The Meaning of Life: Contemporary Analytic Perspectives
Depending on whom one asks, the question, “What is the meaning of life?” is either the most profound question of human existence or else nothing more than a nonsensical request built on conceptual confusion, much like, “What does the color red taste like?” or “What is heavier than the heaviest object?” Ask a non-philosopher, “What do philosophers discuss?” and a likely answer will be, “The meaning of life.” Ask the same question of a philosopher within the analytic tradition, and you will rarely get this answer. The sources of suspicion about the question within analytic philosophy, especially in earlier periods, are varied. First, the question of life’s meaning is conceptually challenging because of terms like “the” “meaning” and “life,” and especially given the grammatical form in which they are arranged. Second, it is often asked with transcendent, spiritual, or religious assumptions at the fore about what the world “should” be like in order for there to be a meaning of life. In so far as the question is entangled with such ideas, the worry is that even if the concept of a meaning of life is coherent, there likely is not one.
Despite such suspicions and relative disinterest in the question of life’s meaning among analytic philosophers for a large part of the twentieth century, there is a growing body of work on the topic over roughly the last two decades. Much of this work focuses on developing and defending theories of meaning in life (see Section 2.d. for more on the distinction between meaning in life and the meaning of life) via conceptual analyses of the necessary and sufficient conditions for meaningful life. A smaller, though no less important, subset of work in this growing field focuses on why we even use “meaning” in the first place to voice our questions and concerns about central facets of the human condition.
This article surveys important trajectories in discussions of life’s meaning within contemporary analytic philosophy. It begins by introducing key aspects of the human context in which the question is asked. The article then investigates three ideas that illumine what meaning means in this context: sense-making, purpose, and significance. The article continues by surveying important topics that provide a greater understanding of what is involved in our requests for meaning. After briefly surveying theories of meaning in life, it concludes with discussions of death and futility, followed by important areas of research that remain under-investigated.
Table of Contents
- The Human Context
- The Contemporary Analytic Context: Prolegomena
- Theories of Meaning in Life
- Death, Futility, and a Meaningful Life
- Underinvestigated Areas
- References and Further Reading
The human desire for meaning finds vivid expression in the stories we tell, diaries we keep, and in our deepest hopes and fears. According to twentieth century Freudian psychoanalyst Bruno Bettelheim, “our greatest need and most difficult achievement is to find meaning in our lives” (Bettelheim 1978: 3). Holocaust survivor and psychiatrist Viktor Frankl said that the human will to meaning comes prior to either our will to pleasure or will to power (Frankl 2006: 99).
Questions about meaning arise and take shape within varied contexts: when struggling to make an important decision about what to do with our lives, when trapped in a job we hate, when wondering if there is more to life than the daily hum-drum, when diagnosed with a terminal illness, when experiencing the loss of a loved one, when feeling small while looking up at the night sky, when wondering if this universe is all there is and why it is even here in the first place, when questioning whether life and love will have a lasting place in the universe or whether the whole show will end in utter and everlasting desolation and silence.
Lurking behind many of our questions about meaning is our capacity to get outside of ourselves, to view our lives from a wider standpoint, a standpoint from which to understand the setting for our lives and question the “why?” of what we do. Humans possess self-awareness, and can take an observational, self-reflective viewpoint on our lives. In this, we are able to shift from mere automatic engagement to observation and evaluation. We do more than simply respond to streams of stimuli. We step back and question who we are and what we do. Shifting our focus to the widest standpoint—sub specie aeternitatis (literally, from the perspective of eternity; a universal perspective)—we wonder how such infinitesimally small and fleeting creatures like ourselves fit in the grand scheme of things, within vast space and time. We worry about whether a reality of such staggering magnitude, at the deepest level, cares about us (for related discussions, see Fischer 1993; Kahane 2013; Landau 2011; Nagel 1971, 1989; and Seachris 2013).
That our concerns about meaning are often cosmically-focused is instructive. Despite the current theoretical emphasis in analytic philosophy on the more terrestrially-focused idea of meaning in life, questions about meaning are very often cosmic in scope. In the words of sociologist Peter Berger, in seeking life’s meaning, many are attempting to locate it “within a sacred and cosmic frame of reference” of trying to plumb the connection “between microcosm and macrocosm” (Berger 1967: 27). This is an important reason why God, transcendence, and other ideas embodied and expressed in religion are so often thought to be relevant to life’s meaning.
Relatively speaking, not too long ago many analytic philosophers were suspicious that the question of life’s meaning was incoherent. Such views found expression in popular culture too, for example, in Douglas Adams’ widely read book The Hitchhiker’s Guide to the Galaxy. The story’s central characters visit the legendary planet Magrathea and learn about a race of hyper-intelligent beings who built a computer named Deep Thought. Deep Thought’s purpose was to answer the ultimate question of life, the universe, and everything, that answer being a bewildering 42. Deep Thought explained that this answer was incomprehensible because the beings who designed it, though super-intelligent, did not really know what they were asking in the first place. Asking for life’s meaning might be like this, in which case 42 is as good of an answer as any other.
Some analytic philosophers in the twentieth century, in the wake of logical positivism, shared Deep Thought’s suspicion. They were particularly weary of the traditional formulation—What is the meaning of life? Meaning, it was thought, belongs in the linguistic realm. Words, sentences, and other linguistic constructions are the proper bearers of meaning, not objects, events, or states of affairs, and certainly not life itself. Some philosophers thought that in asking for life’s meaning, we use an ill-chosen expression to voice something real, perhaps an emotional response of awe or wonder at the staggering fact that anything exists at all. Yet, experiencing such feelings and asking a meaningful question are two different things altogether.
Asking what something means, though, need not be a strictly semantic activity. We ask for the meanings of all kinds of things and employ “meaning” in a wide variety of contexts in everyday life, only some of which are narrowly linguistic. Paying careful attention to the meanings of “meaning” provides important clues about what life’s meaning is all about. Three connotations in particular are instructive here: sense-making, purpose, and significance.
Meaning-talk is common in everyday discourse. Most ordinary uses of “meaning” tend to cluster around three basic ideas: (1) sense-making (which can include the ideas of intelligibility, clarification, or coherence), (2) purpose, and (3) significance (which can include the idea of value). The following list of statements and questions captures the richly varied ways in which we employ the concept of meaning on a regular basis.
Meaning as Sense-Making
- What you said didn’t mean a thing.
- What did you mean by that statement?
- Do you know what I mean?
- What did you mean by that face? (overlaps with purpose)
- What is the meaning of that book? (what is it about?)
- What is the meaning of this? (for example, when asked upon returning home to find one’s house ransacked)
Meaning as Purpose
- What did you mean by that face? (overlaps with intelligibility)
- The tantrum is meant to catch his dad’s attention.
- What is the meaning of that book? (why was it written?)
- I really mean it!
- I didn’t mean to do it. I promise!
Meaning as Significance
- That was such a meaningful
- This watch really means something to me.
- That is a highly meaningful event in the life of that city.
- What do his first six months in office mean for the country (likely overlaps with intelligibility)
- That is a meaningful
- That is a meaningless
- You mean nothing to me.
This category is an important ordinary sense of meaning and connotes ideas like intelligibility, clarification, and coherence. Something has meaning if it makes sense; it lacks meaning if it does not. One way of understanding sense-making is through the idea of proper fit. Words, concepts, propositions, but also events and states of affairs, make sense and are meaningful if and when they fit together properly; if they lack such fit, they make no sense and are meaningless. This applies narrowly. For example, it makes no sense to ask, “What is brighter than the brightest light source?” It does not fit with the concept brightest to ask what is brighter, but it has a broader application too. We say things like:
- It does not make sense for the president to send in troops given the geopolitical situation in the region.
- Asking philosophy students to perform long-division on their midterm makes no sense.
In each of these situations, we perceive a lack of fit—a lack of fit between a decision and circumstances surrounding that decision or between reasonable expectations about what one will find on a philosophy exam and what one actually finds. There is a kind of absurdity here. Perceiving this weaker lack of fit will be a product of beliefs, norms, and other epistemic, evaluative, and social commitments. Therefore, determining whether or not something, in fact, involves a lack of fit in this broader sense often will be a messier task than in cases of narrow sense-making.
Ascertaining meaning, then, is often about fitting something into a larger context or whole: words into sentences, paragraphs, novels, or monographs; musical notes into measures, movements, and symphonies (i.e., the movement from mere sound to music), parts of a photograph within the entire photograph. Meaning is about intelligibility within a wider frame, about “inserting small parts into a larger, integrated context” (Svendsen 2005: 29). Similarly, we can plausibly view our requests for the meaning of life as attempts to secure the overarching context through which to make sense of our lives in the universe (see Thomson 2003: 132-138). Our focus here is on existentially weighty matters that define and depict the human condition: questions and concerns surrounding origins, purpose, significance, value, suffering, and death and destiny. We want answers to our questions about these matters, and want these answers to fit together in an existentially satisfying way. We want life to make sense, and when it does not, we are haunted by the specter of meaninglessness.
Requests for meaning are very often requests for purpose. We want to know whether we have a purpose(s) and if so, what it is. Many assume that there is a cosmic purpose around which to order our lives. A cosmic purpose likely would require transcendence or God. Someone must intend it all in order for there to be a purpose of it all. One might reject the idea of cosmic purpose, though, and still frame the question about life’s meaning as one largely about purpose. In this case, meaningful life (or meaning in life) is about ordering one’s life around self-determined purposes.
We also distinguish actions done on purpose from those done by accident. We use meaning (or meant) to contrast willful from non-willful action. We say things like, “I really mean it” to indicate the ‘full’ operation of our will. Alternatively, our child might say, “I didn’t mean it, I promise!” to indicate that she did not intend to spill her glass of milk. This sense of “meant” is also relevant for life’s meaning. We want sufficient autonomy, and when it is absent or severely mitigated, we worry about the meaningfulness of our lives (see Mawson 2016; Sartre 1973). Most of us do not want to walk through life haphazardly, nor in a way that is largely determined apart from our own consent. Likely one aspect of meaningful life, then, is life lived with our wills sufficiently engaged, one lived on purpose. These two shades of purpose are probably related. We want to really mean it as we select and align our lives with aims that will provide the salient structural rhythms to our day-to-day existence. In other words, we do not want to be alienated from the purposes that guide our lives.
Purpose and sense-making often are connected. Purpose itself, via future-targeted goals that shape pre-goal activity, provide important aspects of the structure that serves as the framework through which life fits together and makes sense. Lives that fit together and make sense—meaningful lives—are those that are sufficiently teleological. Working to attain goals at various levels of life-centrality is likely a facet of life properly fitting together and therefore being meaningful. Teleological threads connecting discreet life episodes are then necessary for a robust kind of sense-making in life. Lives lacking this are threatened with a sort of unintelligibility that results from being insufficiently structured by a telos. In the words of philosopher Alasdair MacIntyre:
When someone complains…that his or her life is meaningless, he or she is often and perhaps characteristically complaining that the narrative of their life has become unintelligible to them, that it lacks any point, any movement toward a climax or a telos (MacIntyre 2007: 217).
Meaning often conveys the idea of significance, and significance tracks a related cluster of notions like mattering, importance, impact, salience, being the object of care and concern, and value, depending on context. We contrast trivial discussions about the mundane with deep discussions about important matters, referring to the latter as meaningful or significant. Physical objects deeply enmeshed in our life stories are meaningful. We view actions and events that have salient implications as significant, and in cases where that significance has positive value, as meaningful (whether a person can lead a meaningful life in virtue of making large negative impacts is a growing topic of discussion as the field seeks to understand the connection between meaning and morality; see Campbell and Nyholm 2015). Finding the cure for that disease was meaningful because it had such a large positive impact within a certain frame of cares and concerns. This shade of meaning is also in view in cases where some piece or set of data crosses a threshold of salience against background information. That such a large percentage of the population living under certain conditions is getting a particular disease is statistically significant or statistically meaningful. In this way, sense-making and significance senses of meaning connect.
Alternatively, when something does not matter to us, we might say, “That means nothing to me.” It was just a meaningless conversation; it was inconsequential. That game did not matter because the playoffs were already set. The wrapping paper does not matter, what is on the inside of the package counts. That piece of information is not meaningful relevant to the aims and questions guiding one’s inquiry. Spending your life sitting on the couch and watching sitcom re-runs on Netflix is meaningless; you do nothing that matters, you do nothing of importance or value, and so on.
Something’s significance is often and largely gauged in relation to a perspective, horizon, or point of reference, all of which can be dynamic. Something that is significant from one vantage point may, and often does, lose its significance when viewed from a broader horizon. Scraping your knee at age four is significant, at least from a four-year old’s perspective. When looking back decades later, its significance wanes. Most events important enough to make it into local lore will not matter enough to be included in a national history, let alone world and, especially, cosmic history. One quickly sees resources available from which to generate pessimistic meaning of life concerns vis-à-vis human significance as one broadens horizons, eventually terminating in the widest cosmic perspective.
Significance is often distinctly normative and person-al. When we say that something is meaningful in the sense of being significant, important, or mattering, we make a kind of evaluative claim about what is good or valuable. Additionally, significance is often connected with being the object of a person’s evaluations, cares, and concerns. Things are, most naturally, significant to someone.
Insofar as meaning is thought to have an affective dimension, that dimension likely intersects with significance. If my grandmother’s necklace is meaningful to me, it has value, it matters, and affective states fitting a certain psychological profile, like being deeply stirred or moved, often accompany such assessments of value and mattering. Though this may not make such affective states a further type of meaning or constitutive of meaning, these states reliably track instances of significance or perceived significance.
Like sense-making and purpose, significance is relevant to life’s meaning. In broad terms, one way of construing meaningful life is as a life that matters and has positive value. This, of course, admits of various understandings of mattering that, at one level, might track the objective naturalist, subjective naturalist, hybrid naturalist, and supernaturalist debate (see Section 3 below): matters to whom and according to what standard? Additionally, some find it difficult to separate personal and cosmic concerns over significance. Cosmic concerns, for many, are also intensely personal. If the universe as a whole lacks significance, some worry that their individual lives lack significance, or at least the kind that they think a deeply meaningful life requires.
Understanding what life’s meaning is all about is complicated, not just because of the expansive semantic range of “meaning,” but also because it is not immediately clear how we should understand the word “life” in the question. In asking for life’s meaning, we are not, at least most of us, asking for the meaning of the word “life.” Neither are we asking about how being alive is different from being non-living or how being organic is different from being inorganic. What then are we asking, and what is the scope of that request? Our question(s) about life’s meaning likely range over the following options:
Life1 = individual human life (meaning of my life)
Life2 = humanity as a whole (meaning of human existence)
Life3 = all biological life (meaning of all living organisms collectively)
Life4 = all of space-time existence (meaning of it all)
Life5 = rough marker for those aspects of human life that have a kind of existential gravitas and are of immense concern and the subject of intense questioning by human beings (see Section 2.e. below)
Each of these options for understanding “life” in the traditional formulation tracks possible interpretations of the question. The targets of our questions and concerns about meaning are varied in scope. We ask questions about our own, personal existence as well as questions about the entire show, and one might think that questions about personal meaning are connected to questions about cosmic meaning. Life5 provides a way of bringing important aspects of each together (see Section 2.e.)
Another thorny issue for the traditional formulation is its incorporation of the definite article—the. It implies that there is only one meaning of life, which violates common inclinations that meaning is the sort of thing that varies from person to person. What makes one life meaningful is different from what makes another meaningful. One person might derive large doses of meaning from her career, another through gardening. For this reason, many are suspicious of the definite article.
There is good reason, though, to question this suspicion. First, it might reveal confusion about what meaning even is in the first place. Indeed, one of the aims of those working in the field is to clarify just what meaning is. Here, it is worth noting that many plausible theories of meaning have an objective component, indicating that not just anything goes for meaning. However, even if meaning were solely a matter of, say, being fulfilled, notice that the following two claims are still consistent: (1) the meaning of life is about being fulfilled and (2) sources of fulfillment are exceedingly diverse. Life’s meaning in this case is about being fulfilled (consistent across persons), but sources of fulfillment vary from person to person.
Second, one might also reasonably think that there is a single meaning of life at the cosmic level that itself is consistent with a rich variety of ways to lead a meaningful life (meaning in life at the terrestrial, personal level). Thinking through possibilities like this will connect with claims about what is true about the world, for example, whether there is a God with a plan for the cosmos and whether there is an overarching meaning to it all. In a case like this, there might be a single meaning of life, but the sense of meaning in which there is a single meaning could be different from the sense of meaning in which there are varied meanings. Regardless of the complexities here, the point is that one should not too quickly dismiss the definite article as contributing to intractable theoretical and practical problems for thinking about life’s meaning.
In what has become a standard distinction in the field, philosophers distinguish two ideas: the meaning of life (MofL) and meaning in life (MinL). Claims like the following are prevalent, “one can find meaning in her life, even if there is no grand, cosmic meaning of life.” MofL is more global or cosmic in scope, and often is intertwined with ideas like God, transcendence, religion, or a spiritual, sacred realm. In asking for life’s meaning, one is often asking for some sort of cosmic meaning, though she may also be asking for the meaning of her individual life from the perspective of the cosmos since many think the meaning of their individual lives is tied to whether or not there is a meaning of it all.
MinL is focused on personal meaning; the meaning of our individual lives as located in the web of human endeavors and relationships sub specie humanitatis—within the frame of human cares and concerns. Many think that we can legitimately talk about life having meaning in this sense regardless of what is true about the meaning of the universe as a whole.
One can see how the various sense of meaning discussed earlier in this entry intersect at both levels—MofL and MinL. For example, if sense-making is in view at the cosmic level, we might ask questions like the following: “What’s it all about?” or “How does it all fit together?” At the terrestrial, personal level, our sense-making questions might, rather, take the following shape: “What is my life about?” “How does my life fit together?” or “Is my life coherent?” If significance is in view at the cosmic level, we might ask, “Do our lives really matter in the grand scheme of things?” whereas terrestrially, personally, we might ask, “Does my life matter to me, my family, friends, or my community?”
The locution, “What is the meaning of x?” need not be understood narrowly as the request for something semantic, say, for a definition or description. There are additional non-linguistic contexts in which this request makes perfect sense (see Nozick 1981). Some of them even share striking similarities to the question of life’s meaning. One in particular is especially relevant.
Sometimes we are confronted with circumstances that we do not yet sufficiently understand, in which case we might naturally respond by asking, “What’s this all about?” or “What’s going on here?” or “What happened?” or “What’s happening?” or “What does this mean?” or “What is the meaning of this?” In asking such questions, we are in search of sense-making and intelligibility. We walk in on our children fighting and demand: “What is the meaning of this?” Mary Magdalene and Mary the mother of James come to find a stone rolled away from a Roman guarded tomb. The burial linens are there, but Jesus’ body is nowhere to be found. One can imagine them thinking, “What is the meaning of this?”
We naturally invoke the formula “What is the meaning of x?” in situations where x is some fact, event, phenomena, or cluster of such things, and about which we want to know, in the words of New Testament scholar and theologian, N. T. Wright, its “implication in the wider world within which this notion makes the sense it makes” (Wright 2003: 719). Such requests track our desire to make sense of a situation, to render it intelligible with the further aim of acting appropriately in response—a kind of epistemic map to aid in practical, normative navigation.
Taking our cue from these ordinary examples, to inquire about life’s meaning is plausibly understood as asking something similar to our requests for the meaning of our children’s scuffle or of Jesus’ empty tomb. Over the course of our existence, we encounter aspects of the world that have a kind of existential gravitas in virtue of their role in defining and depicting the human condition. They capture our attention in a unique way. The word “life,” then, is a rough marker for these existentially-weighty aspects (Life5 in Section 2.b. above), aspects of life that give rise to profound questions for which we seek an explanatory framework (perhaps even a narrative framework) in order to make sense of them. These aspects of the world are akin to the portion of the scuffle and empty tomb above to which we already have limited informational access: yelling and throwing in the case of the scuffle, and the various pieces and clues observed at the empty tomb. Like the parent or Mary Magdalene in those situations, we lack important parts of life’s context, and we desire to fill in these existentially relevant gaps in our knowledge, and then live accordingly. We are in search of life’s meaning, where that meaning is, at center, a kind of overarching sense-making framework for answering and fitting together answers to our questions about origins, purpose, significance, value, suffering, and destiny.
The currently favored strategy for interpreting the traditional formulation of the question—What is the meaning of life?—is the amalgam approach. On this pluralist view, the question is not thought to be a single question at all, but rather an amalgam of numerous other questions, most of which share family resemblances. The question is, on this view, simply a place-holder (some think ill-conceived) for these other questions and is, itself, not capable of being answered in this form. Though it has no answer in this form, other questions about purpose, significance, value, worth, origins, and destiny might. We at least know what we ask when we ask them, so the thought goes. Suspicion of the traditional formulation often accompanies the amalgam view since that formulation makes use of the definite article (“the”), the word “meaning,” and the word “life,” which together in the grammatical form in which they are found contribute to a thorny interpretive challenge. Perhaps the best strategy according to many proponents of the amalgam interpretation, is simply to jettison the traditional formulation and focus on trying to answer some among this other cluster of questions that collectively embody what we are concerned about when we inquire into life’s meaning.
Though the amalgam interpretation is the most popular view among those writing on life’s meaning within analytic philosophy, a few others have favored an approach that views the traditional formulation as a single question capable of being answered in that form (see Seachris 2009, 2019; Thomson 2003). A promising strategy here is to prioritize the sense-making connotation of meaning. On this version of the interpretive approach, asking about the meaning of life is first about seeking a sense-making explanation (perhaps even narrative explanation) for our questions and concerns about origins, purpose, significance, value, suffering, and destiny. Contrary to the amalgam interpretation, on this view, the question of life’s meaning is asking for a single thing—a sense-making explanation. It is, of course, an explanation squarely focused on all this other meaning of life “stuff.” This explanation can be thought of as a worldview or metanarrative. This approach is an organic interpretive strategy that seeks a single answer (e.g., narrative explanation) that unifies or integrates answers to all the sub-questions that define and depict the human condition. It provides the conceptual resources to account for both MofL and MinL. The cosmic and the personal, the epistemic and the normative, and the theoretical and the practical are inseparable in our search for meaning. The sense-making framework that we seek links all of this as we pursue meaningful lives in light of our place within the grand scheme of it all.
This version of the single-question approach, with its emphasis on sense-making, is closely related to the concept of worldview. Worldviews provide answers to the existentially weighty set of questions that brings into relief the human condition. As philosopher Milton Munitz notes:
. . . [people] may say that what they are looking for [when asking the question of life’s meaning] is an account of the “big picture” with whose aid they would be able to see not only their own individual personal lives, but the lives of everybody else, indeed of everything of a finite or limited sort, human or not. . . . The expression of such a concern involves, at bottom, the appeal to a “worldview” or “world picture.” This undertakes to give a description of the most inclusive setting within which human life is situated . . . (Munitz 1993: 30).
To offer a worldview, then, is to offer a putative meaning of life—a sense-making framework focused squarely on the set of questions and concerns surrounding origins, purpose, significance, value, suffering, and destiny.
Looking back further into the origin of the worldview concept strengthens the connection between worldview and life’s meaning, and offers important clues that a worldview provides a kind of sense-making meaning. Nineteenth century German historian and philosopher, Wilhelm Dilthey, spoke of a worldview as a concept that “. . . constitutes an overall perspective on life that sums up what we know about the world, how we evaluate it emotionally, and how we respond to it volitionally.” Worldviews possess three distinct yet interrelated dimensions: cognitive, affective, and practical. They address both MofL and MinL. A worldview is motivated out of a desire to answer what he calls the “riddle of existence:”
The riddle of existence faces all ages of mankind with the same mysterious countenance; we catch sight of its features, but we must guess at the soul behind it. This riddle is always bound up organically with that of the world itself and with the question what I am supposed to do in this world, why I am in it, and how my life in it will end. Where did I come from? Why do I exist? What will become of me? This is the most general question of all questions and the one that most concerns me (Dilthey 1980: 81-82).
Dilthey’s cluster of questions that motivate worldview construction are those same questions to which we want answers in seeking life’s meaning. In this way, life’s meaning might just be a sense-making framework. It is not a stretch to say that life’s meaning is that which worldview’s aim to provide.
Beyond important preliminary discussions over the nature of the question itself and its constituent parts, one will find competing theories of meaning in life. Here, the debate is over the question of what makes a person’s life meaningful, not over the question of whether there is a cosmic meaning of it all (though, again, some think the two cannot be so easily disentangled). The four most influential views of meaning in life are: (1) Supernaturalism, (2) Objective Naturalism, (3) Subjective Naturalism, and (4) Hybrid Naturalism. (5) Nihilism is not a theory of meaning, rather, it is the denial of meaning, whether cosmic or personal. Objective, subjective, and hybrid naturalism are all optimistic forms of naturalism. They allow for the possibility of a meaningful existence in a world devoid of finite and infinite spiritual realities. Pessimistic naturalism, or what is commonly called “nihilism,” is generally, though not always, thought to be an implication of an entirely naturalistic ontology, though vigorous debate exits about whether naturalism entails nihilism.
Roughly, supernaturalism maintains that God’s existence, along with “appropriately relating” to God, is necessary and sufficient for securing a meaningful life, although accounts diverge on the specifics. Among countless others, historic representatives of supernaturalism in the Near-Eastern ancient world and in subsequent history include Qoheleth (the one called “Teacher” in the Old Testament book of Ecclesiastes), Jesus, the Apostle Paul, Augustine, Aquinas, Jonathan Edwards, Blaise Pascal, Leo Tolstoy, C. S. Lewis, and many contemporary analytic philosophers.
Meaningful life, on supernaturalism, consists of claims along metaphysical, epistemological, and relational-axiological axes. Metaphysically, meaningful life requires God’s existence because, for example, conditions that ground properties necessary for meaning like objective value are thought to be most plausibly anchored in a being like God (See Cottingham 2005; Craig 2008). It also requires, at some level orthodoxy (right belief) and orthopraxy (right life and practice), though again, much debate exists on the details. In addition to God’s existence, meaning in life requires that a person be appropriately related to God, perhaps as expressed in one’s beliefs and especially in one’s devotion, worship, and the quality of her life lived with and among others as, for example, embodied in Jesus’ statement of the greatest commandments (cf. Matt. 22:34-40).
Pascal captures the spirit of supernaturalism in this passage from the Pensées:
What else does this craving, and this helplessness, proclaim but that there was once in man a true happiness, of which all that now remains is the empty print and trace? This he tries in vain to fill with everything around him, seeking in things that are not there the help he cannot find in those that are, though none can help, since this infinite abyss can be filled only with an infinite and immutable object; in other words by God himself (Pascal 1995: 45).
As does St. Augustine at the beginning of his Confessions:
. . . you have made us for yourself, and our heart is restless until it rests in you (St. Augustine 1963: 17).
It is worth noting that there are versions of supernaturalism that do not view God as necessary for meaningful life, but nonetheless claim that God and relating to God in appropriate ways would significantly enhance meaning in life. This more moderate form of supernaturalism allows for the possibility of meaningful life, in some measure, on naturalism (see Metz 2019 for a helpful taxonomy of the conceptual space here).
Supernaturalist views, whether stronger or more moderate, connect with questions and concerns about the problem of evil, post-mortem survival, and ultimate justice. It is often thought that a being like God is needed to “author and direct” the narrative of the universe, and, in some sense, the narratives of our individual lives to a good and blessed ending (involving both closure and teleological senses of ending, though not an absolute termination sense; see Seachris 2011). Many worry that, on naturalism, life does not make sense or is absurd (a kind of sense-making meaning; see Section 2.a.i. above) if there is no ultimate justice and redemption for the ills of this world, and if the last word is death and dissolution, followed by silence, forever.
Subjective naturalism is an optimistic naturalistic view in claiming that life can be robustly meaningful even if there is no God, after-life, or transcendent realm. In this, it is like objective and hybrid forms of naturalism. According to subjective naturalism, what constitutes a meaningful life varies from person to person, and is a function of one getting what one strongly wants or by achieving self-established goals or through accomplishing what one believes to be really important. Caring about or loving something deeply has been thought by some to confer meaning in life (see Frankfurt 1988). Some subjectivist views focus on affective states of a certain psychological profile, like fulfillment or satisfaction for example, as constituting the essence of meaningful life (see Taylor 1967). Subjectivism is appealing to some in light of perceived failures to ground objective value, either naturally, non-naturally, or supernaturally, and in accounting for the widespread view that meaning and fulfillment are closely connected.
A worry for subjective naturalism, analogous to ethical worries about moral relativism, is that this view is too permissive, allowing for bizarre or even immoral activities to ground meaning in life. Many protest that surely deep care and love, by themselves, are not sufficient to confer meaningfulness in life. What if someone claims to find meaning by measuring and re-measuring blades of grass or memorizing the entire catalogue of Netflix shows or, worse, torturing people for fun? Can a life centering on such pursuits be meaningful? A strong, widespread intuition here inclines many towards requiring a condition of objective value or worth on meaning. Subjectivism still has thoughtful defenders, though, with some proposals moving towards grounding value inter-subjectively—in community and its shared values—as opposed to in the individual exclusively. It is also worth noting that one could be a subjectivist about meaning while being an objectivist about morality. In this way, a fulfilled torturer might lead a meaningful, though immoral life. Meaning and morality, on this view, are distinct values that can, in principle, come into conflict.
Objective naturalism, like subjective naturalism, posits that a meaningful life is possible in a purely physical world devoid of finite and infinite spiritual realities. It differs, though, in what is required for meaning in life. Objective naturalists claim that a meaningful life is a function of appropriately connecting with mind-independent realities of objective worth (contra subjectivism), and that are entirely natural (contra supernaturalism). Theories differ on the nature of this connection. Some require mere orientation around objective value, while others require a stronger causal connection with good outcomes (see Smuts 2013). Again, objective naturalism is distinguished from subjective naturalism by its emphasis on mind-independent, objective value. One way of putting the point is to say that wanting or choosing is insufficient for a meaningful life. For example, choosing to spend one’s waking hours memorizing the inventory of one’s local Target store, even if this activity results in fulfillment, is likely insufficient for meaning on objective naturalism. Rather, meaning is a function of linking one’s life to objectively valuable, mind-independent conditions that are not themselves the sole products of what one wants and chooses. On objective naturalism it is possible to be wrong about what confers meaning on life—something is meaningful, at least partly, in virtue of its intrinsic nature, irrespective of what is believed about it. This is why spending salient portions of one’s life memorizing department store inventories is not meaningful on objective naturalism, even if the person strongly desires to do this.
One worry for objective naturalism is that it may have a harder time accounting for cases of neural atypicality, for example, a person with ASD who is deeply fulfilled by activities that seem to lack intrinsic value or worth. Does a person who is not a plumber and for whom pipes and interactions with pipes provide salient goals, a kind of coherence to his life, and enjoyable experiences fail to acquire meaning because it all largely revolves around a fascination with pipes? Might subjectivist views better account for the lives of those among us whose interests and interactions with the world are strikingly different, and for whom such interests are the result of neural atypicality?
Critics of objective naturalism might also press the point that proponents of this view conflate meaning and morality or at least conflate important aspects of these two putatively different kinds of value. One value might be objectively shaped, whereas the other might not.
Many researchers think that there is something right about both objectivist and subjectivist views, but that each on its own is incomplete. Susan Wolf has developed what has come to be one of the more influential theories of meaning in life over the last decade or so, the fitting-fulfillment view. Her view includes both objective and subjective conditions, and is captured by the slogan, “Meaning arises when subjective attraction meets objective attractiveness” (Wolf 1997: 211). Meaning is not present in a life spent believing in, being fulfilled by, or caring about worthless projects, but neither is it present in a life spent engaging in worthwhile, objectively valuable projects without also believing in, being fulfilled by, or caring about them. Many think hybridist views capture what is best about objectivism and subjectivism while avoiding the pitfalls of each.
In their naturalistic forms, such theories of meaning are inconsistent with supernaturalism. However, one can imagine supernaturalist forms of each of these views. One might be a supernaturalist who thinks that meaning wholly or largely consists in subjective fulfillment in the Divine—a kind of subjectivism, or that meaning consists in orientation around objective value, again grounded in the Divine—a kind of objectivism. One could also formulate distinctly supernaturalist hybrid views.
In opposition to all optimistic views about the possibility of meaningful life, is pessimistic naturalism, more commonly called nihilism. Roughly, nihilism is the view that denies that a meaningful life is possible because, literally, nothing has any value. Nihilism may be understood as a combination of theses and assumptions drawn from both supernaturalism and naturalism: (i) God or some supernatural realm is likely necessary for value and a meaningful life, but (ii) no such entity or realm exists, and therefore (3) nothing is ultimately of value and there is, therefore, no meaning. Other forms of nihilism focus on states like boredom or dissatisfaction, arguing that boredom sufficiently characterizes life so as to make it meaningless, or that human lives lack the requisite amount of satisfaction to confer meaning upon them.
If meaning is a distinct kind of value that a life can have, and if the three senses of meaning above (see Section 2.a. above) capture the range of ideas encompassed by meaning, then these ideas can help illumine the conceptual shape of meaning in life. Each of the ordinary senses of “meaning” provides strategies for conceptualizing the broad structural contours of meaningful life.
Sense-making: An intelligible life; one that makes sense (broad sense-making), that fits together properly, and exhibits a kind of coherence (for example, relationally, vocationally, morally, spiritually, and so on), perhaps even narrative coherence.
Purpose: A life saliently oriented around purposes, goals, and aims, and lived on purpose in which the person’s autonomy is sufficiently engaged.
Significance: A life that matters (and has positive value)—intrinsically in virtue of the kind of life that it is and extrinsically in virtue of its implications and impacts, especially within the narrow (e.g., familial) and broad (e.g., cultural) relational webs of which the person is a part.
Though one can view these as largely different ways of thinking about what a meaningful life is, one might think that there is a more organic relationship between them. Here is one strategy through which all three senses of meaning might coalesce and bring into relief the full structural contours of meaningful life in a unified way:
Meaningful Life = A life that makes sense, that fits together properly (sense-making) in virtue of appropriate orientation around goals (purpose), other (atelic) activities (see Setiya 2017), and relationships that matter and have positive value (significance).
Philosophers may want to follow social scientists here in thinking more about this tripartite conception of meaning. Psychologists, for example, are increasingly using similar accounts in experimental design and testing. One prominent psychologist working in the area of meaning proposes a definition of meaning in life that incorporates a similar triad that prioritizes sense-making:
Meaning is the web of connections, understandings, and interpretations that help us comprehend our experience and formulate plans directing our energies to the achievement of our desired future. Meaning provides us with the sense that our lives matter, that they make sense, and that they are more than the sum of our seconds, days, and years (Steger 2012: 165).
Life’s meaning is closely linked with a cluster of related issues including death, futility, and endings in general. These are important themes in the literature on meaning, and are found in a wide array of sources ranging from the Old Testament book of Ecclesiastes to Tolstoy to Camus to contemporary analytic writing on the topic. Worries that death, as conceived on naturalism, threatens meaning lead into discussions about futility. It is a commonly held view that life is futile if all we are and do eventually comes to nothing. If naturalism is true and death is the end . . . period . . . then life is futile, so the argument goes. Left undeveloped, it is not entirely clear what people mean by this, though the sentiment behind the idea is intense and prevalent.
In order to explore the worry further, it is important to get clearer on what is meant by futility. In ordinary cases, something is futile when the accomplishment or fulfillment of what is aimed at or desired is impossible. Examples of futility include:
It is futile for a human being to try to both exist and not exist at the same time and in the same sense.
It is futile to try and jump to Mars.
It is futile to try and write an entire, 300-page novel, from start to finish, in one hour.
On the preceding account of futility, the existential angst that accompanies some instance of futility is proportional to how one feels about what it is that is futile. The extent to which one is invested—for example, emotionally and relationally—in attempting to reach some desired end will affect how she responds to real or perceived futility (“perceived” because one could be wrong about whether or not something is, in fact, futile). Imagine that a person has a curiosity to experience flying as a falcon flies. It would be futile to attempt to fly as a falcon flies. Though this person might be minimally distressed as a result of not being able to experience this, it is doubtful he would experience soul-crushing angst. Contrast this with a situation where one has trained for years to run an ironman triathlon, but one week prior to the event, she is paralyzed from the neck down in a tragic automobile accident. To now try and compete in the triathlon without mechanical assistance would be futile. Given the importance of this goal in the person’s life, she would appropriately feel significant existential angst at not being able to compete. Years of training would be unrewarded. Deep hopes would be dashed. A central life goal is now forever unfulfilled. The level of existential angst accompanying futility, then, is proportional to the level of one’s investment in some desired end and the relative desirability of that end.
The preceding analysis is relevant to futility and life’s meaning. What might people have in mind when they say that life itself is futile if naturalism is true and death is the last word of our lives and the universe? The discrepancy here from which a sense of futility emerges is between central longings of the human heart and a world devoid of God and an afterlife, which is a world incapable of fulfilling such longings. There is a stark incongruity between what we really want (even what we might say we need) and a completely and utterly silent universe that does not care. There is also a discrepancy between the final state of affairs where quite literally nothing matters, and the current state of affairs where many things seem to matter (e.g., relationships, personal and cultural achievements, and scientific advancements, among others). It seems hard to fathom that things with such existential gravitas are but a vapor in the grand scheme of things. We might also call this absurd, since absurdity and futility are connected, both of which are partly encapsulated in the idea of a profound incongruity or lack of fit.
Futility, in this way, connects to hope and expectations about fulfillment and longevity. In some circumstances, we are inclined to think that something is characterized by futility if it does not last as long as we think it should last given the kind of thing that it is. If you spend half a day building a snow fort and your children destroy it in five minutes, you will be inclined to think that your efforts were futile even though you accomplished your goal of building the fort. You will not, however, think your efforts were futile if the fort lasts a few days and provides you and your children with several fun adventures and a classic snowball fight. It needs to last long enough to serve its purpose.
Some say that an average human lifetime with average human experiences is sufficient to satiate core human longings and for us to accomplish central purposes (see Trisel 2004). Others, however, think that only eternity is long enough to do justice to those aspects of the human condition of superlative value, primarily and especially, happiness and love, the latter understood roughly as commitment to the true good or well-being of another. Some things are of such sublime character that for them to be extinguished, even after eons upon eons, is truly tragic, so the thinking goes. Anything less than forever is less than enough time, and leads to a sense of futility. We want the most important things in life—especially happiness, love and relationships—to last indefinitely. But if naturalism is true, all will be dissolved in the death of ourselves and the universe; it will be as if none of this ever happened. If the important stuff of life that we are so invested in lasts only a short while, many worry that life itself is deeply and ultimately futile.
Futility, then, is sometimes linked with how something ends. With life’s meaning in view, many worry that its meaning is jeopardized if, in the end, all comes indelibly to naught. Such worries have been articulated in what some call Final Outcome Arguments (see Wielenberg 2006). A final outcome argument is one whose conclusion is that life is somewhat or wholly meaningless or absurd or futile because of a “bad” ending. Such arguments can have weaker and stronger conclusions, ranging from a “bad” ending only slightly mitigating meaning all the way to completely destroying meaning. What they all have in common, however, is that they give the ending an important say in evaluating life’s meaning.
Why think that endings have such power? Many have argued that giving them this power arbitrarily privileges the future over the past. Thomas Nagel once said that “. . . it does not matter now that in a million years nothing we do now will matter” (Nagel 1971: 716). Why should we think the future is more important than, or relevant at all to the past and the present? But perhaps Nagel is mistaken. There may, in fact, be good reasons to think that how life ends is relevant for evaluating its meaning (see Seachris 2011). Whichever conclusion one adopts, principled reasons must be offered to settle the question of which viewpoint—the distant future or the immediate present—takes priority in appraisals of life’s meaning.
Within value theory, an under-investigated area is how meaning fits within the overall normative landscape. How is it connected, if at all, with ethical, aesthetic, and eudaimonistic value, for example? What sorts of relationships, conceptual, causal or otherwise, exist between the various values? Do some reduce to others? Can profoundly unethical lives still count as meaningful? What about profoundly unhappy lives? These and other questions are on the table as a growing number of researchers investigate them.
Another area in need of increased attention is the relationship between meaning and suffering. Suffering intersects with our attempts to make sense of our lives in this universe, motivates our questions about why we are here, and gives rise to our concerns about whether or not we ultimately matter. We wonder if there is an intelligible, existentially satisfying narrative in which to locate—make sense of—our visceral experience of suffering, and to give us solace and hope. Evil in a meaningful universe does not cease from being evil, but it can be more bearable within these hospitable conditions. Perhaps the problem of meaning is more fundamental than the problem of evil. Also relevant is what can be called the eschatological dimension of the problem of evil—is there any hope in the face of pain, suffering, and death, and if so, in what does this hope consist? Addressing future-oriented considerations of suffering will naturally link to perennial meaning of life topics like death and futility. Additionally, it will motivate further discussion over whether the inherent human desire for a felicitous ending to life’s narrative, including, for example, post-mortem survival and enjoyment of the beatific vision or some other blessed state is mere wishful thinking or a cousin to our desire for water, and thus, a truly natural desire that points to an object capable of fulfilling it.
Equally under-investigated is how the concept of narrative (and meta-narrative) might shed light on the meaning of life, and especially what talk of life’s meaning is often all about. Historically, most of the satisfying narratives that in some way narrated the meaning of life were also religious or quasi-religious. Additionally, many of these narratives count as narratives in the paradigmatic sense as opposed to non-narrative modes of discourse. However, with the rise of naturalism in the West, these narratives and the religious or quasi-religious worldviews embedded within them, began to lose traction in certain sectors. Out of this milieu emerged more angst-laden questioning of life’s meaning accompanied by the fear that a naturalistic meta-narrative of the universe fails to be existentially satisfying. More work is needed by cognitive scientists, theologians, and philosophers on our narrative proclivities as human beings, and how these proclivities shape and illumine our pursuit of meaning.
Finally, a number of pressing practical and ethical questions, especially focusing on marginalized populations, deserve more careful attention. For example, how might the actual lives and experiences of persons with disabilities inform and constrain theories of meaning in life? Do their lives call into question certain theories of meaning? What does the practice of solitary confinement reveal about the human need of meaning? Does the profound lack of meaning in such circumstances provide a reason to impose stricter limitations on its use? How might the human need for meaning (see Bettelhiem 1978; Frankl 2006) be leveraged to understand and then address systemic societal issues like homelessness and opioid addiction? How can understanding seemingly pathological expressions of our yearning for meaning help make sense of and respond to nationalism and terrorism?
Analytic philosophy, once deeply skeptical of and indifferent to the meaning of life, is now the source of important and interesting new theorization on the topic. There is even something of a subfield emerging, consisting of researchers devoting significant time and energy to understanding conceptual and practical aspects of life’s meaning. The topic is being approached with an analytic rigor that is leading to progress and opening exciting avenues for promising new breakthroughs. The philosophical waters, though still murky, are clearing.
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