It concludes with one of Lucretius’ greatest passages of verse, his famous (and caustic) analysis of the biology and psychology of sexual love.
Book 5. Lucretius begins this book with another tribute to the genius of Epicurus, whose heroic intellectual achievements, it is argued, exceed even the twelve labors of Hercules. The remainder of the book is devoted to a full account of Epicurean cosmology and sociology, with the poet explaining the stages of life on earth and the origin and development of civilization. This book includes the remarkable passage (837-886) in which the poet offers his own evolutionary hypothesis on the proliferation and extinction of life forms.
Book 6. Though partly unfinished, this book contains some of Lucretius’ greatest poetry, with effective technical explanations of meteorological and geologic phenomena and vivid descriptions of thunderstorms, lightning, and volcanic eruptions. The poem closes with a horrifying account of the great plague of Athens (430 BC), a grim reminder of universal mortality.
Critics universally recognize Lucretius as a major poet and the author of one of the great classics of world literature. But in part because of his accepted role as a spokesperson for Epicureanism rather than an originator, it has been more difficult to assess his merit as a philosopher.
In this respect, it is noteworthy that at least two important philosophers have voiced strong support for Lucretius’ status as a philosophical innovator and original thinker. In 1884, while still a young faculty member at the Blaise Pascal Lycee in Paris, the French philosopher Henri Bergson (1859-1941) published an edition of De Rerum Natura with notes, commentary, and an accompanying critical essay. Throughout this work, Bergson commends Lucretius not only as a poet of genius, but also as an inspired and “singularly original” thinker. In particular, he points out that in his view the poet’s instinctive grasp of the physical operations of nature and his comprehensive, truly scientific world-view exceed anything found in the theories of Democritus and Epicurus.
The Spanish poet and Harvard philosopher George Santayana (1863-1952) held a similarly high opinion of Lucretius’ power as a scientific thinker. Democritus and Epicurus, he argues, are mere sketch artists who offer no more than bare hints and vague outlines of a thoroughly imagined and truly scientifically conceived universe. It thus remained for the deeper, more visionary poet not just to flesh out their rough drafts in fine words, but in essence to actually create and give body to the entire Epicurean system. In Santayana’s view, Epicurus was but a supplier of half-baked ideas; it was Lucretius who was the true creator of scientific materialism and the real founder of Epicureanism.
Hyperbole aside, what both Bergson and Santayana are pointing to is the frequently underrated and misunderstood role of imagination in the production of almost all major systems of philosophy. Great philosophers from Plato and Aristotle to Kant and Nietzsche (and Bergson himself) have never been simply logic mills or thinking machines, but bold thinkers with an imaginative “feel” for abstract reality. In this respect, even if we dismiss the assessments of Bergson and Santayana as extravagant, we can still accept Lucretius as a bona fide philosopher and not just as a poetical embellisher and interpreter.
Every philosopher has strengths and weaknesses; those of Lucretius are conspicuous. In addition to his powerful imagination, his main strength (not surprisingly) is his verbal skill and force of expression. He is one of the most quotable of philosophers, with a flair for striking images and tightly packed statements. A few samples:
“So powerful is religion at persuading to evil.” 1. 101.
“Hot fevers do not depart your body more quickly
If you toss about on pictured tapestries or rich purple coverlets
Than if you lie sick under a poor man’s blanket.” 2. 34-36.
On life without philosophy:
“All life is a struggle in the dark.” 2. 54.
“After a while the life of a fool is hell on earth.” 3. 1023.
On new truths:
“No fact is so obvious that it does not at first produce wonder,
Nor so wonderful that it does not eventually yield to belief.” 2. 1026-27.
“Such is the power of reason to overcome inborn vices
That nothing prevents our living a life worthy of gods.” 3. 321-22.
On the language of love:
“We say a foul, dirty woman is ‘sweetly disordered,’
If she is green-eyed, we call her ‘my little Pallas’;
If she’s flighty and tightly strung, she’s ‘a gazelle’;
A squat, dumpy dwarf is ‘a little sprite,’
While a hulking giantess is ‘divinely statuesque.’
If she stutters or lisps, she speaks ‘musically.’
If she’s dumb, she’s ‘modest’; and if she’s hot-tempered
And a chatterbox, she’s ‘a ball of fire.’
When she’s too skinny to live, she’s ‘svelte,’
And she’s ‘delicate’ when she’s dying of consumption. . .
It would be wearisome to run through the whole list.” 4. 1159-1171.
Of all Lucretius’ intellectual strengths, perhaps none is more characteristic or stands out more impressively than his hard, clear commitment to naturalism. Throughout the poem he consistently attacks supernatural explanations of phenomena and resists the temptation to give in to some form of natural religion or “scientific” supernaturalism. The world, he argues, was not created by divine intelligence, nor is it imbued with any form of mind or purpose. Instead, it must be understood as an entirely natural phenomenon, the outcome of a random (though statistically inevitable and lawful) process. In short, whatever happens in the universe is not the product of design, but part of an ongoing sequence of purely physical events.
Lucretius’ principal philosophical shortcoming is that not only will he occasionally follow Epicurean doctrine to the point of absurdity (e.g., the supposedly tiny size of the sun and moon) but he will also introduce logical fallacies or scientific errors of his own (such as his claim that the atoms travel faster than light – 2. 144ff.). As Bergson points out, these howlers can usually be attributed to the defective method of ancient science, which, because it did not require that hypotheses be confirmed by experimentation, allowed even the wildest conjectures to pass as plausible truths. One further problem is that, for all his reliance on naturalistic explanations and his attempted reduction of metaphysics to physics, Lucretius at times seems to back away, if only ever so slightly, from a purely materialist world view. Indeed in his effusive descriptions of the creative power of nature, effectively symbolized by the figure of Venus, he seems almost (like Bergson) to postulate an immaterial life-force surging through the universe and operating above or beyond raw nature. To read this romantic streak into him is clearly a mistake. Lucretius remains a thorough-going naturalist. Yet when his verse is in high gear, one almost gets the impression that somewhere inside this staunchly scientific, fiercely anti-religious poet there is a romantic nature-worshipper screaming to get out.
Lucretius’ literary influence has been long-lasting and widespread, especially among poets with epic ambitions or cosmological interests, from Virgil and Milton to Whitman and Wordsworth. Not surprisingly, as one of the main proponents and principal sources of Epicurean thought, his philosophical influence has also been considerable. The extent of his communication with and influence on his contemporaries, including other Epicurean writers, is not known. What is known is that by the end of the first century A.D. De Rerum Natura was hardly read and its author had already begun a long, slow descent into philosophical oblivion. It was not until the Renaissance, with the recovery of lost Lucretian manuscripts, that a true revival of the poet became possible.
It is probably an exaggeration to say that the restoration and study of Lucretius’ poem was crucial to the rise of Renaissance “new philosophy” and the birth of modern science. On the other hand, one must not ignore its importance as a spur to innovative sixteenth- and seventeenth-century scientific thought and cosmological speculation. Greek atomism and Lucretius’ account of the universe as an infinite, lawfully integrated whole provided an important background stimulus not only for Newtonian science, but also (if only in a negative or contrary way) for Spinoza’s pantheism and Leibniz’s monadology.
While admitting that “one poem by itself was certainly not responsible for an entire intellectual, moral, and social transformation,” Renaissance scholar Stephen Greenblatt has nevertheless argued convincingly that Lucretius’s epic had a decisive and lasting historical impact. The subtitle of Greenblatt’s study “How the World Became Modern” summarizes his point as he shows how the poem effectively influenced a wide range of Renaissance scientists, philosophers, and literary intellectuals.
As expected, the first figures to spread and expound upon the recently rediscovered poem and its Epicurean gospel were the Italian humanists of the 15th century. Chief among them was the Catholic priest and expert Latinist Lorenzo Valla, author of “On Pleasure,” a fictional debate on whether the best way to achieve a virtuous and happy life is to follow the tenets of Christianity or those of Epicureanism.
Niccolo Machiavelli and Michel de Montaigne were avid readers of the poem. Lucretius appears to have played a major role in shaping Machiavelli’s political thought, while Montaigne quotes abundantly from De Rerum Natura throughout his Essays. No doubt Lucretius’s skeptical outlook and withering critique of religious dogma and political violence appealed to the French writer’s own skepticism, particularly at a time when bloody religious wars were in full fury not far outside the walls of his chateau retreat. Meanwhile, in England, Sir Thomas More proposed a version of Epicurean hedonism as a moral ideal in his fictional fantasy Utopia. However, it remains uncertain whether the Catholic martyr and saint’s account of a pleasure-based, non-religious ethics was sincere or ironical.
Lucretius’ influence on early modern thought is most directly visible in the work of the French scientist and neo-Epicurean philosopher Pierre Gassendi (1592-1655). In 1649 Gassendi published his Syntagma Philosophiae Epicuri, a theoretical refinement and elaboration of Epicurean science. A Catholic priest with a remarkably independent mind, Gassendi seemingly had no problem reconciling his personal philosophical commitment to atomism and materialism with his Christian beliefs in the immortality of the soul and the doctrine of divine providence. Lucretius’s poem also inspired some of the cosmological speculations of Giordano Bruno (1548-1600) and especially his idea of an unbounded cosmos with an infinitude of suns and planets. Bruno was condemned by the Inquisition and burned at the stake for his heretical opinions. However, his views appear to have been at least as deeply rooted in mysticism and pantheism as in Lucretian materialism and atomic theory.
Every modern reader of De Rerum Natura has been struck by the extent to which Lucretius seems to have anticipated modern evolutionary theories in the fields of geology, biology, and sociology. However, to acknowledge this connection is not to say that the poet deserves accredited status as some kind of scientific “evolutionist” or pre-Darwinian precursor. It is merely to point out that, however we choose to define and evaluate its influence, De Rerum Natura was from the 17th century onward a massive cultural presence and hence a ready source of evolutionary ideas. The poem formed part of the cultural heritage and intellectual background of virtually every evolutionary theorist in Europe from Lamarck to Herbert Spencer (whose hedonistic ethics also owed a debt to the poet) – including (though he claimed never to have read Lucretius’ epic) Darwin himself.
Bergson’s early study of Lucretius obviously played an important role in the foundation and development of his own philosophy. In 1907 Bergson published Creative Evolution, outlining his bold, new vitalistic theory of evolution, in opposition to both the earlier vitalism of Lamarck and the naturalism of Darwin, and Spencer. It is hard not to see in the French philosophers’ concept of the élan vital a powerful life force akin to and strongly influenced by the immortal Venus of his great Latin predecessor. Bergson’s evolutionary philosophy influenced the later “process” philosophy of Alfred North Whitehead (1861-1947) and the teleological scientific theories of Pierre Teilhard de Chardin (1881-1955), with the interesting result that it is possible to trace out a fairly direct, if unlikely, line of descent from Greek atomism through the pagan anti-spiritualist Lucretius to the Catholic naturalist Gassendi and then on, via the Jewish-Catholic Bergson, to the highly abstract theism of Whitehead and the “spiritualized” evolutionism of Father Teilhard. That Lucretius’ ideas wound up two thousand years after his death influencing those of a godly British mathematical theorist and a highly original and even eccentric French scientist-priest is remarkable testimony to their durability, adaptability, and persuasive power.
In conclusion, it seems fair to say that, far from being a mere conduit for earlier Greek thought, the poet Titus Lucretius Carus was a bold innovator and original thinker who fully deserves the appellation of philosopher. While his literary fame clearly (and properly) comes first, and although his philosophical reputation is based largely (and again properly) on his role as one of the principle sources and prime exponents of Epicureanism, his own ideas, especially his evolutionary theories and his entirely naturalistic explanation of all universal phenomena, have exerted a long and important influence on western science and philosophy and should not be underestimated.
The most authoritative manuscripts of De Rerum Natura are the so-called O and Q codices in Leiden. Both date from the 9th century. Recently, however, scholars have deciphered a much older and previously illegible manuscript, consisting of papyri discovered in Herculaneum and possibly dating from as early as the first century AD. All other Lucretian manuscripts date from the 15th and 16th century and are based on the one (no longer extant) discovered in a monastery by the Italian humanist Poggio Bracciolini in 1417. Bracciolini’s discovery and the philosophical revolution it helped to bring about is the subject of Greenblatt’s study The Swerve.
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