Meaning and Communication

Communication is crucial for us as human beings. Much of what we know or believe we learn through hearing or seeing what others say or express, and part of what makes us human is our desire to communicate our thoughts and feelings to others. A core part of our communicative activity concerns linguistic communication, where we use the words and sentences of natural languages to communicate our ideas. But what exactly is going on in linguistic communication and what is the relationship between what we say and what we think? This article explores these issues.

A natural starting point is to hold that we use words and sentences to express what we intend to convey to our hearers. In this way, meaning seems to be linked to a speaker’s mental states (specifically to intentions). Given that this idea is at the heart of Paul Grice’s hugely influential theory of meaning and communication, this article begins by spelling out in detail how Grice makes the connection between communication and thought in section §1. The Intentionalist approach personified by Grice’s model has been endorsed by many theorists, and it has provided a very successful paradigm for empirical research; however, it is not without its problems. Section §2 surveys a number of problems faced by Grice’s specific account, and §3 considers challenges to the core Intentionalist claim itself, namely, that meaning and communication depend on the intentions of the speaker. Given these concerns, the article closes in section §4 with a sketch of two alternative approaches: one which looks to the function expressions play (teleology), and one which replaces the Intentionalist appeal to mental states with a focus on the social and normative dimensions of language and communication.

Table of Contents

  1. The Intentionalist Stance: Grice’s Theory of Meaning and Communication
    1. Grice’s Theory of Meaning
      1. Natural and Non-Natural Meaning
      2. Speaker-Meaning and Intention
      3. Speaker-Meaning as Conceptually Prior to Sentence-Meaning
    2. Grice’s Theory of Conversation
  2. Problems with Grice’s Theory of Meaning
    1. Problems with the First Condition of Grice’s Analysis
    2. Problems with the Third Condition of Grice’s Analysis
    3. The Insufficiency of Grice’s Analysis
    4. Problems with Conventional Speech Acts
    5. Problems with Explaining Sentence-meaning in Terms of Speaker-Meaning
  3. Are Intentionalist Approaches Psychologically Implausible?
    1. Is Grice’s Model Psychologically Implausible?
      1. Grice’s Response to the Challenge: Levels of Explanation
      2. A Post-Gricean Response: Relevance Theory
    2. Is the Intentionalist Assumption of the Priority of Thought over Language
  4. Rejecting Intentionalism
    1. Teleological Approaches: Millikan
    2. Normative Social Approaches
  5. Conclusion
  6. References and Further Reading

1. The Intentionalist Stance: Grice’s Theory of Meaning and Communication

a. Grice’s Theory of Meaning

Paul Grice’s seminal work has had a lasting influence on philosophy and has inspired research in a variety of other disciplines, most notably linguistics and psychology. His approach to meaning and communication exemplifies a general thesis which came to be called ‘Intentionalism’. It holds that what we mean and communicate is fixed by what we intend to convey. This idea is intuitively compelling but turns out to be hard to spell out in detail; this section thus offers a fairly detailed account of Grice’s view, divided into two subsections. §1.a summarises the core claims and concepts of Grice’s theory of meaning as well as Grice’s proposed definition of communication. §1.b. briefly summarises a different strand of Grice’s theory, namely, his theory of conversation, which concerns the role that the assumptions of cooperation and rationality play in communication. In setting out the different elements of Grice’s theory, the distinctions between his definition of communication and his theory of conversation become clear. References to other important Intentionalist accounts are provided throughout the article as well.

i. Natural and Non-Natural Meaning

Grice (1957/1989, pp. 213-215) starts by distinguishing two different kinds of meaning: natural and non-natural. The former occurs when a given state of affairs or property naturally indicates a further state of affairs or property, where “naturally indicates” entails standing in some kind of causal relation. So, for instance, we might say “Smoke means fire” or “Those spots mean measles”. This kind of natural meaning relation is very different, however, from non-natural meaning. For non-natural meaning, the relationship between the sign and what is signified is not straightforwardly causal. Examples of non-natural meaning include:

  1. “Three rings on the bell mean the bus will stop”;
  2. “By pointing at the chair, she meant you should sit down”;
  3. “In saying ‘Can you pass the salt?’ he meant Pass the salt”.

It is non-natural meaning (of which linguistic meaning forms a central case) that is the main explanatory target of Grice’s theory of meaning and it is therefore also the focus of this article.

In order to provide a systematic theory of non-natural meaning, Grice distinguishes two main types of non-natural meaning: speaker-meaning and sentence-meaning (this has come to be used as the standard terminology in literature, though it should be noted that Grice himself often preferred a different terminology and made more fine-grained distinctions). As the terms suggest, speaker-meaning is what speakers mean when uttering a sentence (or using a type of gesture, and so forth) on a particular occasion, although sentence-meaning is what sentences mean, where ‘sentences’ are understood as the abstract entities that can be used by speakers on different occasions. Importantly, what a speaker means when using a sentence on a particular occasion need not correspond to its sentence-meaning. For instance, in (3), it seems the speaker means something (pass the salt) which differs slightly from the sentence-meaning (can you pass the salt?). This point returns in subsection §1.b.

Having distinguished speaker-meaning from sentence-meaning, Grice (1957/1989) advances his central claim that speaker-meaning grounds and explains sentence-meaning, so that we can derive sentence-meaning from the more basic notion of speaker-meaning. This claim is crucial to Grice’s overarching aim of providing a naturalistically respectable account of non-natural meaning. That is to say, Grice’s aim is to give an account of non-natural meaning which locates it firmly in the natural world, where it can be explained without appeal to any strange abstract entities (see the article on Naturalism for further details on naturalistic explanations). To do this, Grice was convinced that gestural and conventional meaning needed to be reduced to claims about psychological content—the things that individual gesturers and speakers think and intend. In order to explain how this reduction comes about, Grice’s analysis of speaker-meaning is considered in §1.a.ii, and Grice’s explanation of sentence-meaning in §1.a.iii.

ii. Speaker-Meaning and Intention

According to Grice, speaker-meaning is to be explained in psychological terms, more specifically in terms of a speaker’s intentions. Grice’s analysis thus lines up with the intuition that what a speaker means when producing an utterance is what she intends to get across. Starting with this intuition, one might think that speaker-meaning simply occurs when a speaker intends:

(i) to produce an effect in the addressee.

For instance, imagine that Anne says, “I know where the keys are”. We might think that Anne means Anne knows where the keys are by this utterance because this is the belief she intends her audience to form (that is, the effect she intends to have on her audience is that they form that belief). However, Grice (1957/1989, p. 217) argues that this condition is not sufficient. To see this, imagine that Jones leaves Smith’s handkerchief at a crime scene in order to deceive the investigating detective into believing that Smith was the murderer. Jones intends the detective to form a belief (and so satisfies condition (i)), but it seems incorrect to say that Jones means that Smith was the murderer by leaving the handkerchief at the crime scene. In this situation, it does not seem right to think of Jones as non-naturally meaning or communicating anything by leaving the handkerchief (this intuition is reinforced by recognising that if the detective knew the origin of the sign—that it had been left by Jones—that would fundamentally change the belief the detective would form, suggesting that the belief the detective does form is not one that has been communicated by Jones).

To address this worry, Grice suggests adding a second condition to the definition of speaker-meaning, namely that the speaker also intends:

(ii) that the addressee recognises the speaker’s intention to produce this effect.

This condition avoids our problem with Jones and the handkerchief, demanding the intentions involved in communication to be overt and not hidden, in the sense that the speaker must intend the addressee to recognise the speaker’s communicative aim. Although Grice (1957/1989, pp. 218-219) believes that these two conditions are indeed necessary for speaker-meaning, he argues that one more condition is required for a sufficient analysis. This is because of cases such as the following. Imagine that Andy shows Bob a photograph of Clyde displaying undue familiarity with Bob’s wife. According to Grice, we would not want to say in such a case that Andy means that Bob’s wife is unfaithful, although Andy might well fulfil our two conditions (he might intend Bob to form such a belief and also intend Bob to recognise his intention that Bob forms such a belief). The reason this does not count as a genuine case of communication, Grice claims, is that Andy would have acquired the belief that his wife is unfaithful just by looking at the photo. Andy’s intentions do not then, Grice contends, stand in the right relation to Bob’s belief, because Bob coming to have the belief in question is independent of Andy’s intentions. So, according to Grice, the speaker must not only intend to produce an effect (condition (i)) and intend this intention to be recognised (condition (ii)) but the recognition of (ii) must also play a role in the production of the effect.

Grice holds that these three conditions are necessary and jointly sufficient for a speaker to mean something by an utterance. His account of speaker-meaning (for assertions) can be thus summarised as follows:

A speaker, S, speaker-means that p by some utterance u if and only if for some audience, A, S intends that:

(a) by uttering u, S induces the belief that p in A;
(b) A should recognise that (a);
(c) A’s recognition that (a) should be the reason for A forming the belief that p.

Grice further specifies that what the speaker means is determined, that is, established, by the intended effect. (i-iii) define what is needed for an assertion, as the intended effect is for the audience to form a certain belief—for example, in the example above, Anne intends her audience to form the belief that Anne knows where the keys are. On the other hand, in cases where the speaker means to direct the behaviour of the addressee, Grice claims that the intended effect specified in (i-iii) should instead be that the audience performs a certain action—for example, a person pointing at a chair means the addressee should sit down.

iii. Speaker-Meaning as Conceptually Prior to Sentence-Meaning

As noted above Grice held that speaker-meaning is more basic than sentence-meaning. Note that Grice’s analysis of speaker-meaning does not contain any reference to sentence-meaning. The analysis refers only to utterances and although these can be productions of a sentence or of some other abstract entity (such as a recurrently used type of gesture) this does not have to be the case. To illustrate this, consider an example from Dan Sperber and Deidre Wilson (1995, pp. 25-26) in which a speaker responds to the question “How are you feeling?” by pulling a bottle of aspirin out of her handbag. Here, the speaker means that she is not feeling well but she does not produce anything appropriately considered an utterance of a sentence or some other type of behaviour that has an established or conventionalised meaning. This illustrates that speaker-meaning can be explained in psychological terms without reference to sentence-meaning.

Sentence-meaning, on the other hand, does (according to Grice) require appeal to speaker-meaning. The idea here is that the sentences of a language do not have their meaning in virtue of some mind-independent property but in virtue of what speakers of the language do with them. Hence, Grice claims that “what sentences mean is what (standardly) users of such sentences mean by them; that is to say what psychological attitudes toward what propositional objects such users standardly intend […] to produce by their utterance.” (Grice, 1989, p. 350). For example, the sentence “snow is white” means snow is white because this is what speakers usually intend to get across by uttering this sentence. In this way, Grice explains non-natural meaning in purely psychological terms.

One reservation one might have about this approach is that it looks like Grice gets the relationship between speaker-meaning and sentence-meaning ‘backwards’ because sentence-meaning seems to play an important role in how speakers get across what they intend to convey. For example, Anne’s intention to convey that she knows where the keys are by uttering “I know where the keys are” seems to depend on the meaning of the sentence. So how can speaker-meaning be conceptually prior to sentence-meaning? This worry can be addressed, however, by highlighting a distinction between constitutive and epistemic aspects of speaker-meaning. On Grice’s account, what a speaker means is constituted by the kind of complex intention described in (i-iii) above. However, speakers can nevertheless exploit an established sentence-meaning when they try to get their audiences to recognise what they mean (Grice, 1969/1989, p. 101). The idea here is that an efficient way for a speaker such as Anne to get across that she knows where the keys are will simply be to say, “I know where the keys are”. Although what she means is determined by her intention, the use of the respective sentence allows her to convey this intention to her audience in a straightforward way. At the same time, an established use of a sentence will also inform (or constrain) the formation of communicative intentions on the side of the speaker. For example, a speaker who knows the meaning of the sentence “I know where the keys are” will not utter it intending to convey that ostriches are flightless birds, say, because—in the absence of a very special context—it would be irrational for the speaker to think that this intention would be correctly recognised by the addressee. Importantly, this does not entail that speaker-meaning cannot diverge from sentence-meaning at all and, as is discussed in §1.b, in fact, such divergences are not uncommon.

This section concludes with a note on communication. As has been noted by Intentionalists such as Peter Strawson, for Grice the kind of complex intention that he described seems to play two roles. First, it is supposed to provide an analysis of what it takes for a speaker to mean something. In addition, however, it is also “undoubtedly offered as an analysis of a situation in which one person is trying, in a sense of the word ‘communicate’ fundamental to any theory of meaning, to communicate with another.” (1964, p. 446). Put somewhat differently, on Grice’s account for an agent to communicate something she will need to mean what she tries to get across and this meaning is analysed in terms of the complex intention that Grice provided as an analysis of speaker-meaning. The communicative attempt will be successful—that is, communication will occur—if and only if this intention is recognised by the speaker. For this reason, such intentions have come to be called “communicative intentions” in the literature following Grice (he himself preferred to speak of “m-intentions”).

b. Grice’s Theory of Conversation

The basis of Grice’s theory of conversation lies in his distinction between what is said and what is implicated by a speaker, both of which are part of the content that a speaker communicates (and therefore part of the speaker’s communicative intention). Roughly speaking, what is said lines up with sentence-meaning, with adjustments being made for context-sensitive expressions, such as “I” or “tomorrow” and ambiguous terms (such as “bank” or “crane”; see the article on Meaning and Context-Sensitivity). Although what is implicated is what a speaker communicates without explicitly saying it. To illustrate this distinction, consider the following examples:

(4)         Alice: Do you want to go to the cinema?

Bill: I have to work.

(5)         Professor: Some students have passed the exam.

In an exchange such as (4), it is clear that Bill does not merely communicate what he literally says, which is that he has to work. He also communicates that he cannot go to the cinema. Similarly, in (5) the professor does not merely communicate that some students have passed the exam (which is what she explicitly says) but that not all students have passed. Such implicitly or indirectly communicated contents are what Grice calls “implicatures” and his theory of conversation attempts to explain how they are conveyed.

At the basis of his explanation lies a crucial assumption about communication, namely that communication is a rational and cooperative practice. The main idea is that communicative interactions usually serve some mutually recognised purpose—such as the exchange of information—and that participants expect everyone to work together in pursuing this purpose. This assumption is captured in Grice’s Cooperative Principle:

Make your conversational contribution such as is required, at the stage at which it occurs, by the accepted purpose or direction of the talk exchange in which you are engaged. (1975/1989, p. 26)

Grice further specifies what communicative cooperation involves by distinguishing four central conversational categories: quantity, quality, relation, and manner. All categories come with one or more conversational maxims that are supposed to be observed by cooperative communicators. Roughly, maxims under the category of quantity require interlocutors to provide the right amount of information, whereas quality maxims require speakers to provide only information that they believe to be true (or for which they have sufficient evidence). The only maxim under the category of relation is that interlocutors must make relevant contributions. Finally, maxims of manner require that interlocutors’ contributions are perspicuous.

How do the Cooperative Principle and the associated maxims help to explain how implicatures are communicated? Consider again the exchange in (4). In order to figure out what Bill implicated when he said, “I have to work”, Alice can reason as follows: I assume that Bill is being cooperative, but what he said, on its own, is not a relevant response to my question. I should infer, then, that Bill intended to communicate something in addition to what he merely said, something that does provide a relevant response to my question. This further information is probably that he cannot come to the cinema because he will be at work. A similar explanatory method is available for (5).

More generally, Grice (1975/1989, p. 31) proposes the following as a general pattern for inferring implicatures:

  • S has said that p;
  • there is no reason to suppose that S is not observing the maxims, or at least the Cooperative Principle;
  • S could not be doing this unless he thought that q;
  • S knows […] that I can see that the supposition that S thinks that q is required;
  • S has done nothing to stop me thinking that q;
  • S intends me to think […] that q;
  • and so S has implicated that q.

Notice that this pattern is not supposed to be deductively valid but rather to provide a pattern for an inference to the best explanation. In the first two decades of the twenty-first century it became common for theorists to hold that inferences of this kind not only play a role in the process of interpreting implicatures but also in many other types of linguistic phenomena, such as resolving ambiguous and vague terms. Because such inferences rely not just on sentence-meaning but also on considerations of cooperation, context, and speaker intention, they are often referred to as “pragmatic inferences” or instances of “pragmatic reasoning”.

2. Problems with Grice’s Theory of Meaning

Grice’s theory of meaning has been subject to numerous challenges. This section briefly outlines the standard objections and explains how Grice and other Intentionalists have tried to deal with them. A further problem for Grice’s account, concerning its psychological plausibility, is considered separately in §3.

a. Problems with the First Condition of Grice’s Analysis

As noted, the first condition of Grice’s analysis states that in order to communicate, a speaker must have the intention to bring about an effect in her audience. There are two main types of objection to this claim: first, there are cases in which the intended effects are not the ones that Grice claims they are and, second, there are cases where speakers do not intend to have any effect on an audience, yet which still communicate something.

To appreciate the first worry, it is useful to focus on assertions, where Grice claims that the intended effect is that the audience forms a belief. Reminders, however, seem to be a counterexample to this claim. For instance, imagine a scenario in which the addressee knows that a woman’s name is ‘Rose’ but cannot recall this piece of information in a particular situation. In such a case, the speaker might hold up a rose or simply say the following to remind the addressee:

(7) Her name is Rose.

It seems that the speaker does not want to make the addressee believe that the woman’s name is Rose because the addressee already believes this. It is equally clear, however, that the speaker means or communicates that the woman’s name is Rose. A second type of counterexample concerns examination cases. Imagine that a teacher asks a student when the Battle of Waterloo was fought to which the student replies:

(8) The Battle of Waterloo was fought in 1815.

Again, the student is not intending that the teacher forms the respective belief because the teacher already knows when the Battle of Waterloo occurred. But the student still clearly communicates that the Battle of Waterloo was fought in 1815.

Turning to the second objection, some cases suggest that a speaker need not have any audience-directed intention whatsoever. For instance, sometimes a speaker lacks an audience, such as when writing in a personal diary or practicing a speech in an empty room. However, we still want to say that the speaker means something in such cases. In other cases, speakers do have an audience, but they do not intend their utterances to have any effect on the audience. For example, imagine that an employee at a train station is reading out a list of departures over the loudspeaker. They utter:

(9) The next London train departs at 4 pm.

It is possible that the employee does not care in the least if—and therefore also does not intend that—any passenger thereby comes to believe that the train leaves at 4 pm. Rather the employee is just complying with the requirements of her job. Nonetheless, it seems highly counterintuitive to claim that the employee does not communicate that the train departs at 4 pm. These are just a few illustrations of the numerous examples that, theorists have argued, challenge the fundamental Intentionalist claim that communication requires intentions to cause certain effects in an audience.

Grice (1989) and other scholars who are sympathetic to his theory (for example, Neale 1992, Schiffer 1972) have responded to such examples in numerous ways. A first strategy is to try to accommodate the problem cases by modifying Grice’s original analysis. For example, Grice suggests that reminders could be dealt with by specifying that the intended effect for assertions is not that a belief is formed but that an activated belief is formed (1969/1989, p. 109). Or again, to deal with cases such as examinations Grice proposes further modifying the first condition so that it requires not that the addressee forms an activated belief, but rather that the addressee forms the activated belief that the speaker has the respective belief (1969/1989, pp. 110-111). Hence, in the examination case, the student would intend his utterance to have the effect that the teacher forms the activated belief that the student believes that the Battle of Waterloo was fought in 1815. To deal with other counterexamples of this kind, Grice (1969/1989) proposed further (and increasingly complex) refinements of his original analysis.

Another strategy to deal with alleged counterexamples is to argue that they are in fact compatible with Grice’s original analysis. For example, in cases in which no audience is directly present one might argue that the utterances are still made with the intention of having an effect on a future or possible audience (Grice, 1969/1989, pp. 112-115; Schiffer, 1972, pp. 73-79). Finally, a third strategy is to argue that the definitions of meaning provided by Grice and his followers capture speaker-meaning in its primary sense and that the counterexamples only involve cases of meaning in “an extended or attenuated sense, one derived from and dependent upon the primary sense” (Schiffer, 1972, p. 71). The idea seems to be that the counterexamples are in a sense parasitic upon more standard cases of meaning. For example, it might be argued that an utterance such as (8) is a case of meaning in an extended sense. The utterance can be taken to mean that the next London train departs at 4 pm because this is what speakers usually mean by uttering this sentence (standard meaning), and this is captured by the Gricean analysis.

However, counterexamples to Grice and his followers have been numerous and varied and not everybody has been convinced that the responses proposed can successfully deal with them all. For instance, William Alston (2000, pp. 45-50) has presented a critical examination of Intentionalist defences and pointed out—among other things—that it is far from clear that examples such as (8) can be treated as extended cases of meaning. Further, Alston asks the more general question of whether such a treatment would be attractive from a methodological point of view. In the face of these challenges, then, it remains an open question whether Grice’s fundamental claim—that communication necessarily involves intentions to cause effects on one’s audience (captured in the first clause of his analysis)—can be defended.

b. Problems with the Third Condition of Grice’s Analysis

A less fundamental but nonetheless important worry concerns the third condition of Grice’s analysis, according to which recognition of the speaker’s intention must be (at least part of) the reason that the intended effect comes about. As noted, Grice introduced this condition to deal with cases in which the first two conditions are fulfilled but where there is no relation between the two (because the speaker presents evidence that is already sufficient to bring about the intended effect, as in the photograph case discussed in §1.a.ii).

Theorists have worried that this condition might be too strict because it excludes cases that do intuitively involve communication. A first concern is that intuitions are far from clear even for Grice’s own photograph example. Is Grice right to hold that Andy failed to mean that Bob’s wife is unfaithful when showing the photograph to Bob? In addition, however, there are also counterexamples in which the third condition is not fulfilled but where there is a rather clear intuition that the speaker communicated something. Consider reminders again. It seems that reminders might not only pose a problem for Grice’s first but also for the third condition because they usually have their effects by means of prompting the speaker to remember something rather than because the hearer recognises that the speaker intended this effect. For example, a speaker who utters (6) to remind the addressee that a certain woman’s name is ‘Rose’ might well intend the speaker to remember this not because the addressee recognises this intention but because seeing the rose is sufficient to prompt the addressee’s memory. Nonetheless, one might still want to allow that by producing the utterance the speaker meant and communicated that the woman’s name is ‘Rose’.

Such examples undermine the necessity of Grice’s third condition and, despite his insistence to the contrary (1969/1989, p. 109), several Intentionalists have suggested that it might be dropped or at least weakened (Neale, 1992, pp. 547-549; Schiffer, 1972, pp. 43-48; Sperber and Wilson, 1995, pp. 29, 50-54). One such weakening strategy is considered in §3.a.ii, when the main tenets of Relevance Theory are discussed.

Another strategy that has been proposed is to move the third clause outside the scope of the communicator’s intentions (Moore, 2017a). The idea is that, in general, communicative acts are efficacious when they are properly addressed, and the recipient produces the intended response partly because she recognises that she is being addressed. However, the communicator need not intend that the recipient recognises the overtness of a communicative act as a reason to produce the intended response. This strategy is part of a wider attempt at de-intellectualising the cognitive and motivational requirements for engaging in Gricean communication (as §3.b shows).

c. The Insufficiency of Grice’s Analysis

Although the first two objections claim that certain aspects of Grice’s analysis are not necessary, one can also object by claiming that Grice’s conditions are insufficient to account for communication. This objection, first raised by Strawson (1964, pp. 446-447) and further developed, among others, by Schiffer (1972, pp. 17-27), maintains that there are cases in which all three of Grice’s conditions are satisfied but which do not count as cases of communication. These examples are complicated, but Coady (1976, p. 104) nicely summarises the clearest one:

The most intelligible of such examples is one we owe to Dennis Stampe (although it is not cited by Schiffer) in which a man playing bridge against his boss, and anxious to curry favour, wants his boss to win and to know that the employee wants him to win. He has reason to believe that the boss will be pleased to see that the employee wants him to win but displeased at anything as crude as a signal or other explicit communication to the effect that now he has a good hand. Hence, when he gets a good hand the employee smiles in a way that is rather like but just a bit different from a spontaneous smile of pleasure. He intends the boss to detect the difference and argue (as Grice puts it): ‘That was not a genuine give-away smile, but the simulation of such a smile. That sort of simulation might be a bluff (on a weak hand), but this is bridge, not poker, and he would not want to get the better of me, his boss, by such an impropriety. So probably he has a good hand, and, wanting me to win, he hoped I would learn that he has a good hand by taking his smile as a spontaneous give-away. That being so, I shall not raise my partner’s bid.

What cases of this kind suggest, then, is that Grice’s original analysis is insufficient to ensure the overtness required for communication, that is, that the relevant intentions of speakers are transparent to their interlocutors. As noted above, Grice’s second condition was introduced to prevent deceptive intentions (as in the case of the murderer who left Smith’s handkerchief at the crime scene). However, the example of the bridge players shows that the second condition is insufficient to exclude deception at higher levels. In response to this worry, Strawson (1964, p. 447) proposed adding a fourth condition to Grice’s analysis, but Schiffer (1972, pp. 18-23) argued that in fact five conditions would be needed. However, as Schiffer himself highlights, the problem with all such moves to add additional clauses seeking to rule out certain orders of deceptive intentions is that they will always be open to the construction of ever more complex counterexamples in which all the conditions are fulfilled but where a deceptive intention at a still higher level causes problems. Hence, there is a threat of an indefinite regress of conditions.

Grice himself discusses two main strategies for responding to the concern about deceptive intentions. The first is to insist that complexity has an upper bound, so the regress stops at some point and no further conditions are needed (1969/1989, pp. 98-99). His claim is that at some point the intention that a speaker would need to have for it to constitute a further counterexample would just be too complex to count as psychologically real for the speaker or addressee. However, Grice himself (1969/1989, p. 99) and other Intentionalists (for example, Schiffer 1972, pp. 24-26) raised doubts about this response, objecting both that it fails to specify exactly where the cut-off point is and that it fails to provide the philosophically rigorous analysis of communication that Grice set out to deliver (since it fixes the cut-off point on the basis of contingent facts about the cognitive capabilities of current interlocutors rather than on the basis of the nature of communication).

The second strategy—the one that Grice prefers—is simply to rule out deceptive or hidden intentions (1969/1989, pp. 99-100). However, as Grice (1982/1989, p. 303) realises, there seems to be a worry that the introduction of these conditions is ad hoc and, related to this, other theorists such as Kent Bach and Robert Harnish (1979, p. 153) have wondered why it would be appropriate to introduce a condition against these complex forms of deception but not against simple forms of deception such as lying. Further, Schiffer (1972, p. 26) claims that Grice’s condition might be incapable of accounting for some of the more intricate counterexamples that he constructs. Despite these worries, Grice (1982/1989, pp. 302-303) and some other theorists such as Neale (1992, p. 550) have maintained that a condition against hidden intentions provides the best remedy for deception cases.

Schiffer himself proposes dealing with deceptive cases by appealing to what he calls “mutual knowledge” (1972, p. 30). (David Lewis (1969) is generally credited with introducing the related notion of common knowledge; Schiffer’s notion of mutual knowledge is also clearly related to other so-called ‘common ground’ views, such as those of Stalnaker (2002; 2014), Bach and Harnish (1979), and Clark (1992; 1996).) Roughly, two or more people have mutual knowledge of some state of affairs if they all know that the state of affairs obtains, know that the others know that the state of affairs obtains, know that the others know that they know that the state of affairs obtains, and so on indefinitely. For example, two people who are facing each other while sitting around a table with a candle on it will have mutual knowledge that there is a candle on the table because each of them knows that there is a candle on the table, knows that the other one knows that there is a candle on the table, knows that the other knows that one knows that there is a candle on the table, and so on. Schiffer’s (1972, p. 39) proposal is then to build into Grice’s analysis of speaker-meaning a condition that requires a speaker to be intending to bring about a state of affairs that makes it mutual knowledge that the speaker is intending to cause an effect in the audience by means of the audience’s recognition of this intention. In other words, for Schiffer, communication consists in contributing to the set of mutually known things by making one’s intention known to one’s audience. This, according to Schiffer, handles counterexamples that involve deception because in these cases the interlocutors lack mutual knowledge of the speaker’s intentions. For instance, in the example above, it is not mutual knowledge that the employee intends the boss to believe that he has a good hand by means of the boss’ recognition of this intention because the boss does not know that the employee intends his fake smile to be recognised as such.

Now, it is an essential feature of mutual knowledge that it involves an endless series of knowledge states and one might wonder why the introduction of a condition that appeals to mutual knowledge would therefore not also invite a problematic regress; Grice (1982/1989, p. 299) himself expressed such a worry about Schiffer’s account. Responding to this, Schiffer claims that the infinite series of knowledge states required for mutual knowledge is a “harmless regress” (1972, p. 30) because such an infinite series is also required for individual knowledge. For example, it might be thought that if a person knows that Berlin is in Germany, she will also know that she knows that Berlin is in Germany, know that she knows that she knows that Berlin is in Germany, and so on. Hence, he argues that appeals to mutual knowledge do not create any special problem.

The literature on mutual knowledge contains several attempts at spelling out Schiffer’s insight that the notion of mutual knowledge, understood in terms of dispositions to draw an indefinite number of inferences, is not problematic from a psychological point of view. One such attempt is discussed in §3.a.ii, when the notion of mutual manifestness is introduced. This strategy, proposed and popularised in the first two decades of the twenty-first century, though not discussed in this article in detail, is to conceptualise mutual knowledge as a relational mental state, namely, as a mental state that two or more individuals have if there is a ternary relation that holds between them and a certain proposition (Wilby, 2010). Relational accounts of mutual knowledge, as well as of other cognate notions, have also been criticised on several fronts (see, for example, Battich and Geurts (2020)).

d. Problems with Conventional Speech Acts

Another challenge to the idea that Grice’s model is sufficient to give us a general account of communication has to do with a class of speech acts which are usually referred to as “conventional” (in the following, “speech act” is used to refer to what is usually called “illocutionary speech acts” in speech act theory; for further details, see the relevant sections of the article on John Langshaw Austin). Ever since Strawson’s (1964) introduction of Grice’s analysis to speech act theory, Intentionalists have distinguished conventional speech acts from what they deem to be communicative speech acts. According to them, communicative speech acts are speech acts that must be performed with a communicative intention and they will only be successful if the audience recognises this communicative intention. Types of speech acts that are standardly claimed to be communicative in this way are assertions and directives. Conventional speech acts, on the other hand, neither require any communicative intention on the side of the speaker nor any recognition by the audience for their successful performance. Instead, conventional speech acts depend on the existence of certain conventional or institutional background rules.

Here are two examples. First, consider checking in poker. In order to check in poker, all that one needs to do is to say “check” when it is one’s turn and certain conditions are satisfied (for example, no other player has yet made a bet in that round, and so forth). Importantly, no intention is required for a player to check as illustrated by the fact that sometimes players manage to check by saying “check” although they intended to bet. For this and other reasons, it is also not necessary that the player’s intention to check is recognised. Second, consider pronouncing a couple husband and wife. For a priest to do so, she only needs to say “I hereby pronounce you husband and wife” at the right point during a marriage ceremony. Again, for the speech act to work (that is, for the couple to be married) it will be irrelevant if the priest has a particular intention or if anyone recognises this intention. All that is necessary is that the speech act is performed according to the rules of the church. Of course, these are only two examples and it should be clear that there are many other conventional speech acts, including pronouncing a verdict, naming a ship, declaring war, and so on.

The problem that conventional speech acts pose for Grice’s account is that they have to be classified as non-communicative acts because for Grice speech acts are communicative only if they depend on the existence and recognition of communicative intentions. However, this result is unattractive because it seems false to claim that a speaker who checks in poker does not communicate that she is checking, or that a priest who is marrying a couple does not communicate this. Although theorists in the Gricean tradition usually recognise and accept that analysing communication in terms of certain complex intentions has this result, (Bach and Harnish, 1979, p. 117), a common defence is that it does not undermine Grice’s analysis because “such speech acts as belong to highly conventionalised institutions are, from the point of view of language and communication, of marginal interest only” (Schiffer, 1972, p. 93), and so belong to the study of institutions rather than communication (Sperber and Wilson, 1995, p. 245). It is unclear, however, why their conventional or institutional nature should make conventional speech acts less significant for the study of communication or be a reason to declare them non-communicative. One might claim instead that the Gricean theory is too narrow to include conventional speech acts and therefore defective as a general theory of communication.

e. Problems with Explaining Sentence-Meaning in Terms of Speaker-Meaning

Although the objections discussed in §2.a-d challenged the necessity and sufficiency of Grice’s proposed analysis of meaning and communication, the final set of objections challenges Grice’s claim that sentence-meaning can be reduced to speaker-meaning. One of the most well-known of these objections comes from Mark Platts (1997, pp. 89-90. Another famous objection to this claim has been presented by John Searle (1965); Searle’s objection has been addressed by Grice (1969/1989, pp. 100-105) and Schiffer (1972, pp. 27-30)). The problem with Grice’s analysis, Platts argues, is that a language allows for the formation of infinitely many sentences, most of which have never been used by any speaker, so there are no intentions that are usually associated with them. On Grice’s account, this would have the absurd consequence that most sentences lack meaning.

A possible response to this objection would be to slightly modify Grice’s account and claim that a sentence does not have meaning in virtue of the intentions that speakers actually have when using the sentence but in virtue of the intentions they would have if they were to use the sentence. However, this raises the question why speakers would have such intentions when using the sentence and it seems hard to explain that without making some reference to the meaning of the sentence itself. A more promising starting point in accounting for unuttered sentences is to note that sentences are complex entities that are composed of more basic elements, for example, words (see the article on Compositionality in Language). Taking this into account, a Gricean might argue as follows: there is a finite set of sentences that are regularly used by speakers and which thus have communicative intentions associated with them. Following Grice, one can claim that the meanings of this fixed set of sentences are determined by the intentions that speakers usually have when using them. But once the meaning of these sentences is fixed in this way, the meaning of the constituent words must be fixed, too (by how they are used by speakers in constructing sentences). And once the meaning of words is fixed in this way, they can be combined in novel ways to form new sentences and thereby restrict the possible intentions that speakers may have when using these new sentences and, therefore, also fix the meanings of these new sentences (such a move might be compatible with holding that speakers tacitly know a Davidsonian-style T-theory for their language, though the Intentionalist would claim that the basic meanings deployed in such a theory are generated via speaker intentions rather than via Davidson’s own notion of ‘radical interpretation’; see Davidson: Philosophy of Language). Grice (1968/1989) seems to make a similar proposal when arguing that not only sentence-meaning but also word-meaning should be explained by reference to speaker intentions (for a similar proposal, see Morris (2007, 262)). However, the success of this strategy will depend to a large extent on whether word-meaning can indeed be explained in terms of speaker intentions. After the first two decades of the twenty-first century, a detailed account of how exactly this might be done is yet to come.

3. Are Intentionalist Approaches Psychologically Implausible?

Although section §2 looked at specific objections to some of the elements of the Gricean model, an objection can also be levelled at Intentionalism more generally, concerning its psychological implausibility. This objection deserves to be taken seriously because it targets the core feature of the Intentionalist approach, namely, the overarching ambition of explaining semantic notions in psychological terms.

The objection from psychological implausibility takes two forms: first, there is a worry that the specific Intentionalist model which Grice gives us fails to fit with the cognitive processes which underlie the grasp of meaning and communication. Second, some have objected to the Intentionalist claim per se along the lines that, from a developmental and evolutionary point of view, it gets the relationship between meaning and thought the wrong way round. These challenges are explored in this section.

a. Is Grice’s Model Psychologically Implausible?

To get an intuitive sense of the concern, consider a speaker, S, who has the communicative intention of informing her hearer, H, that coffee is ready. One way of spelling out what it is for S to have an informative intention is to say that:

(i) S intends H to form a certain belief, in this case, that coffee is ready.

As already discussed, if S’s act is to count as communicative in Grice’s sense, it must be overt. So, at least (ii) must also hold:

(ii) S intends that H comes to believe that S intends to inform H.

Correlatively, understanding a communicative act seems to require the hearer to recognise the speaker’s intention as specified in (ii), the content of which comprises a complex embedding of intentions and beliefs. However, the current objection goes, in ordinary communicative exchanges speakers and hearers do not seem to go through complex inferences about each other’s mental states. Indeed, linguistic communication appears to be, by and large, an ‘automatic’ process. So, the model proposed by Grice seems not to fit with the actual psychological processes involved in language understanding and communication.

This concern was often voiced in Grice’s lectures (see, for instance, Warner (2001, p. x)). A prominent presentation of the argument can be found in the work of Ruth Millikan (1984, Chapter 3; other authors who have voiced similar concerns include Alston, 2000; Apperly, 2011; Azzouni, 2013; Gauker, 2003; Pickering and Garrod, 2004). In the remainder of this section, this objection is considered on its own terms, together with some of the replies that have been offered. Millikan’s teleological approach comes back in §4.a.

i. Grice’s Response to the Challenge: Levels of Explanation

Grice’s response to the allegation of psychological implausibility was to stress that his account was meant as a rational explanation of communicative interactions, and not as an attempt to capture the psychological reality of everyday communicative exchanges (Warner, 2001). Another proposal for how to understand Grice’s claim has been offered by Bart Geurts and Paula Rubio-Fernandez (2015), drawing on David Marr’s (1982) distinction between the computational and algorithmic levels of explanation. A computational level explanation captures the task or function a system aims to perform (that is, what mapping from inputs to outputs the system is designed to implement), while an algorithmic explanation captures the actual rules or states of the system which realise that function. So, supposing that the function we want to compute is ‘2x2’ (this is the computational level description of the system), there are then two different algorithms that a system could use to compute this function:

x · x                        x + x

2 · _____                    x · _____

So, two systems can have the same computational description while making use of different algorithms.

In the context of linguistic communication, Geurts and Rubio-Fernandez (2015, pp. 457-459) argue, Gricean pragmatics is pitched at the computational level, specifying the desired mappings between inputs and outputs. Processing theories of communication, on the other hand, are pitched at the algorithmic level. Only processing theories need to reflect the psychological or cognitive reality of the minds of speakers since they need to explain how the model provided by Gricean pragmatics is implemented. According to Geurts and Rubio-Fernandez, then, the objection from psychological implausibility rests on the tacit assumption that Gricean pragmatics is not only a computational theory of pragmatics, but also an algorithmic theory of processing. If the distinction between these two levels of explanation can be maintained, and Gricean pragmatics is understood as being only a computational theory, then the objection from psychological implausibility is undermined.

Finally, if one wants to argue that Gricean pragmatics is psychologically implausible, one needs to provide reliable empirical evidence. Importantly, allegations of psychological implausibility often seem to rely on evidence from introspection. As Geurts and Rubio-Fernandez (2015, pp. 459-466) point out, even assuming that introspection is always reliable (which it is not), ascribing propositional attitudes need not be a conscious or consciously accessible process. It might very well be a process that, by and large, occurs unconsciously (even though, on reflection, communicators can easily and consciously access the outputs of this process). Therefore, evidence from introspection alone is not enough to support the argument that the Gricean model is psychologically unrealistic.

ii. A Post-Gricean Response: Relevance Theory

The concern to capture the psychological reality of our everyday communicative exchanges is also at the heart of a highly influential post-Gricean approach known as ‘Relevance Theory’, which aims at providing a theory of communication that is not only plausible but also explanatory from a cognitive point of view. Proposed by Dan Sperber and Deirdre Wilson (1995), Relevance Theory has been highly influential not only in philosophy but also in linguistics and psychology (Noveck, 2012).

It is important to note that Relevance Theory aims at being, primarily, a theory of communication and not a theory of meaning, although it is suggestive of what is known as a ‘contextualist’ approach with respect to meaning (see Meaning and Context-Sensitivity, section 2). Furthermore, advocates of Relevance Theory stress that, even if Gricean insights have inspired much of their theorising, their approach differs in crucial respects from Grice’s own theory of communication (Sperber and Wilson, 2012, Ch. 1). To introduce the reader to this alternative approach, this section starts by presenting the notions of mutual manifestness and ostensive-inferential communication, which are meant, respectively, to replace the notion of mutual knowledge and expand Grice’s notion of communication (as anticipated in §§2.b and 2.c).

According to Sperber and Wilson (1995, pp. 15-21), the notion of mutual knowledge is not psychologically plausible because it requires interlocutors to have infinitely many knowledge states, and this is just not possible for creatures with limited cognitive resources. Although the argument against mutual knowledge is not perfectly clear, it seems that, according to Sperber and Wilson, when one knows (in the ‘occurrent’ sense of the term) that p, one must have formed a mental representation that p, and no cognitively limited being can form infinitely many representations. It is worth noticing that this further assumption might be misleading. As the early proponents (see §2.c) of the notion of mutual knowledge pointed out, the infinite series of knowledge states is to be understood as a series of inferential steps, which need not directly reflect individuals’ representational states. Therefore, there might not be anything psychologically improper about the notion of mutual knowledge. Setting this point to one side, however, it might still be that mutual manifestness proves more plausible from a cognitive perspective, and thus the notion is still worthy of exploration.

Sperber and Wilson begin their account by defining what they call ‘an assumption’. This is a thought that the individual takes to be true, and it is manifest to an individual if that individual has the cognitive resources to mentally represent it (in a certain environment at a certain time). Importantly, an assumption can be manifest without in fact being true. In this respect, the notion of manifestness is weaker than that of knowledge. Moreover, an assumption can be manifest even if the corresponding representation is neither currently entertained nor formed by the individual. Indeed, an assumption can be manifest simply if the individual has the cognitive resources to infer it from other assumptions, where the notion of inference is meant to cover deductive, inductive, and abductive inferences alike.

With the notion of manifestness in place, the definition of ostensive-inferential communication is next to be discussed, starting with the notion of informative intention. An informative intention is an intention to make a set of assumptions manifest (or more manifest) to the audience. This definition is meant to capture the fact that sometimes we intend to communicate something vague, like an impression. If one intends to make a set of assumptions more manifest to an audience, one might represent that set of assumptions under some description, without thereby representing any of the individual propositions in the set (Sperber and Wilson, 1995, pp. 58-60).

Often enough, the communicator also intends to make the fact that she has an informative intention manifest or more manifest to an audience. According to Sperber and Wilson (1995, pp. 60-62), when the communicator intends to make the informative intention mutually manifest between themselves and the audience, they thereby have a communicative intention. A communicative act in this sense is successful when the communicative intention is fulfilled, namely, when it is mutually manifest between the interlocutors that the communicator has an informative intention.

Finally, Sperber and Wilson (1995, p. 63) define ostensive-inferential communication:

The communicator produces a stimulus which makes it mutually manifest to communicator and audience that the communicator intends, by means of this stimulus, to make manifest or more manifest to the audience a set of assumptions.

Importantly, Sperber and Wilson do not take Grice’s third clause to be necessary for ostensive-inferential communication (see §2.b). In other words, they do not think that the fulfilment of the informative intention must be based on the fulfilment of the communicative intention. As a reminder: Grice’s third clause was meant to exclude, inter alia, cases of ‘showing’ from cases of genuine non-natural meaning. According to Sperber and Wilson (1995, pp. 59-60), however, it is useful to think that there is a continuum of cases from showing something to ‘meaning something’ (in Grice’s sense) in which, at one end of the spectrum, the third clause does not hold (showing), while at the other end of the spectrum the third clause does hold and the informative intention could not be retrieved without having retrieved the communicative intention.

The core of the explanation of pragmatic reasoning proposed by Sperber and Wilson hinges on the idea that any ostensive act comes with a presumption of relevance, and ultimately it is this assumption that guides the recipient in interpreting the utterance. This explanation is based on two principles, which Sperber and Wilson (1995, p. 261) call the cognitive and the communicative principles of relevance. The cognitive principle is meant to capture a general feature of human cognition, namely that it ‘tends to be geared to the maximisation of relevance’ (Sperber and Wilson, 1995, pp. 260-266); Sperber and Wilson emphasise that, in this context, the term ‘relevance’ is used in a technical sense. In this technical sense, the relevance that a representation has for an individual at a given time is a function that varies positively with cognitive benefits and negatively with cognitive costs, or effort required to access the representation (via either perception, memory or inference). This use of the term is then close to, but might not coincide exactly with, the use of the term in ordinary language.

The communicative principle of relevance (Sperber and Wilson, 1995, pp. 266-273), which applies to communication specifically, states that ‘every utterance communicates a presumption of its own optimal relevance’. The presumption of optimal relevance means that, other things being equal, the hearer will consider the utterance as worth the interpretive effort. The interpretive enterprise is thus aimed at finding the most relevant interpretation of an utterance that is compatible with what the hearer believes about the speaker’s abilities and preferences. The range of possible interpretations is constrained by the fact that the hearer will look for the most relevant interpretation that can be achieved whilst minimising cognitive effort.

Contra Grice, this heuristic mechanism for utterance interpretation does not presuppose that communication is a cooperative enterprise-oriented toward the achievement of a common goal. Therefore, it might provide a more straightforward explanation of communicative interactions that are not prima facie cooperative (for example, examinations, adversarial communication, and so on). On the other hand, one might argue, the principles of relevance are so general and vague that they can hardly be falsified, and therefore might lack the desired explanatory power. Wilson (2017, pp. 84, 87) has responded to this objection by pointing out that the principles would be falsified if, for instance, utterance interpretation were systematically driven by considerations of informativeness, where the information derived from utterance interpretation is informative but not relevant.

Relevance Theory sees the heuristic mechanism as explaining how speakers and hearers come to select appropriate assumptions among the many that are manifest to them, which is something that Grice left unexplained (although Levinson 1989 queries the extent to which Relevance Theory itself offers an adequate explanation in this regard). Importantly, proponents of Relevance Theory take the heuristic mechanism to be at play not only in the derivation of implicatures, but more generally in any sort of pragmatic reasoning that leads communicators to retrieve the communicated content, where this stretches from reference assignment and ambiguity resolution to the adjustment of lexical meaning (for an overview, see Wilson (2017, section 4.4); for a critique, see Borg (2016)).

Finally, according to Relevance Theory, pragmatic reasoning is fundamentally an exercise in mindreading, which they understand as attributing and reasoning about mental states (Sperber and Wilson, 2012, Ch. 11). In this respect, Relevance theorists in general tend to take a radically mentalistic stance on how to best interpret Gricean explanations of pragmatic reasoning. However, as the next section shows, this mentalistic stance has itself come under attack.

b. Is the Intentionalist Assumption of the Priority of Thought over Language Plausible?

The first objection from psychological implausibility (§3.a) was that the reasoning about mental states posited in the Gricean model was too complex to play a central explanatory role in linguistic exchanges. Even if this objection is dismissed, however, a related but distinct concern emerges from the fields of developmental and comparative psychology. Infants and (more controversially) some non-human primates appear to be proficient communicators, yet it is unclear to what extent, if at all, they can reason about mental states. This concern threatens one of the central assumptions of the Intentionalist approach, namely that reasoning about mental states comes before the grasp of linguistic meaning. In other words, this second objection from psychological implausibility holds that the Intentionalist approach gets the priority between language and mental state concepts the wrong way around.

A first reason for thinking that pre-linguistic or non-linguistic creatures lack the ability to attribute mental states is that most of what we come to know or believe about other minds is based on our understanding of what others say. It is thus not obvious that children could acquire mental state concepts without already having access to this source of information (for a rich elaboration of this point from an empirical point of view, see Astington and Baird (2005), as well as Heyes (2018, Ch. 8)). Correlatively, the youngest age at which children apparently manifest an understanding of false beliefs, which is often regarded as the hallmark of the capacity for mental state attribution, is between 3 and a half and 4 years of age, namely when they master a language that contains mental states terms (see Wellman, Cross, and Watson (2001), but see also Geurts and Rubio-Fernandez (2013); for a general overview of the field, see Theory of Mind). If one goes for the lowest threshold and assumes that the critical age for false-belief understanding is 3 and a half years of age, there still is an important gap between the time at which infants start communicating flexibly and effectively (after their first birthday), and the time in which they reason about others’ mental states.

Moreover, evidence from atypical development is suggestive of the same developmental trajectory, with linguistic competency developing prior to mental state attribution. For instance, deaf children born of hearing parents, who are delayed in their acquisition of a mental state vocabulary, also manifest a delay in their ability to reason about others’ mental states. Importantly, as soon as they learn the relevant mental state terms, their performance on mindreading tasks improves, even on tasks which do not involve significant use of language (see, for example, Pyers and Senghas (2009)). Or again, at least some individuals on the autistic spectrum successfully acquire language, even though this condition is standardly held to involve impairment to the ability to attribute mental states to others (see, for example, references in Borg (2006, fn. 6)).

The challenge to the Intentionalist approach is thus that from an empirical point of view, linguistic competency seems to precede, and possibly to support, the development of abilities to reason about mental states (rather than the reverse picture assumed by Intentionalists). However, not all researchers working in developmental or comparative psychology accept this claim. In response to the challenge, advocates of an Intentionalist model have argued, first, that there are reasons to think pre-linguistic communication must itself be Gricean in nature (so that an ability to do Gricean reasoning must be present prior to language acquisition; see, for example, Tomasello (2008; 2019)). Second, they have argued that (contrary to the suggestion above) typically developing infants do show sensitivity to others’ mental states prior to the acquisition of language (see, for example, Onishi and Baillargeon (2005); for a useful overview and further references, see Rakoczky and Behne (2019)). While the literature on child development in this area is fascinating, it is also extensive and full consideration of it would unfortunately take us too far afield. This section closes, then, just by noting that the exact nature of infants’ mindreading abilities is still hotly debated and thus whether infants and animals prove to be a direct challenge to Intentionalism remains to be seen. One final point is worth noting, however: following up on the considerations presented in §3.a.i, it seems that a model of communication need not, in general, determine a univocal cognitive underpinning. Therefore, in principle, there could be room for different specifications of the cognitive/motivational mechanisms that underlie communication, even if one grants that the relevant forms of communication must be Gricean in nature (this idea has been pursued by Richard Moore (2017b), who has proposed downplaying the cognitive requirements of Gricean communication in a way that might insulate the approach from developmental evidence of the kind alluded to in this section).

4. Rejecting Intentionalism

Although the previous two sections looked at a range of problems both for the Gricean model for understanding meaning and communication, and for the more general Intentionalist approach which Grice’s framework exemplifies, this article closes by touching briefly on two possible alternatives to the Intentionalist approach.

a. Teleological Approaches: Millikan

As noted above, Millikan’s work provides a clear statement of the objection that the Gricean model is psychologically implausible, but it is important to note that her objection to the Gricean programme emerges from her wider theory of meaning. Millikan’s ‘teleological semantics’ aims (like Grice’s approach) at giving a naturalistic explanation of meaning and communication. However, Millikan seeks to couch this in evolutionary terms which do not (contra Grice) presuppose mastery of mental state concepts. Instead, Millikan tries to show that both meaning and speakers’ intentions should be accounted for in terms of the more fundamental, teleological notion of ‘proper function’. (An alternative, equally important, variety of the teleological approach can be found in the work of Fred Dretske.) In very broad strokes, the proper function of a linguistic device, be it a word or a syntactic construction, is held to be the function that explains why that word or syntactic construction is reproduced and acted upon in certain ways. For instance, the proper function of a word like “dog” is “to communicate about or call attention to facts that concern dogs” (Millikan, 2004, p. 35) and it is the fact that speakers do use the word in this way, and hearers do come to think about such facts when they hear this word, that explains the continued use of the word. Or again, according to Millikan (1984, pp. 53-54), the indicative grammatical mood, which can take several different forms within and across languages, has the proper function of producing true beliefs, while the imperative mood has the proper function of producing compliance. When speakers utter a sentence in the imperative mood, they typically intend to produce compliance in their hearers, and this linguistic device has proliferated because often enough hearers do comply with imperatives.

Given this background, Millikan argues that communicative intentions are, by and large, not necessary for explaining linguistic communication. If you state that p, in Normal circumstances (where ‘Normal’ is a term of art that Millikan has tried repeatedly to specify) I will come to believe that p without needing to represent that you overtly intend me to believe that p. Indeed, according to Millikan (1984, pp. 68-70) language use and understanding happen, first and foremost, ‘automatically’, as ways to express (or act upon others’ expression of) beliefs and intentions. (In a later work, Millikan (2017) suggests that, although the phenomenology of the grasp of meaning may be that of an automatic process, there may nevertheless be some underlying inferential work involved.)

According to Millikan, we engage in the sort of mentalistic reasoning envisaged by Grice only when we somehow inhibit or exploit parts of the automatic processes for language production and understanding. A crucial aspect of Millikan’s argument is that only the mental states that we represent, and which are instantiated in some region of our brains, can be causally relevant to the production and understanding of linguistic utterances. In her view, mental states that we can easily and readily come to have on reflection, but that we do not use in performing a certain task, do not play any direct causal role and she argues that communicative intentions are, most of the time, dispositional in this sense.

b. Normative Social Approaches

A second major alternative to the Intentionalist approach has been offered by Robert Brandom (1994), who suggests that we explain linguistic communication, as well as semantic features of thought and talk, in terms of skilful participation in norm-governed social practices. The core idea is that it is possible to define practices that involve the use of linguistic signs (which Brandom terms ‘discursive practices’) as a species of norm-governed social practices, and that this definition can be given in non-semantic terms. Thus, Brandom argues that we can translate the normative dimension of basic discursive practices (which dictate what is permissible and what is not) into the inferential role of sentences in a language (which dictate which sentences are derivable, or compatible, or incompatible with which other sentences). For instance, a sentence like ‘New York is East of Pittsburgh’ entails, together with other background assumptions, the sentence ‘Pittsburgh is West of New York’. Brandom holds, then, that we can define the meaning of a sentence in terms of its inferential role within the discursive practices in which that sentence appears.

As Loeffler (2018, pp. 26-29) points out, Brandom does not offer a direct critique of Intentionalist accounts. However, one of the main motivations for exploring Brandom’s view is that it offers an account of how utterances can come to have conceptually structured content without presupposing that this content derives from the conceptually structured content of mental states.

Unlike Millikan’s approach, Brandom’s proposed explanation of content is non-naturalistic. Indeed, it makes crucial use of normative notions, chiefly those of commitment and entitlement. According to Brandom, the normativity of these twin notions cannot be accounted for naturalistically. Several theorists see the anti-naturalistic strand of Brandom’s proposal as highly objectionable; for further elaborations of the concerns underlying the objection, see Reductionism). However, this objection reflects general difficulties with naturalising normativity, and these difficulties are not specific to Brandom’s project. In fact, one might argue, Gricean conceptions of communication face an analogous problem, in that they explain linguistic communication as reasoning about mental states, an activity that also has an essentially normative dimension.

A key element of Brandom’s account (and of later, Brandom-inspired approaches, such as Geurts (2019); see also Drobnak (2021)) is the notion of a commitment. Commitments can be conceived of as ternary relations between two individuals and a proposition. To use one of Geurts’ examples, when Barney promises Betty that he will do the dishes, he becomes committed to Betty to act consistently with the proposition that Barney will do the dishes. On the other hand, on accepting Barney’s commitment, Betty becomes entitled to act on the proposition that Barney will do the dishes. As above, the notion of commitment is a normative one (if I commit myself to you to do the dishes, you are entitled to act on the proposition that I will do the dishes, and I can be held responsible if I fail to do the dishes). Moreover, the notion is non-mentalistic. Commitments can be undertaken either implicitly or explicitly, and one can undertake a commitment without knowing or believing that one has done so. Correlatively, one is entitled to act on someone’s commitments whether or not the agent knows that she is so entitled. Therefore, if we coordinate our actions by relying on the commitments that we undertake, we need not always attribute, or reason about, psychological states (for further elaboration and defence of this point, see Geurts (2019, pp. 2-3, 14-15)).

An important upshot of these considerations is that the commitment-sharing view of communication has the potential to account for pre-linguistic communicative interactions without presupposing much, if anything, regarding mindreading capacities, and this might constitute an explanatory advantage over Gricean approaches. In this respect, a promising line of inquiry would be to consider the notion of ‘sense of commitment’ elaborated by John Michael and colleagues (2016). Roughly, the idea is that an individual manifests a sense of commitment when, in the context of a joint action, that individual is motivated to act partly because she believes that other participants in the joint action expect her to do so. Michael and colleagues have proposed several strategies to spell out the notion of sense of commitment in detail, and to experimentally track the emergence and modulation of this aspect of human psychology from infancy. The unexplored potential of this framework for studying pre-linguistic communication becomes apparent if one considers communicative acts, like pointing gestures, as aimed at coordinating contributions to the joint action. Normative inferential approaches also hold out the promise of other advantages. For instance, theorists such as Geurts (2019) and Kukla and Lance (2009) argue that it can give us an attractive explanation of different speech act types (such as assertions, promises, directions or threats). Furthermore, Geurts (2019) emphasises that analysing speech acts in terms of commitments allows one to give a unified treatment of both conventional and non-conventional speech acts. This is an advantage over traditional Gricean pictures, in which conventional speech acts such as “I hereby pronounce you husband and wife” were considered non-communicative (see §2.d).

Finally, the approach might also be thought to yield a good account of the notion of common ground. Geurts’ (2019, pp. 15-20) proposal is to preserve the iterative structure of mutual knowledge (see §2.c), but to redefine common ground in terms of shared commitment. In a nutshell, all that is required for a commitment to be in place is that it is accepted, and when it is accepted, it thereby enters the common ground. If I commit to you to do the dishes, and you accept my commitment, we both become committed to act in a way that is consistent with the proposition that I will do the dishes. In other words, you too become committed to the proposition that I will do the dishes and as a result, for instance, you yourself will not do the dishes. Now, if I accept this commitment that you have as a result of accepting mine, I thereby undertake a further, higher-order commitment, that is, a commitment to you to the proposition that I am committed to you to do the dishes, and so on, as in the iterations that constitute mutual knowledge.

If the analysis of the notion of common ground in terms of shared commitments is tenable, it seems that there are good prospects for explaining pragmatic reasoning and linguistic conventions (on the subject of conventions, see Geurts (2018)). Regarding implicatures, Geurts observes that the same pragmatic reasoning that was proposed by Grice (see §1.b) can be cast in terms of commitments rather than psychological states:

It is common ground that:

(1) the speaker has said that p;
(2) he observes the maxims;
(3) he could not be doing this unless he was committed to q;
(4) he has done nothing to prevent q from becoming common ground;
(5) he is committed to the goal that q become common ground.

And so he has implicated that q. (Geurts, 2019, p. 21)

Although the schema is rather sketchy, it seems that it has the same explanatory capability as its Gricean counterpart. Of course, such a schema will be genuinely non-mentalistic only if all the elements in it have non-mentalistic descriptions and one might wonder whether the conversational maxims themselves can be rephrased in non-psychological terms. Geurts contends that the only maxim for which the reformulation might be problematic is the first maxim of quality (‘do not assert what you believe to be false’), since it is the only maxim that is cast in explicitly psychological terms. However, even in this case, he argues that the notions of belief and intention can be replaced without loss by appeal to the notion of commitments.

Of course, normative inferential approaches face independent challenges as well (for instance, many theorists have questioned whether commitments themselves can be spelt out without prior appeal to semantic content, while Fodor and Lepore (1992; 2001) famously objected to the holistic nature of such approaches). There may also be significant challenges to be faced by commitment-based accounts concerning how hearers identify exactly which commitments speakers have undertaken by their utterances, where this might be thought to require a prior grasp of linguistic meaning (in which case, to get off the ground, the normative inferential approach would need an independent account of how children acquire knowledge of word-meanings). However, if the problems for Intentionalist approaches which have been discussed here are ultimately found to hold good, then alternative approaches such as the normative inferential model will clearly deserve much further exploration.

5. Conclusion

This article began by asking how a gesture or utterance could have a meaning and how that meaning might come to be communicated amongst interlocutors. The starting point was the intuitively appealing idea that meaning and communication are tied to thought: an utterance (u) by a speaker (S) might communicate some content (p) to an audience (H) just in case p was the content S intended H to grasp. As §1 made explicit, spelling out this simple (Intentionalist) idea turns out to be pretty complex, leading Grice, the most famous advocate of the Intentionalist approach, to a three (or more) line definition of speaker-meaning which posited a complex set of (recursively specified) mental states. Grice’s model faces a range of objections. Opponents might query the necessity of Grice’s clauses (§§2.a-2.b) or argue that they are insufficient (§2.c), they might have a concern that the account fails to accommodate conventional speech acts (§2.d), or they might object to Grice’s proposed reduction of sentence-meaning to speaker-meaning (§2.e). Above and beyond these worries, however, it might also be objected that the starting premise—the idea that meaning and communication link inherently to thought—is mistaken, perhaps because such models can never be psychologically realistic (§3.a) or because they fail to cohere with developmental evidence about the relative priority of language acquisition over mental state reasoning (§3.b). Finally, two alternative approaches were surveyed, ones that seek to explain linguistic meaning and communication without assigning a constituent role to the content of thoughts. These two kinds of alternative approaches were the teleological model advocated by Millikan (§4.a) and the sort of normative-inferential model advocated by Brandom (§4.b). However, it is an open question whether these approaches can provide viable alternatives to the well-established Intentionalist account, since they might not be without their own significant problems. How we should understand meaning and communication, then, remains unsettled.

6. References and Further Reading

  • Alston, William. 2000. Illocutionary Acts & Sentence Meaning. Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Apperly, Ian A. 2011. Mindreaders. The Cognitive Basis of “Theory of Mind”. Hove: Psychology Press.
  • Astington, Janet W., and Jodie A. Baird. 2005. Why Language Matters for Theory of Mind. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Azzouni, Jody. 2013. Semantic Perception. How the Illusion of a Common Language Arises and Persists. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Bach, Kent, and Robert Harnish. 1979. Linguistic Communication and Speech Acts. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Battich, Lucas, and Bart Geurts. 2020. “Joint Attention and Perceptual Experience.” Synthese.
  • Borg, Emma. 2006. “Intention-Based Semantics.” In The Oxford Handbook to the Philosophy of Language, by Ernie Lepore and Barry Smith, 250-266. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Borg, Emma. 2016. “Exploding Explicatures.” Mind & Language 31 (3): 335-355.
  • Brandom, Robert. 1994. Making it Explicit: Reasoning, Representing and Discursive Commitment. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Clark, Herbert. 1992. Arenas of Language Use. Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.
  • Clark, Herbert. 1996. Using Language. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Coady, Cecil. 1976. “Review of Stephen R. Schiffer, Meaning.” Philosophy 51: 102-109.
  • Drobnak, Matej. 2021. “Normative inferentialism on linguistic understanding.” Mind & Language.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Ernest Lepore. 1992. Holism: A Shopper’s Guide. Oxford: Blackwell.
  • Fodor, Jerry, and Ernest Lepore. 2001. “Brandom’s Burdens: Compositionality and Inferentialism.” Philosophy and Phenomonelogical Research LXIII (2): 465-481.
  • Gauker, Christopher. 2003. Words Without Meaning. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Geurts, Bart. 2018. “Convention and Common Ground.” Mind & Language 33: 115-129.
  • Geurts, Bart. 2019. “Communication as Commitment Sharing: Speech Act, Implicatures, Common Ground.” Theoretical Linguistics 45 (1-2): 1-30.
  • Geurts, Bart, and Paula Rubio-Fernandez. 2013. “How to Pass the False-Belief Task Before Your Fourth Birthday.” Psychological Science 24 (1): 27-33.
  • Geurts, Bart, and Paula Rubio-Fernandez. 2015. “Pragmatics and Processing.” Ratio XXVIII: 446-469.
  • Grice, Paul. 1957/1989. “Meaning.” In Studies in the Way of Words, 213-223. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press; first published in The Philosophical Review 66(3).
  • Grice, Paul. 1968/1989. “Utterer’s Meaning, Sentence-Meaning, and Word-Meaning.” In Studies in the Way of Words, 117-137. Cambridge,MA: Harvard University Press; first published in Foundations of Language 4.
  • Grice, Paul. 1969/1989. “Utterer’s Meaning and Intention.” In Studies in the Way of Words, 86-116. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press; first published in The Philosophical Review 78(2).
  • Grice, Paul. 1975/1989. “Logic and Conversation.” In Studies in the Way of Words, 22-40. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press; first published in Syntax and Semantics, vol.3, P. Cole and J. Morgan (eds.).
  • Grice, Paul. 1982/1989. “Meaning Revisited.” In Studies in the Way of Words, 283-303. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press; first published in Mutual Knowledge, N.V. Smith (ed.).
  • Grice, Paul. 1989. Studies in the Way of Words. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Heyes, Cecilia. 2018. Cognitive Gadgets. The Cultural Evolution of Thinking. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Kukla, Rebecca, and Mark Lance. 2009. ‘Yo!’ and ‘Lo!’: The Pragmatic Topography of the Space of Reasons. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Levinson, Stephen. 1989. “A Review of Relevance.” Journal of Linguistics 25 (2): 455-472.
  • Lewis, David. 1969. Convention. A Philosophical Study. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Loeffler, Ronald. 2018. Brandom. Cambridge: Polity Press.
  • Marr, David. 1982. Vision. A Computational Investigation into the Human Representation and Processing of Visual Information. New York: W. H. Freeman and Company.
  • Michael, John, Natalie Sebanz and Günter Knoblich. 2016. “The Sense of Commitment: A Minimal Approach.” Frontiers in Psychology 6: 1968.
  • Millikan, Ruth G. 1984. Language, Thought and Other Biological Categories. New Foundations for Realism. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Millikan, Ruth G. 2004. Varieties of Meaning. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Millikan, Ruth G. 2017. Beyond Concepts: Unicepts, Language, and Natural Information. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Moore, Richard. 2017a. “Convergent minds: ostension, inference and Grice’s third clause.” Interface Focus 7(3).
  • Moore, Richard. 2017b. “Gricean Communication and Cognitive Development.” The Philosophical Quarterly 67: 303-326.
  • Morris, Michael. 2007. An Introduction to the Philosophy of Language. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Neale, Stephen. 1992. “Paul Grice and the Philosophy of Language.” Linguistics and Philosophy 15: 509-559.
  • Noveck, Ira. 2012. Experimental Pragmatics: The Making of a Cognitive Science. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Onishi, Kristine H., and Renée Baillargeon. 2005. “Do 15-Months-Old Infants Understand False Beliefs?” Science 308: 255-258.
  • Pickering, Martin J., and Simon Garrod. 2004. “Toward a Mechanistic Psychology of Dialogue.” Behavioural and Brain Sciences 27: 169-190.
  • Platts, Mark. 1997. Ways of Meaning: An Introduction to a Philosophy of Language. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Pyers, Jennie E., and Ann Senghas. 2009. “Language Promotes False-Belief Understanding: Evidence from Learners of a New Sign Language.” Psychological Science 20 (7): 805-812.
  • Rakoczky, Hannes, and Tanya Behne. 2019. “Commitment Sharing as Crucial Step Toward a Developmentally Plausible Speech Act Theory?” Theoretical Linguistics 45 (1-2): 93-97.
  • Schiffer, Stephen. 1972. Meaning. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Searle, John. 1965. “What Is a Speech Act?” In Philosophy in America, by Max Black, 221-240. London: George Allen & Unwin Ltd.
  • Sperber, Dan, and Deirdre Wilson. 1995. Relevance: Communication and Cognition. London: Blackwell.
  • Sperber, Dan, and Deirdre Wilson. 2012. Meaning and Relevance. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Stalnaker, Robert. 2002. “Common Ground.” Linguistics and Philosophy 25: 701-721.
  • Stalnaker, Robert. 2014. Context. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Strawson, Peter. 1964. “Intention and Convention in Speech Acts.” The Philosophical Review 73 (4): 439-460.
  • Tomasello, Michael. 2008. Origins of Human Communication. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.
  • Tomasello, Michael. 2019. Becoming Human. A Theory of Ontogeny. Harvard: Harvard University Press.
  • Warner, Richard. 2001. “Introduction.” In Aspects of Reason, by Paul Grice, vii-xxviii. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Wellman, Henry M., David R. Cross, and Julanne Watson. 2001. “Meta-Analysis of Theory-of-Mind Development: the Truth about False Belief.” Child Development 72(3): 655 – 684.
  • Wilby, Michael. 2010. “The Simplicity of Mutual Knowledge.” Philosophical Explorations 13(2): 83-100.
  • Wilson, Deirdre. 2017. “Relevance Theory.” In The Oxford Handbook of Pragmatics, by Yan Huang, 79-101. Oxford: Oxford University Press.


Author Information

Emma Borg
University of Reading
United Kingdom


Antonio Scarafone
University of Reading
United Kingdom


Marat Shardimgaliev
University of Reading
United Kingdom