Philosophy of Mental Illness

The Philosophy of Mental Illness is an interdisciplinary field of study that combines views and methods from the philosophy of mind, psychology, neuroscience, and moral philosophy in order to analyze the nature of mental illness. Philosophers of mental illness are concerned with examining the ontological, epistemological, and normative issues arising from varying conceptions of mental illness.

Central questions within the philosophy of mental illness include: whether the concept of a mental illness can be given a scientifically adequate, value-free, specification; whether mental illnesses should be understood as a form of distinctly mental dysfunction, and whether mental illnesses are best identified as discrete mental entities with clear inclusion/exclusion criteria or as points along a continuum between the normal and the ill. Philosophers critical of the concept of mental illness argue that it is not possible to give a value-neutral specification of mental illnesses. They argue that that our concept of mental illnesses is often used to disguise the ways in which mental illness categories enforce pre-existing norms and power relations. Questions remain about the relationship between the role that values play within the concept of mental illness and how those values relate to concepts of illness more generally. Philosophers who consider themselves a part of the neurodiversity movement claim that our concept of mental illness should be revised to reflect the diverse forms of cognition that humans are capable of without stigmatizing individuals that are statistically non-normal.

There are also epistemological issues concerning the relationship between mental illness and diagnosis. Historically, the central issue centers on how nosologies (or classification-schemas) of mental illness, especially the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (the DSM), relate mental dysfunctions with observable symptoms. Mental dysfunction, on the DSM system, is identified via the presence or absence of a set of symptoms from a checklist. Those critical of the use of behavioral symptoms to diagnose mental disorders argue that symptoms are useless without a theoretically adequate conception of what it means for a mental mechanism to function poorly. A minimal constraint on a diagnostic system is that it must be able to distinguish a person with a genuine mental illness from a person suffering from a problem with living. Critics argue that the DSM, as currently constituted, cannot do this.

Lastly, there are a host of questions surrounding the relationship between mental illness and normativity. If mental illness undermines rational agency, then there are questions about the degree to which the mentally ill are capable of autonomous decision-making. This bears on questions regarding the degree of moral and legal responsibility that the mentally ill can be assigned. Further questions about agency arise over bioethical questions about the standing of the demands made on healthcare professionals by the mentally ill. For example, individuals with Body Integrity Identity Disorder (BIID) request that surgeons amputate their healthy limbs in order to restore a balance between their internal self-representation and their external body image. Bioethicists are divided over whether the requests of patients with BIID are genuinely autonomous and deserving of assent.

Table of Contents

  1. Conceptions of Mental Illness
    1. Alienism and Freud
    2. DSM I – II
    3. The Bio-psycho-social Model DSM III – 5
  2. Criticisms of the Bio-psycho-social Model
    1. Mental Illness as Dysfunction
    2. Neurobiological Eliminitivism
    3. The Role of Value
    4. Szasz’s Myth of Mental Illness
  3. Neurodiversity
    1. Motivation
    2. Autism, Psychopathy
  4. Responsibility and Autonomy
    1. Psychopathy
    2. Body Integrity Identity Disorder and Gender Dysphoria
  5. References and Further Reading

1. Conceptions of Mental Illness

a. Alienism and Freud

Although there are many conceptions of madness found throughout the ancient world (demon possession, divine revelation or punishment, and so forth), the conception of a distinctly mental form of illness did not fully begin to crystallize, at least in the West, until the latter half of the nineteenth-century with the creation and rise of mental asylums. Individuals who were housed in asylums were thought to be psychotic or insane. Psychotic inmates were seen as distinctly different from the non-psychotic population and this justified the creation of special purpose institutions for the containment of psychotic individuals. Psychotics were construed as suffering from distinct and localizable organic brain disorders and were treated by medical professionals known as Alienists (Elliott 2004, 471). Writing at the time, German psychiatrist Emil Kraepelin’s nosology divided psychoses into one of two types: mood disorders and demtia praexcox (Kraepelin 1896a, 1896b). All other forms of distress were though to fall outside of the province of the asylum and of medical treatment.

Non-psychotic individuals who were unhappy with their lives, who felt intense anxiety, or who might vacillate between periods of high and low-motivation were not thought to have psychotic problem. These individuals were not treated or seen by alienists but instead sought help from their family, friends, or clergy (Horwitz 2001, 40). Non-psychotic dysphoria (unhappiness) was, in this context, understood not as a distinctly medical problem but instead in a variety of other forms: a typically social problem with living, a character flaw, or simply as a different way of life. The solution for the unhappiness that many individuals suffered was not found within the asylum but instead from the family, god, or other social institutions. There was, at this time, a clear distinction between medical problems resulting in psychosis and social problems that caused suffering.

Sigmund Freud grew up in the alienist tradition and received his medical degree in 1881. Freud’s theory of the mental and of mental illness would revolutionize western understanding of psychology and would become the dominant paradigm in the psychological sciences until the middle of the twentieth-century. Where the alienists saw mental illnesses as manifestations of rather discrete brain dysfunctions, Freud would come to understand the distinction between normal persons and the mentally ill as arising from a conflict in psychological mechanisms that were a part of the normal human repertoire (Freud 1915/1977; Ghaemi 2003, 4). Where the alienist understood non-psychotic unhappiness as a problem to be solved by individuals and their support networks, Freud understood problems in living as the domain of the psychotherapist. Paul Roazen famously quotes Freud as claiming that “[t]he optimum conditions for (psychoanalysis) exist where it is not needed—that is, among the healthy” (Roazen 1992, 160).

Crucial to Freud’s reorientation of mental disorder was his view of the relationship between observable behavioral symptoms and underlying psychological disorder. Unlike Kraepelin, who understood psychotic behavioral symptoms as closely tied to specific underlying brain dysfunction, Freud did not believe that behavioral symptoms could be tied to unique disorders. The underlying source of human psychological suffering, as Freud understood it, stemmed from universal childhood experiences that if poorly resolved or understood, could manifest in adulthood as neurosis. Freud saw repression, for example, as a normal part of development from child to adult. An individual could fail to properly apply repressive techniques. If this occurs then poorly repressed trauma can manifest itself in a myriad of ways from obsessive cleaning, chronic gambling, melancholia, and so forth. (Freud 1915/1989; Horwitz 2001, 43). Simply noting melancholia in a patient would not be enough for a psychoanalyst to understand the source of repressive dysfunction.

Because a client troubled by chronic gambling and another client troubled by hysteria could, in principle, be suffering from the same underlying repressive dysfunction, any diagnostic manual based on Freud’s conception of mental disorders would not hold symptoms as fundamentally important to the diagnostic process. Instead, Freud claimed that the only way to truly understand a patient’s underlying psychological dysfunction is to acquire detailed information about a person, including his or her dreams, in order to uncover repressed sexual urges (Freud 1905/1997).

The first two editions of the DSM were largely based on Freud’s underlying theory of repression and mental disorder. This nosology would dominate western thinking about the mentally ill until the 1960s.

b. DSM I – II

When the  first edition of the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders was published in 1952, psychodynamic theorists dominated the clinical and academic landscape. Nearly 2/3 of the chairs of psychology departments in American universities were chaired by psychoanalysts and the emerging DSM strongly reflects their theoretical assumptions (Strand 2011, 277). By this point, psychiatry was seen as an extension of medical practice. This required the creation of a nosology, a catalogue of disorders for clinical practice (Graham 2010, 5).

The first-edition of the DSM represented a revolutionary change in the conception and treatment of mental illness. Given the expansive notion of mental illness proposed by Freud and his students, the first two editions of the DSM conclude that many individuals that, prior to this point,  were not  seen as mentally ill, would benefit from therapy. Because symptoms were only weakly correlated with underlying illness on the psychodynamic view, only repeated, and  intensive, conversations with a qualified analyst could help a person get to the root cause of his problems (Horwitz 2002, 45; Grob 1991, 425). The first-edition of the DSM devotes a significant proportion of its 145 pages to a classification of mental illness concepts and terms (American Psychiatric Association 1952, 73-119). Unlike future editions of the manual, illnesses are not identified in terms of a series of symptoms but instead in terms of the underlying psychological conflict responsible. For example, the manual defines Psychoneurotic Disorder as:

[T]hose disturbances in which “anxiety” is a chief characteristic, directly felt or expressed, or automatically controlled by such defenses as depression, conversion, dissociation, displacement, phobia formation, or repetitive thoughts and acts…a psychoneurotic reaction may be defined as one in which the personality, in its struggle for adjustment to internal and external stresses, utilizes the mechanisms listed above to handle the anxiety created (American Psychiatric Association 1952, 12-13).

Yet, The presence of anxiety is not sufficient to diagnose psychoneurotic disorder. Anxiety must result from an underlying conflict between the personality and other stressors. It is the role of the analyst , in this context, to discover whether this underlying conflict is present. This cannot be done by merely observing symptoms; only psychodynamic therapy can discover the true cause of a patient’s anxiety (Grob 1991, 423).

Dissent against this system of classification and diagnosis arose from many groups both external to psychiatry and internal to the psychiatric discipline; these criticisms solidified in the 1960s. The emerging “anti-psychiatry” movement would come to challenge the assumptions that had grounded psychiatric practice in the first half of the 20th century. Conceptions of mental illness, the underlying assumptions behind the process of diagnosis, and even the status of psychiatry as a science were all subject to sustained critiques. Several of the most vocal critics of psychiatry were themselves clinical psychiatrists: R.D. Laing, David Rosenhan, and Thomas Szasz. The latter’s critique of psychiatric practice and the conceptions of mental illness are outlined in detail below in section 2(b).

Rosenahn conducted a pair of famous studies that would radically undermine the scientific legitimacy of clinical diagnosis, especially in the eyes of the public. In his initial study, Rosenhan, along with seven other volunteers, attempted to have themselves admitted several mental health institutions (Rosenhan 1973, 179-180). Rosenhan instructed his collaborators to claim that they heard a voice which said only two words: “thud” and “hollow.” For all other questions, Rosenhan instructed his subjects to answer honestly. The words ‘thud’ and ‘hollow’ were chosen specifically because they did not correspond to a known pattern of neurosis in the DSM II. Rosenhan, and all of his confederates, were admitted to mental institutions; all but one of Rosenhan’s subjects were admitted under a diagnosis of schizophrenia (Rosenhan 1973, 180). Once admitted, subjects took as long as 52 days before they were released, despite the fact that they did not play-act any symptoms of any mental illness. Rosenhan noted that once he and his confederates had been admitted, everyday behavior began to be interpreted as a sign of their underlying mental illness. Subjects who were taking notes for later use, for example, were noted as engaging in unusual “writing behavior;” subjects speaking with a psychiatrist about their childhood and family were construed as having telltale neurotic early-childhood issues (Rosenhan 1973, 183). Since these subjects were not otherwise in distress, Rosenhan claimed that the diagnostic process was not representing an underlying ‘mental illness’ in any of the pseudopatients but instead that the diagnostic process was unscientific and unfalsifiable.

Once Rosenhan publicized the results of his initial study, several institutions challenged his results by re-asserting the validity of the diagnostic process. They claimed that their institutions would not have fallen for Rosenhan’s ruse and challenged him to send pseudopatients to them for analysis. Rosenhan agreed and, despite the fact that no psuedopatients were actually sent, these institutions suspected at least 41 of their new patients (more than 20% of new patients over a three month period) of being pseudopatients sent by Rosenhan (Rosenhan 1973, 181). Again it seemed as if the diagnostic process was incapable of accurately separating the mentally ill from the healthy. In part resulting from critiques of the diagnostic process like Rosenhan’s studies, the diagnostic model of psychiatry would be radically altered. Beginning as early as 1974, the American Psychiatric Association would assign a taskforce to prepare for the publication of the next edition of the DSM. The DSM III that would result from this process, published in 1980, would represent a rejection of the psychodynamic assumptions built into the previous versions of the manual and provide a framework for all future editions of tDSM.  

c. The Bio-psycho-social Model DSM III – 5

The most recent edition of the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders, the DSM 5, was published in 2013. This edition does not substantially modify the conception of mental disorder that has been offered by the manual since its third edition, first published in 1980. In comparison with the first edition of the DSM, the DSM 5 includes diagnostic criteria for more than 400 individual disorders. The conception of mental disorders used in the DSM 5 presents them as biological, psychological, or social dysfunctions in an individual; this model has, unsurprisingly come to be called the Bio-psycho-social model.  It represents the current consensus view of mental disorder among psychological researchers and clinical practitioners. Psychologists disagree about whether to understand this definition conjunctively or disjunctively (Ghaemi 2007, 8). The Biopsychosocial model states:

A mental disorder is a syndrome characterized by clinically significant disturbance in an individual’s cognition, emotion regulation, or behavior that reflects a dysfunction in the   psychological, biological, or developmental processes underlying mental functioning. Mental disorders are usually associated with significant distress or disability in social, occupational, or other important activities. An expectable or culturally approved response to a common stressor or loss, such as the death of a loved one, is not a mental disorder. Socially deviant behavior (e.g., political, religious, or sexual) and conflicts that are primarily between the individual and society are not mental disorders unless the deviance or conflict results from a dysfunction in the individual, as described above (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 20).

From this characterization we can extract four criteria that serve to a genuine mental disorder from other sorts of issues (problems in living, character flaws, and so forth). In order for a disturbance to be classified as a mental disorder it must:

  1. Be a clinically significant disturbance in cognition, emotion regulation, or behavior
  2. Reflect a dysfunction in biological, psychological, or developmental processes
  3. Usually cause distress or disability
  4. Not reflect a culturally approved response to a situation or event
  5. Not result purely from a problem between an individual and her society

All of the criteria, with the exception of the ‘distress’ criterion, are individually necessary and jointly sufficient for the classification of a patient’s symptoms as stemming from a mental disorder. Prior to the seventh printing of the DSM II, homosexuality had been included as a mental disorder. The revisions to the text that took place between the DSM II and the DSM III were meant to make clear that homosexuality (“an interest in sexual relations or contact with members of the same sex”), does not satisfy the criteria for a mental disorder so long as it is not accompanied by clinically significant dysphoria (American Psychiatric Association 1973, 2). However, an individual who feels dysphoria as a result of their homosexuality can be diagnosed with an Unspecific Sexual Dysfunction in the DSM 5 (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 450).

The third, ‘distress,’ criterion is neither necessary nor sufficient to qualify a mental disturbance as a disorder. This can be seen by examining the process for the diagnosis of the ‘cluster B’ personality disorders (histrionic, anti-social, borderline, and narcissistic personality disorders). Subjects with cluster B disorders often do not suffer as a result of their condition. Indeed, those with Antisocial Personality Disorder, for example, may not see themselves as disordered and may even approve of their condition. This has led some individuals with personality disorders to align with the emerging Neurodiversity movement (see section 3 below). The patterns of behavior manifested by those with cluster B personality disorders are, nonetheless, understood as reflecting clinically significant disturbances in cognition, emotion regulation, and behavior. They form a distinct class of mental disorders in the DSM (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 645-684). Some philosophers have argued that the cluster B personality disorders should not be understood as mental disorders but instead that they are better understood as distinctly moral disorders. Louis Charland argues for this conclusion. He claims that, unlike the cluster A and C personality disorders, the only treatment for the cluster B disorders is distinctly moral improvement; because this fact about the treatment of cluster B personality disorders uniquely distinguishes them from all other mental disorders in the DSM. Thus Charland concludes that they reflect moral (as opposed to value-neutral) dysfunction (Charland 2004a, 67).

Since the publication of the DSM III, mental disorders have been defined as being caused by a clinically significant dysfunction of a mental mechanism. Because the definition of mental illness invokes the concept of dysfunction, it is often subject to critique (see the following section). Although the general definition of mental disorder used by the DSM invokes the concept of dysfunction, the diagnostic criteria for particular mental illnesses do not. It is instructive to provide an example of how particular disorders are defined within the manual. Anorexia Nervosa, for example, is defined by the presence of three clusters of behavioral symptoms (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 338-339):

A: Restriction of energy intake relative to requirements, leading to a significantly low body weight in the context of age, sex, developmental trajectory, and physical health.

B: Intense fear of gaining weight or of becoming fat, or persistent behavior that interferes with weight gain, even though at a significantly low weight

C: Disturbance in the way in which one’s body weight or shape is experienced, undue influence of body weight or shape on self-evaluation, or persistent lack of recognition of the seriousness of the current low body weight

Importantly, this characterization of Anorexia Nervosa presents the disorder as a distinct, specifiable, condition that is present in the person and that the underlying dysfunction is uniquely picked out by the presence of the behavioral symptoms identified as A and C; “B” symptoms are seen as common but not essential to diagnosis (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 340). Given the underlying conception of mental disorder offered by the authors of the DSM, Anorexia Nervosa cannot simply be the result of a conflict between the individual and society. It also must not result from an individual accurately trying to adopt social norms about beauty or appearance or diet. It must instead result from a combination of biological, psychological, and/or social dysfunctions however, the diagnostic criteria do not indicate what this underlying dysfunction consists in nor does it offer any evidence that the symptoms associated with the disorder are caused by the same underlying dysfunction.

Stemming in part for reasons of this sort, both the general bio-psycho-social model of mental disorder and the uses of the model to characterize particular disorders, like Anorexia Nervosa, have been subject to repeated criticism by philosophers.

2. Criticisms of the Bio-psycho-social Model

The definition of mental disorder that stems from the bio-psycho-social model has been subject to several criticisms. Philosophical critiques of the definition of disorder have ranged from calling for revision and specification of the concept of disorder to abandonment of the concept altogether. Many of the 400+ disorders that appear in the DSM have also been criticized. In some cases, these critiques are internal: the disorders do not appear to match the criteria of mental disorder offered in the DSM itself; in other cases, as with some critics of schizophrenia, the aim is to undermine both the existence of the disorder and the conception of mental disorder that results in its inclusion (Bentall 1990).

Many members of the antipsychiatry movement described in section 1b were responsible for setting the stage for the criticisms of the bio-psycho-social model. Although in part political, this movement saw the rise of several alternative conceptualizations of human function and dysfunction that have come to challenge the DSM’s conception of a mental disorder. Chief among these were Thomas Szasz’s influential arguments that mental illness is a ‘myth’ and the rise of ‘positive psychology’ as a viable alternative psychological ideology.

a. Mental Illness as Dysfunction

Nassir Ghaemi has criticized the current conception of mental disorder as resting on an unscientific political compromise between factions within clinical and research psychologists and to stave off the looming threat of neurobiological eliminitivism (see section 2b). Ghaemi argues that many psychologists view the Bio-psycho-social conception of mental illness disjunctively and focus predominantly on their preferred method for understanding a disorder depending on their own assumptions of dysfunction (Ghaemi 2003, 10). Although this compromise presents the appearance of consensus, Ghaemi argues that it is an illusion. He advocates for a form of integrationism about mental disorder that has become popular in some circles (Ghaemi 2003, 291; Kandel 1998, 458). A true integration of biology and psychology requires solving the currently unresolved issue over consciousness and how consciousness is realized by the brain. Because this question does not appear to be resolvable in the near-term, integrationists of Ghaemi’s stripe have offered a placeholder for a replacement to the Bio-psycho-social model instead of a true alternative to current models.

Philosophers have also criticized the DSM conception of mental disorder for its lack of a unified theory of dysfunction. The current DSM requires that mental disorders reflect a dysfunction of biological, psychological, or social mechanisms though the text itself is silent on what it would mean for a mechanism to be dysfunctional and does not provide any evidence that the symptoms used for clinical diagnosis of a disorder are caused by a single underlying dysfunction.

Philosophers have appealed to at least three distinct senses of dysfunction to craft a unified theory of mental disorder: etiological, propensity, and normative dysfunction. Etiological function (and dysfunction) is construed in evolutionary terms. A mechanism is functioning, in the etiological sense, if it evolved to serve a specific purpose and if it is, currently, serving its evolved purpose. In order to discover the function of a mental mechanism, it is necessary to discover its evolved function. Dysfunction can then be construed relative to this purpose (Wakefield 1999, 374; Boorse 1997, 12). A mechanism is dysfunctional if it is not fulfilling its evolutionary purpose. Depression, for example, may, in some cases, represent a dysfunction of a mechanism evolved for affective regulation. However, evolutionary psychological theories of mental function are still in their early stages. Furthermore, some philosophers want to allow for the possibility that many of our mental mechanisms may not have evolved to serve the functions to which we currently put them to use.

A propensity function is not constrained by past selective pressures but instead defines function and dysfunction based upon current and future selective success. Male aggression, for example, may have been adaptive in our ancestral environment and hence may represent a case of proper functioning on the etiological theory. On the propensity view, however, male aggression may not be adaptive for life in modern societies even if it was fitness-enhancing in our ancestral environments. Male aggression might therefore, on a propensity account of function and dysfunction, represent a dysfunctional mechanism and hence a mental disorder (Woolfolk 1999, 663). As with the evolutionary view, propensity function conceptions of mental dysfunction have the advantage of appealing to descriptive evidence in order to determine whether or not a specific pattern of behavior is fitness-enhancing in its current context (Boorse 1975, 52). However, crafting a theory of function and dysfunction in terms of present-day fitness appears to allow some conditions to count as mental disorders that we may be averse to label mental illnesses. One major issue with appealing to propensity function is that it appears to resurrect defunct mental illness. Drapetomania, the mental illness that was applied to runaway slaves in the nineteenth century, would appear to satisfy the definition of a propensity dysfunction. Dysphoria caused by the conditions of slavery and a strong desire to abandon one’s current condition are arguably not fitness-enhancing, in a strictly evolutionary sense, and therefore appear to satisfy the criteria for a propensity dysfunction (Woolfolk 1999, 664).

Purely normative accounts of dysfunction have not garnered much favor within the psychological or philosophical disciplines. On a purely normative account of dysfunction, a person is said to be mentally ill based upon whether or not the behavior fits within the context of a larger normative network. Whether we choose to call a person mentally ill or merely ‘bad’ may depend on whether or not we believe agents like this should be held morally responsible and the concept of responsibility may not be reducible to non-normative elements (Edwards 2009, 78). On such conceptions, it is impossible to avoid invoking evaluative concepts when describing what a mental illness is or why a particular set of behaviors is best understood as an illness (Fulford 2001, 81).

George Graham argues for what he calls an unmediated defense of realism about mental illness; Graham’s defense in unmediated in the sense that he does not believe that it must be shown that mental illnesses are natural kinds or result from brain-disorders in order to qualify as legitimate classification-independent kinds (Graham 2014, 133-134). Instead, he argues that “the very idea of a mental disorder or illness is the notion of a type of impairment or incapacity in the rational or reasons-responsive operation of one or more basic psychological faculties or capacities in persons” (Graham 2014, 135-136; see also Graham 2013a and 2013b). These capacities could be described or analyzed at various levels of implementation according to Graham though their malfunction is understood in normative terms.

Perhaps the most influential theory of dysfunction within the philosophical literature is offered by Jerome Wakefield. Wakefield’s conception of mental disorder attempts to bridge the gap between purely objective conceptions of disorder and subjective or normative views. On Wakefield’s view, a mental disorder arises only when a ‘harmful dysfunction’ is present. This combines two different types of concepts: a concept of dysfunction and a concept of harm. Wakefield’s conception of dysfunction is etiological. A mechanism is dysfunctional if it fails to perform the purpose that it evolved to perform. Etiological function is objective in the sense that etiological functions are pan-cultural: they are not dependent on cultural conceptions of function or value. They are, instead, a set of universally shared facts about human nature. The ‘harmfulness’ criterion, on the other hand, is sensitive to cultural context. (Wakefield 1992, 381; Wakefield 1999, 380). As Wakefield understands it, a person is harmed by a disorder if the disorder causes a “deprivation of benefit to a person as judged by the standards of the person’s culture” (Wakefield 1992, 384). In order to be diagnosed with a mental illness, it must be true that an agent’s behavior is caused by a malfunction of an evolutionary mental mechanism and, furthermore, it must also be true that this dysfunction, in the context of that individual’s culture, deprives her of a benefit.

Wakefield, and others like him, argue that it is crucial to distinguish between mental disorders and other sources of distress (Horwitz 1999). The crucial factor in determining proper treatment for a person’s dysphoria, these philosophers argue, is a proper identification of the cause of his or her distress. Mental disorders are caused by harmful mental dysfunctions. Other sources of distress are better understood as problems in living. Many types of unhappiness that are typically diagnosed as depression, on this view, are better understood not as stemming from depression but instead by an examination of the larger social factors that may be causing unhappiness. Because the DSM’s conception of mental disorder is cause-insensitive and identifies depression only via symptoms, it fails to distinguish between these two forms of unhappiness. The danger, these philosophers argue, is that mental disorders are construed as being problems that reside within an agent and that treatments are therefore focused only on, usually pharmaceutically aided, symptom relief. If distress has an underlying social cause, if it is a problem in living, then treatment unhappiness should have a radically different focus. For example, the symptoms described by Betty Friedan as caused by “the problem that has no name” fit relatively easily within the rubric of depression (Friedan 1963, 17). However, Wakefieldian views would resist this diagnosis. The underlying cause of the distress Freidan describes is social and the best treatment of this form of distress is social change. Sadness that is caused by patriarchal or misogynist cultures does not represent a malfunction in the evolved mechanisms in a person (it may represent just the opposite). On the DSM model, treatment may merely mask these depressive symptoms pharmacologically and would only serve to maintain the unjust social situations that give rise to it. The best understanding for “the problem that has no name” is to identify it as a problem in living stemming from misogynist assumptions about the roles available to women in a culture. Wakefield’s view is realist in the sense that its conception of mental dysfunction is independent of our acts of classification (Graham 2014, 125). Because function is grounded on etiology, there is a culturally-independent fact-of-the-matter regarding the presence or absence of a dysfunction in a person.

Wakefield’s harmfulness criterion allows for different cultures to come to different conclusions about which evolutionary dysfunctions will rightfully count as a mental disorder. On Wakefield’s view, homosexuality may represent a genuine evolutionary dysfunction (in the sense that exclusive homosexual behavior threatens the propagation of genes into future generations) but homosexuality is not harmful in a contemporary broadly Western cultural-context. Because it is not harmful in this cultural-context, it is a mistake to think of homosexuality as a disorder. This leaves open the possibility that the harmfulness criterion would allow homosexuality to be a legitimate mental disorder in other cultural-contexts.

Other critics have assailed Wakefield’s appeal to etiological dysfunction. Aside from the general epistemological problem that results from identifying the evolutionary function of psychological mechanisms, there are two problems that arise with an appeal to etiological dysfunction. First, some have argued that depression is an evolved response and hence could not be construed as a mental disorder on Wakefield’s view (Bentall 1992, 96; Woolfolk 1999, 660). Second, some have argued that many of our mental mechanisms may not have arisen as a result of evolutionary selection pressures. They may be evolutionary “spandrels” in Stephen Gould’s sense. The white color of bones necessarily results from the composition of bone but is itself not a property explicitly selected in an evolutionary sense. A spandrel cannot dysfunction in Wakefield’s terms because it lacks an evolutionary cause for its existence. Although spandrels can confer adaptive advantages, they are importantly not themselves traits that are selected for. If any of our mental mechanisms are spandrels then Wakefield’s view cannot explain disorders arising from their use (Gould and Lewontin 1979, 581; Woolfolk 1999, 664, Zachar 2014, 120). Famously, some philosophers have argued that complex human abilities, like our capacity for language may themselves be evolutionary spandrels (Chomsky 1988; Lilienfeld and Marino 1995, 413). Furthermore, recent critics have suggested that too much of the recent work on mental illness has focused exclusively on elucidating the concept of illness or dysfunction and have neglected to consider how advances within the philosophy of mind and the cognitive sciences might change our conception of the ‘mental’ component of mental illness (Brülde and Radovic 2006, 99).

Philosophers who are critical of attempts to define a distinctly mental conception of disorder have been motivated, in part due to the arguments above, to move in two different directions. Some have proposed that we replace the concept of mental disorder with a strictly neurological conception of dysfunction. Doing so, they argue, would place disorders on a clearer and more scientific footing.

b. Neurobiological Eliminitivism

The transition from the DSM II to DSM III brought with it the adoption of the biomedical model for diagnosis. Unlike the psychodynamic model, which saw symptoms as providing little insight into the underlying cause of distress, the biomedical model afforded symptoms pride of place in diagnosis. For much of the 20th century, the biomedical model of diagnosis understood the symptoms that a patient brought to her clinician as providing insight into the underlying disorder(s) that caused her patient to consult the clinician in the first place.

Psychology, as a therapeutic discipline, adopted this model of diagnosis and, in the process, began to categorized patient symptoms into discrete groupings, each caused by a specific mental disorder. However, some philosophers have noted that the biomedical model itself has changed rapidly in the 21st century and that this has created a dilemma for clinical psychological models of diagnosis. Patient reports, in current biomedical models of diagnosis, have lost their pride of place as the key markers for diagnosis. In their place clinicians turn to laboratory test results to determine the true illness responsible for a patient’s suffering. One motivation for this change, within general clinical practice, is that symptoms underdetermine diagnosis. Adopting this new biomedical model for mental illnesses, however, has been seen by some as presenting an eliminitivist threat to mental disorders (Broome and Bortolotti 2009, 27).

Eliminative materialism arose in the 20th century in order to challenge to views about the mind that assign mental states explanatory/causal roles. The views targeted by the eliminitivist were grounded in common-sense or “folk” ideas about everyday mental states like beliefs and desires. These views situated mental states as entities belonging to proper scientific explanation. Eliminitivists argued that folk psychological theories of the mind would fare no better than our folk biological or physical theories and that the folk mental states should be eliminated from scientific explanations (Churchland 1981). Mature cognitive and neuro-sciences do not need to make reference to folk psychological states like beliefs and desires in order to explain human behavior; furthermore, the neural architecture of the brain itself does not appear to house discrete localizable states like beliefs and desires that are assumed by folk psychology (Ramsey, Stich and Garon 1990). Folk psychological theories tell us that the best explanation of human behavior (including mental illness) should be given in terms of dysfunctional mental states (delusions, compulsive desires, etc.). The eliminitivist, on the other hand, undermines this view by claiming that nothing in the brain corresponds to these folk-psychological states and that we are better off without appealing to them.

Eliminitive materialism has arisen as a challenge to the DSM construal of mental disorders in the form of cognitive neuropsychology. “This process may start as a process of reduction (from the disorder behaviorally defined to its neurobiological bases), but in the end psychiatry as we know it will not just be given solid scientific foundations by being reduced to neurobiology; it will disappear altogether” (Broome and Bortolotti 2009, 27). Just as biomedical diagnosis has shifted away from patient report toward more direct assessments using bio-physiological metrics, the eliminitivist argues that the same process should occur with mental disorders. Neurological dysfunction should supplant folk psychological discussions of mental dysfunction. In much the same way as Alzheimer’s disease is understood as a neurological brain disorder; the eliminitivist claims that a mature cognitive neuroscience will replace contemporary classifications of mental disorders with neurological dysfunction (Roberson and Mucke 2006, 781).

Philosophers who resist the eliminitivist reduction of the mental to the neurological argue that at least some types of mental disorders cannot be understood without appealing to mental states. Plausible candidates for this type of disorder include delusions (Broome and Bortolotti 2009, 30), personality disorders (Charland 2004a 70) and various sexual disorders (Soble 2004, 56; Goldman 2002, 40). Personality disorders, especially those falling under the category of ‘Cluster-B’ disorders, appear to require that individuals have acquired bad characters in order to accurately explain why the behavior stemming from the illness is disordered. If normative competence necessarily makes reference to belief-forming mechanisms (having knowledge about moral concepts, recognition of the agency of other persons, etc.) then Cluster-B personality disorders cannot be fully reduced to their neurobiological underpinnings without a meaningful loss of the disordered element of the disorder (Pickard 2011, 182).

On a related note, philosophers have attempted to resist the purely mechanistic neuro-scientific explanations of psychology. Jeffrey Poland and Barbara Von Eckardt argue that the DSM’s bio-psycho-social model relies on a mechanistic model of mental illness but that purely mechanistic models fail to explain the representational aspects of a mental illness; in their words “[a]ny such account will extend well beyond what one would naturally assume to be the mechanism of (or the breakdown of the mechanism of) the cognition or behavior in question” (Von Eckardt and Poland 2004 982). Peter Zachar argues for a view he calls the Imperfect Community Model. This model is based on a rejection of essentialism grounded in pragmatism; Zachar argues that mental illnesses are united as a class despite lacking any necessary and sufficient conditions to define them; mental disorders bear a prototypical or family resemblance to one another, however, that suggests a rough unity to the concept (Zachar 2014, 121-8).

c. The Role of Value

There are related questions that arise about the nature and role of value and mental illness. The first has to do with whether mental illness is a value-neutral concept. Nosologies of mental illness attempt to create value-neutral definitions of the disorders they contain. In the ideal, the concepts picked out by manuals like the DSM are supposed to reflect an underlying universal human reality. The mental disorders contained therein are, with only minor exception, not meant to represent culturally relative normative value judgments onto the domain of the mental.

The DSM includes a “cultural formulation” section meant to distinguish culturally specific, explicitly normative disorders from the supposed pan-cultural, value-neutral disorders that make up the bulk of the manual (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 749). In part this approach stems from the idea that psychologists adhering to the bio-psycho-social model of mental disorders view their project as being on par with nosologies of non-mental disorders. There are two questions worth raising here. The first is whether or not this “likeness argument” has any merit, the second is whether or not the biomedical illness concept is, itself, value-neutral (Pickering 2003, 244). A heart attack, for example, is a disorder, on this model, no matter the time or location of the infarction. Heart attacks are, in this sense, natural kinds and proper objects for scientific study. A heart attack represents a particular form of cardiovascular dysfunction that is agnostic about the cultural or moral values of a particular community. Despite the fact that heart attacks may not present the same symptoms across different sufferers (some may grab their left arms, some may scream, some may fall to the ground, etc), what unites these heterogeneous seeming symptoms is an underlying causal story that explains them (Boyd 1991, 127). Mental disorders are thought to operate on the same principle. On the one hand, the view that psychological symptoms are united by a common cause may result from pre-theoretical assumptions about mental states (Murphy 2014 111-121).  Critics of the bio-psycho-social model argue that values are an essential component of the concept of mental illness. If values are an ineliminable part of the concept of mental illness, we should be led to ask what kinds of values are invoked by the concept

Michel Foucault was an early critic of mental illness and mental health institutions. In his Madness and Civilization: A History of Insanity in the Age of Reason, Foucault argued that asylums, being institutions where ‘the mad’ were separated from the rest of society, emerged historically by the application of models of rationality that privileged individuals already in power. This model served to exclude many members of society from the circle of rational agency. Asylums functioned as a place for society to house these undesirable persons and to reinforce pre-existing power relations; cures, when available, represented conformity to existing power structures (Foucault 1961/1988). Foucault’s critique of mental disorder inspired a generation of psychologists, many of which see themselves as part of a new counter-movement from within the discipline: the Positive Psychology movement. The constructivist and value-laden interpretation of the DSM’s bio-psycho-social model of mental disorder has led some within this movement to call for the abandonment of the model. There is an intrinsic problem, they argue, with viewing individuals as, primarily, vehicles of dysfunction. Those within the positive psychology movement argue that a new, openly value-laden, conception of human beings should supplant the manual: “[t]he illness ideology’s conception of “mental disorder” and the various specific DSM categories of mental disorders are not reflections and mappings of psychological facts about people. Instead, they are social artifacts that serve the same sociocultural goals as our constructions of race, gender, social class, and sexual orientation—that of maintaining and expanding the power of certain individuals and institutions and maintaining social order as defined by those in power” (Maddux 2001, 15).

Hybrid views, like those of Jerome Wakefield, which attempt to delineate a value-neutral and a value-laden component to the concept of mental illness have also been subject to criticism for the role they assign value. Richard Bentall, for example, has argued that the supposedly objective components of these theories contain value-laden assumptions. Bentall argues that happiness satisfies the objective criteria for mental dysfunction (happiness is a rare mental state, it impairs judgment and decision making, and its neural correlates are at least partially well-understood); however, happiness is not viewed as a dysfunction (and consequently is not categorized as a mental illness) because we value the state for its own sake (Bentall 1999, 97). This view is echoed by constructivists about mental illness.

Constructivists about mental illness can hold a variety of positions about where the concept of social construction operates with regards to mental illness. At the least radical level, constructivists can hold that cultures impose models of ideal agency that are used to label sets of human behaviors as instances of ordered and disordered agency; behavioral syndromes, on this view, can be more or less pan-cultural though each culture develops a theory of ideal agency that renders some of these syndromes ‘illnesses’ while other cultures may group the syndromes differently according to different values (Sam and Moreira 2012). A more thorough-going constructivism understands these packages or syndromes of behavior as themselves objects of constructivism; for example, the set of behaviors currently associated with depression would not be seen as a natural (categorization-independent) grouping of properties. Instead, the set of behaviors we call ‘depressive’ exist only because they have been grouped together by clinicians (for any number of reasons) (Church 2001, 396-397). This form of constructivism claims that the only way to explain why a set of behaviors, feelings, thoughts, and so forth, are grouped into a syndrome is that clinicians have created this grouping. Unlike the set of behaviors characteristic of a heart attack, for which we have a readily available causal story that unifies them, mental illnesses lack a clinician-independent explanation for their grouping. On this view, syndromes are akin to what Ian Hacking has called “interactive kinds” (Hacking 1995, Hacking 1999). For Hacking, while natural kinds represent judgment-independent groupings in the world, an interactive kind “when known, by people or those around them, and put to work in institutions, change the ways in which individuals experience themselves—and may even lead people to evolve their feelings and behaviors in part because they are so classified” (Hacking 1999, 103). To think of mental illnesses, like multiple personality disorder (now Dissociative Identity Disorder), as an interactive kind is to say that multiple personality disorder is not a basic fact about human neurology discoverable by the neuroscientist; instead, once the concept of multiple personality disorder is identified, once a set of behaviors has come to be seen as a manifestation of the condition and clinicians have been trained to identify and treat it, then individuals will begin to understand themselves in terms of the new concept and behave accordingly. Some have argued that many paraphilias and personality disorders are best understood on the interactive kind model (Soble 2004, 60; Charland 2004a, 70).

Critics will note that the natural kind -the socially constructed kind- distinction does note exhaust the alternatives. According to Nick Haslam, the natural kind distinction is tacitly invoked by realists of mental illness; this distinction, however, masks several possible alternative accounts of mental illness that allow for intermediate, less essentialist, even pluralist views (Haslam 2014, 13-20; see also Murphy 2014, 109).

d. Szasz’s Myth of Mental Illness

Perhaps the best-known critic of mental illness to arise out of the anti-psychiatry movement of the 1960’s is Thomas Szasz. He published The Myth of Mental Illness in 1961 initiating a wide-ranging discussion of how best to understand the concept of a mental illness and its relation to physical illnesses. Szasz’s work was (and continues to be) the subject of significant discussion and debate. Szasz’s main claim is that the psychiatric field, and its concomitant conception of a mental illness, rests “on a serious, albeit simple, error: it rests on mistaking or confusing what is real with what is simulation; literal meaning with metaphorical meaning; medicine with morals…mental illness is a metaphorical disease” (Szasz 1974/1962, x). Mental illness should be understood as a metaphorical disease, according to Szasz, because it results from clinicians making a kind of category mistake. It involves the use of concepts derived from one disciplinary body, medicine and the natural sciences, and applying them to a realm where they do not rightfully apply: human agency (Cresswell, 24).

According to Szasz, the proper world-view of the natural sciences is to construe its objects of study as law-like and deterministic. All knowledge in this domain is thought to be reducible to, and explainable in terms of, physicalism. Medicine, being a branch of science, understands medical illness on this model. A malfunctioning heart-valve has characteristic physical discontinuity with a functional one, it has typical effects on the function of the valve, and these effects are identifiable independent of patient symptoms. The treatment for medical illnesses relies on a thoroughly physicalist picture of the workings of the human body. Szasz believed that adopting the concept of a physical illness into the realm of mental illness is fundamentally incompatible with our concept of human agency. This results from two lines of argument. The first is that mental illnesses, unlike physical ones, are not typically reducible to biophysical causes (Szasz 1979, 22). If biological dysfunction cannot be used as a basis for delimiting mental illness then the only option left is to appeal to non-normative behavior. Szasz’s second concern is similar to the worries of neurobiological elimintivism mentioned in section 2(b). Szasz argues that the eliminitivist’s picture of human agency is, at best, incomplete. The root of the problem stems from the fact that Szasz believes that we must view agents as necessarily free, capable of choice, and as responsible; “in behavioral science the logic of physicalism is patently false: it neglects the differences between persons and things and the effects of language on each” (Szasz 1974, 187). Szasz’s argument here is sometimes construed as an appeal to dualism. The physical world is deterministic but the mental world must necessarily be free. Because the bio-psycho-social model uses concepts derived from natural sciences in a realm where they do not rightfully apply (that is, human agency) mental illness, as a concept derived from the natural sciences, is a myth resulting from this category mistake. To say that mental illness is a myth, however, is not meant as a denigration of individuals who suffer. It is, instead, meant to more accurately categorize their suffering as resulting from a failure to conform to social, legal, or ethical norms (Pickard 2009, 85).

Szasz’s critics have responded along several lines. Some do not take issue with his underlying understanding of the illness concept but disagree with his claim that it is not applicable to mental phenomena. Mental illnesses, according to these critics, have been (or will soon be) reducible to neurological or neurochemical dysfunction. They argue that advances in neuroscience give us reason for thinking that the prospect for finding the neurological or neurochemical correlates for at least some of our mental illnesses categories is high (Bentall 2004, 307). Other critics have argued instead in the other direction and attacked Szasz’s construal of physical illness. Szasz’s arguments have been taken, by some, to imply that physical illness itself is a deeply evaluated category reflective of value-judgments in much the same way mental illness is meant to on Szasz’s account (Fulford 2004; Kendell 2004). Still others have aimed to preserve Szasz’s primary claim that the overarching category of ‘mental illness’ will prove to be a non-natural interactive-kind, reflective of our values and practices, while simultaneously maintaining that “particular kinds of mental illnesses may yet constitute valid scientific kinds” (Pickard 2009, 88).

3. Neurodiversity

Human cognitive and physical functions range widely across the species. Although most individuals fall within a statistically normal range in terms of their abilities in all of these arenas, statistical normalcy has long been criticized as a normative marker (Daniels 2007, 37-46). Advocates for what has come to be known as the ‘neurodiversity movement’ have begun, in part stemming from the criticisms of psychiatry and the DSM begun in the 1960’s, to push for widespread acceptance of the  forms of cognition beyond the “neuro-normal” that individuals operate with (Hererra 2013, 11). Members of the neurodiversity movement understand it as “associated with the struggle for the civil rights of all those diagnosed with neurological or neurodevelopmental disorders (Fenton and Krahn, 2007, 1). Forms of cognition currently seen as dysfunctional, ill, or disordered are better understood as representing diverse ways of seeing and understanding the space of reasons. Proponents of neurodiversity claim that agents on the autism spectrum, those with personality disorders, attention deficit and hyperactivity disorder, dyslexia, and perhaps even those with psychopathic traits should not suffer from the stigma associated with the illness label. Individuals to whom these label apply often demonstrate profound capabilities (artistic, mathematic, and scientific) that are inseparable from the condition underlying their illness-label (Glannon 2007, 3; Ghaemi 2011). Pluralism about forms of human agency should be encouraged once we fully understand the problematic ways in which norms have come to influence illness categories.

a. Motivation

Applying the label “mentally ill” or “disordered” can have long-term negative effects not only by  affecting how individuals to whom we apply the label view themselves (Charland 2004b, 338-340; Rosenhan 1973, 256) but also by affecting how others view and treat them (Didlake and Fordham 2013, 101). Often, the decision to create a new mentally ill class is decided without the consultation of the groups involved. Homosexuality, for example, had been labeled a mental disorder in the first two editions of the DSM until social and political movements, largely headed by homosexuals themselves, caused the American Psychiatric Association to re-assess its stance (Bayer and Spitzer 1982, 32). The effects that being labeled mentally ill or disordered have on persons are wide-ranging and durable enough to warrant caution; those in the neurodiversity movement argue, from various perspectives, that clinicians continue to mistake diverse forms of cognition (variations from the neuro-normal) with mental illness because of the assumption, which advocates argue is mistaken, that deviation from statistically-normal neural-development and function constitutes disorder. Advocates for neurodiversity typically argue along two lines. The first is to argue that our current concepts of mental dysfunction are in need of revision because they contain one or more of the problems described in section 2 of this entry. This line of argument focuses especially on issues over the role of power and value in the construction of mental illness categories. The second line of argument is “firmly grounded in motivations of an egalitarian nature that seek to re-weight the interests of minorities so that they receive just consideration with the analogous interests of those currently privileged by extant social institutions” (Fenton and Krahn 2007, 1). Any resulting account of neurodiversity must aim to preserve useful categories of illness or mental disorder (if only for the purposes of treatment).

Perhaps the most forceful arguments from the neurodiversity perspective target the status of autism as a form of mental disorder. Much controversy has followed the APA’s decision to fold the diagnosis of Asperger’s syndrome into the more general category of Autism Spectrum Disorder.

b. Autism, Psychopathy

Autism Spectrum Disorder is the diagnosis applied to a wide-ranging number of individuals who have demonstrated persistent difficulty with social understanding and communication and whose symptoms emerge quite early in development. For example, the DSM-5 lists “[i]mpairment of the ability to change communication to match context or the needs of the listener,” “[d]ifficulties following rules for conversation and storytelling,” and “[d]ifficulties understanding what is not explicitly stated (e.g., making inferences) and nonliteral or ambiguous meanings of language” as diagnostic for ASD (American Psychiatric Association 2013, 50-51). Advocates for neurodiversity argue that it is unjust to attempt to force those with ASD to modify their behavior in order to more closely match neurotypical behavior especially as a form of treatment for a disease or disorder. For example, efforts to “change the diets of people with ASD, force them to inhale oxytocin, and expose children to countless hours of floor time or social stories to try to make persons with ASD more like neurotypicals” fail to realize that these attempts at changing individual cognition imposes a narrow conception of proper functioning as a form of treatment. Furthermore, treatments whose aim is to reduce ASD symptoms, some argue, resemble arguments made by those wishing to eradicate other minority-cultures defined by functioning (that is, deaf-communities) (Barnbaum 2013, 134). Some individuals with ASD argue that they constitute their own unique culture that deserves respect (Glannon 2007, 2). Advocates for neurodiversity argue that conceptions of mental illness that include ASD assume that deviation from neurotypical function is evidence of mental dysfunction rather than a sign of the forms of neurodiversity present in any human population. Autistic flourishing must be understood as being different from (though not a degenerate form of) neurotypical flourishing. Equally important within the call to neurodiversity is the project to identify and articulate the ways that social institutions are built around and advantage persons of “neurotypical” function over others (Nadesan 2005, 30). Given the proper account of functional agency, many individuals with ASD should be seen as functional and not disordered or mentally ill. Although not as common, similar arguments are sometimes advanced for other mental disorders including psychopathy.

Psychopathy is a controversial construct. As currently understood, it is a spectrum-disorder and is diagnosed using the revised version of what is known as the “Psychopathy Checklist” (PCL-R). Importantly, psychopathy does not appear in any version of the DSM as a distinct disorder. In its place, the DSM offers Antisocial Personality Disorder (ASPD). ASPD is intended as an equivalent diagnosis, though there is significant evidence that ASPD and Psychopathy are distinct (Gurley 2009, 289; Ramirez 2013, 221-223). Psychopathy, discussed in more detail in section 4a, is characterized by an inability to feel empathic distress (to find the suffering of others painful) along with a pronounced difficulty in understanding the differences between norms that are purely conventional versus other types of norms (Dolan and Fullam 2010, 995). Beyond these symptoms, however, psychopathy is characterizable as a distinct form of agency that raises concern about neurodiversity. Some psychopaths are ‘successful’ in the sense that they avoid incarceration while satisfying PCL-R diagnostic criteria. Psychopaths of this sort are much more likely to be found in corporate and other institutional settings (academia and legal, medical, or corporate professions) (Babiak 2010, 174). In these contexts, some have argued that psychopathic personality traits should be seen as virtues (Anton 2013, 123-125). A more contextual understanding of psychopathy as a distinct way of relating to reasons, persons, and situations may lead us to appreciate the distinct contributions persons with these traits can make. Psychopathy, especially the effects that psychopathy has on emotional and moral competence, has raised challenges to traditional theories of moral responsibility.

4. Responsibility and Autonomy

Accounts of mental illness are closely tied to accounts of agency and responsibility. It is not unusual, following an especially horrific crime, for public discourse to include questions about a suspect’s mental health history and whether a suspect’s alleged mental illness should excuse them from responsibility. Eric Harris, one of the teens responsible for the Columbine High School massacre, was called a psychopath by psychologist Robert Hare (Cullen); media commentators noted that Adam Lanza, the man responsible for killing 26  at Sandy Hook Elementary School in Connecticut had been diagnosed with autism and raised questions about the role this may have played (Lysiak and Hutchinson). One reason why discussions like these happen so quickly after a crime likely has to do with the relationship between mental illness and the effects that mental illness are thought to have on responsibility. One view on the matter states that “[t]o diagnose someone as mentally ill is to declare that the person is entitled to adopt the sick role and that we should respond as though the person is a passive victim of the condition. Thus, the distinguishing features of dysfunction that we should look for are not a universally consistent set of exclusive qualities, but things that provide the grounds for the normative claim made by applying the label ‘mental illness’” (Edwards 2009, 80). A more careful analysis of the relationship between mental illness and theories of moral responsibility indicates that several factors are often thought to matter when it comes to holding a person with a mental illness responsible for what s/he has done.

a. Psychopathy

Philosophical theories of moral responsibility often make a distinction between two different aspects of responsibility: attributability and accountability (Watson 1996, 228). Attributability refers to all of the capacities that someone must have in order to be responsible. One minimal condition may be that an action is attributable to a person if it stems from her agency in the right sort of way. Accidental muscle spasms, for example, are not typically attributable to an agent.

If we are dealing with an agent that has satisfied these attributability conditions, we can ask further questions about how we should treat this person after she has acted. This is a question about accountability. Some philosophers have claimed that there are many different forms of accountability, each requiring its own justification (Fischer and Tognazzini 2012, 390). It is one thing to make sure that I intentionally made the rude comment at dinner, it is another to decide what should be done to me as a result. The former is a question about attributability, the latter is a question about accountability.

Emotional capacities form an important component of many theories of moral responsibility (Fischer and Ravizza 1999; Strawson 1962; Wallace 1994; Brink and Nelkin 2013). Reactive attitude theories give moral emotions a central location within a conception of attributability and accountability. The term ‘reactive attitude’ was originally coined by Peter Strawson as a way to refer to the emotional responses that operate in the context of responding (that is, reacting) to what people do (Strawson, 1962). Resentment, indignation, disgust, guilt, hatred, love, and shame (and potentially many others) are reactive attitudes. For Strawson, and philosophers who have followed him, to respond to a person’s action with one of these reactive attitudes is to simultaneously hold him accountable. A theory of moral attributability could be derived, in principle, via an examination of the conditions under which we believe it to be appropriate to respond to someone with a reactive attitude.

Reactive attitudes focus on the quality of their target’s will. What this means is that our reactive emotions are sensitive to facts about an agent’s intentions, desires, her receptivity to reason, and so forth. Philosophers refer to this as the Quality of Will Thesis. Reactive attitude theorists explain excuses and an exemption from responsibility by analyzing how an agent’s will affects our attitudes. Legitimate excuses, for example, lead us to believe that we should extinguish our reactive response to a person. Excuses, in effect, show us that we were wrong about the quality of a target’s will (Wallace 1994, 136-147). If you push me and I fall, I might resent you; however, if I realize that you pushed me in order to save me from oncoming traffic, my attitude will be modified. My resentment will have been extinguished and the pushing has been excused. Excuses inform us that we were mistaken about what action was done. Excuses are singular events, they do not cast doubt on a person’s agency, their attributability, but instead inform us that we were wrong about what intention/purpose we attributed to them. Agents that appear to be universally excused are more traditionally said to be exempt from responsibility.

An exemption occurs when we are led to question whether a person meets our attributability requirements. Imagine again that I am knocked over except this time I learn that the person who pushed me suffers from significant and persistent psychotic delusions. She believed, in that moment, that I was a member of the reptilian illuminati and pushing me would get the grey aliens to repossess her hated neighbor’s house. Unlike a case involving excuse, a person whose agency is hampered by delusions as severe as these is not a proper target for our reactive attitudes at all (Strawson, 1962; Broome and Bartolotti, 2009, 30). Agency as abnormal as this is better seen as exempt from judgments of attributability or accountability. Exempt agents are not true sources of their actions because exempt agents lack the ability to regulate their behavior in an intelligibly rational way (Wallace 1994, 166-180). It would not be appropriate to resent these agents.

The logic of excuses and exemptions has been thought to show that responsible agency requires that a responsible agent have epistemic access to moral reasons along with the ability to understand how these reasons fit together (Fischer and Ravizza 1997). Furthermore, some have proposed that an agent must have the opportunity to avoid wrongdoing (Shoemaker 2011, 6). Psychopaths seem to be rational and mentally ill at the same time; because of these features, they create difficulty for many theories of responsibility.

Perhaps the most notable diagnostic feature shared by psychopaths is an inability to feel empathic distress. You feel empathic distress when you are pained by the perception of others in pain. The processes that ground empathic distress are not thought to be under conscious control. Psychopaths do not respond as most people do when exposed to signs of others in pain (Patrick, Bradley and Lang 1993) Although the degree to which someone can have the capacity for empathic distress varies, psychopaths are significantly different from non-psychopaths (Flor, 2002).

Furthermore psychopaths have significant difficulty distinguishing between different types of norms. Psychologists have noted that most people are readily able to note the difference between a violation of moral norms from violations of conventional norms (Dolan and Fullam 2010). Normal persons tend to characterize moral norms as serious, harm-based, not dependent on authority, and generalizable beyond their present context; conventional norms are characterized as dependent on authority and contextual (Turiel 1977). Children began to mark the distinction between moral and conventional norms at around two years of age (Turiel 1977). Psychopaths, on the other hand, fail to consistently or clearly note the differences between them. Most psychopaths tend to treat all norms as norms of convention.  Non-psychopaths note a difference between punching someone (a paradigmatic moral norm violation) and failing to respond in the third-person to a formal invitation (a violation of a conventional norm).  Although there is significant controversy about how much we can infer from the psychopath’s inability to mark the ‘moral / conventional’ distinction, the inability, along with their previously noted empathic deficit, has led some philosophers to argue that psychopaths cause problems for traditional theories of moral responsibility(Turiel 1977).

Reactive attitude theorists have argued that psychopaths should be exempt or excused from moral responsibility on both epistemic and fairness grounds. Given their difficulty distinguishing between moral and conventional norms, many reactive attitude theorists conclude that psychopaths are not properly sensitive to moral reasons and cannot be fairly held accountable (Fischer and Ravizza 1998; Wallace 1994; Russell 2004). It would be unfair to hold someone morally responsible if they cannot understand moral reasons; it is therefore inappropriate to express reactive attitudes at psychopaths (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 78-79). However, some have argued that psychopathic agency can ground accountability ascriptions.

David Shoemaker, for example, has argued that: “[a]s long as [the psychopath] has sufficient cognitive development to come to an abstract understanding of what the laws are and what the penalties are for violating them, it seems clear that he could arrive at the conclusion that [criminal] actions are not worth pursuing for purely prudential reasons, say. And with this capacity in place, he is eligible for criminal responsibility” (Shoemaker 2011, 119). Although Shoemaker’s claim about legal responsibility has struck many as correct, the larger debate is over whether psychopaths are morally responsible for their choices given what we know about psychopathic agency.

If moral responsibility requires the capacity to understand moral reasons as distinctly moral and if, as many philosophers have supposed, this capacity is grounded on the ability to empathize with others, then psychopaths cannot understand moral reasons and should be excused. This puts pressure on Shoemaker’s characterization of psychopathic responsibility. If a psychopath’s understanding of moral reasons can be gauged by, for example, their poor ability to distinguishing moral norms from conventional norms then this also appears to be evidence for their lack of receptivity to moral reasons. Some philosophers have excused psychopaths for just this reason: “[c]ertain psychopaths…are not capable of recognizing…that there are moral reasons…this sort of individual is not appropriately receptive to reasons, on our account, and thus is not a morally responsible agent” (Fischer and Ravizza 1998, 79). Others, like Patricia Greenspan, have argued that psychopaths do have a form of moral disability, stemming from their emotional impairments, but that this form of disability should serve to mitigate, not extinguish, their responsibility (Greenspan 2003, 437).

Some philosophers note the consequences of psychopathic moral receptivity on the quality of will thesis. If reactive attitudes are sensitive to the quality of an agent’s will, then psychopaths cannot express immoral wills if they do not understand morality. If psychopaths cannot act on a will that merits reactive accountability then they lack attributability altogether. Jay Wallace has argued that “[w]hat makes it appropriate to exempt the psychopath from accountability…is the fact that psychopathy…disables an agent’s capacities for reflective self control” (Wallace 1994, 178).

Others argue that psychopaths may be held accountable by appealing to non-moral reactive attitudes like hatred, disgust or contempt. These attitudes, they claim, can be targeted at the quality of a psychopath’s will even if it is granted that they cannot act on immoral wills (Talbert 2012, 100). This is true even if the psychopath cannot appreciate that we have moral reasons for caring about our status as agents. Insofar as the psychopath can make judgments like these, then, in the words of Patricia Greenspan, “[the psychopath] is a fair target of resentment for any harm attributable to his intention to the extent that the reaction is appropriate to his nature and deeds. He need not be “ultimately” responsible in the sense that implies freedom to escape blame” (Greenspan 2003, 427). Because psychopaths are incapable of understanding moral reasons it is unfair to hold them morally responsible but there are forms of accountability and reactive address that are outside the moral sphere that may remain appropriate to direct at them.

Shame, in particular, appears to be a normatively significant reactive attitude that psychopaths have access (Ramirez 2013, 232). Shame grounds a family of retributive forms of accountability and has been though to serve as another way to hold psychopaths accountable even if it can be established that psychopaths are not capable of feeling or understanding moral reactive attitudes. If psychopaths are susceptible to shame then they can be fairly held accountable on shame-based grounds.

It is fair to hold psychopaths accountable in these non-moral (shame-based) ways based if they are able to feel the emotion being levied against them and can express a quality of will that these attitudes are sensitive to. More importantly, although psychopaths do not understand the distinctiveness and weight of moral reasons, their judgments can still express condemnable attitudes about those reasons. Greenspan notes that all of us have “blind spots” about certain narrow classes of reasons and we stand to those reasons in the same relation that psychopaths stand to moral reasons; these blind spots don’t excuse us from accountability (Greenspan 2003, 435).

b. Body Integrity Identity Disorder and Gender Dysphoria

Conceptions of mental illness, and mentally impaired agency, factor prominently over questions regarding the best way to treat a disorder. In 1997, Robert Smith, a surgeon at the Falkirk and District Royal Infirmary in Scotland, amputated one of this patient’s limbs at this patient’s request. The limb itself was healthy. There did not exist any medical justification for the amputation. In 1999, Smith amputated another patient’s healthy limb, again at the request of the patient, and was scheduled to perform a third amputation (on a third patient) before the hospital’s board of directors forbade him from amputating any more healthy limbs. Smith’s patients came to him with a set of symptoms that do not correspond to any particular disorder in the DSM. Smith’s patients were not under the delusion that their limbs did not belong to them; they did not see their limbs as disfigured or disgusting. Instead, his patients claimed that, from a young age, they had not thought of the limb as part of their authentic selves. They were, the patients claimed, never meant to be born with the limb and were seeking surgery to allow their inner representation of their bodily identity to match their external body presentation. The only way to do this was to amputate their healthy limb.

Patients who seek to radically alter their body via repeated surgeries or extreme dieting are ordinarily (barring other symptoms) diagnosed with Body Dysmorphic Disorder (BDD). BDD, however, requires that patients seek to modify their bodies because they find a specific part of their body disgusting or revolting or flawed. Patients with BDD also tend to engage in obsessive behaviors related to the body-part’s appearance (grooming, ‘mirror checking,’ etc) (APA 2013, 248). Smith’s patients, although they claimed to experience significant dysphoria because of their condition, did not do so because they found their limbs revolting or disfigured. They identified themselves as having a different condition: Body Integrity Identity Disorder. Like psychopathy, BIID is not a disorder cataloged in the DSM. Although BIID is not a DSM disorder, the APA does recognize that it appears distinct from BDD. “Body Integrity Identity disorder (apotemnophilia)…involves a desire to have a limb amputated to correct an experience of mismatch between a person’s sense of body identity and his or her actual anatomy. However, the concern does not focus on the limb’s appearance, as it would be in body dysmorphic disorder” (APA 2013, 246-247). Vilayanur Ramachandran and Paul McGeoch claim that they have discovered several of the neural correlates of BIID and these appear distinct from BDD; specifically, they claim that the disorder arises in part from a dysfunction of the right parietal lobe (Ramachandran and McGeoch 2007, 252).

Apart from the conceptual question over whether BDD and BIID are underlying manifestations of the same mental illness, individuals who claim to suffer from BIID raise significant ethical questions over the nature of mental illness, autonomy, and surgical treatments for dysphoria. Patients with BIID request that surgeons recognize and grant their request for surgical intervention to cure psychological suffering. Although the case of BIID has not received widespread philosophical attention, several different approaches have been advanced with regards to BIID patient requests for amputation. The purpose of these amputations is, they claim, to correct what they see as a mismatch between their inner and outer selves. Some philosophers have raised doubts about the ability of BIID patients to act on genuinely autonomous decisions (Mueller 2009, 35). One worry about challenging the autonomy of otherwise rational agents is that, in other domains, we appear to allow individuals significant freedom to modify their bodies for many reasons (aesthetic, political, self-expression, and so forth) without thereby questioning their status as autonomous agents (Bridy 2004). The right to bodily autonomy is typically construed as one of the guiding values in biomedical decision-making. Furthermore, BIID sufferers who have their requests for amputation denied often resort to self-harm. Many will harm their limbs to the point where amputation becomes medically necessary. Some have argued that it is morally permissible to grant BIID requests for amputation on the basis of harm-prevention (Bayne and Levy 2005, 78). Others have expressed concern over the use of surgical treatments for mental illnesses (if it is granted that BIID is a mental illness), given that the surgery persons with BIID are requesting involve the permanent removal of a capacity typically thought to important (Johnston and Elliot 2002, 430).

Given that BIID patients appear to have a locatable dysfunction in their temporal lobes (an area where internal body representations are thought to be located), some philosophers have argued that surgical treatments are unjustified if a non-surgical solution can be found. That is, if BIID results from the suffering that is caused by a mismatch between a patient’s internal representation of herself and her outer presentation, then if it possible to change the inner representation, and thereby evade surgery, and thus we have an obligation to ought to do so (Johnston and Elliot 2002, 432). This approach, however, forces us to confront philosophical responses to other conditions that involve mismatches between a person’s inner representation of their bodies and their external bodily presentation. In particular, patients with BIID argue that their condition is analogous to the suffering faced by those with gender dysphoria. These individuals often seek sexual reassignment surgery to alleviate their perceived embodiment mismatch (Bayne and Levy 2005, 80). Individuals who are suffering as a result of their assigned sex/gender and who exhibit a strong desire to alter their sex and gender characteristics can be diagnosed with Gender Dysphoria (APA 2013, 451-459). Unlike other patients desiring surgical body modification (for self-expression, to meet unrealistic gender ideals, and so forth), individuals with BIID or Gender Dysphoria both report that their desires for surgical alteration of their body presentation originate at a young age. Both groups seek to have their request for surgical alteration respected by those around them as a recognition of their autonomy and of the value that gender (or bodily integrity) play in the formation of an authentic self (Lombardi 2001, 870).

The discussion of BIID, its status as a mental disorder, and the ethics of granting a person’s request for amputation are all relatively new and hotly debated topics within the Philosophy of Mental Illness and Bioethics generally. This debate is, however, connected to a larger, better established, questions concerning patient autonomy and what it means for an agent to make autonomous choices. At the moment there does not exist a clear-consensus on the status of BIID as disorder or a received view on how to treat BIID requests for amputation.

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Author Information

Erick Ramirez
Santa Clara University
U. S. A.