Moral Character

At the heart of one major approach to ethics—an approach counting among its proponents Plato, Aristotle, Augustine and Aquinas—is the conviction that ethics is fundamentally related to what kind of persons we are. Many of Plato’s dialogues, for example, focus on what kind of persons we ought to be and begin with examinations of particular virtues:

What is the nature of justice? (Republic)
What is the nature of piety? (Euthyphro)
What is the nature of temperance? (Charmides)
What is the nature of courage? (Laches)

On the assumption that what kind of person one is is constituted by one’s character, the link between moral character and virtue is clear. We can think of one’s moral character as primarily a function of whether she has or lacks various moral virtues and vices.

The virtues and vices that comprise one’s moral character are typically understood as dispositions to behave in certain ways in certain sorts of circumstances. For instance, an honest person is disposed to telling the truth when asked. These dispositions are typically understood as relatively stable and long-term. Further, they are also typically understood to be robust, that is, consistent across a wide-spectrum of conditions. We are unlikely, for example, to think that an individual who tells the truth to her friends but consistently lies to her parents and teachers possesses the virtue of honesty.

Moral character, like most issues in moral psychology, stands at the intersection of issues in both normative ethics and empirical psychology. This suggests that there are conceivably two general approaches one could take when elucidating the nature of moral character. One could approach moral character primarily by focusing on standards set by normative ethics; whether people can or do live up to these standards is irrelevant. Alternatively, one could approach moral character under the guideline that normative ethics ought to be constrained by psychology. On this second approach, it’s not that the normative/descriptive distinction disappears; instead, it is just that a theory of moral character ought to be appropriately constrained by what social psychology tells us moral agents are in fact like. Moreover, precisely because virtue approaches make character and its components central to ethical theorizing, it seems appropriate that such approaches take the psychological data on character and its components seriously. This desire for a psychologically sensitive ethics partly explains the recent resurgence of virtue ethics, but it also leads to numerous challenges to the idea that agents possess robust moral characters.

Table of Contents

  1. 1. Moral Character, Ethics and Virtue Theory
    1. a. Character and Three Major Approaches to Ethics
    2. b. Moral vs. Non-moral Character
    3. c. Moral Responsibility
  2. 2. A Traditional View of Moral Character
    1. a. Dispositions in General
    2. b. Virtues and Vices as Dispositions
      1. i. Relatively Stable, Fixed and Reliable
      2. ii. Dispositions of Action and Affect
      3. iii. Rationally Informed
    3. c. Three Central Features
      1. i. Robustness Claim
      2. ii. Stability Claim
      3. iii. Integrity Claim
  3. 3. Challenges to Moral Character
    1. a. Situationism
    2. b. Moral Luck
    3. c. Impossibility of Being Responsible for One’s Character
    4. d. Responses
  4. 4. Conclusion
  5. 5. References and Further Reading
    1. a. Character and Virtue
    2. b. Dispositions
    3. c. Challenges to the Traditional View

1. Moral Character, Ethics and Virtue Theory

Etymologically, the term “character” comes from the ancient Greek term charaktêr, which initially referred to the mark impressed upon a coin. The term charaktêr later came to refer more generally to any distinctive feature by which one thing is distinguished from others. Along this general line, in contemporary usage character often refers to a set of qualities or characteristics that can be used to differentiate between persons. It is used this way, for example, commonly in literature. In philosophy, however, the term character is typically used to refer to the particularly moral dimension of a person. For example, Aristotle most often used the term ēthē for character, which is etymologically linked to “ethics” and “morality” (via the Latin equivalent mores).

Aristotle’s discussion of moral character, and virtue in particular, is the most influential treatment of such issues. For this reason, his discussion will be used as a beginning point. The Greek word used by Aristotle and most commonly translated as virtue is aretē, which is perhaps better translated as “goodness” or “excellence.” In general, an excellence is a quality that makes an individual a good member of its kind. For example, it is an excellence of an ax if it is able to cut wood. An excellence, therefore, is a property whereby its possessor operates well or fulfills its function. Along these same lines, it is helpful to think of excellences as defining features of one’s character. Aristotle, for instance, sometimes speaks of a good moral character as “human excellence” or an “excellence of soul” (Nicomachean Ethics I.13). The idea here is the same as with the axe—having a good moral character helps its possessor operate well and live up to her potential, thereby fulfilling her nature.

In Nicomachean Ethics Book II, Aristotle distinguishes two kinds of excellences or virtues: excellences of intellect and excellences of character (though, as we shall see below, he does not think these two are completely separable). The excellences of thought include epistemic or intellectual virtues such as technical expertise accomplishment and practical wisdom. The last of these, practical wisdom, is particularly important and will be discussed in greater detail below because of its relationship with the excellences of character. Given their connection with the intellect, it is not surprising that he thought these excellences are fostered through instruction and teaching.

Aristotle’s phrase for the excellences of character is ēthikē aretē, literally “virtue of character,” and is sometimes translated as “moral virtue.” As discussed in greater detail below, the excellences of character are dispositions to act and feel in certain ways. Aristotle famously thought a moral disposition was virtuous when it was in proper proportion, which he described as a mean between two extremes:

Excellence [of character], then, is a disposition issuing in decisions, depending on intermediacy of the kind relative to us, this being determined by rational prescription and in the way in which the wise person would determine it. And it is intermediacy between two bad states, one involving excess, the other involving deficiency; and also because one set of bad states is deficient, the other excessive in relation to what is required both in affections and actions, whereas excellence both finds and chooses the intermediate. (Nicomachean Ethics II.7).

For instance, the courageous person is one who is disposed to feel neither more nor less fear than the situation calls for. Furthermore, insofar as the excellences of character include a person’s emotions and feelings, and not just her actions, there is a distinction between acting virtuously and doing a virtuous action. Merely doing the right action is not sufficient to have the moral excellences. One must also be the right sort of individual or have the right sort of character.

The subject of moral character belongs to virtue theory more generally, which is the philosophical examination of notions related to the virtues. Roger Crisp distinguishes virtue ethics and virtue theory as follows: “Virtue theory is the area of inquiry concerned with the virtues in general; virtue ethics is narrower and prescriptive, and consists primarily in the advocacy of the virtues” (Crisp 1998, 5). Virtue ethics is a sub-species of virtue theory insofar as the former attempts to base ethics on evaluation of virtue.

a. Character and Three Major Approaches to Ethics

It is commonplace to differentiate three major approaches to normative ethics: consequentialism, deontology, and virtue ethics. At the heart of consequentialist theories is the idea that the moral action is the one that produces the best consequences. According to deontological theories, morality is primarily a function of duties or obligations, regardless of the consequences of acting in accordance with those duties. Both of these sets of theories are commonly described as ethics of rules. In contrast, virtue theories give primacy of importance not to rules, but to particular habits of character such as the virtue of courage or the vice of greed. This description of these three approaches is a vast over-simplification. For example, the ethical writings of Immanuel Kant are often taken to be the epitome of deontology, but his Lectures on Ethics and the second part of The Metaphysics of Morals focus largely on virtue. Nevertheless, even this short discussion illustrates how moral character plays a particularly central role in virtue ethics, even if it can also play a similar role in other approaches to normative ethics.

Most ancient philosophers were virtue theorists of some sort or other. Virtue ethics was often criticized during the modern period, but has experienced a revival in recent years. This recent resurgence in virtue ethics, and virtue theory more generally, has many sources. Two of the most notable are G. E. M. Anscombe’s “Modern Moral Philosophy” (1958) and John Rawls’s A Theory of Justice (1971). In her article, Anscombe criticizes deontological and consequentialist approaches to ethics for wrongly focusing on legalistic notions of obligations and rules. She suggests that ethics would benefit from an adequate philosophy of psychology. According to Anscombe, only a return to a virtue approach to ethics and the notions of human flourishing and well-being will be able to provide for the future flourishing of ethics. Less directly influential is Rawls. Though the primary aim of A Theory of Justice is not virtue ethics, Rawls’s discussion of the good citizen affords an important place to virtue and moral character in part III: “the representative member of a well-ordered society will find that he wants others to have the basic virtues, and in particular a sense of justice” (Rawls 1971, 436).

b. Moral vs. Non-moral Character

Persons have all kinds of traits: physical, psychological, social traits. Not all of these traits are particularly moral in nature, though they can impact one’s moral character. Psychologist Lawrence Pervin defines a personality trait as “a disposition to behave expressing itself in consistent patterns of functioning across a range of situations” (Pervin 1994, 108). But even among such traits, some do not appear to be morally relevant. For instance, Holli’s disposition to drink coffee rather than tea, or her disposition to exercise by jogging rather than doing yoga, will not be morally relevant in most cases. We thus need a way to differentiate those traits that are morally relevant from those that are not, particularly because philosophers and psychologists tend to use the term “character trait” in slightly different ways. Yet the differences are crucial. Philosophers typically think that moral character traits, unlike other personality or psychological traits, have an irreducibly evaluative dimension; that is, they involve a normative judgment. The evaluative dimension is directly related to the idea that the agent is morally responsible for having the trait itself or for the outcome of that trait. Thus, a specifically moral character trait is a character trait for which the agent is morally responsible.

c. Moral Responsibility

According to a widespread approach to moral responsibility, to be morally responsible is to be deserving of the reactive attitudes. According to Peter Strawson, whose work on moral responsibility has had wide influence, the reactive attitudes “are essentially natural human reactions to the good or ill will or indifference of others towards us, as displayed in their attitudes and actions” (P. Strawson 1997, 127). These reactive attitudes can be either positive (as in cases of moral praise, gratitude, respect, love), or negative (as in cases of moral blame, resentment, indignation). In other words, a person is morally responsible for performing some action X only if that person is the apt recipient of praise (or gratitude, etc.) or blame (or resentment, etc.). On such an account, a person could be responsible for some action even if no other person in fact actually held her responsible. A person could be deserving of resentment, for example, for performing some action even if no one does, in fact, resent her for performing that action.

Most work on moral responsibility has focused on an agent’s responsibility for her actions. Such an account of moral responsibility, however, can be extended beyond actions to include character traits as well. Consider the case of Chester. Chester has a very strong desire to molest young children. If he thought he could get away with it, he would abduct and molest the children playing on the playground near his house. But Chester is very afraid of getting caught since there is a police station across the street from the playground. As a result of his fear, Chester never does in fact molest any children, and thus isn’t deserving of blame or punishment for his behavior in this regard. Despite this fact, there is still something morally wrong with Chester; he is deserving of blame for being the kind of individual that wants to molest children and would if he could get away with it.

Finally, there are two related sets of questions that may be asked about responsibility. The first set of questions is about the general conditions that must be met in order for an agent to be morally responsible. Such questions include:

  • What kind of control over one’s actions is required for an agent to be morally responsible?
  • What is the epistemic condition that must be met in order for an agent to be morally responsible?
  • Must an action flow from an agent’s moral character for her to be responsible for it?

The second sort of question attempts to figure out what candidates are subject to the conditions for moral responsibility, in other words, whether a particular individual satisfies these conditions. In what follows, it will be assumed that only persons are morally responsible agents. However, it does not follow from the fact that a person is a morally responsible agent that she is morally responsible for all her actions and character traits.

2. A Traditional View of Moral Character

The previous section helped to differentiate moral versus non-moral character traits via their relationship with moral responsibility. In short, moral character traits are those for which the possessor is the proper recipient of the reactive attitudes. Little was said, however, about the exact nature of a moral character trait. The present section explores the nature of the most common understanding of moral character traits, which I will call “the Traditional View of Moral Character,” or Traditional View for short. Different theories within the Traditional View will, of course, fill out the details in diverse ways. So it will be helpful to think of the Traditional View as a family of similar and related views, rather than a fully developed and determinate view itself.

As mentioned earlier, the moral character traits that constitute one’s moral character are typically understood as behavioral and affective dispositions. For this reason, it will be helpful to look at dispositions in general before turning toward specifically moral dispositions. This is the topic of the first sub-section below. The second sub-section looks at virtues and vices as particular kinds of dispositions. The third sub-section discusses the three central claims of the Traditional View of moral character. (The present entry will not address the related issue of the development of moral character—see the entry on Moral Development.)

a. Dispositions in General

Dispositions are particular kinds of properties or characteristics that objects can possess. Examples of dispositions include the solubility of a sugar-cube in water, the fragility of porcelain, the elasticity of a rubber band, and the magnetism of a lodestone. Dispositional properties are usually contrasted with non-dispositional or categorical properties. Providing a fully adequate account of this distinction is difficult, though the basic idea is fairly easy to grasp (for a discussion of these issues, see Mumford 1998, particularly Chapter 4). Compare the solubility of a sugar-cube in water with its volume. The sugar-cube’s solubility means that it would dissolve if placed in water. The sugar-cube need not actually be placed in water to be soluble; one simply sees that it is soluble when it is placed in water. In contrast, one need not do anything to the sugar-cube to see that it has the categorical property of volume, for the sugar-cube always manifests this property in a way that it does not always manifest solubility in water. For dispositional properties, there is a difference between an object having such a property and manifesting its disposition (this same point will be true of the virtues discussed below). This contrast suggests that dispositional properties fundamentally involve conditionality in a way that categorical properties do not. What objects are soluble in water at standard temperature and pressure? Just those that would dissolve if placed in water at standard temperature and pressure.

There are a number of metaphysical questions about dispositions. Is the conditionality involved in dispositions to be understood counter-factually, or some other way? Are colors dispositional or categorical properties? Can dispositional properties be reduced to categorical properties, or vice versa? Such questions, however, need not concern us here. Instead, it is sufficient to note that a thing’s dispositional properties are often just as important to us as their non-dispositional properties. There would be significantly fewer college students, for example, with avidity for beer were it not disposed to cause intoxication in those who drink it. Dispositions can help explain not only why past events happened, but also provide the grounds for future events.

Certain kinds of objects are dispositional in nature; thermostats, for example. While persons aren’t inherently dispositional in this way, they can and do have numerous dispositions. Persons have some dispositions in virtue of their physical bodies (such as solubility in certain solvents) and other dispositions in virtue of their mental lives (such as a disposition to play the piano when one is present, or to give to Oxfam if asked). In fact, Gilbert Ryle has famously suggested that the mind, rather than being another substance in addition to the body, is just a set of dispositions for the body to behave in certain ways (It is on this basis that Ryle argues that substance dualism is a category mistake; see Ryle 1949, Chapter 1). Whether one accepts Ryle’s claim, persons have behavioral and affective dispositions that impact our moral judgments of those persons. It is to these moral character traits that we now turn.

b. Virtues and Vices as Dispositions

Moral character traits are those dispositions of character for which it is appropriate to hold agents morally responsible. A trait for which the agent is deserving of a positive reactive attitude, such as praise or gratitude, is a virtue, and a vice is a trait for which the agent is deserving of a negative reactive attitude, such as resentment or blame. Moral character traits are relatively stable, fixed and reliable dispositions of action and affect that ought to be rationally informed. The subsequent sub-sections will further elucidate these various aspects of moral character traits.

i. Relatively Stable, Fixed and Reliable

Moral character traits are relatively stable and reliable dispositions, and thus should be reasonably good predictors over time of an agent’s behavior if that agent is in a trait-relevant situation. This does not mean, however, that such traits must be exceptionless. For example, a single case of dishonesty need not mean that an individual lacks a generally honest character. Thus, the dispositions should be understood as involving a particular level of probability. Furthermore, while such traits are malleable—individuals can change their moral character over time—such changes are usually not immediate, taking both time and effort.

ii. Dispositions of Action and Affect

Moral character traits are not just dispositions to engage in certain outward behaviors; they can also be dispositions to have certain emotions or affections. For example, justice is the disposition to treat others as they deserve to be treated, while courageousness is the disposition to feel the appropriate amount of fear called for by a situation. Additionally, as mentioned above with regard to dispositions in general, an individual can have a particular moral character trait and not currently be manifesting trait-relevant behavior or affect. An individual may be generous in her giving to charity, even if she is not engaged presently in any charitable action.

iii. Rationally Informed

In order for a moral character trait to be a virtue, it must not only be in accord with the relevant moral norms, but the disposition must also be informed by proper reasoning about the matter at hand. This is so because the virtues are excellences of character insofar as they are the best exercise of reason. In his discussion of the virtues, for example, Aristotle says that all the excellences of character must be informed by practical wisdom (phronēsis), itself a disposition to make morally discerning choices in practical matters. This suggests a link between intellectual virtues and virtues of character.

c. Three Central Features

With the above discussion of the nature of moral character traits in mind, the Traditional View can now be summarized as consisting primarily of three claims about moral character: the Robustness Claim, the Stability Claim and the Integrity Claim. The first two are claims about the nature of moral character traits, while the third is a claim about the relationship among traits within a particular individual.

i. Robustness Claim

According to the first central claim of the Traditional View, an individual with a particular moral character trait will exhibit trait-relevant behavior across a broad spectrum of trait-relevant situations. Such traits are said to be “robust” traits. For example, the Robustness Claim suggests that an honest person will tend to tell the truth in a wide range of honesty-related situations: honesty toward friends, family members, co-workers, students, etc. Given that moral character traits need not be exceptionless, a single counter-instance doesn’t rule out an individual’s possession of a particular trait and doesn’t contradict the Robustness Claim.

ii. Stability Claim

According to the Stability Claim, moral character traits are relatively stable over time. The Stability Claim doesn’t preclude the possibility of an individual changing his moral character over time. Rather, it holds that such changes take time. A soldier who has courageously proven himself in battle situations over the course of numerous years will not cease to be courageous overnight. If the soldier does act non-courageously in a particular battle, the Stability Claim suggests that we should still think of the soldier as possessing the virtue of courage unless the soldier behaves non-courageously for a significant period of time.

iii. Integrity Claim

According to the Integrity Claim, there is a probabilistic correlation between having one virtue and having other virtues. For example, an individual who is temperate with regard to the pleasures derived from food (the virtue of abstinence) is likely to also be temperate with regard to the pleasures derived from sexual intercourse (the virtue of chastity). Likewise, an individual with a particular vice is likely to possess other vices. Here, the Integrity Claim suggests that an individual who is disposed to lie for monetary gain will likely also be disposed to cheat for monetary gain. The Traditional View thus expects a fairly high level of inter-trait consistency.

This is the most contentious and perhaps counter-intuitive of the three claims of the Traditional View. Examples such as the courageous and self-controlled bomber appear to be counterexamples to the Integrity Claim insofar as such an individual appears to possess some virtues (such as courage) but lack others (such as justice). Nevertheless, the Integrity Claim has a substantial pedigree among virtue theorists. Aristotle held that the multiplicity of virtues are all related by practical wisdom: “It is clear… it is not possible to possess excellence in the primary sense without [practical] wisdom, nor to be wise without excellence of character” (Nicomachean Ethics, 1144b30-32). Given the role that phronēsis plays, the “evaluative considerations” involved in the virtues are so interdependent that any individual having one virtue will have them all (see Nicomachean Ethics, 1144b30-1145a11). Plato similarly held that the various virtues are all related by justice. More recently, Raymond Devettere embraces the unity of the virtues thesis as follows:

If you have one virtue, you have them all…. Virtues cannot be separated—a person lacking the virtue of temperance also lacks the virtues of justice, love, and so forth. At first, this thesis appears counterintuitive, but once the central role of practical wisdom in each and every moral virtue is understood, the unity of the virtues emerges as inevitable (Devettere 2002, 64).

Socrates took the unity among the virtues even further, arguing not only that the virtues are unified in this way, but that there is in fact ultimately only one virtue—wisdom; the apparent diversity of virtues is in reality just different expressions of this one virtue (Protagoras, 330e-333d).

3. Challenges to Moral Character

As indicated above, versions of the Traditional View of moral character outlined in the previous section have long been accepted within the virtue ethics tradition. Other ethical traditions such as utilitarianism and deontology have been less inclined to stress the importance of moral character, though there are exceptions. For example, Julia Driver’s Uneasy Virtue (2001) provides a consequentialist account of virtue. Similarly, as mentioned above, some of Kant’s ethical writings focus largely on virtue. Despite these exceptions, it is not surprising that many proponents of these other ethical traditions have critiqued the traditional understanding of moral character and its relation to virtue.

More recently, however, the traditional understanding of moral character outlined above has been criticized from other directions. One major source of criticism is motivated by the idea that normative ethics ought to be constrained by the best currently available psychological data. According to this view, theories of moral character ought to be constrained in certain regards by what social and cognitive psychology tells us moral agents are actually like. And recent empirical work suggests that agents lack the kind of robust moral character at the heart of the Traditional View. Other recent challenges arise from the fact that the preconditions for moral character cannot be met, either because they are undermined by moral luck, or because it is impossible for an agent to be morally responsible for anything, in which case moral character collapses. This section briefly considers these recent challenges.

a. Situationism

Recently, a number of philosophers and social scientists have begun to question the very presuppositions that robust theories of moral character and moral character traits are based on. The following quotation by John Doris captures this concern:

I regard this renaissance of virtue with concern. Like many others, I find the lore of virtue deeply compelling, yet I cannot help noticing that much of this lore rests on psychological theory that is some 2,500 years old. A theory is not bad simply because it is old, but in this case developments of more recent vintage suggest that the old ideas are in trouble. In particular, modern experimental psychology has discovered that circumstance has surprisingly more to do with how people behave than traditional images of character and virtue allow (Doris 2002, ix).

In other words, the Traditional View of moral character is empirically inadequate (see also Mischel 1968).

This criticism of the Traditional View began with attributionism, a branch of psychology that seeks to differentiate what is rightly attributable to an individual’s character from what is rightly attributable to outside features. Much of attribution theory attributes a significantly higher proportion of the causal basis of behavior to external factors and less to moral character than traditionally thought. According to such theorists, most individuals overestimate the role of dispositional factors such as moral character in explaining an individual’s behavior, and underestimate the role the situation plays in explaining an agent’s behavior. Gilbert Harmon expresses this idea as follows:

In trying to characterize and explain a distinctive action, ordinary thinking tends to hypothesize a corresponding distinctive characteristic of the agent and tends to overlook the relevant details of the agent’s perceived situation…. Ordinary attributions of character traits to people are often deeply misguided and it may even be the case that there… [are] no ordinary traits of the sort people think there are (Harman 1999, 315f).

Philosophers such as Doris and Harman have used this work in the social sciences to develop an alternative approach to moral character, commonly known as “Situationism.”

Like the Traditional View, Situationism can be understood as comprised of three central claims:

  1. Non-robustness Claim: moral character traits are not robust—that is, they are not consistent across a wide spectrum of trait-relevant situations. Whatever moral character traits an individual has are situation-specific.
  2. Consistency Claim: while a person’s moral character traits are relatively stable over time, this should be understood as consistency of situation specific traits, rather than robust traits.
  3. Fragmentation Claim: a person’s moral character traits do not have the evaluative integrity suggested by the Integrity Claim. There may be considerable disunity in a person’s moral character among her situation-specific character traits.

Thus, Situationism rejects the first and third claims of the Traditional View, and embraces only a modified version of the second claim.

According to Situationists, the empirical evidence favors their view of moral character over the Traditional View. To cite just one early example, Hugh Hartshorne and M. A. May’s study of the trait of honesty among school children found no cross-situational correlation. A child may be consistently honest with his friends, but not with his parents or teachers. From this and other studies, Hartshorne and May concluded that character traits are not robust but rather “specific functions of life situations” (Hartshorne and May 1928, 379f). Other studies further call into question the Integrity Claim of the Traditional View.

b. Moral Luck

A second challenge to the traditional view can be found in the idea of moral luck. While there are a number of varieties of moral luck, the underlying idea is that moral luck occurs when the moral judgment of an agent depends on factors beyond the agent’s control. There are number of ways that moral luck can motivate criticisms of moral character.

A species of moral luck that is particularly relevant to Situationism is circumstantial or situational luck, which is the luck involved in “the kind of problems and situations one faces” (Nagel 1993, 60). If all of an agent’s moral character traits are situation-specific rather than robust, what traits an agent manifests will depend on the situation that she finds herself in. But what situations an agent finds herself in is often beyond her control and thus a matter of situational luck. According to one experiment conducted by Isen and Levin, experimenters looked for helping behavior in unaware subjects after they left a public phone-booth. Whether or not the individuals helped a person in need was found significantly influenced by whether or not one had just found a dime in the phone-booth. In the initial experiment, the results for the 41 subjects are as follows (Doris 2002, 30):

Helping Behavior
No Helping Behavior
Found Dime
Didn’t Find Dime

These results suggest that morally significant behavior such as helping another in need depends largely on minute factors of the situation that are not in the control of the agent. (It should be noted that Isen and Levin’s results have not been replicated in all subsequent studies. See, for example, the discussion in Chapter 4 of Doris’s text. Doris concludes that the set of results from all these experiments “in any event… exemplifies an established pattern of results” [Doris 2002, 180 footnote 4]).

But there is a more significant challenge that luck plays to the idea of moral character, regardless of the outcome of the dispute between proponents of the Traditional View and Situationists. Whether moral character traits are robust or situation-specific, some have suggested that what character traits one has is itself a matter of luck. If our having certain traits is itself a matter of luck, this would seem to undermine one’s moral responsibility for one’s moral character, and thus the concept of moral character altogether. As Owen Flanagan and Amélie Oksenberg Rorty write:

It [the morality and meaning of an individual’s life] will depend on luck in an individual’s upbringing, the values she is taught, the self-controlling and self-constructing capacities her social environment enables and encourages her to develop, the moral challenges she faces or avoids. If all her character, not just temperamental traits and dispositions but also the reflexive capacities for self-control and self-construction, are matters of luck, then the very ideas of character and agency are in danger of evaporation (Flanagan and Rorty 1990, 5).

c. Impossibility of Being Responsible for One’s Character

Related to the problem posed by moral luck is the third recent challenge to the Traditional View, namely the idea that moral responsibility is impossible. Indeed, this option may be understood as taking the problem that moral luck proposes to its logical conclusion.

It was suggested above that what makes a character trait a specifically moral character trait, and thus a constituent of a person’s moral character, is an evaluative dimension of that trait. A moral character trait is a character trait for which the agent is morally responsible; in other words, the apt recipient of the reactive attitudes. If moral responsibility is impossible, however, then agents cannot be held responsible for their character traits or for the behaviors that they do as a result of those character traits.

Why might one think that moral responsibility, and thus moral character, is impossible? Galen Strawson (1994) summarizes the argument, which he calls the Basic Argument, in this way:

  1. In order to be morally responsible, an agent would have to be a cause of itself or causa sui.
  2. Nothing can be causa sui.
  3. Therefore, no agent can be morally responsible.

The idea behind the Basic Argument can be elaborated as follows. In order for an agent, Allison, to be responsible for some action of hers, that action must be a result of the kind of person that Allison is. We might say, for instance, that Allison is blameworthy for eating too much chocolate at time T because she is a gluttonous individual. But in order for Allison to be responsible for being a gluttonous individual at T, she would have to be responsible at some earlier time T-1 for being the kind of person that would later become a gluttonous person. But in order for Allison to be responsible for being the kind of person that would later become a gluttonous person, she would have to be responsible at some earlier time T-2 for being the kind of person that would later become the kind of person that would later become a gluttonous person. According to Strawson, this line of thinking begins an infinite regress: “True self-determination is impossible because it requires the completion of an infinite series of choices of principles of choice” (G. Strawson, 7).

A similar argument has also recently been advocated by Bruce Waller. According to Waller, no one is “morally responsible for her character or deliberative powers, or for the results that flow from them…. Given the fact that she was shaped to have such characteristics by environmental (or evolutionary) forces far beyond her control, she deserves no blame [nor praise]” (Waller, 85f).

Of course, if moral responsibility is impossible, then all moral theories that involve responsibility are wrong, not just the Traditional View of moral character. So the argument for the impossibility of moral responsibility is not just a challenge for the Traditional View, but for all views. And there is perhaps reason to think that character-based approaches are better able to deal with this problem than are choice-based theories.

d. Responses

These recent challenges to the Traditional View have not gone unnoticed. Some have attempted to modify the Traditional View to insulate it from these challenges, while others have tried to show how these challenges fail to undermine the Traditional View at all. For example, Dana Nelkin (2005), Christian Miller (2003), Gopal Sreenivasan (2002), and John Sabini and Maury Silver (2005), among others, have argued that the empirical evidence cited by the Situationists does not show that individuals lack robust character traits.

4. Conclusion

Given the importance of moral character to issues in philosophy, it is unlikely that the debates over the nature of moral character will disappear anytime soon.

5. References and Further Reading

a. Character and Virtue

  • Anscombe, G. E. M. (1958). “Modern Moral Philosophy,” Philosophy 33:1-19.
  • Aristotle (2002). Nicomachean Ethics, translated by Christopher Rowe (Oxford University Press). A good translation of Aristotle’s text which also contains a very helpful introduction to Aristotle’s ethical thought by Sarah Broadie.
  • Brandt, Richard (1992). Morality, Utilitarianism, and Rights (Cambridge University Press).
  • Crisp, Roger (1998). “Modern Moral Philosophy and the Virtues,” in How Should One Live? Essays on the Virtues, ed. Roger Crisp (Oxford University Press): 1-18. A very good discussion of the virtues in modern ethics.
  • Devettere, Raymond (2002). Introduction to Virtue Ethics (Georgetown University Press). A very readable introduction to virtue ethics.
  • Driver, Julia (2001). Uneasy Virtue (Cambridge University Press). A consequentialist account of virtue.
  • Flanagan, Owen, and Amélie Oksenberg Rorty (1990). Identity, Character, and Morality (MIT Press). A collection of interesting and wide-ranging essays on topics related to moral character.
  • Kupperman, Joel (1995). Character (New York: Oxford University Press). Focuses on the nature and acquisition of moral character.
  • MacIntyre, Alasdair (1981). After Virtue (London: Duckworth). An influential book on the virtues and their relationship to modern ethics.
  • McKinnon, Christine (1999). Character, Virtue Theories, and the Vices (Broadview Press). A clear and thorough discussion of central themes in virtue ethics, with a focus on moral character.
  • Rawls, John (1971). A Theory of Justice (Harvard University Press).
  • Strawson, Peter (1997). “Freedom and Resentment,” in Free Will, ed. Derk Pereboom (Hackett Press): 119-142. A seminal discussion of the nature of moral responsibility and its relation to the reactive attitudes.

b. Dispositions

  • Mellor, D. H. (1974). “In Defense of Dispositions,” Philosophical Review 83: 157-181.
  • Mumford, Stephen (1998). Dispositions (Oxford University Press). One of the most thorough and detailed discussion of dispositions in general.
  • Prior, Elizabeth (1985). Dispositions (Aberdeen: Aberdeen University Press).
  • Ryle, Gilbert (1949). The Concept of Mind (Hutchinson’s University Library). Contains Ryle’s famous argument that the mind is just the disposition of the body to behave in certain ways.

c. Challenges to the Traditional View

  • Doris, John (2002). Lack of Character: Personality and Moral Behavior (Cambridge University Press). A fascinating, and thorough, discussion of the psychological challenges to the Traditional View and a defense of Situationism.
  • Harman, Gilbert (1999). “Moral Philosophy Meets Social Psychology: Virtue Ethics and the Fundamental Attribution Error,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 99: 315-331. Another influential philosophical defense of Situationism.
  • Hartshorne, Hugh, and M. A. May (1928). Studies in the Nature of Character (Macmillan). Widely influential discussion of psychological challenges to the Traditional View.
  • Mischel, Walter (1968). Personality and Assessment (John J. Wiley and Sons). Contains a discussion of the psychological literature on the problems with the Traditional View
  • Nagel, Thomas (1993). “Moral Luck,” in Moral Luck, ed. Daniel Statman (State University of New York Press): 57-61.
  • Nelkin, Dana (2005). “Freedom, Responsibility, and the Challenge of Situationism,” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 29 (Free Will and Moral Responsibility). An argument against Situationist conclusions.
  • Miller, Christian (2003). “Social Psychology and Virtue Ethics,” The Journal of Ethics 7: 365-392. A defense of the traditional view of moral character in the light of Situationist critiques.
  • Pervin, Lawrence (1994). “A Critical Analysis of Current Trait Theory,” Psychological Inquiry 5: 103-113.
  • Sabini, John and Maury Silver (2005). “Lack of Character? Situationism Critiqued,” Ethics 115: 535-562. A recent criticism of Situationism.
  • Sreenivasan, Gopal (2002). “Errors about Errors: Virtue Theory and Train Attribution,” Mind 111: 47-68. Another criticism of Situationism.
  • Strawson, Galen (1994). “The Impossibility of Moral Responsibility,” Philosophical Studies 75: 5-24. A well known and influential argument for the impossibility of moral responsibility.
  • Waller, Bruce N. (2006). “Denying Responsibility without Making Excuses,” American Philosophical Quarterly 43: 81-89.

Author Information

Kevin Timpe
University of San Diego
U. S. A.