Music and Social Justice

Protests demanding social justice as the alternative to an unacceptable status quo have been mounted in response to war, political and social inequality, poverty, and other constraints on economic and development opportunities.  Although social justice is typically thought of as a political agenda, many justice movements have used music as a way of inviting and maintaining broad-based participation in their initiatives.

Some of this integration of music and social justice has become so deeply embedded in the identity and culture frameworks of particular groups that it is understood today primarily as culturally constitutive.  For instance, the tradition of the blues is widely recognized as a distinctively African-American contribution to music, but is not always recognized for its role helping to shape the political consciousness of African-American communities emerging from Reconstruction in the nineteenth century and migrating out of the American South in the twentieth century.  The same is true of the interplay between the free jazz of the 1960s and the black-nationalist movement it helped to nurture.  Other moments in music and social justice appear in our social and historical narratives less as integration than as accidental convergences which we do not always notice or remember.  Examples of music dropping out of the politics, rather than politics dropping out of the music, include cultural inattention to the role music has played in later social protests taking place under the banners of the Occupy movement and UK-Uncut, and to the crucial role that music played in the anti-apartheid movement in South Africa.  The paradigm for reciprocity of musical expression and commitment to social justice, on the other hand, is the political protest culture of the United States in the 1960s: the Civil Rights Movement and the anti-Vietnam War movement, in particular.

In his book Rhythm and Resistance, p. 39, Ray Pratt observes that “No music alone can organize one’s ability to invest affectively in the world, [but] one can note powerful contributions of music to temporary emotional states.”  It is because of the way music feeds into our emotional lives and because of the sense of social well-being we get from sharing emotional states with others that music so frequently accompanies movements that build, and depend upon, solidarity.  This is a contingent association, to be sure, but the absence of logical necessity does not diminish the powerful role music plays in our efforts to build a better world.

Table of Contents

  1. Musical Traditions
    1. Origins and Impacts of Blues and Jazz
    2. Folk Music, Rock Music, and Protest Songs
    3. Post-industrial Musical Contestation: Disco, Punk, and Hip-hop
  2. Contemporary Protest
    1. Communal and Community-based Music Making in Democratic States
    2. Building Social Solidarity against Neo-liberalism
    3. Confrontations with Authoritarian Regimes
  3. Academic Attention to Music-Politics Links
    1. Social Aesthetics
    2. Improvisation Theory
    3. Peace through Art
  4. References and Further Reading

1. Musical Traditions

Social transformation effected through music—so-called Peace through Art—is an approach that has been under-theorized.  One of the few theorizers and practitioners who seeks to advance our understanding of social justice through art and music is John Paul Lederach, whose peace-building work focuses on conflict transformation through sonic capacities to promote social healing.  His work with fractured communities emphasizes the restoration of voice, a concept he has found particularly resonant with people who are struggling to repair their violent communities (110, 89).  The music and poetry that can aid in this repair is various and highly contextual; to be meaningful to the community who is seeking social justice, the music that accompanies justice-building must be—or be connected to—an organic part of the community’s everyday life.  In the interest of providing a sense of the sonic diversity of effective musical backdrops, this account of music and social justice is introduced through a discussion of musical types and traditions.

a. Origins and Impacts of Blues and Jazz

One of the most influential historians of the blues is Amiri Baraka who, writing as Leroi Jones in his first book Blues People, explores the African-American experience of the nation through music.  The blues, he explains, is the response of African abductees to their American enslavement, a cultural outpouring developed from work songs and spirituals which represents in microcosm the entire range and nuance of a people’s adaptation to a foreign land they were given no choice but to make into a home.  This history of adaptation Baraka traces is one in which the songs become more complex and more secular, leaving aside the theme of deliverance into heaven that characterized African-American musical production in slavery in favor of a more immediately empowering emphasis on self-determination.  The blues thus functioned as a repository of cultural engagement, its lyrical content evolving over time to reflect whatever social challenges African-American communities were facing at the time.  One notable instance of blues reflecting African-American struggles for respect and legitimacy in the public sphere was the 1941 collaboration between jazz great Count Basie and author Richard Wright (of Native Son fame) on a piece called King Joe (The Joe Louis Blues) that valorized the boxer as the pride of his community at the same moment that anti-lynching campaigns were finally starting to gain traction in the Jim Crow South.

Both Baraka and Albert Murray, another prominent African-American historian of uniquely American music, tell the story of jazz in such a way as to underscore its birth out of the blues.  For Baraka, one of the more coherent ways of defining jazz is as a synthesis of European instrumentation and the African-derived polyrhythms that, fundamentally, are the blues—even as jazz developed its own trajectory.  Murray’s tracing of this history in Stomping the Blues reiterates this common heritage but concentrates so much on jazz and jazz musicians that a reader who comes to his book looking for an analysis of the blues may feel shortchanged.  Yet another treatment of the emergence of the blues and jazz, in Frank Kofsky’s Black Nationalism and the Revolution in Music, tells the story of jazz through a narrative reminiscent of Thomas Kuhn’s Structure of Scientific Revolutions, a story of problem-solving within paradigms that finally, inevitably, break down and must be replaced—as in the case of the shift of musicians like John Coltrane and Ornette Coleman from trying to work their ideas out in bebop to an embrace of free jazz.

Kofsky too endorses the thesis that music and socio-political relations go hand in hand, arguing that we can see in the free jazz that emerged in the early 1960s a kind of “proto-nationalism” which presaged the black nationalist messages of Malcolm X, the Black Panthers, and other “do for self” movements in African-American communities during the 1960s.  These movements stressed the need for community self-sufficiency in the face of a systemically racist white majoritarian society and although the black nationalist (a.k.a. black separatist) message was often simplistically opposed to the integrationism attributed to Martin Luther King and the Civil Rights Movement, their community development efforts—after-school arts programs for children, musical benefits to feed people struggling with food insecurity, “neighborhood watch” security efforts—still stand as tangible models for grassroots solidarity.  The self-sufficiency message Kofsky finds in jazz proto-nationalism is a celebration of a unique African-American aesthetic, one that contested the aesthetic imperialism of the white critics who promoted the value and determined the negotiating power of the mostly black musicians within the system of white-owned recording and performance institutions.  At the height of the free jazz movement, self-sufficiency imperatives were the driving force behind the independent recording facilities and cooperatively owned performance venues with which Coltrane, Coleman, and Charles Mingus, among others, experimented.  They were also a factor in the political stances taken by many of the free jazz musicians—anti-war, anti-colonialism, anti-enslavement, and broadly supportive of the Pan-Africanism that flourished in the wake of African decolonization movements.  Its most enduring legacy, however, was the credence it gave to a counter-narrative about what constituted aesthetic value.  White critics used a theoretical framework developed for Western art music (so-called classical music) to evaluate the originality, authenticity, and artistic complexity of a musical tradition that came out of the African-American experience.  But, as a reading of Kofsky’s history together with Henry Louis Gates Jr.’s literary theory in The Signifying Monkey makes clear, the black musicians immersed in the jazz world were developing their own aesthetic—a conception of, for instance, the value of originality that rejects the Eurocentric ideal of the original (as something that has never before been seen in this world) in favor of an understanding that one makes an original contribution when one adds one’s own perspective to an existing cultural product.  This revision of what originality means implicates the individual empowerment and attention to existing and nascent community networks that black nationalism’s later advocacy of self-sufficiency promoted.

b. Folk Music, Rock Music, and Protest Songs

The protest songs of folk music have a long history of engagement with social justice struggles for abolition of slavery, universal suffrage, and other human rights agendas, but really began to assert their power during the unionization drives emerging out of the industrialization of wealthy societies.  In the United States, some of the most recognizable of these songs that came out of the labor movement include “John Henry” and “Which Side Are You On?”  While folk music developed its reputation as the voice of social justice in America in no small part due to the music of Woody Guthrie, Pete Seeger, and Bob Dylan, perhaps the protest song that has had the most profound effect on American political life is the anti-lynching song “Strange Fruit.”

This song’s lyrics were written Jewish schoolteacher Abel Meeropol (who adopted the orphaned sons of Julius and Ethel Rosenberg, the couple executed in 1953 by the US government on the charge that they passed atomic secrets to the Soviet Union) in the 1930s as a response to a grisly photograph of a lynching.  Recorded by Billie Holiday and performed as one of her signature pieces, “Strange Fruit” became a widely-heard protest against social injustice, a schooling of audiences about the realities of African-American lives (and deaths) in parts of the United States that practiced lynching (“Strange Fruit: The film” Independent Lens).  Jazz critic Leonard Feather once said of “Strange Fruit” that it was “the first significant protest in words and music, the first unmuted cry against racism” (Margolick).  Given the history of African-American activism and oratory, Feather’s claim about its ‘first-ness’ is best parsed as hyperbole, but there is no denying the impact this song had on Holiday’s audiences.  Margolick recounts fights breaking out in nightclubs after it was performed and Billie Holiday herself being attacked by distraught and traumatized patrons.  Despite the emotional toll that singing “Strange Fruit” had on her, Holiday apparently felt a duty to perform it.  “I have to sing it,” Margolick quotes her as saying; “[it] goes a long way in telling how they mistreat Negroes down South.”  And the impact of the song did play a part in efforts at changing social policy: some of the people who endorsed passage of federal anti-lynching laws sent recordings of “Strange Fruit” to members of Congress, presumably because they felt hearing it would produce an awakening of the legislators’ moral outrage.  “Strange Fruit” holds its power, even with the passage of time, and has been called “one of the 10 songs that actually changed the world” (see the November 2003 issue of Q Magazine, a British music magazine).

In the world of rock music—the style that emerged from mainstream white America’s assimilation of rhythm and blues—there is another paradigmatic intersection of music and social justice that can be understood as a rock parallel to folk music’s “Strange Fruit.”  More than forty years ago, Jimi Hendrix and the somewhat thrown-together band that was forming in the wake of the Jimi Hendrix Experience played a two hour set as the final musical act of the Woodstock Festival, a performance most remembered for their improvisation upon the American national anthem, “The Star-Spangled Banner” (Daley 52, 55).  This moment that has come to symbolize the essence of Woodstock was a masterful performance, and critique, of an anthem whose lyrics valorize the resilience of a people under attack.  Shifting between faithful rendition and strategic distortion, Hendrix forcefully shows his audience the moral inconsistency of a nation that sang this song at the same time as it dropped bombs on the people of other nations.  The sounds Hendrix pulls out of the guitar in that iconic performance are reminiscent of explosions and squeals of horror at exactly the points one who is singing along would get to “the rockets’ red glare” and “bombs bursting in air.”  The message that seems to have entered the popular imagination as a result of Hendrix’s improvisation on “The Star-Spangled Banner” at Woodstock is very clearly an anti-war, anti-imperialist one.  In his book Crosstown Traffic, British music journalist Charles Murray concludes that Hendrix’s performance “depicts, as graphically as a piece of music can possibly do, both what the Americans did to the Vietnamese and what they did to themselves” (C. Murray 24; quoted in Daley 57).

c. Post-industrial Musical Contestation: Disco, Punk, and Hip-hop

The music that accompanied industrial decline in Western industrialized nations—notably the United States and the United Kingdom—articulated two distinct responses to the foreclosure of empowerment and idealism that the counterculture of the 1960s had nurtured.  Disco, with its elaborate costumes, exhibitionist focus on dance, and attendant drug culture, represented a turning away from political challenges, a refusal to deal with social problems, and a desire for momentary pleasures.  Punk, on the other hand, was a howl of rage from working class youth who saw, and rejected in no uncertain terms, the hypocrisy of the social establishment and the increasing inaccessibility of economic opportunities for the socio-economically disadvantaged.  Disco was stereotypically identified with African-American performers (albeit predominantly white consumers) whereas punk was typed as a British phenomenon, although, in fact, both musical constituencies could be found in any of the wealthy nations that were starting in the 1970s to wrestle with de-industrialization, wage stagnation, and the corporate restructuring now known as outsourcing.

Elements of both of these musical responses to social marginalization and injustice are synthesized in hip-hop, the most popular musical form for expression of protest worldwide in the following period.  In Black Noise: Rap Music and Black Culture in Contemporary America, sociologist Tricia Rose theorizes the hip-hop universe of her youth as emerging from a post-industrial nightmare in which the ethnic poor were being crowded out of public space, and creative protest was fostered in the effort to reclaim for the people the neighborhoods that were being torn apart to build expressways into the city for affluent suburban commuters (31-33).  Into this unacknowledged war on the poor and the marginalized came the interplay of technology, economics, and culture at the origin of hip-hop, what Rose describes as a practice of appropriating cultural refuse for pleasure (22-23).  Subways, street corners, abandoned parks were occupied by listeners and dancers as political spaces.  The elements of “flow, layering, and rupture” both reflect and contest social marginalization, Rose says; in its origins, the music was both articulating and symbolizing the lived experience of people struggling to hold onto a community identity in the face of “urban development” and gentrification processes (22).  The struggle, she insists, was not a final, futile gesture of victims of urban apocalypse, but was the formation of an alternative, communally-forged identity by producers of a conscious “take back the public spaces” movement (Rose 33).  It was an intransigent, unapologetic assertion of the right of all human beings to take up public space, to interact with each other and with the music that informed these politicized, reclaimed spaces.

2. Contemporary Protest

As noted in the previous section, much of the protest of injustice that is expressed musically in the early 21st century is done so through hip-hop.  There is, for instance, a Hungarian rapper by the name of Dopeman who performs his discontent with the political homogenization of the country’s post-communist regime.  And in Haiti, there was a nationwide rap contest in June 2006, the “Concours Pwojè Lari Pwòp,” in which young people submitted original raps on the topic of cleaning up the environment and the nation voted for their favorite recordings made by twelve finalists—a sort of socially conscious “Haitian Idol” program (Yéle Haiti, 2006).  But the resonance that hip-hop has for youth in many different cultures should not blind us to the diversity of music—traditional and improvised—through which justice appeals speak to people.  For instance, Foucaultian scholar Ladelle McWhorter opens her book Racism and Sexual Oppression in Anglo-America with an anecdote about attending a vigil for Matthew Shepard, the young college student in Wyoming whose 1998 death was an anti-gay hate crime, recalling that some attendees felt inspired to sing the Civil Rights-era anthem “We Shall Overcome” as an expression of their stand against homophobia.  The discussions in this section should therefore be read not as a comprehensive overview, but as a selection of examples that showcase the diversity of musical styles that are speaking justice around the world.

a. Communal and Community-based Music Making in Democratic States

One of the most inspiring instances of music expressing the ethos to which a community aspires can be found in the response of the Norwegian people to the shocking mass murder committed in the summer of 2011 by right-wing extremist Anders Behring Breivik.  To the extent that a motivation has emerged for Breivik’s actions—killing 77 people and wounding 200 more in attacks on government buildings in Oslo and a summer camp on the nearby island of Utoeya—he seems to have been driven by a hatred of the multiculturalism Norway has embraced and by a belief that immigration—Muslim immigration, in particular—has had a contaminating effect on society.  One of the elements of Norwegian multiculturalism that he cited as the object of his hatred was a song that is taught to children in schools, “Children of The Rainbow.”  This song is a Norwegian version of folk singer Pete Seeger’s anti-war song “My Rainbow Race” and it embodies for many Norwegians their shared social commitments to celebrating the diversity of human beings  and to teaching their children a similar appreciation.

One might expect a community that has been devastated by mass-murder to react with rage and calls for harsh punishment for the perpetrator, especially given that many of his victims were young people.  One might also expect heated public debates about gun control and the need for better early diagnosis and intervention in matters of mental health.  What one might not expect to see, but did in fact happen in April 2012, is a gathering of thousands of people in the capital to sing both Norwegian and English versions of the song as a defiant refusal of Breivik’s hate-fueled politics of racial purity.  This community response took place in a public square close to the courthouse in which Breivik was being tried, and some participants spoke of their hope that he could hear their response.  The larger point, though, was to reaffirm the values of peace and love that the song represents, to reaffirm the community’s commitment to each other in the face of efforts to divide them and distance them from their values.

b. Building Social Solidarity against Neo-liberalism

While the Norwegian example demonstrates the expression of shared existing values, music also has considerable constructive power.  It can bind a community or movement which is in the process of being built to the values or ideals that are inspiring the emergent community, a dialectical performance of communities and commitments through music.  One such example is the 2012 student protest movement in the Canadian province of Quebec.  The student protests began in March as demonstrations against an announced hike in tuition fees at the public universities and colleges, an increase of 75% to be phased in over five years, that would have brought Quebec’s historically much lower tuitions into line with those paid by students in the rest of Canada.  This harmonization attempt, apparently reasonable in the eyes of many observers, struck members and representatives of Quebec’s student unions as a violation of the social contract governing the province and a direct assault on their stated goal of low-cost—preferably tuition-free—and accessible post-secondary education.  Students at some Montreal institutions refused to attend classes, going on strike to demand a rollback of the announced increases.  They began marching in the streets, wearing and displaying in apartment windows or on apartment balconies the sign of the protest, the carré rouge (a red square, usually of felt or wool).

They also began making “music,” a discordant but coordinated noise-making that was adapted from Chilean protests against the Pinochet dictatorship.  Every evening at 8pm, people were invited to go out on their balconies and bang pots and pans in a display that was dubbed les casseroles.  The purpose of the noise-making in Chilean protests had been to signal that the population was refusing to live in fear of the dictatorship, but in Quebec the point was to assert membership in the community of those who believe that accessible education is a crucial foundation of social egalitarianism.  Participation in les casseroles was not limited to protesting students; ordinary citizens took part also as a way of demonstrating their solidarity with the student groups in defending Quebec’s noticeably left-wing social consensus.  This sustained protest resulted in an electoral defeat for the premier of the province in September, the historic election of the province’s first female leader, and her announcement that the new government would cancel plans to hike tuition.

c. Confrontations with Authoritarian Regimes

Even when there is no existing or emergent solidarity, there is still a role for music in social protests.  For some time, Russian society has been treated to various improvised musical protests against Vladimir Putin’s extra-democratic election triumphs by an all-female punk band known as “Pussy Riot.”  These young women performed in masks and mini-dresses at politically-inflected sites in Moscow, and recently faced arrest and a high-profile trial for their performances.  They persisted, despite initial warnings, because they have a point to make about the threat to democracy that the Putin oligarchy represents.  Most recently they have been in prison for five months and have been sentenced to a two-year-long prison term in a labor camp as the result of a number of impromptu performances in Moscow, in early spring 2012.  During one such performance, they took over a rooftop in Red Square opposite a prison where dissidents are incarcerated (BBC America, GMT, 28 February 2012).  The most controversial, and the one that has most clearly motivated the charges of “hooliganism,” was a performance in a revered Orthodox church, where they stormed the altar and sang a “punk prayer” that called upon the Virgin Mary to assert herself as a feminist icon and save the nation from Putin.  The incarceration they face for their performances has inspired solidarity protests outside Russian embassies in other countries, and seems to have rattled the oligarchy to the point that Putin himself called for leniency in sentencing on the very charges he insisted be brought against them.  His public call for mercy is widely seen as political theater, however, and the harshness of their sentence is seen by some commentators on Russian public opinion as a possible spur to building a more outspoken opposition to his rule.

3. Academic Attention to Music-Politics Links

For all of the time in which music has played an integral role in movements for social progress, it is only recently that academic theorizing has begun to take notice of these links.  The three major areas of attention to aesthetics-politics overlap are the discourse in social aesthetics (or relational aesthetics) in cultural studies, the broadly interdisciplinary area of improvisation theory, and the “Peace through Art” strand of peace studies.  Not all of the scholars working in these areas look primarily at questions of music, but valuable theoretical insights are being produced.

a. Social Aesthetics

Social aesthetics starts with a consideration of the extent to which one’s membership in community—that is, one’s social identity—shapes one’s approach to art-making and art appreciation.  This approach is exemplified by French sociologist Pierre Bourdieu’s critical rebuttal of Kantian aesthetics on the grounds that “taste” is not a universal trait which identifies a single standard of artistic merit but is instead indexed to one’s class position.  Bourdieu offers a detailed, fine-grained argument for this hypothesis in his 1984 book Distinction, which discusses the results of surveys of respondents from a cross-section of social classes in France of the 1970s.  Contrasting working class, bourgeois, and elite preferences in entertaining, decorating, leisure activities, music, and film, Bourdieu argues that what we find beautiful is indeed demonstrably shaped by our class positions and trajectories.  This reveals aesthetic preferences as socially-inflected, hence political, regardless of how natural they might seem to their bearers.  The net effect of Bourdieu’s intervention is repudiation of a universalist aesthetic hierarchy in which the cultural preferences of the elite class are judged as better than those of the working class, in favor of a relativist indexing of artistic productions to class positions.

While much of the research into musical tastes that explicitly engages the notion of class is being done in the European context, it is not hard to see how this discourse asserts itself in American accounts of taste.  The concepts of “highbrow” music—Western art music, or “classical”—and “lowbrow” music—popular, mass-marketed productions, from jazz in the 1930s to rock in the 1950s through 1980s and, most recently, hip-hop—link tastes to education and income levels, which appear in the American lexicon as stand-ins for the concept of class.  Understanding this linguistic translation makes it possible for us to employ a social aesthetics reading of some of the claims in the history of American musical production that otherwise seem unmotivated.  In particular, John Coltrane’s rejection of the label “jazz” for his music, and his preference for labeling jazz “America’s classical music” can, through this lens, be interpreted as a contestation of the class position to which jazz musicians and their art-making had be relegated.  This contestation does not achieve the relativism of Bourdieu’s inventory, but it does underscore the connection between social identity, or community membership, and aesthetic taste.

b. Improvisation Theory

While much of the work in social aesthetics/relational aesthetics is taking place in the discipline of cultural studies, improvisation theory is asserting itself as a self-consciously interdisciplinary endeavor.  It draws together musicians, musicologists, philosophers, historians, and cultural theorists, among others, to consider questions of how and why improvisation as both a musical and social practice contributes to social organization overall.

Another developing area is the ethics of improvisation.  Tracey Nicholls argues that the examination and adoption of the norms and values that flourish in communities of improvising musicians—those who improvise in the “free jazz” tradition, in particular—can help us to build more responsive, more democratic political societies.  To be part of an improvising ensemble demands an openness to others, a willingness to listen carefully, closely, and charitably, and to respond in constructive ways that advance the musical “conversation.”  This requires capacities for self-trust and respect for others on the part of every participant.  The payoff is an expanded ability to engage difference creatively, instead of through an attitude of fear and hostility, and this in turn leads to a greater ability to deal with the complexity of a fast paced, globalized world.  The ideal actor, in both musical improvisation and the sphere of grassroots popular political action, is the figure Cornel West dubs “the jazz freedom fighter”—an individual who pits his or her creative vision and talents against other members of a group in a way that is both competitive and collaborative.  As West puts it, “individuality is promoted in order to sustain and increase the creative tension with the group—a tension that yields higher levels of performance to achieve the aim of the collective project” (italics in original, 150-151).  In developing our capacities for openness to difference and living with risk (that, for instance, our attempts to negotiate and communicate might fail), this ethics of improvisation grounds subsidiary virtues that are not otherwise encouraged by our social status quo (a way of thinking that teaches us to refrain from taking chances if failure is a live option). Virtues like generosity towards others, willingness to support their risk-taking and their struggles to find creative ways out of impasses, commitment to an enhanced capacity to forgive the mis-steps that inevitably happen in these struggles, and greater respect for the ability to integrate, adopt, or even switch between different perspectives and different types of tools are also encouraged.  This is not to suggest that we should dispense with planning but, given that our best-laid plans may fail, there is an enormous value to developing our individual capacities for improvisatory action.  In this way, improvisation in music points the way to more resilient and more just societies.

c. Peace through Art

Peace through Art, in particular, social transformation effected through music, is an approach to music and social justice that shares  with improvisation theory its inter-disciplinarity.  One of the theorizers and practitioners of peace-building who not only takes seriously the role of art and music, but also seeks to advance our understanding of it, is John Paul Lederach whose peace-building work focuses on conflict transformation through social healing—in particular, the question of “how sonic phenomena might be applied to contexts of social change” (90).  Lederach’s work with fractured communities emphasizes the restoration of voice, a concept he finds particularly resonant with people who are struggling to repair their violent communities (110, 89).  What “voice”—understood both as the individual regaining his or her voice, and the community engaging in meaningful conversation (Lederach 109)—requires is “a container or space within which people [feel] safe but [are] also close enough to hear and receive the echo of each other’s voices” (Lederach 89).

The particular metaphor Lederach favors in his representations of peace processes is one that brings together voice and container: the Tibetan singing bowl.  He observes that social healing, like musical resonance, “does not arise from the individual.  It emerges from the interaction of many vibrations, individual and collective, held within a community context.  In other words, social healing and reconciliation emerge in and around the container that holds collective processes” (Lederach 101).  Elaborating on the bowl metaphor, Lederach points to some of the distinguishing characteristics of the multi-directionality that the bowl shares with sound (94).  The first is circular movement: “[g]oing in circles and repeating them over and again is not,” he insists, “… a movement of going nowhere,” but has instead “a ritualistic quality … creating a certain kind of space and moment” (Lederach 94).  The second is the container itself: “the bowl creates the space or location from which the sound is coaxed and held, but in terms of movement the sensation is one of going deep, made possible by the circling” (Lederach 94).  “Deepening becomes a directional focus of the container,” says Lederach (94). The third directional characteristic that makes the bowl a compelling metaphor is rising: “[s]ound not only seems to rise from the bowl,” he explains; “it expands, moves out, touches and surrounds the space within its reach.  Sound moves in all directions…. sound is multi-directional and non-linear in its movement” and offers the experience of “feelings of being touched and held” (Lederach 94).

Circling, deepening, and rising are all aspects of percussion that make instruments like drums and the singing bowl often function as “the heartbeat” of musical performances.  They are also important aspects of the genuine, voluntary, non-imposed community reconciliation that Lederach prefers to discuss as “conflict transformation.”  Going around, repeating over and over, is a way of gathering grassroots support within a community; each time an outreach effort is made, space is created for community members who had previously not been involved to join the movement.  The descending movement can be understood as a way of describing the process of developing, through a repetition that may well become ritualized, an emotional loyalty to something that starts out as a social commitment—internalizing the peace-building ambition.  And the rising movement can similarly be understood as the inexorable pressure that a fully committed, mobilized grassroots community can exert on a wider population—regional, national, or international—a bending of the discourse to the demands of the grassroots in the same way that the expanding, enveloping musical note arising from the bowl captures the attention of people in the audience who may not have been giving the performance their full attention.

4. References and Further Reading

  • Attali, Jacques. Noise: The Political Economy of Music. Trans. Brian Massumi. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1985.
    • A history of the interplay of music and political life.
  • Baraka, Amiri [Leroi Jones].  Blues People: Negro Music in White America.  New York: Quill/William Morrow, 1999 [1963].
    • A classic text in African-American cultural studies.
  • BBC America.  GMT.  28 February 2012.
    • A television report on Pussy Riot performances.
  • Born, Georgina and David Hesmondhalgh.  Western Music and Its Others: Difference, Representation, and Appropriation in Music.  Berkeley: University of California Press, 2000.
    • A collection of essays on difference and culture-crossing in global musical exchanges.
  • Bourdieu, Pierre.  Distinction: A Social Critique of the Judgement of Taste.  Trans. Richard Nice.  Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1984.
    • A sociological rebuttal of philosophy of art that identifies an attitude of disinterest as the mark of aesthetic appreciation.
  • “Breivik trial: Norwegians rally around peace song.”  BBC News.  26 April 2012.
    • A news report about people’s responses to the trial.
  • Clibbon, Jennifer.  “How a student uprising is reshaping Quebec.”  CBC News.  29 May 2012.
    • An interview with three cultural commentators on the historical context and current significance.
  • Daley, Mike.  “Land of the free.  Jimi Hendrix: Woodstock Festival, August 18, 1969.”  Performance and Popular Music: History, Place and Time.  Ed. Ian Inglis.  Hampshire UK: Ashgate, 2006.  52-57.
    • An essay on how this iconic performance shaped the development of popular music.
  • Gates, Jr., Henry Louis.  The Signifying Monkey: A Theory of African-American Literary Criticism.  New York: Oxford UP, 1988.
    • A scholarly survey of the culturally-distinct communicative practices shaping African-American artistic production.
  • Kofsky, Frank.  Black Nationalism and the Revolution in Music.  New York: Pathfinder, 1970.
    • A history of the free jazz movement of the 1960s and its socio-political commitments.
  • Lederach, John Paul and Angela Jill Lederach.  When Blood and Bones Cry Out: Journeys through the Soundscape of Healing and Reconciliation.  New York: Oxford University Press, 2010.
    • An account of peace-building in conflict zones through local musical traditions.
  • Margolick, David.  “Strange Fruit.”  Vanity Fair Magazine, September 1998.
    • A journalistic account of the history of the Billie Holliday song.
  • Monson, Ingrid.  Saying Something: Jazz Improvisation and Interaction.  Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1996.
    • A musician and music theorist’s account of the transformative effects of music.
  • “Moscou: les trois Pussy Riot condamnées à deux ans de prison chacune.”  métro.  17 August 2012.
    • An Associated Press story in a Montréal free daily newspaper.
  • Murray, Albert.  Stomping The Blues.  Cambridge MA: Da Capo Press, 1976.
    • An analysis of the aesthetic merits of jazz and blues music on their own terms.
  • Nicholls, Tracey.  An Ethics of Improvisation: Aesthetic Possibilities for a Political Future.  Lanham MD: Lexington, 2012.
    • An argument for the transferability of norms shaping improvising musicians’ communities to political communities, and their transformative possibilities.
  • Pratt, Ray.  Rhythm and Resistance: Explorations in the Political Uses of Popular Music.  New York: Praeger, 1990.
    • A study of the political uses of popular music by marginalized communities.
  • Rose, Tricia.  Black Noise: Rap Music and Black Culture in Contemporary America.  Middletown CT: Wesleyan University Press, 1994.
    • An exploration of the history, aesthetics, and political commitments of hip-hop culture, with an emphasis on its musical production.
  • “Strange Fruit.”  Independent Lens.
    • A Public Broadcasting System (PBS) documentary exploring the origins and impact of Billie Holiday’s most famous song.
  • Yéle Haiti Foundation, 2006.
    • The grassroots social rebuilding movement organized by Haitian-American rapper Wyclef Jean.


Author Information

Tracey Nicholls
Massey University
U. S. A.