Nicholas of Cusa (1401—1464)
In the 21st century, Nicholas of Cusa or Cusanus is variously appreciated as a Christian disciple of the burgeoning Italian humanism of the 15th century, one of the great mystical theologians and reforming bishops of the late Middle Ages, and a dialogical religious thinker whose philosophical and political ideas peacefully contemplate the unity of old wisdom and new, Christian and Muslim religious aspirations, and even the differences between cultures and nations. As a humanist, he praised the plainspoken delivery of the idiota or lay philosopher more than the excessive eloquence or vast erudition of the well-trained scholar. Nicholas of Cusa retrieved the idea of the limits of human knowing not just as a finite end but as a path of inquiry centered on the infinite. The seeker of wisdom who follows Cusanus’s path to wisdom needs to tread that itinerary anew every day. Cusanus combined conjectural knowing with a new synthesis of the immanence of the Absolute in the world and dared to think about the relationship between God and the world in terms of a logic of the coincidence of opposites. He creatively investigated the analogy between a God who creates the world with beauty and the artisanship of the human mind. This process of searching for analogies between the inexpressible Absolute and a world that can be represented and investigated on a map yielded new insights into art, language, and even creation itself.
Cusanus was not considered as a significant thinker in the history of Western thought until the late 18th and early 19th centuries. His entrance onto the stage of modern thought is itself revealing. In the 19th century, German philosophers rediscovered Cusanas’s conjectures on infinite worlds, perspectival knowing, and the scientific method. Later Neo-Kantians such as Hermann Cohen and Ernst Cassirer popularized the idea that Cusanus was a Neoplatonic forerunner of the modern, scientific worldview, and his reputation as a modern German speculative giant began to grow. In 1932 Heidelberg, however, the erudite Jewish scholar Raymond Klibansky started a critical edition of Cusanas’s works partly to challenge the myth of a modern Cusanus by documenting amply the ancient and medieval inheritances. Klibansky’s groundbreaking initiative, which soon moved to Oxford and then Canada due to the Nazi persecution of Jews, would not be completed until the first decade of the 21st century, by which point it included the editing of all of the sermons as well. This massive and long-awaited effort has changed the face of studies of Cusanus permanently. Now scholars of multiple disciplines and philosophers of highly diverse schools of thought can read the complete works and evaluate them in their entirety.
Table of Contents
- Life and Works
- The Catholic Concordance
- Learned Ignorance
- God and the World: Cosmology in Perspective
- Imago Dei: The Human Person and the Artistic Image
- Metaphor and Transcendence in the Late Works
- References and Further Reading
He came from the town of Kues on the Moselle River and was born with the name Nikolaus Cryfftz (or Krebs, in German). He received the Latin name of “Cusanus,” which means “the one from Kues.” His background was neither that of the upper class nor of the lower class since his father “was a moderately well-to-do boatman and vineyard owner who served on juries and lent money to local nobility” (Sigmund xi). He excelled in learning and was sent first to Heidelberg for one year before obtaining a doctorate in canon law in Padua in 1423. There in Padua he made contacts with humanists. Contemporary artistic developments in any case attracted his attention, including the prose works of Petrarch and Leon Battista Alberti’s treatises on art. After a few years of study (and perhaps teaching), in Cologne in the early 1430s, he began to preach with a passion for love of God that he attributed to the Italian reformer Bernardino of Siena. His ordination to the priesthood took place at some point in the 1430s and is one of the few acts in his adult life that is not well documented.
Cusanus did not have the typical formation or career of a medieval philosopher. His legal, administrative, and evangelizing work for the Church was his central occupation, but he obviously found time to write and disseminate philosophy outside of the schools. He was a Roman Cardinal and Papal Legate whose historical memory and legal acumen were highly praised, and he is said to have retained an extraordinary recall of the acts of Church Councils. He twice turned down an offer to assume a position in Canon Law at the university that was formed in Louvain in 1425. His learning was formed by contacts he made at the Council of Basel, in the Roman curia, and in his travels through Italy, Germany, and the Low Countries. Other humanists admired him, in part, because he discovered lost manuscripts, such as twelve previously unknown comedies of Plautus. His reputation grew among humanists, and this renown gave him a new point of entry for professional and ecclesiastical success. He also acquired and assiduously annotated what is thought to be the most impressive book collection of his day. For this reason, Rudolf Haubst coined the label “a doorkeeper of a new age (1988).” Cusanus gathered an impressive collection of manuscripts of ancient wisdom and “deposited” them at a point of transition between worldviews that later thinkers would come to identify as the threshold to modernity. Steeped in medieval sources, Cusanus himself could barely have witnessed the birth of a modern world, but his European commentators in the first half of the 20thcentury nevertheless began to write about him almost exclusively through that lens.
His first major philosophical work, On Learned Ignorance, appeared in 1440 and was on the basis of the study of ancient humanist manuscripts as well as the Biblical ideas he had begun to expound in his preaching.
Opening page of On Learned Ignorance
in Codex Cusanus 218
For Cusanus, the communication of the Word of God in the Church and the sharing of philosophical wisdom were intertwined tasks. In this sense, his works mirror his practically oriented life even though the speculative discourse in the former probably went far beyond the grasp of many of the parishioners and clergy with whom he interacted on a daily basis.
His later works contain highly creative forays into mystical theology and even more daring reflections on the utter incomprehensibility of the idea of God. He generally, but not always, avoided sharp polemics, favoring irenic treatises even as fierce battles raged around him. For example, his most important work in interreligious understanding, On the Peace of Faith (1453), was written as the Muslim Turks took possession of the imperial city of Constantinople and turned the Hagia Sofia into a mosque. Likewise, he spent the years 1457-1458 trapped in a remote castle in Andraz because his reform efforts led the nuns in Sonnenberg to convince the Archduke Sigismund to send an army to his bishopric in Brixen. In seclusion, and awaiting a papal army to free him, Cusanus managed to contemplate ultimate realities and compose at least one major philosophical treatise, On the Beryl.
- De Docta ignorantia (On Learned Ignorance, 1440).
- De coniecturis (On Conjectures, 1441-2).
- De quaerendo Deum (On Seeking God, 1445).
- De filiatione Dei (On Divine Sonship, 1445).
- De dato patris luminum (On the Gift of the Father of Lights, 1445/6).
- De Deo abscondito (On the Hidden God, 1444/5).
- De genesi (On Genesis, 1447).
- Apologia doctae ignorantiae (The Defense of Learned Ignorance, 1449), a response to charges of heresy and pantheism by the Heidelberg scholastic theologian John Wenck in a work entitled De ignota litteratura (On Unknown Learning, 1442-3).
- Idiota de mente (The Layman on Mind, 1450).
- Idiota de sapientia (The Layman on Wisdom, 1450).
- Idiota de staticis experimentis (The Layman on Experiments done with Weight-Scales, 1450).
- De visione Dei (On the Vision of God, 1453).
- De mathematicis complementis (On Complementary Mathematical Considerations, 1453, a second book was added in 1454).
- De theologicis complementis (Complementary theological considerations, 1453), in which he pursued his continuing fascination with theological applications of mathematical models.
- Caesarea circuli quadratura (The imperial squaring of the circle, 1457).
- De beryllo (On the Beryl, 1458), a treatise using a beryl or transparent stone as the crucial symbol.
- De aequalitate (On Equality, 1459).
- De principio (On the Beginning, 1459).
- De possest (On the Actual Existence of Possibility, 1460).
- De non aliud (On the Not-Other, 1462).
- De venatione sapientiae (On the Hunt for Wisdom, 1462).
- De ludo globi (The Bowling-Game, 1463).
- Compendium (Compendium, 1463).
- Epistola ad religiosum Nicolaum, novitium Montisoliveti (Letter to the religious Nicholas, novice of the Abbey of Mount Oliveto, 1463).
- De apice theoriae (On the Summit of Contemplation, 1464).
Except in the case of The Catholic Concordance (translated by Paul Sigmund) and where otherwise noted, the citations below of the works of Cusanus are taken from the translations of Jasper Hopkins. The paragraph numbers from the critical edition are, where possible, adopted in the English translations and are usually indicated below with the abbreviation “N.”
What style of philosophy did Cusanus adopt? His works do not follow the quaestio method of medieval Scholasticism, which favored a juxtaposition of rival arguments in a fixed classificatory scheme. He often employs a form of dialogue, albeit one that differs considerably from the more eloquent humanist dialogue of the 15th century. Some pieces are written in response to questions from friends who were seeking guidance about the practice of the contemplative life. In general, Cusanus experiments with new genres while avoiding the humanist absorption into the taxonomy or learned examination of genres. Above all, he was interested in exploring ways to communicate Christian wisdom that could be made easily accessible to a variety of listeners. In 1450, for example, he composed three books attributed to a Christian layman. These works signaled an approach to learning that engages the wisdom found outside of the standard contexts of learning.
All of his philosophical works were written between 1440 and 1464. Jacques Lefèvre d’Étaples, a Renaissance humanist, prepared a print edition of some works in 1514, but the critical edition prepared by the Heidelberg Academy of Sciences contains not only all the philosophical and theological works but the sermons as well. These works are preserved in Latin except for Sermon 24, which is a philosophical meditation on The Lord’s Prayer that was originally written in the Mosel-Franconian dialect. Nancy Hudson and Frank Tobin prepared an English translation and commentary on this text (Casarella 2006, 1-25).
The Cusanus-Portal (http://www.cusanus-portal.de/) has made available all of the texts in their edited form, several translations, and glossaries. Jasper Hopkins, Professor Emeritus of Philosophy at the University of Minnesota, has translated all of the philosophical works and a good number of the sermons into English. The American Cusanus Society (http://www.americancusanussociety.org/) also maintains valuable resources about recent publications, bibliographies, and upcoming conferences. The society’s Newsletter, which is published annually on the website, contains book reviews, recent conference presentations, and original articles about Cusanus and related topics.
In Cusanus’s time, Archbishops in places like Cusanus’s native diocese of Trier, Germany wielded temporal power. With the death of the local Archbishop in 1430, a local nobleman named Ulrich von Manderscheid made a claim on the archbishopric and in 1431 hired Nicholas of Cusa to represent him and his claim at the Council of Basel. In 1432, Cusanus became incorporated as a member of the Council, which was caught in a bitter dispute with the Pope about the relative authority of the Pope over the Church Council. Soon, Cusanus was more than just an attorney in a case about the political leadership in the Rhine and Moselle valleys. His learning and acumen gained him equal respect on questions of faith and doctrine and placed him at the center of the most pressing theological debates in the Catholic Church of his day. Accordingly, during the year 1433 Cusanus composed a treatise entitled On the Catholic Concordance (De concordantia catholica). He later wrote significant legal briefs on political and ecclesiastical matters, but this early work is his major contribution to both the idea of the Church and political theory.
This treatise reflects the raging polarizations in Basel between the majority of delegates, who favored the authority of the Council over the Pope, and the minority who favored a more pro-Papal line. In the treatise, Cusanus clearly represents conciliarist thinking. A few years after the dissolution of the Council, he sided with the hardened position of the decidedly anti-conciliarist Pope Eugene IV. The motives for this switch are debated by scholars. The treatise offers a window to the early development of a philosophically inclined and speculative mind grappling with key ideas about the Church and politics. This exposition will be limited to two of the more central and widely discussed ones: consent and harmony (concordantia).
Nicholas develops his theory of consent in The Catholic Concordance, Book II, 8-15. In speaking about the Church, Cusanus does not assume, as one might, that the views of the consenting bishops must be represented in the form of a vote. Voting is just one form of consent in the Church. On the other hand, the third book on the Holy Roman Empire was written in response to the visit of the Emperor Sigismund to the Council of Basel. In it, Cusanus tried to argue for a political reform of the empire that might mirror the ecclesial reform developed in the first two books. In Book III, 37, for example, Cusanus draws inspiration from the Mallorcan thinker Ramon Llull and adopts a system of preferential voting by which the prince electors can elect a Holy Roman Emperor. By comparison, the concept of consent within the Church in the second book is more abstract and sacramental. Cusanus notes that ecclesial consent can be both explicit and tacit. He places a great deal of weight on the force of custom. Yet the novelty regarding a reform of the Church based upon the doctrine of consent is striking. The Pope, he says, does not depend upon the Council; nevertheless, “even in the decision on matters of faith which belongs to him by virtue of his primacy he is under the council of the Catholic Church” (I, 15, no. 61). Furthermore, Cusanus allows for this consensual principle of Church governance to have more far-reaching consequences when he writes:
Since all are by nature free, every governance—whether it consists in a written law or living law in the person of a prince…can only come from the agreement and consent of the subjects. For if men are by nature equal in power and equally free, the true properly ordered authority of one common rule who is their equal in power can only be constituted by the election and consent of the others, and law is also established by consent (II, 14, no. 127).
In the previous medieval tradition the appeal to natural freedom as the basis for participation in governance was not widely held. In this sense, Cusanus may not be the explicit harbinger of modern constitutionalism as some have claimed, but he is certainly opening the door to a relatively unknown and democratically oriented form of thinking about political representation.
The doctrine of harmony in The Catholic Concordance is one that emanates from doctrinal authority, institutional and sacramental presence, and legal jurisdiction of the Church. As Jovino Miroy has argued, there are still glimpses here of the explicitly philosophical notion of harmony that unfolds in Cusanus’s later works. The later works opt explicitly for a dialogical harmony that seeks to encompass seeming contradictions about God and the world in an ordered whole. The basic notion in The Catholic Concordance is that there cannot be discord in God. As such, the world is an image of a harmony that finds its supreme expression in the Triune conception of God, that is, of God as one nature in three persons (Father, Son, and Holy Spirit). Cusanus seeks to explicate this notion not only as a religious precept but a metaphysical truth (Miroy 90-93). Concordance as an image of divine harmony is traceable in the world as a harmony of differences. Cusanus is too experienced as a lawyer to assume naively that all visible concordances lead immediately to actual peace, but he is committed in both theory and practice to the novel idea that the faith-laden gift of eliciting harmony out of real differences also reveals a more transparent image of God in the world.
In 1440, Cusanus finished his programmatic work On Learned Ignorance (De docta ignorantia). Cusanus introduces the notion of learned ignorance by reworking the ancient idea that “there is present in all things a natural desire to exist in the best manner in which the condition of each thing’s nature permits this (I,1, N.2).” His program for renewal resembles a largely forgotten Neo-Pythagorean tradition (ibid.). As such he compares the “natural desire to exist in the best manner” with the search for first principles in mathematics. He likens human knowing to searching for comparative relations in mathematical knowledge. When the object of our perception can be apprehended by means of a close proportional tracing to what one knows, then through our judgment we apprehend easily. Otherwise, we need to proceed from later propositions back to earlier ones until we reach the first principles. Here, he says, hard work is required in order to attain certainty (ibid.).
Nicholas states: “Since the desire in us is not in vain, assuredly we desire to know what we do not know (I, 1, N.4).” Drawing upon an attestation in multiple religious traditions and in the early Italian humanist re-appropriation of the model of Socrates found in the dialogues of Plato, Cusanus defines learned ignorance as a state where no greater knowledge can be attained (ibid.). Haubst comments upon the distinctiveness of Cusanus’s path to learned ignorance by means of the ancient dictum that all individuals have by nature a desire to know. Haubst then claims that Cusanus, by contrast with the ancients, never delimits the natural desire of a human being to use his natural powers to recognize or attain knowledge (1991, 66). Cusanus posits an insatiable and limitless desire in the human being that shows the presence of a gift in the order of things. In De Deo abscondito (1444), the pagan interlocutor says that the desire to be in the truth is what has drawn the Christian into worship (N. 6). The Christian agrees, saying that an orientation to the God who is ineffable truth draws him to worship. For Cusanus, there is no fixed measure or perfection or maximum that the human being holds in his or her possession (von Bredow, 69). Learned ignorance opens up a dynamic path of being and knowing for the individual and, in a certain way, for the spirit. This is not, as some have claimed, a slippery slope to the modern conflation of the dynamic, human spirit with the divine one (von Balthasar, 209). For Cusanus, the absoluteness of the difference is always held in view.
At the end of his life, Nicholas returned to the theme of learned ignorance to underscore its novelty. In De venatione sapientiae (1462-63), he first exclaims: Mira res! (“How wondrous a thing!”). He then states that the natural desire of the intellect to know God’s Quiddity is not innate to it:
Rather, [what is innate is its desire] to know that its God is so great that there is no end of his Greatness. Hence, he is greater than everything conceived and knowable (De venatione sapientiae, ch. 12, N. 32.).
This passage highlights the theocentric radicalism of Cusanus’s understanding of desiderium naturale. His Neoplatonism colors his Christian philosophy without overtaking it. In other words, the wondrous incomprehensibility of God—rather than the limited endowments of the human mind—is what he takes to be the much needed new starting point. A middle work confirms this trajectory. Cusanus in chapter 16 of De visione Dei (1453) states that “unless God were infinite, he would not be the end of desire.” Although his thinking about natural desire arises in the context of what he himself labels an Aristotelian commonplace, it has been suggested by Sophie Berman that his theory of desire here effectively reverses the Aristotelian supposition that a divine being is incompatible with infinity (De visione Dei, ch. 16). By virtue of this pious desire for a reversal of the philosophical tradition, Cusanus embeds a new tradition of thinking about intellectual desire within a richly dynamic theory of the movement of the intellectual spirit (motus desideriosus). This new invention is neither the standard Aristotelianism nor a standard anti-Aristotelian Augustinianism.
In De Docta ignorantia, Cusanus introduces his theory of divine names through the similitude of an infinite sphere. The complete actuality of the sphere is the maximal center that precedes all width, length, and breadth and is also the End and the Middle of these and all other lines. All beings tend toward God but not as an end, like the last stop of a bus or train. The movement of the infinite sphere is the dynamic image of God as “the End of motion, viz., the Form and Actuality of being,” and, likewise, the cessation of motion. Names befit the Maximum according to a similar process of entering into the divine motion and simultaneously being stilled within the same actuality. No name is expunged by the infinitude of divine actuality. Each contributes signification in a manner like the multivalent being of a line within the Cusan infinite sphere. Nor can any discursively posited name stay apace with the motionless motion of the divine source. Names thus hover between perspectival knowing and the Absolute.
In the treatment of affirmative theology in Bk. I, ch. 24, Cusanus symbolizes the divine actuality with the names “Oneness,” “tetragrammaton,” and “Maximum.” The true name can be only that which is signified by the absolute name. Affirmative theology is not thereby relativized. Even if affirmative names befit God only infinitesimally, they do so in relation to created things. In this way, Cusanus deliberately connects his positive theory of naming to an analogical metaphysics of created reality. He maintains that the pagans named God in various ways in relation to created things, allowing the young Cusanus another opportunity to brandish his humanist credentials (I, 25, N. 83-84).
Worship is tied to this upward movement from created things to the infinitely nameable Maximum. At the summit of this contemplative ascent is the ineffable one, spoken of more truly through removal and negation. The lesson regarding this path is re-named from “learned ignorance” to “sacred ignorance (I, 26, N. 87).” Cusanus is still maintaining with Pseudo-Dionysius that names for God cannot by themselves point to the Absolute, but he also believes that the way of negation makes the revelation of the Triune God even more perfect and worthy of silent, liturgical praise. Certain hierarchical realities in creation–the superiority of intelligence over a stone or virtue over drunkenness, for example–are made more evident through removal and negation (I, 26, N. 85). So, when Cusanus concludes his treatment of divine names by stating that, in the end, “precise truth shines within the darkness of our ignorance,” he is illuminating a path to knowing and revering the incomprehensibly good and self-diffusively good God.
In the late tetralogue De li non aliud (1462), Cusanus shows an even greater debt to ancient Neoplatonic authorities on unknowing the Absolute. Here, he is particularly indebted to the metaphysics of negation in Proclus and Pseudo-Dionysius. “Not-other” (non aliud) is introduced as more than another neologism for the ineffable God. It is a phrase adapted from a new reading of the second and third books of the Latin text of Proclus’ Theologia platonis that defines definition itself. For example, in commenting on the divine names “being,” “truth,” and “goodness,” Cusanus tells his Aristotelian interlocutor that “Not-other” is not other than any of these. The “not-other” is “seen to be before these (and other) things in such a way that they are not subsequent to it but exist through it (De li non aliud, ch. 4, N. 14). While the whole schema is noteworthy for its originality, D’Amico is among those who have investigated the heavy dependence on Proclus throughout this writing. This dialectical understanding of the world as an exemplar of the Absolute reconfigures both the “what” and the “how” of naming God. Scholastic theology had already distinguished between the mode of signifying and the thing being signified, but Cusanus is making a much bolder claim. The defining character of the new signifier is the even more fervent abjuring of any middle position between affirmation and negation. The immanence of “the not-other” comes into thought based on its appearance through the non-material “sight” of the intellect (visio intellectualis), namely, through its refraction in all other possible signifiers, including the transcendentals of being, truth, and goodness.
The second book of DDI develops a theological cosmology of the creative presence of the unnameable Absolute. At the center of this book, Cusanus elaborates on the world as a contraction of the Absolute maximum and states that the world is the unfolding of that which is enfolded in the Absolute Maximum. This pairing of complicatio (enfolding) and explicatio (unfolding) is not original to Cusanus, but it is made a hallmark of his new understanding of the world. In order to foreground the newness of his conception of the world, Cusanus states at the outset of DDI II, 11: “Now that learned ignorance has shown these previously unheard of [doctrines] (ista prius inaudita) to be true, perhaps there will be amazement on the part of those who read them.” Scholars today are divided as to whether the inaudita refers backward or forward in the second book. If backward, then Cusanus is marveling on amended speculative insights drawn from Boethius, Thierry of Chartres, and Augustine on the trinity of the universe in DDI, II, 7-10. Certain key features of Cusanus’s cosmology in these sections stem from the Boethian-Chartrian heritage revived in the 15th century: the triad of unitas, equalitas, and conexio, Thierry’s four modes of being and trinity of perpetuals, and the Trinitarian attribution of “exemplar” and “form of forms” to the divine Word (Albertson 2010, 388). To complicate matters further, this section of the text is almost identical to an anonymous 15th century treatise Fundamentum Naturae and may have been plagiarized from it. If inaudita refers to what comes afterwards, as Jasper Hopkins has argued, then the “previously unheard of” doctrines include the idea that the earth is not the center of the universe but “a noble star (II, 12, N. 166).” Following that clue, DDI II, 12 indicates that Cusanus hypothesizes the relativity of the earth as a strictly theological postulate: “Blessed God created all things in such way that when each thing desires to conserve its own existence as a divine work, it conserves it in communion with others (II, 12, N. 166).” Regine Kather has argued that Cusanus’s radical transformation of the Ptolemaic universe bears more in common with Einstein’s denial of any universal center than with the heliocentrism revolutionized by Copernicus and completed by Galileo. Either way, there is both genuine novelty and a conscious recovery of a distinguished literary heritage in Cusanus’s theological cosmology.
De genesi (1447) is a philosophical meditation on the act of creation as such. Biblical texts and even the figure of Moses are mentioned, but the rhetorical appeal lies in the application of Cusanus’s religious cosmology by means of an invented neologism to the question of what distinguishes the Christian apprehension of created reality. The dialogue deals with the genesis of all things, “which are so different and so opposed,” out of the Same (I, N. 143). The metaphysics of the Same does anything but erase worldly difference. Cusanus is claiming that only Absolute Sameness could produce a world of difference because the Sameness of the same is so radically other than the differences that define the world of measurement and finite proportionality. The Absolute Same exists at the point of coincidence with “the Unattainability” that begets a world in which things can be judged to be the same and different (I, N. 151). Cusanus uses a rich variety of artistic and linguistic metaphors to demonstrate how “the unattainable Same shines forth brightly in the countless multitude of all attainable things (II, N. 154).”
Cusanus sees the human person as a Deus humanatus (De dato patris luminum, N. 102). Jasper Hopkins renders this as “a God manqué.” By that, he means that the human person is like God in all things except that of being God. In other words, human beings cannot be God but can image God in a human and living way. The humanists who surrounded Cusanus in Italy also played with this notion in their theology and in promoting the rise of a new appreciation of the arts. In fact, Cusanus approximates the “practice-oriented relativism” of the theorist of painting and architecture, Leon Battista Alberti, a thinker who had even called the artist “another God” (Harries 1990, 102). This historical connection seems like a reasonable hypothesis given that Cusanus and Alberti both studied in Padua in the same years although there is no recorded confirmation of their meeting in person. Cusanus also annotated Alberti’s writings on art.
In three writings from 1450, we see the full unfolding of this view of the human person and of art. The dialogue Idiota de mente (1450) is part of a trilogy that deals with the wisdom of the putatively unsophisticated lay philosopher and sheds light on the philosophical question of human creativity. The idiota, a model of lay wisdom, engages the professional philosopher on the question of the mind (mens) as a measure (mensura). The layman is portrayed in the dialogue as a handcraftsman. He is encountered by the philosopher while the former is busy carving a spoon. A wooden spoon in the Italian context signifies homegrown sapientia. So, the dialogue commences with a discussion of “the form-of-spoonness, through which a spoon is constituted a spoon (ch. 2, N. 63).” In sum, the spoonmaker teaches the philosopher that there is a difference between the Peripatetic (Aristotelian) and Academic (Platonist) approach to attaining knowledge of spoonness. The spoonmaker opts for neither explanation but uses the image of spoon carving to suggest a third way of understanding the mind. If the Aristotelian approach represents the claim that knowledge of the exemplar is first gained through the perception of the sensory spoon, then the Platonist represents the opposite view, for example, that knowledge of the exemplar is the condition for the possibility of knowledge of the sensory perception. The layman fashions a humanistically inspired exemplarism whereby form remains infinite and ineffable, but the imposition of an arbitrarily imposed name (coclear, “spoon”) and the perception of an imperfectly carved wooden utensil both lend weight to the unified grasp of the living form (what the Renaissance theorist of art and architecture Leon Battista Alberti called la più grassa Minerva—putting a new emphasis on the visibility of form or “more crude, fatter” wisdom). In other words, forms are not revealed in either a static, ideal world or as already given, fully knowable empirical data; they are grasped not only in themselves but also in the act or self-manifestation of their own production. Arbitrarily, Cusanus pushes to, and perhaps, even beyond the limits of how Platonic and Aristotelian ideas of the mind were typically understood in his day.
The treatise is primarily philosophical but introduces theological topics in equally surprising ways. In Chapter two, Cusanus turns from the question of an inherently unknowable form to the problem of naming. There is naming in both the human and divine mind. This parallel again suggests to him a likeness to the “spoon” inasmuch as both the names we give to things and the craftsman’s artifact are created seemingly at will: “The wood receives a name from the advent of a form, so that when there arises the proportion in which spoonness shines forth, the wood is called by the name “spoon”; and so, in this way, the name is united to the form (Ch. 2, N. 64).” This comparison suggests, somewhat paradoxically, that there is both an arbitrary and a true dimension to a fitting name. Drawing upon his own creative theology of the divine Word that creates the world, Cusanus compares the layman’s dialogical presentation of a new theory of knowledge through the creation of names:
Therefore, there is one ineffable Word, which is the Precise Name of all things insofar as these things are captured by a name through the operation of reason. In its own manner this Ineffable Name shines forth in all [imposed] names. For it is the infinite nameability of all names and is the infinite vocalizability of everything expressible by means of voice, so that in this way every [imposed] name is an image of the Precise Name. (Ch. 2, N. 68).
The creativity of the divine Word is both a power from above, connected to the second person of the Trinity, and an absolute figure for the creative mind that seeks to know the right names of things. As such, reasoning to find the precise name of a thing, Cusanus discovers therein the mind’s capacity to “enfold” within itself the humanized but infinite power to seek and name the absolute in every discrete thing. The word “spoon” is therefore a perfectly fitting name based both upon social convention and the empirical experience of spoons and a quasi-divine cipher for an invisible human power to express the self in the world as a knower of the world.
This analogy of the Word recurs frequently in Cusanus. In the late work De Principio (“On the Beginning,” 1459), for example, he weaves together the ancient distinction between an inner and outer Word with Trinitarian and Biblical theology of the Word. In doing so, Cusanus makes some basic Neoplatonic points about the eternal, ineffable beginning (principium) that “precedes” all that begins. So, for example, the speech of the Word made flesh displays “that the eternal-form-of-Being speaks perceptibly in the things that, through it, exist in a perceptible way (N. 16).” “The Word” (verbum) can also signify “all intellect, which is either Creator-intellect or assimilator-intellect,” the former being the form of forms and the exemplar of all assimilable things that lends figure to them (N. 21, translation Casarella, Peter). In considering the narrative of creation in Genesis, the Word is the formless receptacle in which all things are present before being made (N. 23). Likewise, if one distinguishes between the world seen before its creation and as created, then the former comes to be as Word and the latter as created by the Word (N. 37). Finally, he ends his reflection by praising the “Word of the living God, through which Word all things exist (N. 40).” In sum, there is no comparable relationship between the Word as the absolute beginning of all things and the Word as utterance, as that which has been expressed as outward speech. The metaphor of speech grounds the otherwise mysterious disclosure of a new starting point for a metaphysics of the world as God’s creation. In the Protestant Reformation in the early sixteenth century, a strong emphasis on the theology of the Word as the basis of creation would also be affirmed, but often without such a robust and straightforward affirmation of the mysterious beauty of the glory of God made visible in the created order.
In 1453 Nicholas responded to a question posed by monks in Tegernsee (Austria) about the role of intellect in the contemplative life with a lengthy and highly metaphorical mystical treatise on the vision of God. Starting with this work and with increased intensity in the late 1450s and until his death, symbolic language and expressions begin to occupy a central place in his philosophical and theological works. In his speculative treatise of 1458 De Beryl he takes up the likeness between divine and human creativity and declares: Et haec est scientia aenigmatica (N. 7). Hopkins renders this as “Now, this knowledge [of the Divine Intellect] is symbolical knowledge (1998, 794).” In the late works, there is thus a repeated attempt to play with metaphors, grammar, visual images, and knowledge of the world and of God that is itself symbolical for the sake of expressing the infinite variety of the inexpressibly Absolute.
In three of the late works (De possest, De venatione sapientiae, and De apice theoriae), Cusanus proposes a new way to grasp the relationship between possibility and actuality. In the first two works, he accomplishes this reflection by means of the amalgam possest. This neologism brings together the infinitive of the verb “to be able” (posse) with the third person singular of the present tense of the verb “to be” (est). The signifier thus looks to the union of opposites of two significations (actual existence and possible existence) and two modalities of a verb (one a phrase that is uninflected, non-temporal, and literally “non-finite” and another a temporal act that brings the non-temporal into the present). One possible translation into English of possest is “the actual existence of possibility.” In De apice theoriae Cusanus makes the more radical claim that that which is signified by possest can also be signified by posse ipsum (“to be able to be itself”).
De possest is a dialogue in which the concept “long-pondered” by the Cardinal is introduced and discussed (De possest, N. 1). The point of departure is Romans 1:20: “The invisible things of Him, including His eternal power and divinity, are clearly seen from the creation of the world, by means of understanding created things,” (DP2, comparing DP 15). This draws attention to Cusanus’s ongoing concern to articulate that creation is not just a true doctrine that refutes error but a mode of “showing” whereby the infinite appears in the finite.
The treatise introduces the Cusan style of speculative thought well, for it joins a thorough discussion of possibility and actuality with the seamless incorporation of spiritual themes, like the gift of faith that comes through Jesus Christ (N. 31-33) and reflections on God’s triunity. Three concrete symbols of transcendence are elaborated: the infinite motion of a spinning top (DP 18-23), the word possest (N. 27), and the word “in” (N. 54-6). Cusanus takes “in” as a symbol of the Trinity because of its three lines. In contemplating “in,” Cusanus first considers the construction of the written letters solely through straight lines into a whole greater than the parts and builds his way to that which is signified by the word “in.” The word points to an entrance. All entering, he notes, involves going in. As a prefix “in” is joined to other roots. For example, intueor (“to regard, admire”) signifies that knowledge of God can be likened to “entering” into the wondrous mystery of an ineffable God. The prefix can also be a negation as in “ineffability.” The joining of “in” in the signifier is moreover symbolically the movement beyond the union of positive and negative theology (in the sense of being “enfolded” in the divine mystery). In all these senses, “in” functions like a hidden signifier that precedes all naming of God.
Cusanus likewise plays with a symbol elicited from the signifier possest. The “e” is found in posse, est, and their union. He then argues that the “triune” sharing of the letter “e” in the amalgamation of posse and est signifies a hidden vocalization of both possibility and actuality at the heart of the new divine name. Likewise, God is beyond the union of opposites of absolute possibility and absolute actuality. God, in any case, is said to be hiddenly, Trinitarianly, and immanently discoverable in the world in the same way that “e” is in possest (N. 57).
How does this new divine name articulate the relationship between actuality and possibility? Possibility and actuality are joined and surpassed in the Infinite. The cipher of possest illuminates this union of opposites. There is also a reflection of this union in the world created by the act of a divine possibilizer. On this question, the strictly Aristotelian-Thomistic tradition sees potentiality as a void and actuality as fullness. Cusanus, in certain ways, calls this prioritizing of the actual into question. He does so by introducing in N. 27-29 another pair that is surpassed in God by possest: posse fieri (to be able to be made) and posse facere (to be able to make). Both are self-evident in God’s creation. Seen apart from its material form, the posse fieri of creation would be a purely passive receptacle given that the sole source of its actuality comes from the Creator. God has the possibility of making, and creation possesses the possibility to be made. But Cusanus complicates this scenario without detracting from the centrality of the freedom of God to create something out of nothing. On the part of Creator, God is not only the one who accomplishes and transcends the act of divine making (what he calls “the divine art of the Word” in N. 34). God, is also the absolute possibility that transcends the distinction between potentiality and actuality of making. On the part of creation, one can speak by analogy of a posse fieri and posse facere in the created order, as for example, in the author’s relationship to a book that she has made. The author possesses the posse fieri of the book at least as an abstract possibility of not writing the book (N. 29). As a triune image of the Creator, human authors also possibilize, for they see their own creations not just as abstractly actualized but also in the process of becoming (another translation of fieri). Finite actuality is therefore not just a fullness prior to all possibility and still not posterior to it. It is, one might say by a certain extrapolation, the multivalent presence of possibility in both its coming into being and its having been actualized. God is symbolized in the very depth of the coming to be of things and not just in their completed actuality.
The dialogue brings specific philosophical doctrines to the fore in order to be illuminated by the figure of possest. The interlocutors, for example, also examine the absolute beginning of the world, the epistemological status of the mathematical entities (N. 43), the nature of motion (N. 52-3), the tripartite ordering of theoretical investigations into physics, pure intellectuality, a middle realm consisting of the union of intellectual abstraction with the faculty of the imagination (N. 63-4), the ubiquity and power of form and the nature of the intellect’s abstraction of form from matter (N. 64), and the philosophy of being and not-being (N. 65-6). There is, however, an overriding concern that emerges in each of these engagements. Creation is that being that was brought into being by God as possest. As such, there is a clear and unequivocal negation in the created order; creation is that which is not God. The not-being of creation on this level directs the mind to the triune eternity of possest out of which God creates. To the degree, however, that God creates being as the one possible not-being of creation, God becomes manifest anew as possest in the very order of creation. This is a kind of secondary not-being in the order of being, one whose recognition makes the manifestness of creation apparent. Cusanus amplifies the aesthetic dimension of this revelation by means of the Greek term cosmos:
Now, the name [“cosmos”] denies that the world is ineffable Beauty itself But it affirms that [the world] is the image of that [Beauty] whose truth is ineffable. What, then, is the world except the manifestation of the invisible God? What is God except the invisibility of visible things?—as the Apostle says in the verse set forth at the beginning of our discussion (N. 72).
This abyss between divine manifestness and absolute not-being is also likened to the difference between heaven and hell (N. 72).
In sum, what is the idea of God in De possest and how does it relate to other prevalent conceptions of God in the Christian Middle Ages of the Latin West? Cusanus draws upon the logic of divine perfections in the tradition of St. Anselm but even more heavily upon his own theories of learned ignorance, unions of opposites, and the pairing of complicatio–explicatio. Of the possible paths to God that were being articulated in his milieu, two in particular are not pursued. The first is the nominalist idea of the absolute power of God that stands in some way in opposition to God’s ordained power. William of Ockham had popularized this notion, and Cusanus is clearly interrogating such voluntarism in a critical vein. But neither does he fully endorse the notion of God as actus purus et perfectus developed by Thomas Aquinas. Possest is no compromise between nominalism and Thomism but an original creation that sheds light on both. It is important to note that terms like potentia, possibilitas, and even posse are used interchangeably in the dialogue. Thus, the divine potency in God is clearly affirmed but according to its infinite possibilizing. Cusanus is thus a radical Thomist in that he completely rejects the notion of a divine power that arbitrarily acts without any self-refraction in the rationally knowable order of actual existence. But he is also clearly affirming neither the words nor the spirit of the standard Thomistic position whereby God is pure act devoid of all possibility. In terms of act, possest, he claims, signifies precisely what is signified by the Biblically inspired “I am who am” (N. 14). The act of being of God cannot become more or other than what it already is but an infinite perfection of being is laden with the possibility of being comprehended as an eternally present “is” that is always already able to be. The most radical consequence of this innovation regards the theory of the knowledge of things finite and infinite as an image of such posse (for example, N. 41, 63). The intellect in its learned ignorance becomes aware of a possest of knowing in its apprehension of the divine name and its images in a variety of fields of knowing. Some have likened this newly discovered subjective capacity to the creative imagination of Neokantianism even though they must then abandon the metaphysical project as pursued by Cusanus.
In this very late work, Cusanus incorporates the vision of God into a semiotic interpretation of reality. For Cusanus, both man and other animals use a variety of verbal signs. Cusanus notes that a hen makes different noises when she is calling chicks to eat than when she is warning them of the presence of a predator whose shadow she has sighted (N. 4, lines 3–5, p. 5). Despite their natural variety, the semiotic utterances of animals are still unformed signs (confusum signum). The power of human ars presents the possibility of bringing intellectual form to naturally given signs to communicate better a variety of desires (N. 7, lines 13–14). According to Cusanus, the art of writing adds nothing to the formation of the sign but consigns it to a realm of visible signs in which it will remain once the spoken sign is lost from memory. The formation of a species for each word therefore precedes the genesis of writing. Both the receptivity of sensible signs and the spontaneity to create abstract signs are present in speech. Writing mirrors the activity of the imagination, which retains signs created by the intellect.
Both spoken and written words are conventional signs since they do not signify naturally. The conventions by which words are assigned distinct meanings are imposed arbitrarily but are not intrinsically arbitrary. Speech and writing elevate the linguistic capacity of humans so that they too may strive to refabricate the natural knowledge that Adam possessed most completely (ch. 9, N. 26). As a creator of iconic signs, the human knower strives to represent not the thing as it is known in itself but the intention that lies behind the sign. The human knower alone seeks a purely formal sign, one that can be abstracted completely from sensible signs. The search for a purely formal sign points to the analogy between human and divine conception: the human knower “creates knowledge out of signs and words, just as God creates the world out of things (ibid.).” The creative activity of the mind produces something new in a manner analogous to God’s creation of the world. The intention by which God creates must be mirrored in every level of the rational creature’s semiotic creativity.
The image of the human sign-maker is the reclaiming of the living image of God. There is always a gap between the signs the artistic mind makes and the signs that the divine Artist places in the world. There is no proportion between the work of the human and divine sign-maker. This gap thus remains unbridgeable for the finite intellect. In any case, the meditative consideration of the gap and of the desire of the intellect to overcome that gap spurs human creativity to a life-long quest to seek an image of the invisible God precisely in the finite, semiotic world in which we now find ourselves.
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