Moral Epistemology

Can we ever know that it’s wrong to torture innocent children? More generally, can we ever know, or at least have some justification for believing, whether anything is morally right or wrong, just or unjust, virtuous or vicious, noble or base, good or bad? Most of us make moral judgments every day; so most of us would like to think so. But how is such knowledge, or justification, possible? We do not seem to simply perceive moral truth, as we perceive the truth that there is a computer screen before us. We do not seem to simply understand it, as we understand that all roosters are male. And we do not seem to simply feel it, as we feel a bit hungry right now. Moral epistemology explores this problem about knowledge and justification.

First, this article explores the traditional approaches to the problem: foundationalist theories, coherentist theories, and contextualist theories. Then the article explores the non-traditional approaches: reliabilist theories, noncognitivist theories, ideal decision theories, and politicized theories. The article concludes with an introduction to naturalizing moral epistemology and to some relevant issues in metaethics.

Table of Contents

  1. Classifying Theories of Moral Epistemology
  2. Traditional Approaches
    1. Foundationalist Theories
    2. Coherentist Theories
    3. Contextualist Theories
    4. Traditional Skepticism
  3. Non-Traditional Approaches
    1. Reliabilist Theories
    2. Noncognitivist Theories
    3. Ideal Decision Theories
    4. Politicized Theories
  4. Can Moral Epistemology Be Naturalized?
  5. Moral Epistemology & Metaethics
  6. References and Further Reading

1. Classifying Theories of Moral Epistemology

Below we introduce moral epistemology in terms of eight theories of moral epistemology. We divide these in half by distinguishing traditional from non-traditional approaches. By “traditional” we intend something more precise than just “old school.” So we launch our discussion of traditional approaches by defining our sense of “traditional.”

We conclude with two more detailed discussions. First, we introduce a moral epistemic debate of considerable recent importance, the debate about whether moral epistemology can be naturalized (roughly, moved in the direction of becoming scientific). Second, we discuss moral epistemology’s broader context as a subfield of metaethics (roughly, the part of ethical theory that examines the deepest assumptions behind our moral thought); we use this final discussion to introduce the problem of what the objects of moral knowledge could be.

2. Traditional Approaches

Foundationalist theories, coherentist theories, and contextualist theories represent the traditional approaches to moral epistemology. Reliabilist theories, noncognitivist theories, ideal decision theories, and politicized theories represent non-traditional approaches. By an approach to moral epistemology, we mean either (a) an attempt to explain how we can have moral knowledge, or at least justified moral beliefs, or (b) an attempt to argue that we cannot have one or both of these. The former are more or less non-skeptical, and the latter are more or less skeptical, approaches. This allows non-skeptical and skeptical approaches to compromise at the point of saying that we can have some justification for believing, but not knowledge of, some moral truths.

Approaches to moral epistemology are traditional only if they are committed to all of the following five (two moral and three epistemic) assumptions:


  1. [Moral] Cognitivism: we have moral beliefs, and thus moral belief contents that are either true or false (but not both true and false).
  2. [Moral] Realism: there are moral facts that can correspond to what moral claims represent as being the case, such as facts about the goodness or badness of people or the rightness or wrongness of their actions.
  3. [Epistemic] The Necessity of Justified True Belief: If someone knows something, then at the very least one is justified in believing it; and it is true; and one believes it. If one is justified in believing it, then one has a decisively good reason to believe it, a reason that makes one epistemically responsible in believing it.
  4. [Epistemic] Internalism: In order to be justified in believing something and therefore in order to know it, one must have in mind the factors that reasonably ground one’s right to believe it. The strongest internalist theories demand that these factors be immediately in mind, whereas the milder internalist theories demand only that they be available upon reflection. This seems to imply that one must possess (without any need for further experience or research) the grounds of good answers to all kinds of skeptics in order to be justified in believing something. However, it perhaps does not imply that one can recognize all of those reasons as such or that one can effectively articulate them.
  5. [Epistemic] The Priority of Epistemic Structure: Theories of justification must also be theories of the structure of justification in response to the regress problem, which is discussed in the section on Traditional Skepticism.

a. Foundationalist Theories

According to foundationalism, all justified beliefs are either foundational or derived. Foundational beliefs or basic beliefs possess noninferential justification; derived beliefs do not. A foundational belief does not owe its justification to logical inference from other justified beliefs. A derived belief gets its justification through inference, either directly or indirectly, from foundational beliefs.

Where can we get noninferential justification for our foundational beliefs? This is one of the most difficult questions for any foundationalist theory. The two most common answers are experience (for instance, sense perception or introspection) and reason (for instance, grasp of the self-evident through understanding). Most foundationalist moral epistemic theories go for one or the other, or some blend, of these two very general answers. The two following sorts of theories are usually conceived in foundationalist terms.

Moral Sense Theories assert the existence of a uniquely moral sense by which we perceive rightness or wrongness. According to early Scottish versions of this theory, such as those of Frances Hutcheson ([1725]) and David Hume ([1740]), the perception in question is reflexive, grounded in a kind of sentiment or feeling, which is secondary to, and attendant upon, perceiving actions or states of affairs with our ordinary senses. Sometimes moral sense theories are described as intuitionist theories; more often “intuitionism” is used only for the following.

Moral Epistemic Intuitionist theories imply that we can non-perceptually recognize some moral truths in a way that can noninferentially justify us in believing them. According to W. D. Ross, who defended perhaps the most influential classical version of the theory, some moral propositions are self-evident, so that merely understanding them produces, at least in the best people, justification for believing them. His main examples are mid-level moral generalizations such as, ‘I have a prima facie duty (an unless-overridden-by-a-stronger-duty, duty) to keep my promises’. Ross’s intuitionism is rationalist: it grounds foundational justification for moral beliefs in a rational grasp of the self-evident ([1930]; 1936). Some intuitionist theories are less obviously rationalist. For instance, A. C. Ewing thought that we have a unique ability to detect “fittingness” in responses to circumstances, which is neither as straightforwardly rationalist as Rossian intuition nor as similar to sense perception as a moral sense theory would require (1949). Most historical moral and epistemic theories imply some form of intuitionism, and even the most radical departures from tradition. For instance, some naturalized moral epistemologies claim strong analogies with intuitionism. Some writers who have recently defended versions of moral epistemic intuitionism are Robert Audi (1997, 2004), Jonathan Dancy (1993), Brad Hooker (2000), and David McNaughton (2000).

b. Coherentist Theories

According to coherentism, all justified beliefs are inferentially justified; there are no foundational beliefs. Instead, what justifies us in holding beliefs are their relations of mutual support, that is, their coherence. Justification therefore accrues to beliefs only in virtue of their membership in coherent sets, and so cannot be assessed when beliefs are evaluated singly. Coherence itself is usually taken to be, at a minimum, logical consistency. Many coherentists argue that it requires not only logical consistency, but also explanatory potency or predictive value, similar to what good scientific theories exhibit.

The most important conception of coherence in recent moral epistemology is called reflective equilibrium. John Rawls is largely responsible for the contemporary importance of this conception. He proposed it in the context of arguing for his even more famous contractarian theory of justice; but as a moral epistemic idea, we can consider it apart from that context. According to Rawls, one achieves reflective equilibrium (narrowly conceived) when, and only when, one has brought all of her judgments about the rightness or wrongness of particular actions into ultimate harmony with all of one’s judgments about what it is generally or universally right or wrong to do. Reflective equilibrium is a moral epistemic ideal: Rawls does not suggest that anyone has achieved or will achieve it. Nevertheless, he thinks that one is more or less justified in holding the moral beliefs one does happen to hold according to, and in virtue of, the extent to which she approaches reflective equilibrium (1971: 48-51). Reflective equilibrium is a kind of epistemic balance across levels of generality, achieved by facing and resolving conflicts between particular and general moral beliefs by means that are supposed to sort themselves out in the long run.

Some coherentist moral epistemologists, such as Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, argue that a broader conception of reflective equilibrium, which includes balance among not only our moral beliefs but also our non-moral beliefs. For instance, Sayre-McCord thinks the broader conception is better because requiring consistency between our moral and our non-moral beliefs is likely to rule out perverse but coherent sets of moral beliefs (1996: 166-70).

c. Contextualist Theories

Among close family I take for granted certain moral beliefs that I would be hard-pressed to defend at a meeting of my philosophical colleagues. Concerning the maintenance of my car, I take for granted many things that I would not take for granted if it were a passenger jet. Epistemic contextualism seems to vindicate such practices. It is the view that justified beliefs can owe their justifications to beliefs that are (even if not justified) not in need of justification under the circumstances. Beliefs not in need of justification under the circumstances are contextually basic. Which beliefs are contextually basic in a given context depends on the sorts of considerations raised in our examples above: Who am I talking to?, How serious is it if I am wrong?, and so forth

Mark Timmons is a recent moral epistemic contextualist. He argues for a context-dependent conception of epistemic responsibility that he thinks supports (epistemic) contextualism especially well in the case of moral beliefs. In actual practice, what constitutes epistemic responsibility—for example, checking such and such counterpossibilities before believing—varies according to context. In the moral case, people are especially prone to take for granted, and thus take to be epistemically responsible, certain mid-level moral generalizations (of the sort W. D. Ross thought are intuitive) that pass current in their contexts. These thus tend to serve as contextually basic in moral belief (Timmons, 1996). Of course, how much real epistemic justification one can get by extrapolating from his epistemically responsible (even if not justified) beliefs can vary according to the truth of those beliefs. For instance, Nazis extrapolating from their peculiar, shared, anti-Semitic beliefs can get very little epistemic justification. After all, one can take the conception of epistemic justification that is accepted in one’s context to be epistemically significant when it is not, just as one can (in the arguably more idealized, less realistic, foundationalist and coherentist cases) take one’s beliefs to be foundational or coherent when they are not.

d. Traditional Skepticism

Each broad theory-type above is, among other things, an attempt to solve a particular skeptical problem: the regress problem of justification. The problem can be presented in the form of an argument for a general, and not specifically moral, epistemic skepticism:

  1. If all justified beliefs owe their justifications via inference to other justified beliefs, then each justified belief owes its justification to other justified beliefs which owe their justifications to still further justified beliefs, and so on. Such chains of epistemic dependence must either
    1. never end, and thus form infinite regresses of justified beliefs, or
    2. end only when the chains form closed circles.
  2. All justified beliefs owe their justifications (via inference) to other justified beliefs.
  3. So all justified beliefs owe their justifications to chains of epistemic dependence of type (a) or type (b).
  4. But, if (3), then human beings can have no justified beliefs because
    1. human beings have finite minds and are thus incapable of possessing chains of epistemic dependence of type (a);
    2. chains of epistemic dependence of type (b) add up to, at best, circular arguments; circular arguments are never good reasons to believe; so allegedly justified beliefs that fall into type (b) dependence are not really justified.
  5. Hence, human beings can have no justified beliefs.

The apparent seriousness of this problem, combined with epistemic internalism’s demand that we face it head on, leads to the “priority of epistemic structure” assumption that is essential to traditional approaches. Foundationalism and contextualism try to defeat the regress argument by offering alternatives to premise (2). Coherentism tries to defeat it by offering holistic alternatives to the linear conception of epistemic dependence at work in premises (1) and (4).

To accept the soundness of the regress argument is to become a general, extreme kind of epistemic skeptic: it is to accept that we can have no justified beliefs and, thus, no knowledge. Such general, extreme epistemic skepticism is rare. Moral epistemic skepticism, on the other hand, is relatively common. It takes either weak or strong forms. According to weak (moral epistemic) skeptical theories, we can have justification for moral beliefs but we cannot have moral knowledge: the kinds or degrees of justification involved are too weak for knowledge. According to strong skeptical theories, we cannot even have justified moral beliefs.

At least one recent, strong moral epistemic skeptic is traditional (in our sense). Walter Sinnott-Armstrong thinks that the regress argument is sound, so long as by “beliefs” we mean “moral beliefs.” Perhaps, for instance, foundationalism is a good response to the regress problem in the case of our empirical—such as our perceptual—beliefs. In any case, he does not think that foundationalism works for moral beliefs. There are no good grounds, he argues, for accepting that we have a faculty that justifies foundational moral beliefs. Every attempt to argue that we do is essentially a form of dogmatism. It is an attempt to strongly insist on our most cherished moral beliefs in order to avoid having to defend them. Coherentism and contextualism fare even worse on Sinnott-Armstrong’s appraisal. They are not even viable as general epistemologies. No matter how coherent a set of beliefs is, there are any number of equally coherent sets that are inconsistent with it. So coherentism fails to explain how beliefs, in general, can be justified. Contextualists confuse mere persuasion with argument: for example, my ability to get you to agree to certain assumptions, and thus make them contextually basic, simply has no bearing on whether they are likely to be true, and, so, on whether we are justified in believing them (Sinnott-Armstrong,1996).

3. Non-Traditional Approaches

For various reasons, many philosophers reject one or more of the essential assumptions of traditional moral epistemology. Below we briefly introduce four sample kinds of non-traditional approaches. Unlike foundationalism, coherentism, and contextualism, these theories are all potentially compatible. There could be a reliabilist, noncognitivist, ideal-decision-based, politicized theory. Some of these are even, in the end, compatible with traditional theories (or close analogues of traditional theories). They all, however, reject one or more of the traditional assumptions as starting points.

a. Reliabilist Theories

I am probably average in my ability to correctly recognize dollar bills. Yet I am also, sadly, average in my lack of understanding of the complex physical, economic, sociological, and political conditions that make dollar bills be dollar bills. Somehow I nevertheless reliably recognize and daily form practically successful beliefs about dollar bills. If I am ever justified in believing that ‘here is a dollar bill’, I do not have in mind, and am not even capable of calling to mind without further research, all of the factors that make my belief true or that would justify it. Thus I cannot be justified, if traditional epistemic internalism is right, in believing that ‘here is a dollar bill’, despite my dollar-bill-reliability. David Copp (2000), the reliabilist moral epistemologist whose example this is, wants us to see that the traditional internalist outcome seems preposterous.

Of course I am justified in believing in many cases that ‘here is a dollar bill.’ So traditional epistemic internalism must be false. It is false because, Copp thinks, it is the reliability, or lack of reliability, of the processes by which we form beliefs that justifies, or fails to justify, our beliefs; not, as epistemic internalists insist, our deep skeptic-proof insight into their truth conditions. Whether we perceive, understand, or can even recognize, how such processes are reliable in us, as epistemic internalism demands, is beside the point.

Copp proposes and defends an anti-internalist, that is, externalist, moral epistemology. He argues that we (or at least the best of us) have a reliable moral sensitivity, much as we have a reliable dollar bill sensitivity. Our relevant moral sensitivity is made up of a certain combination of (i) a heightened tendency to notice morally relevant features of a situation, such as the pain produced by burning a cat alive and the much less morally significant enjoyment that doing this might bring to a gang of thugs; (ii) a reliable tendency to draw correct moral conclusions from these features, such as the conclusion that burning the cat, under the circumstances, is morally reprehensible; and (iii) a reliable tendency to be motivated in a morally appropriate way, such as being motivated to do something, if feasible, to prevent the thugs from burning the cat alive (2000; 55-58). We can, as ethical theorists do, legitimately struggle towards the exactly right combination of (i) – (iii). However we need not understand how they are connected with truth—a highly complicated matter of societal norms that appropriately arise from societies’ struggles to meet their “needs,” according to Copp—in order for our combinations of (i) – (iii) to justify our moral beliefs (1995). We need only have combinations that reliably produce true beliefs in us, in order for our (thus produced) moral beliefs to be justified.

b. Noncognitivist Theories

In his provocative attack on traditional, speculative philosophy, Language, Truth, and Logic, A. J. Ayer wrote ([1936]: 107):

…if I say to someone, “You acted wrongly in stealing that money,” I am not stating anything more than if I had simply said, “You stole that money.” In adding that this action is wrong I am not making any further statement about it. I am simply evincing my moral disapproval of it.

According to Ayer, moral language merely expresses emotion just as “a peculiar tone of horror” or “special exclamation marks” express feelings. It does not make claims: it has no content of a sort that can be true or false. Hence [moral] cognitivism—an essential ingredient of traditional moral epistemology—is false. So, the whole enterprise of moral epistemology, that is, the study of moral knowledge, is doomed from the start: there cannot be moral beliefs or truths, and because there cannot be justified true moral beliefs, there cannot be moral knowledge.

Ayer, however, does not mean to entirely relegate the concerns of moral epistemology to the dustbin. He only means to demote them. We can accept noncognitivism and still argue that some moral feelings are more reasonable or appropriate to given kinds of circumstances than others. We can have more or less justification (although not epistemic justification) for having, or tending to have, certain moral attitudes. We can thus have better and worse moral theories.

While we might think that noncognitivism degrades ethics too much by disconnecting it from the promise of truth, we might appreciate that it allows us to non-skeptically avoid a host of messy ethical and epistemic problems associated with moral realism. According to moral realism, moral claims represent the world as being thus and so; they are true when the world really is thus and so and false when it is not. It is hard to say for moral claims, however, what “thus and so” is supposed to be. Also, the very idea that moral “claims” represent the world as being a certain way is a suspect idea. It suggests that moral talk aims, like perceptual talk, at describing. But moral talk does not seem to aim at describing; it seems to aim at prescribing. Arguably, noncognitivism can make better sense of this than realism. Noncognitivism conceives moral talk as projecting moral emotion (Ayer, [1936]) or prescription (Hare, 1989) onto a perhaps otherwise indifferent world, rather than as representing the moral features of a world which contains no moral features.

Two especially influential recent noncognitivist theories are Simon Blackburn’s “quasi-realism” and Allan Gibbard’s “norm expressivism.” Blackburn’s quasi-realism combines an account of moral value as projected value with a sophisticated attempt to vindicate the rationality of certain indispensable (to moral discourse) practices that treat moral talk as if it were cognitive (1996; 1998). Gibbard’s norm-expressivism claims that moral judgment is a species of rationality judgment constituted by expressive, as opposed to cognitive, acceptance of norms or rules that determine in the moral case whether actions are forbidden, permitted, or required (1990).

c. Ideal Decision Theories

Ideal decision theories ascribe special philosophical importance to the moral decisions of idealized persons who decide under idealized circumstances. Only some ideal decision theories are moral epistemic theories (others are non-epistemic, for example, ethical or metaethical theories), and only some of those offer whole approaches to moral epistemology. Contractarianism and the sort of approach that Richard Brandt proposes are two ideal decision theories that are sometimes conceived as whole approaches to moral epistemology.

Contractarian theories seek to ratify moral claims by appeal to the agreement of fully rational, non-biased, well-informed people in real or, more often, imagined circumstances. For instance, John Rawls famously argued that principles of justice are morally binding on members of a society if and only if they would be unanimously agreed to by rational, relevantly-well-informed people in what he calls the “original position.” The original position is an imaginary situation walled off by a “veil of ignorance,” which prevents knowledge of the particular, personal features that engender biases, such as our sexes, ages, races, special tastes, talents, handicaps, or developed moral, political, or religious outlooks. Rawls, however, was a traditional coherentist when it came to moral epistemology. He did not view his contractarian decision procedure as either an ethical theory or a moral epistemology, but rather as a way of generating authoritative principles of justice that would dovetail with the best ethical theory and the best moral epistemology (1971).

Nevertheless, others have proposed and defended contractarian theories as ethical theories and/or moral epistemologies. For instance, a contractarian ethical theory might hold that actions are morally permissible if and only if they would not be rejected in something like Rawls’s original position. Some contractarian moral epistemologists think that discerning that a moral claim would be endorsed in something like the original position can justify someone in believing it (Gauthier, 1986; Morris, 1996). Although Rawls did not hold this view, he did see his method as a kind of access to deep facts about rationality itself, facts of the sort that his more traditional moral epistemology finds ultimately decisive.

Richard Brandt suggests a different, but related, ideal decision theory. A way to demonstrate the validity of a moral system is

…to show persons that if they were factually fully informed they would want a certain sort of moral system for the whole society in which they expect to live. (1996: 207-08)

This by no means makes moral knowledge easy to come by. But it does put it on the same sort of footing as our other knowledge, since all of our other knowledge is presumably about what the facts are, and to make a claim about what the facts are is to imply something about what it is like to be fully factually informed.

d. Politicized Theories

Most recent politicized theories are feminist theories. The very idea of feminist epistemology strikes many as a mistake. What could be more impartial, and less open to political interpretation, than standards of knowledge or justified belief? We may as well talk about feminist radio repair. However, feminist epistemologists often see the very mistake they want to address in such a response. This impartiality, or pretense of impartiality, in traditional epistemology blinds it to relevant information or standpoints of oppressed classes, such as women; or at least to the narrowness and biases that it is likely to have since its assumptions, methods, and so on were conceived and developed by socially privileged white men.

Anatole France ([1894]) famously wrote: “The law, in its majestic equality, forbids the rich, as well as the poor, to sleep under bridges, to beg in the streets, and to steal bread.” His irony is Marxist: Marx thought that the impartiality of laws can blind us to the very partialities they are designed to promote. Similarly, many feminist epistemologists argue that the alleged impartiality of traditional theories of justification or knowledge can blind us to the views of the world, and perhaps in particular the moral views of the world, they are designed to promote. Foundationalism, for instance, which looks on the surface like a logically motivated response to the regress problem of justification, has been considered to be just a method for vindicating the basic tenets of the foundationalist’s world view, whatever those happen to be.

What is it that white-male-dominated, traditional moral epistemology has missed? Let’s consider three kinds of feminist answers. (1) Susan Harding (1986) argues that the epistemic standpoints, that is, perspectives from which we collect evidence, of oppressed classes are epistemically better, that is, more likely to produce true beliefs, than the epistemic standpoints of oppressor classes, especially concerning the oppressor classes’ biases. For instance, an antebellum plantation owner would miss much that would be readily apparent to his lowliest slaves. For many topics, including moral ones, he is likely to live on some sort of epistemic Cloud Nine . (2) Traditional epistemology builds its misleading impartiality on taking knowledge to be an individual, rather than a community, activity. In fact, as the relative success of science illustrates, real knowing is a community activity: its body of knowledge improves only by surviving attempts by communities to refute it. By wrongly conceiving knowledge as an individual activity, traditional epistemology merely codifies the individual biases, including sexisms, of its conceivers. (3) Traditional epistemology is non-naturalized. So, it conceives actual knowledge-ascription or justification-ascription practices as mere subjects of epistemic evaluation, never as raw material upon which to base epistemic principles. Once we reverse this trend, and go in for naturalized epistemologies (see below), we can regard the actual social and linguistic circumstances of knowledge ascriptions as starting points. Once we do that, we can have, at best, only half of a good moral epistemic theory if we ignore the special moral epistemic practices, concerns, and paradigms provided by women (as traditional moral epistemology arguably has). Feminist moral epistemologists, such as Margaret Urban Walker (1996) and Lorraine Code (2000), have been leaders in the effort to naturalize moral epistemology.

4. Can Moral Epistemology Be Naturalized?

To naturalize a philosophical subject is to somehow bring it under the purview of natural science. What this means is controversial; but it is usually thought to involve both substantial and methodological projects. Substantially, it involves attempting to confine theories to existence claims that science countenances, or could eventually countenance. Methodologically, it involves attempting to limit philosophical inquiry to methods whose validity science can, or could eventually, vindicate.

There is nothing new about attempts to affect substantial naturalization in ethics. Over two centuries ago, Jeremy Bentham ([1781]) tried to conceive moral claims as substantially about quantities of pleasure and pain, and thus as about something that might be scientifically modeled and studied. Efforts to naturalize episstemology are a more recent phenomenon, with a more methodological focus. The naturalized epistemology movement was launched by W. V. Quine (1969), who rejected the traditional epistemological project of trying to discover, through conceptual analysis, skeptic-proof, a priori conditions for knowledge or justification. He proposed, instead, that epistemology be reconceived as a branch of empirical psychology. Many of his followers propose less radical reforms. What they have in common is that they reject a fully traditional approach in favor of “…an anti-skeptical, or at least non-skeptical, empirically informed investigation of the grounds of knowledge” (Copp, 2000: 39).

The effort to naturalize moral epistemology is even more recent. Most attempts take one or more of three forms: reliabilism, feminism, and scientism (or so we will call it). Below, we say a bit about each of these and introduce two objections that naturalized moral epistemologists strive to overcome.

Some epistemic reliabilists try to naturalize epistemology, in general, by identifying epistemic justification with observable and measurable consequences: such as facts about the reliability of the various processes by which we arrive at beliefs (for example, Goldman, 1994). Their rejection of traditional epistemic internalism makes room for an anti-skeptical stance by allowing justification and even knowledge in the absence of answers to traditional skeptical problems like the regress problem. David Copp (2000), whose moral epistemic reliabilism we sketched above, conceives his reliabilism as a naturalized moral epistemology, and defends it against several objections, including those we mention below.

Feminists stand to gain from naturalized moral epistemology room to urge the relevance of their various empirical critiques of the impartiality of traditional ethics and epistemology. The traditional pretense of impartiality in epistemology was largely upheld by the traditional conception of epistemology as only susceptible to a priori investigation. Naturalized moral epistemology opens the door to, and can even privilege, the sorts of psychological and sociological facts that feminist moral epistemologists seek to call attention to.

Theories that promote scientism propose and evaluate moral epistemic theories on the basis of current scientific theory, such as current sociology, psychology, artificial intelligence, and neuroscience. For instance, Paul Churchland (2000) tries to reconceive moral epistemology so that moral knowledge has much less to do with the truth of general moral and epistemic principles than with a kind of skill by which we build and more or less ably negotiate complex brain-to-social-space relations.

One of the largest sources of objections to naturalized ethics or epistemology concerns the essential normativity (value-ladenness, prescriptivity) of both ethics and epistemology. Ethics is essentially normative because it is about what we should do, not what we do. Epistemology is essentially normative because it is about what our epistemic standards should be, not what they are. Science, on the other hand, is purely descriptive. Its subject matter—how the natural world in fact is—is not normative. How then can ethics or epistemology be brought within the purview of natural science? If we try to assimilate the naturalization of both ethics and epistemology into a naturalized moral epistemology, then the problem gets even worse: neither ethics nor epistemology can derive their essential normativity from the other.

Arguably, moral and epistemic principles must be general, in the sense that they cover indefinitely many particular instances of rightness, goodness, knowledge, and so on. Science can produce generalities, such as natural laws, on the basis of generalizing from particular observations. However, as Immanuel Kant ([1785]: 63) pointed out, in order to soundly generalize to moral [or epistemic] principles in the scientific way, one would have to already know which examples, which observations or theoretical entities, are morally relevant; and one can only know that on the basis of other general moral [or epistemic] principles. Thus, if we are limited to scientific generalization from examples, then we are trapped, unable to generate the general moral [or epistemic] principles we need in order to get started.

5. Moral Epistemology & Metaethics

Metaethics is the part of ethical theory which studies the deep, often non-moral assumptions behind our moral thought. Here are some important metaethical topics:

  1. moral epistemology;
  2. moral semantics, the study of how and what moral language means;
  3. moral ontology, the study of what sort(s) of reality underwrites the truth or reasonableness of moral claims or attitudes; and
  4. moral psychology, the study of the nature of, and relations among, moral mental states, such as morally-relevant beliefs, desires, intentions and motivations.

Such topics are difficult to pursue in a vacuum. Not only does each involve an intersection or overlap between ethical theory and some other enormous topic, their problems are often inextricably interdependent.

For instance, the problem of what the objects of moral knowledge could be is larger than moral epistemology; it is also a problem of moral ontology and moral semantics. We conclude with a brief look at this problem. We access it through the general outline of a dilemma posed by A. J. Ayer against moral cognitivism. We borrow from Michael Smith (1994) the idea of using Ayer’s dilemma as a window into recent metaethics. However, we do not closely follow Ayer in developing the details of the dilemma nor explore Smith’s more sophisticated treatment.

Ayer’s Dilemma (Ayer, [1936]: 103-06): Assume moral cognitivism. If any moral claims are true, some sort of reality—something we can think of them as representing—underwrites their truth. This reality must be either something natural or something non-natural. However, if it is something natural, then it must fall victim to G. E. Moore’s arguments against ethical naturalism. If it is something non-natural, then it must either also fall victim to Moore’s arguments against ethical naturalism or fall victim to a host of other insuperable problems. So no moral claims are true.

Obviously, Ayer’s Dilemma leans heavily on G. E. Moore’s arguments against ethical naturalism. We briefly describe two of these, consider how they also preclude some non-naturalist theories, and then give some examples of the alleged host of other insuperable problems that confront the ethical non-naturalist.

Like Moore, let’s simplify by calling “the Good” whatever it is that all true moral claims collectively represent as being the case. Ethical naturalism is the view that the Good is something natural. By “natural” Moore meant “…the subject matter of the natural sciences and…psychology,” or “…all that has existed or will exist in time” ([1903]: 92). Moore’s two most famous arguments against ethical naturalism are the naturalistic fallacy argument and the open question argument. According to the naturalistic fallacy argument, any attempt to identify the Good with something natural must commit a fallacy because goodness is a normative (value-laden, prescriptive) property and because nature is decidedly non-normative (value-neutral, descriptive). According to the open question argument, good definitions “close” certain questions for competent users of the term defined. For instance, competent users of the term, “triangle,” cannot wonder whether there are any round triangles. But no identification of the Good with something natural can have this feature: competent users of “good” will always be able to wonder whether the natural states of affairs in the definition are really good, and vice versa ([1903]).

Many philosophers think that Moore’s definition of “natural” is flawed. However, this matters little for our purpose since his arguments seem to work, if they work, against ethical naturalist theories of every stripe, and against many non-natural ones. They work, if they work, against any position that identifies the Good with something non-normative, even if it is something theological.

What remains, then, is to identify the Good with something non-natural and normative. This seems to imply that the Good must be sui generis, that is, utterly unique. This is the option which, according to Ayer’s Dilemma, must fall victim to “a host of other insuperable problems.” We will briefly mention three of these. First, if the Good is sui generis, then we cannot defend the possibility of moral knowledge, since we have no independent evidence of an epistemic faculty that apprehends something as being both morally significant and utterly unique. Second, if the Good is sui generis, then knowing what is good could not provide motivation for doing what is good. Third, if the Good is sui generis, then we are left without any possible explanation for why moral properties supervene on natural (or at least non-normative) properties; that is, why we cannot conceive any difference in correct moral assessment when we cannot point to any difference in the plain facts.

Responses to Ayer’s Dilemma: One way to respond to Ayer’s Dilemma is to accept it. This leaves two alternatives: keep cognitivism and become a skeptic or, as Ayer preferred, abandon cognitivism. J. L. Mackie (1977) kept cognitivism and became a skeptic. He argued that our realm of moral discourse, just like our realm of, say, Santa Claus discourse, is nothing more nor less than a large body of false claims. Ayer ([1936]), R. M. Hare (1989), Simon Blackburn (1996, 1998), and Allan Gibbard (1990) all chose, instead, to abandon cognitivism and to defend on a noncognitivist basis the possibility of something like moral knowledge,.

Another option is to keep cognitivism and reject either the anti-naturalistic or the anti-non-naturalistic horn of the dilemma. Let’s consider post-Ayer ethical naturalist theories, first.

Some ethical naturalists think that the Good is both natural and sui generis. For instance, “Cornell Realists,” such as Nicolaus Sturgeon (1989), David Brink (1989), and Geoffrey Sayre-McCord (1988) think that every particular instantiation of the Good can be identified with a natural state of affairs, such as an instance of moral rightness with some act of kindness under a natural description. However, they think that the Good, itself, cannot be identified with anything these natural instantiations all have in common. Instead, moral properties like goodness and rightness have irreducible, and thus sui generis, explanatory power of their own.

Others think that the Good is natural and not sui generis: it reduces to some natural property or properties. For instance, Peter Railton argues that it reduces to being what we would want for us, as we really are now, to want, if we had “unqualified cognitive and imaginative powers, and full factual and nomological information about…[our]…physical and psychological constitution.” (1986: 173-74). Other “Reductionist” naturalists include Gilbert Harmon (1975); Richard Brandt (1979); David Lewis (1986); and Frank Jackson, Philip Pettit and Michael Smith (2004). Reductionist naturalists typically respond to Moore’s anti-naturalistic arguments by arguing that their reductions—that is, their identifications of the Good with something natural—are a posteriori (experience-based) identifications, rather than a priori, and thus are immune to his criticisms.

Among ethical non-naturalists we must include Moore ([1903]). He accepted that the Good is sui generis, and he argued that we have an intuitive epistemic faculty that apprehends goodness and thus grounds our beliefs about what is good or right. Although his positive view is often rejected as a reduction to absurdity of ethical non-naturalism, it has had important recent defenders, for example, Panayot Butchvarov (1989).

Most recent defenders of ethical non-naturalism reject the sui generis view, or at least Moore’s version of it. Some argue that we can tell what constitutes the telos (roughly, proper function) of something that has one, provided that we know enough about it; and thus we can know what constitutes the Good for it. The facts about telos for some things—especially the most morally considerable things, like people—cannot all be identified with something natural, at least not in anything like Moore’s sense of “natural.” (Foot, 1978; MacIntyre, 1984)

Many non-naturalists reject that the Good exists, per se, in the world that science studies, and they argue instead that it arises as a necessary byproduct of any attempt to pursue purposive, or goal-driven, rational activities—such as perceiving or understanding or inferring or deliberating or intending or acting. The Good belongs, as John McDowell (1994) says, to the “space of reasons.” Such views are capable of broadly Aristotelian, Kantian, or existentialist development. In any case, they can require that the “space of reasons” be sensitive to facts (whether natural, and thus unique to the world that science models and studies, or non-natural) and logic. The Aristotelian turn conceives the space of reasons as a product of social relations, engendered by the necessary formation of interpersonal relationships and conveyed by societally-sanctioned forms of education (McDowell, 1994; MacIntyre, 1984). The Kantian turn conceives the “space of reasons” in more individualistic terms: the choices of individuals are morally evaluable according to whether the principles implicit (or explicit) in them pass some objective test, or tests, of rationality, such as being permitted by Kant’s Categorical Imperative (Korsgaard, 1996; Audi, 2004). Finally, the existentialist turn views facts and logic as radically underdetermining the rationality of choices, a short-coming that can only be made up for by adopting some thoroughly subjective criteria, usually some kind of authenticity, or trueness to oneself (Kierkegaard, [1843]; Sartre, 1992).

6. References and Further Reading

  • Audi, Robert, Moral Knowledge and Ethical Character, Oxford: Oxford University press, 1997.
  • Audi, The Good in the Right: A Theory of Intuition and Intrinsic Value, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2004.
  • Ayer, A.J., Language, Truth and Logic [1936], New York: Dover Publications, Inc., 1952.
  • Bentham, Jeremy, The Principles of Morals and Legislation, [1781] Amherst, NY: Prometheus Books, 1988.
  • Blackburn, Simon, “Securing the Nots: Moral Epistemology for the Quasi-Realist,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Blackburn, Simon, Ruling Passions, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1998.
  • BonJour, Laurence, The Structure of Empirical Justification, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1985.
  • Brandt, Richard, “Science as a Basis for Moral Theory,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Brink, David, Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
  • Campbell, Richard & Hunter, Bruce, “Introduction,” eds. Richmond Campbell and Bruce Hunter, Moral Epistemology Naturalized, Calgary, Alberta: University of Calgary Press, 2000.
  • Chisholm, Roderick, The Foundations of Knowing, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982.
  • Code, Lorraine, “Statements of Fact: Whose? Where? When?,” eds. Richmond Campbell and Bruce Hunter, Moral Epistemology Naturalized, Calgary, Alberta: University of Calgary Press, 2000.
  • Copp, David, Morality, Normativity, and Society, New York: Oxford University Press, 1995.
  • Copp, David, “Four Epistemological Challenges to Ethical Naturalism,” eds. Richmond Campbell and Bruce Hunter, Moral Epistemology Naturalized, Calgary, Alberta: University of Calgary Press, 2000.
  • Dancy, Jonathan, Moral Reasons, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 1993.
  • Dancy, Jonathan, “The Particularist’s Progress,” eds. Brad Hooker and Margaret Little, Moral Particularism, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000.
  • Ewing, A. C., The Definition of Good, New York: The Macmillan Company, 1949.
  • Foot, Philippa, Virtues and Vices, University of California Press, 1978.
  • Gauthier, David, Morals by Agreement, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1986.
  • Gewirth, Alan, Reason and Morality, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1978.
  • Gibbard, Allan, Wise Choices, Apt Feelings, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1990.
  • Goldman, Alvin, “What is Justified Belief?” ed. by Hilary Kornblith, Epistemology Naturalized, 2nd Ed., Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 1994.
  • Harding, Sandra, The Science Question in Feminism, Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1986.
  • Hare, R(ichard) M., Essays in Ethical Theory, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1989.
  • Hare, R(ichard) M., “Foundationalism and Coherentism in Ethics,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Harman, Gilbert, Morality, New York: Oxford University Press, 1977.
  • Hooker, Brad, Ideal Code, Real World, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2000.
  • Hume, David, A Treatise of Human Nature, [1740] 2nd Ed., ed. by L. A. Selby-Bigge, rev. by P. H. Nidditch, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1975.
  • Hutcheson, Frances, An Inquiry Into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Nature, [1725] New York: Garland Publishers, 1971.
  • Jackson, Frank, Pettit, Philip, and Smith, Michael; Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2004.
  • Kant, Immanuel, Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals [1785], tr. by Mary Gregor, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997.
  • Kierkegaard, Soren, Fear and Trembling / Repetition, tr. Howard V. Hong, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1983, pp. 54-67.
  • Korsgaard, Christine, The Sources of Normativity, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
  • Mackie, J. L., Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong, New York: Penguin, 1977.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair, After Virtue, 2nd Ed., Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1984.
  • McDowell, John, Mind and World, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1994.
  • McNaughton, David, “Intuitionism,” Blackwell Guide to Ethical Theory, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers, 2000, pp. 268-287.
  • Miller, Alexander, An Introduction to Metaethics, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2003.
  • Moore, G. E., Principia Ethica, [1903], rev. edn., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Morris, Christopher, “A Contractarian Account of Moral Justification,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Quine, W.V.O., “Epistemology Naturalized,” Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, New York: Columbia University Press, 1969.
  • Railton, Peter, “Moral Realism,” Philosophical Review 95, 1986.
  • Rawls, John, A Theory of Justice, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1971.
  • Ross, W. D., The Right And The Good [1930], Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 1988.
  • Ross, W. D., The Foundations of Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1936.
  • Sartre, Jean-Paul, Notebook For an Ethics, [posthumous publication] tr. David Pellauer, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992.
  • Sayre-McCord, Geoffrey, “Moral Theory and Explanatory Impotence,” Midwest Studies 12, 1988, pp. 433-57.
  • Sayre-McCord, Geoffrey, “Coherentist Epistemology and Moral Theory,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Scanlon, T. M., What We Owe to Each Other, Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press, 1998.
  • Sidgwick, Henry, The Methods of Ethics [1907], Indianapolis, IN: Hackett Publishing Company, 1981.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, Walter, “Moral Skepticism and Justification,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Smith, Michael, The Moral Problem, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers Ltd, 1994.
  • Sturgeon, Nicholas, “Moral Explanations,” Essays on Moral Realism, ed. by Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1989, 229-55.
  • Timmons, Mark, “Outline of a Contextualist Moral Epistemology,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.
  • Walker, Margaret Urban, “Feminist Skepticism, Authority, and Transparency,” eds., Walter Sinnott-Armstrong and Mark Timmons, Moral Knowledge?: New Readings in Moral Epistemology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996.

Author Information

Peter Tramel
United States Military Academy
U. S. A.