Maurice Merleau-Ponty (1908—1961)
Maurice Merleau-Ponty’s work is commonly associated with the philosophical movement called existentialism and its intention to begin with an analysis of the concrete experiences, perceptions, and difficulties, of human existence. However, he never propounded quite the same extreme accounts of radical freedom, being-towards-death, anguished responsibility, and conflicting relations with others, for which existentialism became both famous and notorious in the 1940s and 1950s. Perhaps because of this, he did not initially receive the same amount of attention as his French contemporaries and friends, Jean-Paul Sartre and Simone de Beauvoir. These days though, his phenomenological analyses are arguably being given more attention than either, in both France and in the Anglo-American context, because they retain an ongoing relevance in fields as diverse as cognitive science, medical ethics, ecology, sociology and psychology. Although it is difficult to summarize Merleau-Ponty’s work into neat propositions, we can say that he sought to develop a radical re-description of embodied experience (with a primacy given to studies of perception), and argued that these phenomena could not be suitably understood by the philosophical tradition because of its tendency to drift between two flawed and equally unsatisfactory alternatives: empiricism and, what he called, intellectualism. This article will seek to explain his understanding of perception, bodily movement, habit, ambiguity, and relations with others, as they were expressed in his key early work, Phenomenology of Perception, before exploring the enigmatic ontology of the chiasm and the flesh that is so evocatively described in his unfinished book, The Visible and the Invisible.
Table of Contents
- Life and Works
- Early Philosophy
- Later Philosophy
- References and Further Reading
Maurice Merleau-Ponty was born on March 14th 1908, and like many others of his generation, his father was killed in World War I. He completed his philosophy education at the Ecole Normale Superieure in 1930, and rather rapidly became one of the foremost French philosophers of the period during, and immediately following World War II, where he also served in the infantry. As well as being Chair of child psychology at Sorbonne in 1949, he was the youngest ever Chair of philosophy at the College de France when he was awarded this position in 1952. He continued to fulfill this role until his untimely death in 1961, and was also a major contributor for the influential political, literary, and philosophical magazine that was Les Temps Modernes. While he repeatedly refused to be explicitly named as an editor alongside his friend and compatriot Jean-Paul Sartre, he was at least as important behind the scenes.
Along with Sartre, he has frequently been associated with the philosophical movement existentialism, though he never propounded quite the same extreme accounts of freedom, anguished responsibility, and conflicting relations with others, for which existentialism became both famous and notorious. Indeed, he spent much of his career contesting and reformulating many of Sartre’s positions, including a sustained critique of what he saw as Sartre’s dualist and Cartesian ontology. He also came to disagree with Sartre’s rather hard-line Marxism, and this was undoubtedly a major factor in what was eventually a rather acrimonious ending to their friendship. For Merleau-Ponty’s assessment of their differences see Adventures of the Dialectic, but for Sartre’s version of events, see Situations. While he died before completing his final opus that sought to completely reorient philosophy and ontology (The Visible and the Invisible), his work retains an importance to contemporary European philosophy. Having been one of the first to bring structuralism and the linguistic emphasis of thinkers like Saussure into a relationship with phenomenology, his influence is still considerable, and an increasing amount of scholarship is being devoted to his works.
His philosophy was heavily influenced by the work of Husserl, and his own particular brand of phenomenology was preoccupied with refuting what he saw as the twin tendencies of Western philosophy; those being empiricism, and what he termed intellectualism, but which is more commonly referred to as idealism. He sought to rearticulate the relationship between subject and object, self and world, among various other dualisms, and his early and middle work did so primarily through an account of the lived and existential body (see The Phenomenology of Perception). He argued that the significance of the body, or the body-subject as he sometimes referred to it, is too often underestimated by the philosophical tradition which has a tendency to consider the body simply as an object that a transcendent mind orders to perform varying functions. In this respect, his work was heavily based upon accounts of perception, and tended towards emphasizing an embodied inherence in the world that is more fundamental than our reflective capacities, though he also claims that perception is itself intrinsically cognitive. His work is often associated with the idea of the ‘primacy of perception’, though rather than rejecting scientific and analytic ways of knowing the world, Merleau-Ponty simply wanted to argue that such knowledge is always derivative in relation to the more practical exigencies of the body’s exposure to the world.
When asked whether he was contemplating retirement on account of illness and the ravages of advancing age, Pope John Paul II confirmed that he was, and bemoaned the fact that his body was no longer a docile instrument, but a cage. Although it is difficult to deny that a docile body that can be used instrumentally might be preferable to its decaying alternative–a body that prevents us acting as we might wish to–both positions are united by a very literal adherence to the mind-body duality, and the subordination of one term of that duality; the body. Of course, such a dualistic way of thinking, and the denunciation of the body that it usually entails, is certainly not restricted to religious traditions. This denigration of embodiment governs most metaphysical thought, and perhaps even most philosophical thought, until at least Nietzsche. Even Heidegger’s philosophy has been accused of deferring the question of the body, and a non-dualistic exploration of our embodied experience seems to be a project of some importance, and it is one that preoccupied Maurice Merleau-Ponty throughout his entire career.
While a major figure in French phenomenology, Merleau-Ponty, at least until relatively recently, has rarely been accorded the amount of attention of many of his compatriots. In my opinion, this has been a considerable oversight, as it is doubtful that any other philosopher, phenomenologist or otherwise, has ever paid such sustained attention to the significance of the body in relation to the self, to the world, and to others. There is no relation or aspect of his phenomenology which does not implicate the body, or what he terms the body-subject (which is later considered in terms of his more general notion of the flesh), and significantly, his descriptions allow us to reconceive the problem of embodiment in terms of the body’s practical capacity to act, rather than in terms of any essential trait.
In the Phenomenology of Perception, which is arguably his major work, Merleau-Ponty sets about exposing the problematic nature of traditional philosophical dichotomies and, in particular, that apparently age-old dualism involving the mind and the body. It is no accident that consideration of this dualism plays such an important role in all of his work, since the constitution of the body as an ‘object’ is also a pivotal moment in the construction of the idea of an objective world which exists ‘out there’ (PP 72). Once this conception of the body is problematized, so too, according to Merleau-Ponty, is the whole idea of an outside world that is entirely distinguishable from the thinking subject.
Merleau-Ponty criticizes the tendency of philosophy to fall within two main categories, neither of which is capable of shedding much light on the problems that it seeks to address. He is equally critical of the rationalist, Cartesian accounts of humanity, as well as the more empirical and behavioristic attempts to designate the human condition.
Rationalism is problematic because it ignores our situation, and consequently the contingent nature of thought, when it makes the world, or at least meaning, the immanent property of the reflecting mind. One quote from Descartes is illustrative of this type of attitude:
“If I chance to look out of the window onto men passing in the street, I do not fail to say, on seeing them, that I see men… and yet, what do I see from this window, other than hats and cloaks, which cover ghosts or dummies who move only by means of springs? But I judge them to be really men, and thus I understand, by the sole power of judgment that resides in my mind, what I believed I saw with my eyes” (Crossley 10).
Descartes’ prioritizing of the mental above the physical (and indeed the duality itself), is very obvious here and this is something that Merleau-Ponty strongly rejects. As well as being unjust to existential experience, it also leaves the problem of meaningful judgment untouched. The account presupposes the meaningful judgment of hats and cloaks, rather than explaining how this perception could actually be meaningful. We shall return to such criticisms of Cartesianism throughout this chapter, but for the time being it is more important for us to have an accurate understanding of where Merleau-Ponty situates his philosophy, than it is for us to have a systematic comprehension of exactly why he refutes rationalism, or what he terms intellectualism.
According to Merleau-Ponty, empiricism also makes our cultural world an illusion, by ignoring the internal connection between the object and the act. For him, perception is not merely the result of the functioning of individual organs, but also a vital and performative human act in which “I” perceive through the relevant organs. Each of the senses informs the others in virtue of their common behavioral project, or concern with a certain human endeavor, and perception is inconceivable without this complementary functioning. Empiricism generally ignores this, and Merleau-Ponty contends that whatever their efficacy in explaining certain phenomena, these type of scientific and analytic causalities cannot actually appraise meaning and human action. As one critic points out, “if we attempt to localize and sectionalize the various activities which manifest themselves at the bodily level, we lose the signification of the action itself” (Barral 94). In the terms of Merleau-Ponty’s later philosophy, such an analysis would “recuperate everything except itself as an effort of recuperation, it would clarify everything except its own role” (VI 33).
The main point to extract from this is that, for Merleau-Ponty, both empiricism and intellectualism are eminently flawed positions:
“In the first case consciousness is too poor, in the second too rich for any phenomenon to appeal compellingly to it. Empiricism cannot see that we need to know what we are looking for, otherwise we would not be looking for it, and intellectualism fails to see that we need to be ignorant of what we are looking for, or equally again we should not be searching” (PP 28).
It is not difficult to see why Merleau-Ponty would be preoccupied with undermining such dichotomous tendencies. Essentially it ensures that one exists as a constituting thing (subject) or as a thing (object). Moreover, that perennial philosophical debate regarding whether humanity is free or determined is more than tangentially related, and all of these issues seem to be inextricably intertwined in what Foucault aptly terms the “empirico-transcendental doublet of modern thought.” This ontological dualism of immanence and transcendence – see mind/body, thought/language, self/world, inside/outside – is at the forefront of all of Merleau-Ponty’s attempts to re-orientate philosophy.
While Merleau-Ponty does not want to simplistically deny the possibility of cognitive relations between subject and object, he does want to repudiate the suggestion that these facts are phenomenologically primitive. It may be useful, in a particular situation, to conceive of a seer and a seen, a subject and an object. Many scientific endeavors fruitfully rely upon the methodological ideal of a detached consciousness observing brute facts about the world. Merleau-Ponty can accommodate this, provided that the terms of such dualities are recognized to be relationally constituted. In other words, for him, the seer and the seen condition one another and, of course, there is an obvious sense in which our capacity for seeing does depend on our capacity for being seen – that is, being physically embodied in what Merleau-Ponty has occasionally described as an ‘inter-individual’ world.
In this repudiation of traditional metaphysical philosophy and its governing subject-object relationship, it is perhaps unsurprising that Merleau-Ponty, when speaking of his phenomenological method, suggests that “the demand for a pure description excludes equally the procedure of analytical reflection on the one hand, and that of scientific explanation on the other” (PP ix). Only by avoiding these tendencies, according to him, can we “rediscover, as anterior to the ideas of subject and object, the fact of my subjectivity and the nascent object, that primordial layer at which both things and ideas come into being” (PP 219).
The Phenomenology of Perception is hence united by the claim that we are our bodies, and that our lived experience of this body denies the detachment of subject from object, mind from body, etc (PP xii). In this embodied state of being where the ideational and the material are intimately linked, human existence cannot be conflated into any particular paradigm, for as Nick Crossley suggests, “there is no meaning which is not embodied, nor any matter that is not meaningful” (Crossley 14). It should be clear from this that Merleau-Ponty’s statement that ‘I am my body’ cannot simply be interpreted as advocating a materialist, behaviorist type position. He does not want to deny or ignore those aspects of our life which are commonly called the ‘mental’ – and what would be left if he did? – but he does want to suggest that the use of this ‘mind’ is inseparable from our bodily, situated, and physical nature. This means simply that the perceiving mind is an incarnated body, or to put the problem in another way, he enriches the concept of the body to allow it to both think and perceive. It is also for these reasons that we are best served by referring to the individual as not simply a body, but as a body-subject.
Virtually the entirety of the Phenomenology of Perception is devoted to illustrating that the body cannot be viewed solely as an object, or material entity of the world. Perception has been a prominent theme in Merleau-Ponty’s attempts to establish this, and even in his latest work, he still holds its primacy as our clearest relationship to Being, and in which the inadequacy of dualistic thinking is most explicitly revealed. However, despite the titles of two of his major works (Phenomenology of Perception and The Primacy of Perception), perception, at least as the term is usually construed, is paradoxically enough, not really a guiding principle in his work. This is because the practical modes of action of the body-subject are inseparable from the perceiving body-subject (or at least mutually informing), since it is precisely through the body that we have access to the world. Perception hence involves the perceiving subject in a situation, rather than positioning them as a spectator who has somehow abstracted themselves from the situation. There is hence an interconnection of action and perception, or as Merleau-Ponty puts it, “every perceptual habituality is still a motor habit” (PP 153).
This ensures that there is no lived distinction between the act of perceiving and the thing perceived. This will become clearer in his later philosophy, where the figure of the chiasm becomes an important ontological motif for explaining how and why this is the case. At this stage however, it suffices to recognize that for Merleau-Ponty, “in the natural attitude, I do not have perceptions” (PP 281). Moreover, in the “Working Notes” of his final, unfinished work, The Visible and the Invisible, he states that “we exclude the term perception to the whole extent that it already implies a cutting up of what is lived into discontinuous acts, or a reference to things whose status is not specified, or simply an opposition between the visible and the invisible” (VI 157-8). Hence, as Gary Madison has pointed out, “what traditionally has been referred to as ‘perception’, no longer figures in Merleau-Ponty’s post-foundationalist mode of thinking” (MPHP 83). To the degree that we can actually speak of Merleau-Ponty’s account of perception, it essentially suggests the same thing as the rest of his work (and despite the incredible breadth and perspicacity of his work, one cannot deny that the Phenomenology of Perception is repetitious); it criticizes our tendency to bifurcate between two positions. Merleau-Ponty suggests that;
“We started off from a world in itself which acted upon our eyes so as to cause us to see it, and now we have consciousness of, or thought about the world, but the nature of the world remains unchanged; it is still defined by the absolute mutual exteriority of its parts, and is merely duplicated throughout its extent by a thought which sustains it” (PP 39).
In other words, the common perceptual paradigm that involves passively seeing something and then interpreting that biological perception is, for Merleau-Ponty, a false one. The presumption is still that one exists either as a thing, or as a consciousness (PP 198), but the perceiving body-subject conforms to neither of this positions; its mode of existence is manifestly more complicated and ambiguous. As hard as we may try, we cannot see the broken shards of a beer bottle as simply the sum of its color, shape etc. The whole background apparatus of what that bottle is used for, what consuming the liquids contained therein means for different people, what it is for something to be ‘broken’ etc, comes with, and not behind, our perception of that bottle. For Merleau-Ponty, perception cannot be characterized as a type of thought in a classical, reflective sense, but equally clearly, it is also far from being a third person process where we attain access to some rarefied, pure object. Just as for Heidegger we cannot hear pure noise but always a noise of some activity, the objects that we encounter in the world are always of a particular kind and relevant to certain human intentions (explicit or otherwise), and we cannot step outside this instrumentality to some realm of purified objects or, for that matter, thought.
Perception then, is not merely passive before sensory stimulation, but as Merleau-Ponty suggests, is a “creative receptivity”. In this respect, it is interesting to observe that our modern vernacular incorporates this more ‘active’ and appropriative dimension of perception. After all, one is often commended for ‘perceptive’ observations, and for this to function as a compliment at all, it must admit of an individual’s creative influence, and hence some responsibility, over the manner in which they perceive.
More empirically, it is also worth pointing out that if we were merely passive before a sensory image, it would not be possible to see different aspects of things as we so often do, or for that matter, for different individuals to construe a particular representation differently. Consider Jastrow’s/Wittgenstein’s famous example in which a picture can be variously interpreted as a duck or a rabbit, or the prominent psychological diagram that highlights the capacity of an individual to see a vase at one moment and two faces confronting one another at the next, depending upon which part of the diagram they determine to be the background. These experiential studies seem to reinforce Merleau-Ponty’s fundamental point that we are not simply passive before sensorial stimulation, since the visual experience seems to change, and yet nothing changes optically with respect to color, shape or distance. What we literally see, or notice, is hence not simply the objective world, but is conditioned by a myriad of factors that ensures that the relationship between perceiving subject and object perceived is not one of exclusion. Rather, each term exists only through its dialectical relation to the other, and from this analysis of the perceiving body-subject, Merleau-Ponty enigmatically concludes that “Inside and outside are inseparable. The world is wholly inside and I am wholly outside myself” (PP 407).
For Merleau-Ponty, this inseparability of inner and outer ensures that a study of the perceived ends up revealing the subject perceiving. As he puts it, “the body will draw to itself the intentional threads which bind it to its surroundings and finally will reveal to us the perceiving subject as the perceived world” (PP). It is precisely this ambiguous intertwining of inner and outer, as it is revealed in a phenomenological analysis of the body, which the intellectualism of philosophy cannot appreciate. According to Merleau-Ponty, philosophers of reflection ignore the paradoxical condition of all human subjectivity: that is, the fact that we are both a part of the world and coextensive with it, constituting but also constituted (PP 453).
However, if perception is not grounded in either an objective or subjective component (for example, it is not objectively received before a subjective interpretation), but by a reciprocal openness which resides between such categories, it may be remarked that this would seem to endow perception with an instability that it clearly doesn’t have. Merleau-Ponty’s philosophy has the means to cater for this stability though.
His analysis of the body’s tendency to seek an equilibrium through skilful coping, or what he somewhat problematically terms “habituality,” affirms how perception is learnt, primarily through imitation, in an embodied and communal environment. While perception is subject to change, just as communities can change over periods of time, this possibility certainly does not allow for wild fluctuations in perceptive experience from one moment to the next. Habit, and the production of schemes in regards to the body’s mobilization, “gives our life the form of generality and prolongs our personal acts into stable dispositions” (PP 146). This tendency of our body to seek its own equilibrium and to form habits, is an infinitely important component of Merleau-Ponty’s body-subject, and it is a theme that we will return to.
For the moment however, we must return to other manifestations of Merleau-Ponty’s argument for the body-subject. Another idea of central significance for him is the fact that the body is always there, and that its absence (and to a certain degree also its variation) is inconceivable (PP 91). It means that we cannot treat the body as an object available for perusal, which can or cannot be part of our world, since it is not something that we can possibly do with out. It is the mistake of classical psychology, not to mention the empiricism of all sciences, that it treats the body as an object, when for Merleau-Ponty, an object “is an object only insofar as it can be moved away from me… Its presence is such that it entails a possible absence. Now the permanence of my body is entirely different in kind” (PP 90). It is inordinately difficult to fault this claim that the omnipresence of our body prevents us treating it simply as an object of the world, even though such an apparently axiomatic position is not always recognized by traditional philosophy, as we have already seen exemplified by both Descartes, and Pope John Paul II.
Another factor against conceiving of the body as being completely constituted, and an object in-itself, is the fact that it is that by which there are objects. Our motility, that is, our capability of bodily movement, testifies that the body cannot be the mere servant of consciousness, since “in order that we may be able to move our body towards an object, the object must first exist for it, our body must not belong to the realm of the in-itself” (PP 139). This Sartrean term will be accorded with more significance as we progress, but for the moment, one only need see that Merleau-Ponty is making explicit that the aspects of an object revealed to an individual are dependent upon their bodily position.
For him, it is also clear that we are not accorded quite the same privilege in viewing our own bodies, as we have in viewing other ‘objects’. For Merleau-Ponty, this is because “the presentation of objects in perspective cannot be understood except through the resistance of my body to all variation of perspective” (PP 92). We cannot see our body as the other does, and as Merleau-Ponty says, “the reflection of the body upon itself always miscarries at the last minute” (VI 9). I think it is relatively clear that we do need the other to attain to true awareness of ourselves as a body-subject. Even our vision of ourselves in a mirror is always mediated by body image, and hence by the other, and it would seem that we can’t look at our own mirror image in quite the same way that we can appreciate the appearance of others. These more existential aspects of our existence suggest that there is something fundamentally true about Merleau-Ponty’s more general suggestion that our body should be conceived of as our means of communication with the world, rather than merely as an object of the world which our transcendent mind orders to perform varying functions.
Merleau-Ponty offers one particularly good example of the body as a means of communication, which also makes it clear that a subject-object model of exchange tends to deprive the existential phenomena of their true complexity. He suggests that:
“If I touch with my left hand my right hand while it touches an object, the right hand object is not the right hand touching: the first is an intertwining of bones, muscles and flesh bearing down on a point in space, the second traverses space as a rocket in order to discover the exterior object in its place” (PP 92).
More significantly, the hand touching itself represents the body’s capacity to occupy the position of both perceiving object and subject of perception, if not at once, then in a constant oscillation. However, as he puts it, “when I press my two hands together, it is not a matter of two sensations felt together as one perceives two objects placed side by side, but an ambiguous set-up in which both hands can alternate the role of ‘touching’ and being ‘touched'” (PP 93). Mark Yount expresses Merleau-Ponty’s point well, when he suggests that “the reflexivity of this touching-touched exceeds the logic of dichotomy: the two are not entirely distinguished, since the roles can be reversed; but the two are not identical, since touching and touched can never fully coincide” (MPHP 216-7). This double touching and encroachment of the touching onto the touched (and vice versa), where subject and object cannot be unequivocally discerned, is considered to be representative of perception and sensibility generally. Pre-empting the more explicit ontology of The Visible and the Invisible (and with which we shall become increasingly concerned), Merleau-Ponty hence tacitly argues for the “reversibility” of the body, its capacity to be both sentient and sensible, and reaffirms his basic contention that incarnate consciousness is the central phenomena of which mind and body are abstract moments (PP 193).
However, Merleau-Ponty has another vitally important and related point to make about the status of our bodies, which precludes them from being categorized simply as objects. According to him, we move directly and in union with our bodies. As he points out, “I do not need to lead it (the body) towards a movement’s completion, it is in contact with it from the start and propels itself towards that end” (PP 94, my italics). In other words, we do not need to check to see if we have two legs before we stand up, since we are necessarily with our bodies. The consequences of this simple idea however, are more extensive than one may presume.
On a more complicated level, the sporting arena testifies to this being with our bodies, as does the wave, or other gesture, that simply responds to given circumstances without the intervention of traditional philosophical conceptions of thought and/or intention. For instance, the basketball player who says that they are “in the zone” perceives the terrain in accordance with some general intentions, but these are modified by the situation in which they find themselves. Their actions are solicited by the situations that confront them, in a constantly evolving way.
Interestingly enough, in The Structure of Behavior, Merleau-Ponty also makes use of a sporting analogy. He suggests that:
“For the player in action the football field is not an ‘object’, that is, the ideal term which can give rise to a multiplicity of perspectival views and remain equivalent under its apparent transformations. It is pervaded with lines of force (the ‘yard lines’; those which demarcate the penalty area) and articulated in sectors (for example, the ‘openings’ between the adversaries) which call for a certain mode of action and which initiate and guide the action as if the player were unaware of it. The field itself is not given to him, but present as the immanent term of his practical intentions; the player becomes one with it and feels the direction of the goal, for example just as immediately as the vertical and horizontal planes of his own body” (SB 168).
This passage implies that to perceive the football pitch it is not necessary that an individual be aware of perceiving it, but this is not the only significance of this revealed mode of being. The perceptions/actions of the sportsperson reveal a form of intelligence that informs much of our everyday interaction, and that refutes many dichotomous positions (PP 142), most obvious among these being the insistence that a separate act of interpretation (to determine a goal or intention), is necessary to give action a meaningful form. Moreover, Merleau-Ponty’s descriptions of sporting activity also imply that as we refine our skills for coping with existence (based upon past experiences), scenarios show up as soliciting those acquired skilful responses, and it is this aspect of his work that attracts Hubert Dreyfus’ attention. For Dreyfus, this “skilful coping does not require a mental representation of its goal. It can be purposive without the agent entertaining a purpose” and this pre-reflective mode of existence reveals many of the postulations of dualistic thinking as abstractions.
Moreover, if this purposive action without a purpose (other than best accommodating oneself to the situation in which one is immersed), is forestalled, say if a particular golfer starts to ponder the intricacies of their swing, where their feet are positioned, mental outlook etc, rather than simply responding, it is certainly probable that they will lose form. So what, one may ask? According to Merleau-Ponty, the point is that “whether a system of motor or perceptual powers, our body is not an object for an ‘I think’, it is a grouping of lived-through meanings which moves towards its equilibrium” (PP 153). The emphasis upon rationalistic thought, and its tendency to dissect human behavior through the ‘I think’, can conspire to turn us away from the body’s acclimatization to it’s own environment. Merleau-Ponty hence seems to explore a more basic motivation for human action than is usually taken to be the case. Rather than focusing upon our desire to attain certain pleasures or achieve certain goals, his analysis reveals the body’s more primordial tendency to form intentional arcs, and to try and achieve an equilibrium with the world.
Through reference to embodied activity, Merleau-Ponty makes it clear that our actions, and the perceptions involved in those actions, are largely habitual; learnt through imitation, and responsiveness within an environment and to a community. Indeed, without such a pre-reflective base, language-games would be unlearnable, and as Wittgenstein was also beginning to do at virtually the same historical moment (the early 1940’s), Merleau-Ponty hence emphasizes the philosophical importance of the act of learning, and by implication, training. According to him, philosophy has generally been unable to adequately address these phenomena (PP 142), and it is worth repeating what I take to be an important sentence from the Phenomenology of Perception. Merleau-Ponty suggests that empiricism and intellectualism (the two logical outcomes of metaphysical thought), “are in agreement in that neither can grasp consciousness in the act of learning, and that neither attaches due importance to that circumscribed ignorance, that still empty but always determinate intention which is attention itself” (PP 28).
This emphasis upon consciousness in the act learning, is also what Dreyfus is intent on exploring in relation to Merleau-Ponty’s philosophy, and he agrees that in the act of learning, consciousness is irremediably embodied. Dreyfus asks, “if everything is similar to everything else in an indefinitely large number of ways, what constrains the space of possible generalizations so that trial and error learning has a chance of succeeding? Here is where the body comes in”. It is worth suggesting that this might apply equally if everything is dissimilar, other to everything else – the body narrows this disparate range of phenomena down, or more accurately, renders them intelligible. Our skilful embodiment makes it possible for us to encounter “more and more differentiated solicitations to act”, and enables us to react to situations, in ways that have previously proved successful, and which do not require purposive thought.
However, in order to begin to fathom what Dreyfus’ “embodied solicitations to act” might involve, it is worth contemplating the suggestion of another commentator, who also emphasizes the importance of the body in learning:
“Movements of the body are developed almost without conscious effort, in most cases. There seems to be a sort of intelligence of the body: a new dance is learned without analyzing the sequence of movements. Children learn dances very easily and well… This is also the reason why habits can be formed: the body seems to have understood and retained the new meaning” (Barral 137).
From this description, we can ascertain that it is usually not through conscious reflection and analysis that a dance or other language-game is learnt, but through repeated embodied efforts that are modified until the “right” movements are achieved. This intelligence of the body (for example, its capacity to innovate and retain new meaning), again denies the heavy emphasis that much of the philosophical tradition has placed upon interpretation, and certainly any conception of interpretation that contrasts itself with a purely passive perception. This can also be envisaged as applying just as well to the intellectual, as it does to the dancer. In reacting to their own different, but nevertheless distinct set of influences, they still choose modes of action in relation to past success. Even in the most apparently ‘thoughtful’ of activities, the body inclines itself towards an equilibrium.
It is worth making explicit that this habit to which we are referring, is far from being merely a mechanistic or behaviorist propensity to pursue a certain line of action. Our habitual mode of being is constantly being altered (in however small a way), and the point is that habit is far more akin to a competence, or a “flexible skill, a power of action and reaction” (Crossley 12), which can be mobilied under different conditions to achieve different effects (PP 143). However, we may want to ask, as Merleau-Ponty does, “if habituality is neither a form of knowledge nor an involuntary action, what is it then?” According to him, “it is knowledge in the hands, which is forthcoming only when bodily effort is made, and cannot be formulated in detachment from that effort” (PP 144). Merleau-Ponty suggests that this type of “knowledge in the hands” is primordial, and he implies that if we completely detach ourselves from this habitual base, we risk embarking upon philosophic and scientific endeavors that are of no practical benefit, and that might also artificially serve to legitimize the mind-body dualism.
Another good example of this practical and embodied intelligence that Merleau-Ponty insistently points us towards, is the driving of a car. We are intimately aware of how a particular car’s gearshift needs to be treated, its ability to turn, accelerate, brake etc, and importantly, also of the dimensions of the vehicle. When we reflect on our own parking, it is remarkable that there are so few little bumps considering how many times we are actually forced to come very close. Indeed, even when reversing many drivers need not really monitor the progress of their car, because they ‘know’ (in the sense of a harmony between aim and intention) what result the various movements of the steering wheel are likely to induce. The car is absorbed into our body schema with almost the same precision that we have regarding our own spatiality. It becomes an “area of sensitivity” which extends “the scope and active radius of the touch” (PP 143) and rather than thinking about the car, it is more accurate to suggest that we think from the point of view of the car, and consequently also perceive our environment in a different way (Crossley 12). Notably, this thinking is not reflective or interpretive – we do not have to perceive the distance to a car park, and then reflect upon the fact that we are in a car of such and such proportions, before the delicate maneuver can be attempted. Rather, it is a practical mastery of a technique which ensures that the given rules can be followed blindly (or at least without reflective thought), and yet nevertheless with an embodied intelligence.
In one paragraph from the Phenomenology of Perception, Merleau-Ponty captures the issues at hand particularly well. He observes that:
“We said earlier that it is the body which “understands” in the acquisition of habituality. This way of putting it will appear absurd, if understanding is subsuming a sense datum under an idea, and if the body is an object. But the phenomenon of habituality is just what prompts us to revise our notion of “understand” and our notion of the body. To understand is to experience harmony between what we aim at and what is given, between the intention and the performance – and the body is our anchorage in the world” (PP 144).
In this paragraph, Merleau-Ponty defines understanding as a harmony between what we aim at and what is given, between intention and performance, and this also sheds some light upon his suggestion that consciousness is primarily not a matter of “I think that”, but of “I can” (PP 137). Action in this paradigm is spontaneous and practical, and it is clear that we move phenomenally in a manner somewhat antithetical to the mind-body distinction (PP 145).
However, it is worth pointing out that while habit and the tendency to seek an equilibrium might help us adjust to the circumstances of our world, they don’t simply make things easy. For Merleau-Ponty, “what enables us to centre our existence is also what prevents us from centering it completely, and the anonymity of our body is inseparably both freedom and servitude” (PP 85). Merleau-Ponty’s point seems to be that though the body searches for equilibrium, as a mortal and temporal body it is also precluded from perpetual equilibrium (cf PP 346).
Merleau-Ponty’s claim that knowing is far from an imperative for human action will be considered in greater detail throughout, but for the moment it is more important to consider some other consequences of his account of embodiment, particularly in relation to his suggestion that we move spontaneously, and pre-reflectively, in accord with our bodies. According to his version of the pre-reflective cogito, when one motions towards a friend to come nearer, there is no preceding or ancillary thought prepared within me which motivates my action (PP 111). I do not perceive a certain signal in my mind and then decide to act on it, or if I do, it is a rare and derivative occurrence. According to Merleau-Ponty, the immense difference posited by the philosophical tradition between thinking and perceiving (and of course, mind and body), is hence revealed as a mistake.
However, this suggestion that pre-reflective existence does not require interpretation, or any prior formulation of intention, is an important one and deserving of prolonged consideration. Insisting that we cannot discern an interior state that precedes the expression of that state, Merleau-Ponty suggests that “I am not in front of my body, I am in it or rather I am it… If we can still speak of interpretation in relation to the perception of one’s own body, we shall have to say that it interprets itself” (PP 150). One would struggle to envisage a much closer relationship to the body than that, and Merleau-Ponty elsewhere goes so far as to suggest that:
“Nothing is changed when the subject is charged with interpreting his reactions himself, which is what is proper to introspection. When he is asked if he can read the letters inscribed on a panel or distinguish the details of a shape, he will not trust a vague “impression of legibility”. He will attempt to read or describe what is presented to him” (SB 183).
According to Merleau-Ponty then, there is no ‘mental’ correlate of reading that makes it possible to definitively know that reading is taking place. Faced with the demand that they prove that they have actually read, an individual can only refer, with circularity, to the words that have read themselves, repeating what is in front of him or her. If further justification is demanded, eventually one can respond only by pointing out that “this is simply what I do”, and that these are the practices that I engage in.
Refusing to accord the ‘mental’ any privileged status, Merleau-Ponty even suggests that:
“If I try to study love or hate purely from inner observation, I will find very little to describe: a few pangs, a few heart throbs – in short, trite agitations which do not reveal the essence of love or hate… We must reject the prejudice which makes “inner realities” out of love, hate or anger, leaving them accessible to one single witness: the person who feels them. Anger, shame, hate and love are not psychic facts hidden at the bottom of another’s consciousness: they are types of behavior or styles of conduct which are visible from the outside” (SNS 52-3).
Human subjectivity is no longer conceived of as residing in an inaccessible, private domain of the ‘mental’. Rather, Merleau-Ponty’s notion of the body-subject entails an affirmation of public and surface interaction, and of the physiognomic qualities of our bodies. This does not preclude deep feelings, but merely suggests that they must necessarily be manifested in our public lives. A disturbance aroused in the affective life of an individual will have correlative repercussions in the physical, perceptive, and expressive life of that person. This will obviously have significant ramifications for how we conceive of relationships with the other, but these are not merely flippant remarks designed only to refute intellectualism and empiricism. Merleau-Ponty has thought through the consequences and recognizes, for example, that the Japanese express the emotion of love in significantly different ways to the archetypal French or Australian citizen. But for him this cultural variance, “or to be more precise, this difference of behavior, corresponds to a difference in the emotions themselves. It is not only the gesture that is contingent in relation to the body’s organization, it is the manner itself in which we meet the situation and live it…. Feelings and passional conduct are invented like words” (PP 189).
This quote is slightly misleading, because Merleau-Ponty’s philosophy of situation does not want to suggest that either passional conduct, or words for that matter, can simply be constructed from nothing by a self-actualized individual. The word invention, which seems to imply an individual inventing something, is the problematic term here. Both passional conduct and words however, are invented, but by a community, and hence subtend any individual existence.
However, for some critics Merleau-Ponty’s notion of the body-subject, and his emphasis upon the intentional arc that inclines one towards an equilibrium and tacitly suggests the derivative nature of thought and interpretation, induces a picture of humanity that is too easy, and not reflective enough. There is, after all, a tendency to interpret his position as being an advocacy of simple, spontaneous relations, and a nostalgic desire for some primordial inherence in Being. It has been suggested that Merleau-Ponty’s phenomenology does not give the required amount of attention to reflection, and other factors that might complicate this spontaneous, pre-reflective state.
On the other hand, it might also be claimed that not only can Merleau-Ponty’s philosophy of situation accommodate rationality, it also consigns it to its proper place. While in many ways his philosophy does affirm the primacy of perception (broadly construed to incorporate the practical action that it cannot be distinguished from), this doesn’t simply come at the cost of sacrificing the validity of rational processes. Rather, it attempts to ground them in our situation, and to reinforce that reflection should not feign ignorance of its origins in perceptual experience. His point is simply that the “I can” precedes and conditions the possibility of the “I know” (PP 137). As Merleau-Ponty states, there is “a privilege of reason, but precisely in order to understand it properly, we must begin by replacing thought amongst the phenomena of perception” (PrP 222).
Analytic thought, and philosophy per se, can and should be used to render pre-reflective experience intelligible, for as he points out:
“It is a question not of putting the perceptual faith in place of reflection, but on the contrary of taking into account the total situation, which involves reference from the one to the other. What is given is not a massive and opaque world, or a universe of adequate thought; it is a reflection which turns back over the density of the world in order to clarify it, but which, coming second, reflects back to it only its own light” (VI 35).
Indeed, despite the nostalgic yearning that Merleau-Ponty occasionally seems to have for a primordial union with the world, he nevertheless makes it clear that one never returns to immediate experience. It is only a question of whether we are to try to understand it, and he believes that to attempt to express immediate experience is not to betray reason but, on the contrary, to work towards its aggrandizement. Philosophy is hence a means to improve our ways of living, and reason has a role in this, providing that it is based in the phenomenological exigencies of the subject and their life-world. While his philosophy is poised on the margins of philosophy and non-philosophy, it is not anti-philosophical in any respect.
Moreover, Merleau-Ponty does not intend to suggest that the complicity of body and mind that we see in habit and the mastery of a certain technique, implies an absolute awareness of one’s own ‘subjectivity’. According to him, “there is the absolute certitude of the world in general, but not of anything in particular” (PP 344). Knowing an individual person in a particular manifestation may presuppose an understanding of humanity in its totality, but certainly not any singular motivation for a particular act. Lived relations can never be grasped perfectly by consciousness, since the body-subject is never entirely present-to-itself. Meaningful behavior is lived through, rather than thematized and reflected upon, and this ensures that the actions of particular individuals “may be meaningful without them being fully or reflectively aware of the meaning that their action creates or embodies. In this sense, the behaving actor is not a fully-fledged subject in the Cartesian sense. She is not fully transparent to herself” (Crossley 12). There is ambiguity then, precisely because we are not capable of disembodied reflection upon our activities, but are involved in an intentional arc that absorbs both our body and our mind (PP 136). For Merleau-Ponty, both intellectualism and empiricism presuppose “a universe perfectly explicit in itself” (PP 41), but residing between these two positions, his body-subject actually requires ambiguity and, in a sense, indeterminacy.
According to Merleau-Ponty, ambiguity prevails both in my perception of things, and in the knowledge I have of myself, primarily because of our temporal situation which he insists cannot but be ambiguous. He suggests that:
“My hold on the past and the future is precarious and my possession of my own time is always postponed until a stage when I may fully understand it, yet this stage can never be reached, since it would be one more moment bounded by the horizon of its future, and requiring in its turn, further developments in order to be understood” (PP 346 cf 426).
In such sentiments Merleau-Ponty seems to be suggesting that the relationship that we have to ourselves is one that is always typified by alterity, on account of a temporal explosion towards the future that precludes us ever being self-present. [The term “alterity” is basically synonymous with otherness and radical difference, but it also emphasizes change and transformation in a way that these terms might not.] There can be no self-enclosed “now” moment because time also always has this reflexive aspect that is aware of itself, and that opens us to experiences beyond our particular horizons of significance. Indeed, it is because of this temporal alterity, that Merleau-Ponty asserts that we can never say ‘I’ absolutely (PP 208). Rather, he suggests, “I know myself only insofar as I am inherent in time and in the world, that is, I know myself only in my ambiguity” (PP 345). Elsewhere in the Phenomenology of Perception he goes on to imply that the subject is time and time is the subject (PP 431-2), and these sentiments are not that far from certain ‘postmodern’ conceptions of subjectivity.
Moreover, the attempt to take seriously the notion of ambiguity would, or at least should, also involve the deconstruction of what is termed the ‘metaphysics of presence’. Being the “mark of a thought which is resolutely attempting to overcome oppositional thinking itself” (MPHP 120), Merleau-Ponty’s emphasis upon ambiguity, if consistently adhered to, would seem capable of refuting the various readings of him that assert that he is overly preoccupied with presence.
Mary Barral puts Merleau-Ponty’s point exceedingly well, when she suggests that “since we cannot remain in the alternative of either not understanding the subject, or of knowing nothing about the object, we must seek the object at the very heart of our experience… to understand the paradox that there is a “for-us” of the “in-itself” (Barral 130 cf PP 71). In other words, we must attain an understanding of what Merleau-Ponty describes elsewhere as “the paradox of transcendence in immanence” (PrP 16) – that is, to understand that objects are given over to us, influenced by us, just as we are influenced by the objects that surround us. For Merleau-Ponty, this interdependence and mutual encroachment is evident in all aspects of perception and subjectivity. As he makes clear, “whenever I try to understand myself, the whole fabric of the perceptible world comes too, and with it comes the others who are caught in it (S 15). In the concluding words of the Phenomenology of Perception he insists that “man is a network of relations” (PP 456), or “man is a knot of relations”, depending upon the translation, and the strong implication of Merleau-Ponty’s philosophy is that this is not a knot (or network) of the Gordian variety, and that these relations are not something that we can, or even should, want to unravel. The interdependence of the knot is what gives humanity its very qualities, and by dissecting it, we risk losing the very thing that establishes us as human.
But I think this point is best explored by Merleau-Ponty when he describes how in writing his philosophical texts, he might not necessarily have a precise idea of exactly where his discussion is leading but, “as if by magic”, the words flow from him and slowly become a cogent whole (PP 177). This is not to be dismissed as merely being symptomatic of a supposed continental lack of philosophical rigor. All papers, analytic or otherwise, are not written in the head, entirely worked out, before they are laid down. The process of laying them down inevitably effects alterations. Merleau-Ponty embraces this aspect of writing, and he doesn’t consider it merely the derivative attempt to faithfully transcribe some self-present thought. However, there is also the further point that where exactly the written creation derives from (the particular word, as much as the whole book) is a fundamentally ambiguous point, since it is neither the self-present subject, nor the cultural world, which determines the product, but the knot, the sum relation of all networks.
Again, this also necessitates a certain ambiguity at the heart of our experience. Trying to discern what is a legitimate authentic project of the self, which is not induced by the demands of one’s society, is infinitely difficult. Indeed, it is not a possibility for Merleau-Ponty and because of its overtones of an unattainable individualism, he refused to use the existential concept of authenticity for his entire career. But he would not want to say that something like, but slightly different from authenticity (that is, an individual coming to terms with their own situation in an empowering way), is an impossibility. In many ways, this is a primary ethical demand of his. Finally however, this ambiguity at the heart of our experience will always be there and an authentic path is not one that we consciously choose by attempting to ensure that we are the only origin of our projects, somehow attempting what he contends is impossible; that is, the transcending of our environment. Rather, Merleau-Ponty’s suggestion is that circumstances point us to, and in fact, allow us to find a way (PP 456). The human situation is both a product of the ‘mind’ and our socio-historical situation, and moral achievement is a tenuous embrace of these facts.
Merleau-Ponty died before he had the opportunity to complete The Visible and the Invisible, which was intended to be a text of some considerable proportions. He left us with three reasonably complete chapters, as well as his “Working Notes” for the remainder of this book, and from these two sources it is apparent that his thought had undergone some transformations. However, opinions vary widely as to the extent of these changes. Indeed, it is worth recalling that in an essay that was unpublished in his own lifetime, Merleau-Ponty describes his philosophical career as falling into two distinct phases: he tells us that the first phase of his work – up to and including the Phenomenology of Perception – involved an attempt to restore the world of perception and to affirm the primacy of the pre-reflective cogito. In other words, in this period of his work he was intent on emphasizing an inherence in the world that is more fundamental than our thinking/reflective capacities. The second distinct phase of his work, which refers predominantly to The Visible and the Invisible as well as to the abandoned Prose of the World, is characterized as an attempt “to show how communication with others, and thought, take up and go beyond the realm of perception” (EW 367-8). This is important for several reasons, not least that it suggests a fairly major change in direction. The idea that communication with others goes beyond the realm of perception, is sufficiently radical to put him at odds with at least a certain definition of phenomenology.
Ostensibly in opposition to this type of characterisation, Martin Dillon’s book Merleau-Ponty’s Ontology has emphasized that these two periods of Merleau-Ponty’s career are actually intimately connected. Dillon downplays the significance of quotes from Merleau-Ponty like that which has just been cited, and instead insists that The Visible and the Invisible is primarily concerned with bringing the results of the earlier work, which are often primarily psychological, to their ontological explication. Merleau-Ponty has also suggested similar things at times (cf VI 176), and according to this type of account, the ontology of his later philosophy was already implied in his earlier works.
Despite agreeing with the broad outlines of this position, there are nevertheless some problems with such a characterization that suggest that the truth of this dispute might lie somewhere between these respective accounts. The more radical aspects of The Visible and the Invisible are ignored by the view that conflates these two major periods, and Merleau-Ponty’s treatment of Sartre’s work in his two main texts (VI and PP) also seems to be importantly different. It is however, more for exegetical than philosophical reasons that I have separated out Merleau-Ponty’s thought into two major periods.
Before we begin to examine his final attempt to circumvent the subject-object dichotomy, it is first necessary to get some idea as to why Merleau-Ponty thought his philosophy had to change. Basically his main criticism of the Phenomenology of Perception is that it remains confined within a philosophy of consciousness, or a philosophy of mind paradigm. He thinks that to a certain extent the Phenomenology of Perception remains Cartesian, in that it starts from the position of the reflecting philosopher in his or her ivory tower. Merleau-Ponty suggests that this starting point presupposes a subject doing the reflection, and it hence has an element of humanism about it.
More importantly however, he suggests that this starting point also means that the problems he raises are largely insoluble, as he never quite gets away from a subject/object dichotomy. If it is unclear what all of these references to a subject-object dichotomy mean, I am simply pointing out the tendency in Western philosophy to posit that which is seen within the field of vision as an object, whereas that which looks, or does the perceiving, is the subject. Various versions of this type of thought have recurred throughout the tradition, and this partly explains the tendency that we have to think in terms of things in the world (for example, empirical objects or facts), and the human capacity to reflect upon these brute things of the world, and hence transcend them. We generally maintain a very distinct difference between ourselves and the objects of the world – say the seat upon which we sit – and it might be suggested that we are free, and they are determined, for instance. Or even if one does not want to assert that human activity is predominantly reflective (and usually this amounts to saying that it is free), philosophers and most of us generally, think in terms of the difference between the empirical fact of what we did, and our reason which transcends this behavior. This object/consciousness distinction is a dualism.
In The Visible and the Invisible, Merleau-Ponty suggests that the Phenomenology of Perception was ultimately unsuccessful in getting beyond this dualistic way of thinking. Of course, there is little doubt that Merleau-Ponty is a little bit harsh in regards to his retrospective accounts of his earlier philosophy, and is also simplifying matters if he wants us to believe that the Phenomenology of Perception doesn’t significantly problematize this subject-object dichotomy, and any of philosophies other traditional dualisms.
What is clear however, is that The Visible and the Invisible does attempt to effect a transition from something like a phenomenology of consciousness (which is basically just an analysis of how the objects we perceive present themselves to us), to a philosophy of Being. Being is another of those words in philosophy that is frequently thrown around, but perhaps relatively rarely understood. This is partly because it is not something that we can pin down or define, because it exceeds all of our resources for attempting to describe it. Let us suggest, hesitatingly, that Being is that which allows existence to be possible at all, and Merleau-Ponty becomes increasingly concerned with such matters.
This move away from a subject-based philosophy also has some important consequences for the type of philosophy that he was interested in writing. No longer is his work so strictly an analysis of phenomenological subjectivity, and this means that in some ways The Visible and the Invisible is a little harder to get into than his earlier work. It is not existential in the sense that the Phenomenology of Perception is. This earlier text is typified by numerous phenomenological descriptions of our everyday activity and the situations that confront us, and his later work is more concerned with ontological matters.
Ontology just means the study of Being, of that which allows things to be at all, and it is this type of terrain that Merleau-Ponty moves into. One could even suggest that The Visible and the Invisible gives the results of the Phenomenology of Perception their ontological significance. In that sense, the subject influenced, and often psychological thinking of his earlier work, would be revealed as also presupposing an account of the structure of Being, which only later came to be elaborated. It is apparent however, that his thought his changed to the extent that the notion of subjectivity, and its controlling place, is further diminished. References to the body-subject are also conspicuously absent in his later philosophy, and he seems to have decided that such terminology is inadequate. The consequences of this move away from a subjective orientation will become more apparent when we consider his ontology later in this essay.
Merleau-Ponty also makes one other important comment about the Phenomenology of Perception, and his reasons for writing a new ontology, which is worth exploring. According to him, a major factor behind him setting out upon this different path, was the conviction that the tacit or pre-reflective cogito of his earlier philosophy is problematic (VI 179). The pre-reflective cogito is basically just the idea that there is a cogito before language, or to put it crudely, that there is a self anterior to both language and thought that we can aim to get in closer contact with. The notion of a pre-reflective cogito hence presumes the possibility of a consciousness without language, and it exhibits something of a nostalgic desire to return to some brute, primordial experience. This is something that thinkers like Irigiray have criticized Merleau-Ponty for, and in The Visible and the Invisible he has come to share these type of concerns.
In his own words, he suggests that while this concept of the pre-reflective, or tacit cogito, can make understood how language is not impossible, it nevertheless cannot make understood how it is possible (VI 179). While a logician might grimace at such a suggestion, Merleau-Ponty is certainly aware of this paradox, and seeks to explicate the problems that he associates with this concept of the tacit cogito. He suggests that like all other philosophies of consciousness, his notion of the pre-reflective cogito depends upon the illusion of non-linguistic signification and The Visible and The Invisible attempts to call into question the very coherence of such a concept. As he states in one of his “Working Notes”:
“What I call the tacit cogito is impossible. To have the idea of thinking (in the sense of thought of seeing and thought of feeling), to make the phenomenological reduction to the things themselves, to return to immanence and to consciousness, it is necessary to have words. It is by the combination of words that I form the transcendental attitude” (VI 171).
He later goes on to speak of the “mythology of self-consciousness to which the word consciousness refers”, and contends that “there are only differences between significations” and language (VI 171).
According to Merleau-Ponty, the tacit cogito is therefore a product of language, and the language of the philosopher, in particular. He continues to speak of a world of silence, but the concept of the pre-reflective cogito imports the language of the philosophy of consciousness into the equation, and hence misrepresents the relationship between vision and speech. The famous phenomenological reduction to the things themselves, which tries to bracket out the outside world, is hence envisaged as a misplaced nostalgia rather than as a real possibility.
There is a sense in which Merleau-Ponty’s giving up on the pre-reflective cogito also entails something like a giving up on phenomenology, despite the fact that embodiment is still a major factor in The Visible and the Invisible. By way of clarification, it is worth noting that he still thinks that an analysis of the body is one of the best ways to avoid the subject-object dichotomy that he argues is typical of most philosophical thought. At the same time however, his abandonment of the idea of a pre-reflective cogito, or consciousness before linguistic significance, at the very least serves to radicalize phenomenology. It also means that language comes to play a far more important role in his philosophy than it previously had.
Indeed, Merleau-Ponty used both linguistics, and the language-based emphasis of structuralism to critique Sartre, among other of his contemporaries, who only accorded language a minimal role in their philosophies. He was also friends with, and used the work of people like Jacques Lacan (a psychoanalyst who suggested that the unconscious is structured like a language), Claude Levi-Strauss (a structuralist anthropologist who dedicated his major work The Savage Mind to the memory of Merleau-Ponty), and also Ferdinand De Saussure (a linguist who showed what a pivotal role differences play in language, and whose work has inspired many recent philosophers including Derrida). Merleau-Ponty was hence very much involved in what is termed the linguistic turn, and one curious aspect of Merleau-Ponty’s place within the philosophical tradition is that despite the enduring attention he accords to the problem of language, the work of thinkers such as those cited above, and others who have been inspired by them (Derrida and Foucault for example), has been used to criticize him. In an important way, he paradoxically laid the groundwork for his own denigration and unfashionability in French intellectual circles, and it is only in the last 15 years that it has been realized that his phenomenology took very seriously the claims of such thinkers, and even pre-empted some aspects of what has come to be termed ‘postmodern’ thought. Levi-Strauss actually finds The Visible and the Invisible to be a synthesis of structuralism with phenomenology, and he is not alone in this regard.
Rather than maintaining a traditional dualism in which mind and body, subject and object, self and other, and so forth, are discrete and separate entities, in The Visible and the Invisible Merleau-Ponty argues that there is an important sense in which such pairs are also associated. For example, he does not dispute that there is a divergence, or dehiscence, in our embodied situation that is evident in the difference that exists between touching and being touched, between looking and being looked at, or between the sentient and the sensible in his own vocabulary. On the contrary, this divergence is considered to be a necessary and constitutive factor in allowing subjectivity to be possible at all. However, he suggests that rather than involving a simple dualism, this divergence between touching and being touched, or between the sentient and the sensible, also allows for the possibility of overlapping and encroachment between these two terms.
For example, Merleau-Ponty has somewhat famously suggested that the experience of touching cannot be understood without reference to the tacit potential for this situation to be reversed. As Thomas Busch points out, The Visible and the Invisible highlights that “in the body’s touching of itself is found a differentiation and an encroachment which is neither sheer identity nor non-identity” (MPHP 110). To substantiate this claim in adequate detail would take us too far afield of this essay’s main concerns, but it is important to recognize that Merleau-Ponty’s initial, and I think permissible presumption, is that we can never simultaneously touch our right hand while it is also touching an object of the world. He suggests that “either my right hand really passes over into the rank of the touched, but then its hold on the world is interrupted, or it retains its hold on the world, but then I do not really touch it” (VI 148). There is then, a gap (or ecart in French) between ourselves as touching and ourselves as touched, a divergence between the sentient and sensible aspects of our existence, but this gap is importantly distinct from merely reinstating yet another dualism. Touching and touched are not simply separate orders of being in the world, since they are reversible, and this image of our left hand touching our right hand does more than merely represent the body’s capacity to be both perceiving object and subject of perception in a constant oscillation (as is arguably the case in Sartre’s looked at, looked upon, dichotomy, as well as the master-slave oscillations that such a conception induces). As Merleau-Ponty suggests:
“I can identify the hand touched in the same one which will in a moment be touching… In this bundle of bones and muscles which my right hand presents to my left, I can anticipate for an instant the incarnation of that other right hand, alive and mobile, which I thrust towards things in order to explore them. The body tries… to touch itself while being touched and initiates a kind of reversible reflection” (PP 93).
This suggests that the hand that we touch, while it is touching an inanimate object, is hence not merely another such ‘object’, but another fleshy substance that is capable of reversing the present situation and being mobile and even aggressive. Given that we cannot touch ourselves, or even somebody else, without this recognition of our own tangibility and capacity to be touched by others, it seems that the awareness of what it feels like to be touched encroaches, or even supervenes upon the experience of touching (VI 147). Any absolute distinction between being in the world as touching, and being in the world as touched, deprives the existential phenomena of their true complexity. Our embodied subjectivity is never located purely in either our tangibility or in our touching, but in the intertwining of these two aspects, or where the two lines of a chiasm intersect with one another. The chiasm then, is simply an image to describe how this overlapping and encroachment can take place between a pair that nevertheless retains a divergence, in that touching and touched are obviously never exactly the same thing.
According to Merleau-Ponty, these observations also retain an applicability that extends well beyond the relationship that obtains between touching and being touched. He contends that mind and body (VI 247, 259), the perceptual faith and its articulation (VI 93), subject and object, self and world (VI 123), as well as many other related dualisms, are all associated chiasmically, and he terms this interdependence of these various different notions the flesh (VI 248-51). The rather radical consequences of this intertwining become most obvious when Merleau-Ponty sets about describing the interactions of this embodied flesh. At one stage in The Visible and the Invisible he suggests that the realization that the world is not simply an object:
“does not mean that there was a fusion or coinciding of me with it: on the contrary, this occurs because a sort of dehiscence opens my body in two, and because between my body looked at and my body looking, my body touched and my body touching, there is overlapping or encroachment, so that we may say that the things pass into us, as well as we into the things” (VI 123).
According to Merleau-Ponty then, this non-dualistic divergence between touching and being touched, which necessitates some form of encroachment between the two terms, also means that the world is capable of encroaching upon and altering us, just as we are capable of altering it. Such an ontology rejects any absolute antinomy between self and world, as well as any notion of subjectivity that prioritizes a rational, autonomous individual, who is capable of imposing their choice upon a situation that is entirely external to them. To put the problem in Sartrean terms, while it may sometimes prove efficacious to distinguish between transcendence and facticity [a technical term of Martin Heidegger’s that in Merleau-Ponty’s usage refers to the sum of brute “facts” about us, including our social situation and our physical attributes, abilities and circumstances], or Being-for-itself and Being-in-itself, Merleau-Ponty thinks that such notions also overlap in such a way as to undermine any absolute difference between these two terms. As a consequence, Sartre’s conception of an absolute freedom in regards to a situation is also rendered untenable by the recognition of the ways in which self and world are chiasmically intertwined, though this is not to suggest that the world can be reduced to us. Indeed, Merleau-Ponty explicitly asserts that precisely what is rarely considered is this paradoxical fact that though we are of the world, we are nevertheless not the world (VI 127), and in affirming the interdependence of humanity and the ‘things’ of the world in a way that permits neither fusion nor absolute distance, he advocates an embodied inherence of a different type.
Given that he rarely makes any distinction between the structure of our relations with others and the structure of our relations with the world, his descriptions also pertain directly to the problem of the other, which has come to be accorded of lot of attention in recent times under the auspices of what is frequently termed alterity. Merleau-Ponty’s chiasmic ontology ensures that in some sense the other is always already intertwined within the subject, and he explicitly suggests that self and non-self are but the obverse and reverse of each other (VI 83, 160). If I can present his position a little schematically, basically his later philosophy attempts to reinforce that self and other are also relationally constituted via their potential reversibility. One example of this might be the way in which looking at another person – or even a painter looking at trees, according to one of Merleau-Ponty’s more enigmatic examples – always also involves the tacit recognition that we too can be looked at. However, rather than simply oscillating between these two modes of being – looker and looked upon, as Sartrean philosophy would have it – for Merleau-Ponty each experience is betrothed to the other in such a way that we are never simply a disembodied looker, or a transcendental consciousness. Rather, the alterity of the other’s look is always already involved in us, and rather than unduly exalting alterity by positing it as forever elusive, or as recognizable only as freedom that transcends my freedom, he instead affirms an interdependence of self and other that involves these categories overlapping and intertwining with one another, but without ever being reduced to each other. One consequence of Merleau-Ponty’s position is that questions regarding the otherness of the other are rendered something of an abstraction, at least if they attempt to conceive of that other without reference to the subjectivity with which it is always chiasmically intertwined. As Dorothy Olkowski has suggested, “if there is to be room in the world for others as others, there must be some connection between self and other that exceeds purely psychic life” (Olkowski 4), and this is envisaged as an ontological necessity rather than an attempt to propound a thesis that restores us to the primordial affection that we have for the other. For Merleau-Ponty, a responsible treatment of alterity consists in recognizing that alterity is always already intertwined within subjectivity, rather than by obscuring this fact by projecting a self-present individual who is confronted by an alterity that is essentially inaccessible and beyond comprehension. Far from merely being a negative thing, the alterity of the other is too complicated to simply be posited as that which will forever elude us, and such a description ignores the important ways in which self and other are partially intertwined.
In The Visible and the Invisible then, there is a tacit claim regarding what a responsible treatment of the alterity of the other consists in, even if Merleau-Ponty rarely considers notions like responsibility in any explicit fashion. His final ontology wants to insist that alterity is something that can only be appreciated in being encountered, and in a recognition of the fact that there can be no absolute alterity. If absolute alterity is but a synonym of death, and inconceivable to humanity, then what needs to be considered, according to Merleau-Ponty, is the paradoxical way in which self and other are intertwined, and yet also, and at the same time, divergent.
Indeed, Merleau-Ponty is also careful not to fall prey to what has been termed, sometimes disparagingly, the horizonality of phenomenology. He devotes an entire chapter titled “Interrogation and Intuition” to distancing himself from this tendency of phenomenology – which he traces to Hegel, Husserl and Bergson – to subsume all else under the concept of context and background. Engendering a coincidence between self and world (or self and other), is just as antithetical to his philosophical purposes as advocating a vast abyssal difference, and Merleau-Ponty asserts that when we are overly sure of the other, just as when we are overly unsure of the other, an inadequate apprehension of human relations beckons. For Merleau-Ponty, alterity is that which cannot be reduced to the logic of an either/or, as he doesn’t want to espouse a Sartrean version of human relations where the other can never really be understood, and yet nor does his philosophy reductively ignore this alterity. He suggests that: “this infinite distance, this absolute proximity express in two ways – as a soaring over or as fusion – the same relationship with the thing itself. They are two positivisms…” (VI 127), indeed, neither of which he wants to associate with his new ontology.
In an attempt to avoid this dualistic tendency to conceive of the other as either beyond the comprehension of a subject, or as domesticated by the subject and their horizons of significance, The Visible and the Invisible emphasizes that the other is always already encroaching upon us, though they are not reducible to us, and for Merleau-Ponty, the risk of this overlapping with the other can and should always be there (VI 123). His philosophy consistently alludes to the manner in which this encroachment is not simply a bad thing. For Merleau-Ponty, interacting with and influencing the other (even contributing to permanently changing them), does not necessarily constitute a denial of their alterity. On the contrary, if done properly it in fact attests to it, because we are open to the possibility of being influenced and changed by the difference that they bring to bear upon our interaction with them. This is the ethics that his ontology of the flesh tacitly presupposes, and it is a position that is importantly different from those proposed by more recent philosophers, including Sartre, Levinas and Derrida respectively.
Before themes like the death of philosophy, and the non-space of philosophy began to dominate the philosophical landscape, Merleau-Ponty had already begun to articulate a similar problem, though arguably without sharing quite the same nihilistic consequences that some more recent proponents of a similar position have found themselves implicated in. Harboring a deep distrust of the philosophy of reflection, Merleau-Ponty sought to ensure that reflection was not unduly exalted in the Phenomenology of Perception, and The Visible and the Invisible reaffirms this contention, albeit in slightly different terms, through his espoused methodology of “hyper-reflection,” which is also synonymously referred to as a “hyper-dialectic.” There are several aspects of this notion that require delineation, but the most obvious of these pertains to the role of philosophy, and precisely what he thinks it can accomplish.
At one stage in The Visible and the Invisible, Merleau-Ponty rather controversially claims that in the philosopher’s descriptions of the sensible world, “there is no longer identity between the lived experience and the principle of non-contradiction” (VI 87). Merleau-Ponty’s apparent disavowal of the law of non-contradiction requires further consideration, as it challenges one of the most fundamental principles of Western philosophy since Aristotle. In explaining his rejection of this principle, he suggests that:
“The situation of the philosopher who speaks as distinct from what he speaks of, insofar as that situation affects what he says with a certain latent content which is not its manifest content… implies a divergence between the essences he fixes and the lived experience to which they are applied, between the operation of living the world and the entities and negentities in which he expresses it” (VI 87).
For Merleau-Ponty then, lived experience may partake in contradiction on account of a residue of this difference between the act of speaking and what is spoken of, as well as a correlative divergence between a latent content and a manifest content. This divergence that he theorizes hints at a predicament that seems closely related to what Jacques Derrida has more recently insisted upon in his strategy of deconstruction, in that both philosophers point towards the inevitability of a philosophical expression containing contrary elements within it. While Derrida has also implicitly entertained the possibility that the law of non-contradiction might be false, in suggesting that their may instead be a law of impurity or “a principle of contamination”, it is important to ascertain that their are some surprising similarities between Merleau-Ponty and Derrida’s descriptions of the necessarily double nature of a philosophy that can never recapture the pre-reflective faith, or coincide with itself in a moment of self-presence. This strange proximity between deconstruction and Merleau-Ponty’s own methodology cannot be explored in any detail in this essay, but Jean-Francois Lyotard and Rodolphe Gasche are two important ‘continental’ thinkers to have recognized the manner in which Merleau-Ponty’s notion of a hyper-reflection pre-empted aspects of deconstruction.
Of course, unlike Derrida, Merleau-Ponty’s critique of reflection, and his subsequent call for a hyper-reflection, quite obviously locates itself primarily in an analysis of the body where he discerns a necessary and constitutive divergence within the embodied situation. As we have seen, this ecart is variously described as the difference between the sentient and the sensible, the tangible and the touched, and for Merleau-Ponty, it also applies to several other divergences, including one between the perceptual faith and its articulation (VI 87). Once again, this concept is most easily demonstrated through an example that we have previously contemplated – that is, an individual’s left hand touching their right hand, while their right hand is also simultaneously touching another object. Of this situation, Merleau-Ponty suggests that:
“If my left hand is touching my right hand, and if I wish to suddenly apprehend with my right hand the work of my left hand as it touches, this reflection of the body upon itself always miscarries at the last moment: the moment I feel my left hand with my right hand, I correspondingly cease touching my right hand with my left hand” (VI 9, cf to PP 108).
According to Merleau-Ponty, there is hence a fundamental divergence within the body, but just as this gap ensures the impossibility of any thorough and all-encompassing self-perception, it is also that which allows perception, and indeed subjectivity, to be possible at all. It is important to ascertain that if our embodied divergence inaugurates our capacity for perception (as well as language and reflection), this same divergence also ensures that there are certain limits upon this capacity. Just as we cannot reflexively attain to a self-identity with the hand that we are touching, for Merleau-Ponty the philosophy of reflection cannot entirely overcome similar divergences (VI 38).
In his critique of Hegel, Sartre and others, Merleau-Ponty insists that “reflection recuperates everything except itself as an effort of recuperation, it clarifies everything except its own role” (VI 33). There is a temporal divergence that precludes the attempted recovery of meaning via reflection from coinciding with that which it attempts to demarcate. The task of hyper-reflection then, is to ensure that reflection is always aware of its own finitude. It is hence somewhat removed from philosophical reflection itself, and resides in what several theorists have referred to as the non-space of philosophy. The proximity of such sentiments to Derrida has been widely recognized (and also occasionally contested), but what is irrefutable is that Merleau-Ponty is concerned with the tendency of the metaphysical tradition to exalt self-presence, as well as the rationalism that this usually entails. While traditional reflective thought is inevitable and indeed indispensable, the idea of philosophy being able to mirror or transcend nature is disparaged (VI 99). Philosophy and other reflective pursuits cannot recuperate the pre-reflective faith or rediscover some pure immediacy (VI 35, 99). On the contrary, he claims that:
“What we propose here, and oppose to the search for the essence, is not the return to the immediate, the coincidence, the effective fusion with the existent, the search for an original integrity, for a secret lost and to be rediscovered, which would nullify our questions and even reprehend language. If coincidence is lost, this is no accident; if Being is hidden, this is itself a characteristic of Being and no disclosure will make us comprehend it” (VI 121-2).
Of course, this is a rather negative characterization of what hyper-reflection involves, and it is worth digressing to consider more precisely what it is that Merleau-Ponty wants his philosophy to achieve. According to him:
“What we call hyper-dialectic is a thought that, on the contrary, is capable of reaching truth because it envisages without restriction the plurality of the relationships and what has been called ambiguity. The bad dialectic is that which thinks it recomposes being by a thetic thought, by an assemblage of statements, by thesis, antithesis, and synthesis; the good dialectic is that which is conscious of the fact that every thesis is an idealization, that Being is not made up of idealizations or of things said… but of bound wholes where signification never is except in tendency” (VI 94).
While this passage reaffirms the enduring role of ambiguity in his philosophy, Merleau-Ponty’s hyper-dialectic is also described as acknowledging that not only is every thesis an idealisation, but that Being cannot be ascertained through such idealisations. He also goes on to suggest that such a dialectical thought:
“Abounds in the sensible world, but on condition that the sensible world has been divested of all that the ontologies have added to it. One of the tasks of the dialectic, as a situational thought, a thought in contact with being, is to shake off the false evidences, to denounce the significations cut off from the experience of being, emptied – and to criticize itself in the measure that it itself becomes one of them” (VI 92).
Merleau-Ponty’s hyper-dialectic is envisaged as being a situational thought that must criticize all thinking that ignores the conditional nature of idealizations, and it must also maintain a vigilance to ensure that it does not itself become one of them. This is why Merleau-Ponty describes his project as propounding an ‘indirect’ ontology, rather than a direct ontology (VI 179). Undoubtedly these themes are deserving of more prolonged attention, but there seems to be a significant and underestimated connection between what Merleau-Ponty’s hyper-reflection seeks to achieve, and what Derrida’s deconstructive methodology has more recently attempted. Without digressing unduly in this regard, his work retains a relevance to contemporary European philosophy, and not least because many theorists are convinced that he is a valuable resource who doesn’t quite succumb to the excesses of his successors on the French scene.
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