Nietzsche’s Ethics

NietzscheThe ethical thought of German philosopher Friedrich Nietzsche (1844–1900) can be divided into two main components. The first is critical: Nietzsche offers a wide-ranging critique of morality as it currently exists. The second is Nietzsche’s positive ethical philosophy, which focuses primarily on what constitutes health, vitality, and flourishing for certain individuals, the so-called “higher types”.

In the critical project, Nietzsche attacks the morality of his day from several different angles. He argues that the metaphysical foundations of morality do not hold up to scrutiny: the concepts of free will, conscious choice, and responsibility that underpin our understanding of morality are all vociferously critiqued, both on theoretical and on practical grounds. Nietzsche also objects to the content of our contemporary moral commitments. He rejects the idea that suffering is inherently bad and should be eradicated, and he denies that selflessness and compassion should be at the core of our moral code. Key components of Nietzsche’s critical project include his investigation of the history of the development of our moral commitments—the method of “genealogy”—as well as an analysis of the underlying psychological forces at work in our moral experiences and feelings. Ultimately, perhaps Nietzsche’s most serious objection to morality as it currently exists is his claim that it cannot help us to avoid the looming threat of nihilism.

In the positive project, Nietzsche offers a vision of what counts as a good and flourishing form of existence for certain people. This positive ethical vision is not open to everyone, but only to the so-called “higher types”—people whose psycho-physical nature makes them capable of coming to possess the traits and abilities that characterize health, vitality, and flourishing on Nietzsche’s account. The flourishing individual, according to Nietzsche, will be one who is autonomous, authentic, able to “create themselves,” and to affirm life. It is through such people, Nietzsche believes, that the threat of nihilism can be averted.

Table of Contents

  1. The Critical Project
    1. The Object of Nietzsche’s Attacks
    2. Rejection of an Otherworldly Basis for Value
    3. Attacks on the Metaphysical Basis of Moral Agency
    4. Attacks on the Content of Morality
    5. Genealogical Critique
    6. Psychological Critique
    7. The Threat of Nihilism
  2. The Positive Project
    1. Higher Types
    2. Autonomy
    3. Authenticity and Self-Creation
    4. Affirmation
  3. References and Further Reading
    1. Primary Texts
    2. Secondary Texts

1. The Critical Project

In 1981, the British philosopher Bernard Williams wrote that “[i]t is certain, even if not everyone has yet come to see it, that Nietzsche was the greatest moral philosopher of the past century. This was, above all, because he saw how totally problematical morality, as understood over many centuries, has become, and how complex a reaction that fact, when fully understood, requires.” As Williams’s remark suggests, the core of Nietzsche’s ethical thought is critical: Nietzsche seeks, in various ways, to undermine, critique, and problematize morality as we currently understand it. As Nietzsche himself puts it, “we need a critique of moral values, the value of these values should itself, for once, be examined­” (On the Genealogy of Morality, Preface, 6). In speaking of “the value of these values”, Nietzsche is making use of two different senses of the notion of value. One is the set of values that is the object of the critique, the thing to be assessed and evaluated. The other is the standard by which we are to assess these values. In attacking moral values, then, Nietzsche is not setting himself against all possible evaluative systems. And as we shall see, Nietzsche does indeed go on to make many substantive evaluative claims of his own, both critical and positive, including many claims that are broadly ethical in nature. Nietzsche thus proposes to undertake what he calls a “revaluation of all values”, with the final product of this project being a new system of evaluations (see part 2., “The positive project”).

a. The Object of Nietzsche’s Attacks

Since Nietzsche’s critical project is not targeted towards all values as such, we should ask what, exactly, Nietzsche is attacking when he attacks “morality”. In fact, Nietzsche’s various attacks have multiple targets, which together form a family of overlapping worldviews, commitments, and practices. The Judeo-Christian moral-religious outlook is one broad target, but Nietzsche is also keen to attack the post-religious secular legacy of this moral code that he sees as dominant in his contemporary culture in Europe. He is concerned with Kantian morality, as well as the utilitarianism that was gaining prominence around Nietzsche’s time, especially in Britain. Aspects of his attacks are levelled against broadly Platonist metaphysical accounts, as well as the Christian inheritance of these accounts, which understand value as grounded in some otherworldly realm that is more real and true than the world we live in. Other parts of the critical project are directed towards certain particular evaluative commitments, such as a commitment to the centrality of pity or compassion (Mitleid), as exemplified in Schopenhauer’s ethics in particular, but which Nietzsche also sees as a point of thematic commonality between many different moral and religious worldviews. Nietzsche even criticizes evaluative systems that he envisages coming to be widely accepted in the future, such as the commitment to ease and comfort at all costs that he imagines the “last human being” endorsing (see section 1. g., “The threat of nihilism”).

Given this diversity, determining exactly what is under attack in Nietzsche’s critical project is best achieved though attention to the detail of the various attacks. In general, this article uses “morality” as a catch-all term to cover the multiple different objects of Nietzsche’s attacks, allowing the precise target of each attack to be clarified through the nature of the attack itself. The reader should note, then, that not all of Nietzsche’s attacks on “morality” will necessarily apply to each of the individual views and commitments that are gathered under this broad heading.

b. Rejection of an Otherworldly Basis for Value

Nietzsche rejects certain metaphysical accounts of the nature of value. These parts of Nietzsche’s position are not directly about the substantive evaluative content of moral worldviews, but rather the metaphysical presuppositions about the grounds of value that certain moral, and especially moral-theological, worldviews involve. In section 230 of Beyond Good and Evil, Nietzsche states that his philosophical work aims to “translate humanity back into nature”, to reject “the lures of the old metaphysical bird catchers who have been piping at him for far too long: ‘You are more! You are higher! You have a different origin!’”. Human beings, according to Nietzsche, are fundamentally a part of nature. This means that he rejects all accounts of morality that are grounded in a conception of human activity as answerable to a supernatural or otherworldly source of value. The idea of morality as grounded in the commands of God is thus rejected, as is the Platonist picture of a realm of ideal forms, including the “Form of the Good,” as the basis for value.

For the most part, Nietzsche does not go out of his way to argue against these sorts of metaphysical pictures of the nature of value. Instead, he tends to assume that his reader is already committed to a broadly naturalistic understanding of the world and the place of the human being within it. Nietzsche’s rejection of theological or Platonist accounts of the basis of value, then, tends to stand as a background assumption of his discussions, rather than as something he attempts to persuade his reader of directly.

The recurring motif of the “death of God” in Nietzsche’s writing is usefully illustrative here. In The Gay Science, Nietzsche describes a “madman” who is laughed at for announcing the death of God in the marketplace (section 125). But the laughter is not because people think that God is not dead but instead alive and well; rather, these people do not believe in God at all. The intellectual elite of Europe in Nietzsche’s day were, for the most part, atheists. Nietzsche’s insistent emphasis on the idea that “God is dead” is thus not intended as a particularly dramatic way of asserting the non-existence of God, and he does not expect the idea that God does not exist to come as a surprise to his reader. Rather, the problem that Nietzsche seeks to draw attention to is that his fellow atheists have failed to understand the cultural and spiritual significance of the widespread loss of belief in God, and thus of the associated metaphysical picture of the human being as created for a higher divine purpose (see section 1. g., “The threat of nihilism”).

Indeed, Nietzsche is often interested in the way in which aspects of these earlier supernatural worldviews, now largely abandoned, have nonetheless left traces within our current belief and evaluative systems—even within the modern naturalistic conception of the world that Nietzsche takes himself to be working within. Nietzsche writes:

New Battles. – After Buddha was dead, they still showed his shadow in a cave for centuries – a tremendous, gruesome shadow. God is dead; but given the way people are, there may still for millennia be caves in which they show his shadow. – And we – we must still defeat his shadow as well! (The Gay Science, 108)

Although Nietzsche clearly sets himself against supernaturalist accounts of value and of the place of the human being in the cosmos, the precise nature of his own naturalism, and the consequences of this naturalism for his own ethical project, is a topic of debate among commentators. This is complicated by the fact that Nietzsche often directs his attacks towards other naturalist accounts, sometimes simply under the heading of “naturalism,” in a way that can seem to suggest that he himself rejects naturalism. (See Leiter (2015), Clark and Dudrick (2012), and Riccardi (2021) for useful discussion of the nature of Nietzsche’s naturalism.)

In general, Nietzsche expects his reader to share his own basic naturalist orientation and rejection of supernatural metaphysics. However, he thinks that most people have failed to properly understand the full consequences of such commitments. The atheists of his day, thinks Nietzsche, have typically failed to understand the cultural impact that a loss of religious faith will have—perhaps because these cultural effects have not yet shown themselves clearly. Nietzsche also thinks that his contemporaries have not always grasped the ways in which an accurate picture of the nature of the human being will force us to revise or abandon many concepts that are key to our current understanding of morality—perhaps most strikingly, concepts of moral agency and responsibility (see the following section). Many of Nietzsche’s fellow naturalists suppose that we can abandon the supernatural trappings that have previously accompanied morality, and otherwise continue on with our evaluative commitments more or less as before. This, Nietzsche thinks, is not so.

c. Attacks on the Metaphysical Basis of Moral Agency

One family of arguments presented by Nietzsche attacks the metaphysical basis of moral agency. Again, the point here is not directly about the substantive evaluative content of particular moral systems, but rather their metaphysical presuppositions, especially those that have been thought to ground the concept of moral responsibility—notions of the freedom of the will, and the role of consciousness in determining human action.

First, Nietzsche attacks the idea of free will. Nietzsche writes:

The causa sui [cause of itself] is the best self-contradiction that has ever been conceived, a type of logical rape and abomination. But humanity’s excessive pride has got itself profoundly and horribly entangled with precisely this piece of nonsense. The longing for “freedom of the will” in the superlative metaphysical sense (which, unfortunately, still rules in the heads of the half-educated), the longing to bear the entire and ultimate responsibility for your actions yourself and to relieve God, world, ancestors, chance, and society of the burden—all this means nothing less than being that very causa sui and, with a courage greater than Münchhausen’s, pulling yourself by the hair from the swamp of nothingness up into existence. (Beyond Good and Evil, 21)

This passage appears to reject the idea of free will primarily on metaphysical grounds: for the will to be free would be for a thing to be causa sui, the cause of itself, and this is impossible. And so, to the extent that a moral worldview depends on the idea that we do have free will in this sense, then the foundations of such a worldview are undermined.

Some scholars, noting Nietzsche’s references to “pride” and “longing”, have suggested that the primary mode of Nietzsche’s attack on the idea of free will is practical rather than metaphysical. The real problem with the idea of free will, they argue, is that a belief in this idea is motivated by psychological weakness, and is thus not conducive to good psychic health and flourishing (see Janaway (2006)).

Others have argued that Nietzsche’s relationship to the traditional metaphysical debate about free will is not so much to deny that we have free will, but rather to deny the very coherence of the concept at work in this debate (see Kirwin (2017)). For Nietzsche goes on to call the notion of free will an “unconcept” or “nonconcept” (Unbegriff), insisting that just as we must let go of this notion, so too must we let go of “the reversal of this unconcept of ‘free will’: I mean the ‘un-free will’”.

This scholarly disagreement about the nature of Nietzsche’s attacks on the concept of free will also impacts how we understand parts of Nietzsche’s positive ethical vision. In particular, the question of whether we should understand that positive ethical vision to include an ideal of ‘freedom’ in some sense is hotly contested (see section 2. b., “Autonomy”).

Alongside these attacks on the notion of free will, Nietzsche also denies that human action is primarily a matter of conscious decision and control on the part of the agents themselves. We experience ourselves as consciously making decisions and acting on the basis of them, but this experience is, thinks Nietzsche, misleading. To begin with, our conscious self-awareness is only one small part of what is going on within the mind: “For the longest time, conscious thought was considered thought itself; only now does the truth dawn on us that by far the greatest part of the mind’s activity proceeds unconscious and unfelt” (The Gay Science, 333). Furthermore, Nietzsche thinks, it is unclear that this conscious part of the mind really plays any sort of role in determining our action, since “[a]ll of life would be possible without, as it were, seeing itself in the mirror and […] the predominant part of our lives actually unfolds without this mirroring” (The Gay Science, 354). Consciousness, says Nietzsche, is “basically superfluous” (ibid). These parts of Nietzsche’s account of human psychology have often been understood as a precursor to Freudian theories of the unconscious, as well as to recent empirical work establishing that our self-understanding of our own minds and activities is often far from accurate (see Leiter (2019)). Some scholars, while acknowledging Nietzsche’s downgrading of consciousness, have nonetheless argued that Nietzsche retains a robust picture of human agency (see Katsafanas (2016), and section 2. b., “Autonomy”).

Nietzsche’s rejection of free will and his denial of the idea that the conscious mind is the real source of action both appear to undermine the possibility of a person’s being morally responsible for their actions, at least as that notion has traditionally been understood. If moral responsibility requires free will in the sense rejected by Nietzsche, then there can be no moral responsibility. Some philosophers have argued that responsibility does not require free will in this sense, but they have generally done so by arguing that it is sufficient for responsibility that a person’s action follow from their intentions in the right sort of way. But Nietzsche’s attacks on the causal role of consciousness in human action seem to cause problems for this sort of approach as well. In undermining these metaphysical ideas about the nature of human action, then, Nietzsche takes himself to have done away with notion of moral responsibility, thus removing a key underpinning of the system of morality.

d. Attacks on the Content of Morality

Nietzsche also raises objections to the normative content of morality—to the things it presents as valuable and disvaluable, and the actions it prescribes and proscribes. One particular focus of his attacks here is the centrality of Mitleid (variously translated as “pity” or “compassion”) to the moral codes he sees in his contemporary society. Nietzsche sometimes refers to Christianity as “the religion of pity,” and asserts that “[i]n the middle of our unhealthy modernity, nothing is less healthy than Christian pity” (The Antichrist, 7). But Nietzsche’s critique of pity is not limited to Christianity; indeed, he suggests that the “morality of pity” is really an outgrowth of Christianity, rather than properly part of Christianity itself:

[…] ‘On n’est bon que par la pitié: il faut donc qu’il y ait quelque pitié dans tous nos sentiments’ [one is only good through pity: so there must be some pity in all of our sentiments]—thus says morality today! […] That men today feel the sympathetic, disinterested, generally useful social actions to be the moral actions – this is perhaps the most general effect and conversion which Christianity has produced in Europe: although it was not its intention nor contained in its teaching. (Daybreak, 132)

Nietzsche connects the morality of pity to utilitarian and socialist movements, to thinkers in France influenced by the French revolution, and to Schopenhauer’s moral philosophy. (Interestingly, Nietzsche notes that Plato and Kant, who are elsewhere the target of his attacks on morality, do not hold pity in high esteem—On the Genealogy of Morality, Preface, 5.)

The morality of pity, thinks Nietzsche, is problematic in various ways. It emphasizes the eradication of suffering as the main moral goal—and yet suffering, thinks Nietzsche, is not inherently bad, and can indeed be an impetus to growth and creativity. (Nietzsche himself suffered from ill health throughout his life, and often seems to connect his own intellectual and creative achievements to these experiences.) Pity, thinks Nietzsche, both arises from and exacerbates a “softness of feeling” (On the Genealogy of Morality, Preface, 6), as opposed to the sort of strong and hardy psychological constitution that he admires. The morality of pity also prioritizes the wellbeing of “the herd” over that of those individuals who have the potential to achieve greatness. Some of Nietzsche’s attacks on the morality of pity take the form of a distinctive sort of psychological critique: what presents itself as a concern for the other person in fact has a darker, hidden, and more self-serving motive (see section 1. f., “Psychological critique”). Finally, Nietzsche believes that making pity central to our evaluative worldview will lead humanity towards nihilism (see section 1. g., “The threat of nihilism”).

The German word that Nietzsche uses is Mitleid, which can be translated as “pity” or as “compassion”. Some scholars have sought to emphasize the difference between these two concepts, and to interpret Nietzsche’s attacks on Mitleid through the lens of this distinction (Von Tevenar (2007)). The proposal is that pity focuses its attention on the suffered condition rather than on the sufferer themselves, creating distance between the sufferer and pitier, and as a result can end up tinged with a sense of superiority and contempt on the part of the pitier. Compassion, by contrast, is understood to involve genuine other-regarding concern and thus to foster closeness between the two parties. When we read Nietzsche’s attacks on Mitleid in light of this distinction, some of his objections seem to apply primarily to pity, thus understood, while others seem to take compassion as their main target (see section 1. f., “Psychological critique” and section 1. g. “The threat of nihilism” for some further discussion).

Nietzsche’s various objections to Mitleid stand at the heart of his attack on the content of morality. But, as he explains, his concerns with this concept eventually lead him to a broader set of questions about morality. Nietzsche says:

This problem of the value of pity and of the morality of pity […] seems at first to be only an isolated phenomenon, a lone question mark; but whoever pauses over the question and learns to ask, will find what I found:—that a vast new panorama opens up for him, a possibility makes him giddy, mistrust, suspicion, and fear of every kind spring up, belief in morality, all morality, wavers. (On the Genealogy of Morality, Preface, 6)

More generally, then, Nietzsche holds that various traits, behaviors, and ideals that morality typically holds in high regard—humility, love of one’s neighbor, selflessness, equality, and so on—are all open for critique, and indeed all are on Nietzsche’s view found wanting. These values are, according to Nietzsche, “ascetic” or “life-denying”—they involve a devaluation of earthly existence, and indeed of those parts of human existence, such as struggle, suffering, hardship, and overcoming, that are capable of giving rise to greatness. It may be true that the more people possess the qualities that morality holds in high esteem, the easier and more pleasant life may be for the majority of people. But whether or not this is really so does not really matter, for Nietzsche is not concerned with how things are for the majority of people. His interest is primarily in those individuals who have the potential for greatness—those “higher types” who are capable of great deeds and profound creative undertakings. And here, Nietzsche thinks, the characteristic values that morality holds in such esteem are not conducive to the health and flourishing of these individuals.

e. Genealogical Critique

One of the most important and influential components of Nietzsche’s critical project is his attempt to offer a ‘genealogy’ of morality, a certain sort of historical account of its various origins and development over time. This account is offered primarily in On the Genealogy of Morality, though other texts develop similar themes, especially Beyond Good and Evil. In the Genealogy, Nietzsche explicitly connects this historical investigation to his critical project:

[W]e need a critique of moral values, the value of these values should itself, for once, be examined­—and so we need to know about the conditions and circumstances under which the values grew up, developed and changed. (On the Genealogy of Morality, Preface, 6)

Scholars have puzzled over this claim. Why do we need to know about the historical origins of morality in order to assess its value here and now? Indeed, it has seemed to many that Nietzsche is here committing the “genetic fallacy”, wrongly inferring an assessment of a thing’s current meaning or value on the basis of its source or origins. But Nietzsche himself appears to be aware of the fallacy in question (see for example The Gay Science 345), and so we have reason to take seriously the project of the Genealogy and to try to understand it as part of Nietzsche’s critical project.

In fact, there are ways in which a thing’s source or origin can rightly affect our current assessment of it. For example, if you learn that the person who gave you a piece of information is untrustworthy, this does not automatically imply that the information is false, but it does undermine your original justification for accepting it, and gives you reason to reconsider your belief in it. It may be that Nietzsche’s genealogical project works in a similar sort of way. In seeking to understand morality as a historical phenomenon, Nietzsche’s approach already unsettles certain aspects of our understanding of morality’s nature and its claim to authority over us. If we had supposed that morality has a timeless or eternal nature (perhaps because it is bestowed by God, or because it is grounded in something like Plato’s Form of the Good—see section 1. b., “Rejection of an otherworldly basis for value”), then coming to understand it as instead a contingent product of human history and development may give us reason to question our commitment to it. Even if morality is not thereby shown to be bad or false, it does seem to be revealed as something that is properly open to questioning and critique.

Furthermore, part of Nietzsche’s point in developing his genealogical account is that certain human phenomena—here, morality, and its associated concepts and psychological trappings—are essentially historical, in the sense that one will not understand the thing itself as it exists here and now, and thus will not be able to give a proper critique, without understanding how it came to be. (Think of what would be needed for a person to properly understand the phenomenon of racial inequality in the present-day United States, for instance.) To fully comprehend the nature of morality, and thus to get it into view as the object of our critique, thinks Nietzsche, we will need to investigate its origins.

In the First Essay of the Genealogy, “‘Good and Evil,’ ‘Good and Bad,’” Nietzsche charts the emergence of two distinct systems of evaluation. The first is the aristocratic “master morality,” which begins from an evaluation of the aristocratic individual himself as “good,” which here indicates something noble, powerful, and strong. Within this moral code, the contrasting evaluation—“bad”—is largely an afterthought, and points to that which is not noble, namely the lowly, plebian, ill-born masses. The opposing evaluative system, “slave morality,” develops in reaction to the subjugation of this lower class under the power of the masters. Led by a vengeful priestly caste (which Nietzsche connects to Judaism), this lower class enacts the “slave revolt in morality,” turning the aristocratic moral code on its head. Within the slave moral code, the primary evaluative term is “evil,” and it is applied to the masters and their characteristic traits of strength and power. The term “good” is then given meaning relative to this primary term, so that “good” now comes to mean meek, mild, and servile—qualities which the slave class possess of necessity, but which they now cast as the products of their own free choice. This evaluative system comes along with the promise that justice will ultimately be meted out in the afterlife: those who suffer and are oppressed on earth will receive their reward in heaven, while the evil masters will face an eternity of punishment in hell. In the resulting struggle between the two evaluative systems, it was the slave morality that eventually won out, and it is this moral code that Nietzsche takes to be dominant in the Europe of his day.

In the Second Essay, “‘Guilt,’ ‘Bad Conscience,’ and Related Matters,” Nietzsche explores the origins of the institution of punishment and of the feelings of guilt and bad conscience. Punishment, Nietzsche thinks, originally emerged from the economic idea of a creditor-debtor relationship. The idea eventually arises that an unpaid debt, or more generally an injury of some kind, can be repaid through pain caused to the debtor. It is from this idea that the institution of punishment comes into being. But punishment is not what gives rise to feelings of bad conscience. Instead, the origins of bad conscience, of the feeling of guilt, arise as a result of violent drives that would normally be directed outwards becoming internalized. When individuals come to live together in communities, certain natural violent tendencies must be reined in, and as a result they are turned inwards towards the self. It is the basic drive to assert power over others, now internalized and directed towards the self, that gives rise to the phenomenon of bad conscience.

In the Third Essay, “What Do Ascetic Ideals Mean?,” Nietzsche explores the multiple significances that ascetic ideals have had, and the purposes they have served, for different groups of people, including artists, philosophers, and priests. The diversity of meanings that Nietzsche finds in ascetic ideals is an important component of the account: one of the characteristic features of genealogy as a method of investigation is the idea that the object under scrutiny (the phenomenon of morality, for instance) will not have a single unified essence, meaning, or origin, but will rather be made up of multiple overlapping ideas which themselves change and shift over time. Nonetheless, ascetic ideals share in common the characteristic of being fundamentally life-denying, and thus, on Nietzsche’s account, not conducive to flourishing health. And although the narrative of the Genealogy so far has connected these ideals to the Judeo-Christian worldview and moral code, in the final part of the book we are told that the most recent evolution of the ascetic ideal comes in the form of science, with its unquestioning commitment to the value of truth. Nietzsche’s critique of morality thus leads even further than we might have expected. It is not only the Judeo-Christian moral code, nor even its later secular iterations that are under attack here. Rather, Nietzsche seeks to call into question something that his investigation has revealed to be an outgrowth of this moral code, namely a commitment to the value of truth at all costs. Even practices like science, then, embody the life-denying ascetic ideal; even the value of truth is to be called into question, evaluated—and found wanting.

In general, Nietzsche expects that when we consider the origins of morality that he presents us with, we will find them rather unsavory. For instance, once we realize that morality’s high valuation of pity, selflessness, and so on came to be out of the weakness, spite, and vengefulness of the subjugated slave class, this new knowledge will, Nietzsche hopes, serve to lessen the grip that these values have on us. Even if morality’s dark origins do not in themselves undermine the value of these ideals, the disquiet or even disgust that we may feel in attending to them can do important work in helping us to overcome our affective attachment to morality. Overcoming this attachment will pave the way for a more clear-eyed evaluation of these ideals as they exist today.

Nonetheless, the question remains just how far this sort of historical account can take us in assessing the value of morality itself. Even if the ideal of loving one’s neighbor, for instance, originally emerged out of a rather less wholesome desire for revenge, this seems not to undermine the value of the ideal itself. So long as loving one’s neighbor now does not involve such a desire for revenge, what, really, has been shown to be wrong with it? Nietzsche sometimes seems to be suggesting, however, that the historical origins of morality are not merely something that happened in the past. Instead, the dark motives that originally gave rise to morality have left their traces within our current psychological make-up, so that even today the ideal of loving one’s neighbor retains these elements of cruelty and revenge. (See section 1. f., “Psychological critique.”)

The Genealogy leaves behind a complex legacy. Scholars still disagree about what, exactly, the method of genealogy really is and what it can achieve. Nonetheless, Nietzsche’s approach has proved remarkably influential, perhaps most notably in relation to Foucault, who sought to offer his own genealogical accounts of various phenomena. The Genealogy also stands in a complex relationship to anti-Semitism. Nietzsche’s writing, including the Genealogy, often include remarks highly critical of anti-Semitism and anti-Semitic movements of his time. Nonetheless, that the book itself deals freely in anti-Semitic tropes and imagery seems undeniable.

f. Psychological Critique

Another distinctive component of Nietzsche’s critical project is his psychological analysis of moral feelings and behavior. Nietzsche frequently attempts to reveal ways in which our self-understanding of supposedly “moral” experiences can be highly inaccurate. Lurking behind seemingly compassionate responses to others, Nietzsche claims, we find a dark underside of self-serving thoughts, and even wanton cruelty. He suggests that feelings of sympathy [Mitgefühl] and compassion [Mitleid, also translated as “pity”] are secretly pleasurable, for we enjoy finding ourselves in a position of power and relative good fortune in relation to others who are suffering. These supposedly selfless, kind, and other-regarding feelings are thus really nothing of the sort.

Nietzsche’s psychological analysis of moral feelings and behaviors echoes the historical analysis he provides in the Genealogy (see section 1. e., “Genealogical critique”). Nietzsche often uses metaphors of “going underground” to represent investigations into the murky historical origins of morality as well as investigations into subconscious parts of the individual or collective psyche. It is not fully clear exactly how the two sorts of investigation are connected for Nietzsche, but he does seem to think that a person’s present psychic constitution can bear the imprint not only of their own personal history but also of historical events, forces, and struggles that affected their ancestors. If this is so, it seems plausible for Nietzsche to suppose that the subconscious motives at work in a person’s psyche could reflect the historical origins that Nietzsche traces for morality more generally, and that an investigation into one could at the same time illuminate the other.

Leaving aside this connection between psychological investigation and genealogy, when it comes to the detail of Nietzsche’s claims about what is really going on in specific instances of seemingly moral feelings, many commentators have found Nietzsche’s psychological assessments to be cuttingly insightful. As Philippa Foot puts it, “Nietzsche, with his devilish eye for hidden malice and self-aggrandizement and for acts of kindness motivated by the wish to still self-doubt, arouses a wry sense of familiarity in most of us”. Nietzsche does seem to have a knack for uncovering hidden motives, and for getting the reader to recognize these less wholesome parts of their own psyche. For instance, describing our responses when someone we admire is suffering, Nietzsche says:

We try to divine what it is that will ease his pain, and we give it to him; if he wants words of consolation, comforting looks, attentions, acts of service, presents—we give them; but above all, if he wants us to suffer at his suffering we give ourselves out to be suffering; in all this, however, we have the enjoyment of active gratitude—which, in short, is benevolent revenge. If he wants and takes nothing whatever from us, we go away chilled and saddened, almost offended […]. From all this is follows that, even in the most favourable case, there is something degrading in suffering and something elevating and productive of superiority in pitying. (Daybreak, 138)

Here, if the reader follows along imaginatively with Nietzsche’s story, they may indeed find themself feeling “chilled and saddened, almost offended” when supposing that the suffering person does not want their help—perhaps they even experience the feeling a split second before they read Nietzsche’s naming of those very feelings. They have been caught in the act, as it were, and made conscious of the secretly self-regarding nature of their supposedly compassionate responses to the suffering of others.

But even supposing that Nietzsche’s observations are correct about a great many real-world instances of purportedly moral phenomena—or even all of them—what sort of objection to morality does this really give us? After all, the problem here does not seem to be with the moral values or ideals themselves. Nietzsche’s objection here does not appear to directly target compassion itself (say) as a moral ideal, but rather the hypocrisy of those who understand themselves and others to be compassionate, but who are in reality anything but. Indeed, in a certain sense, the critique seems to depend on the idea that cruelty and self-serving attitudes are bad, and this evaluation is itself a core component of the morality that Nietzsche is supposed to be attacking.

There are various ways of making sense of Nietzsche’s psychological critique as part of his broader critique of morality. It may be that the uncovering of these hidden motives is merely intended to elicit an initial air of disquiet and an attitude of suspicion towards the whole system of morality—to force us to let go of our comfortable sense that all is well with morality as it currently exists. It seems likely, in addition, that Nietzsche’s main concern is not so much with moral values in the abstract (with the concept of compassion, say), but rather with their concrete historical and psychological reality—and this reality, Nietzsche suggests, is importantly not as it seems. Or perhaps the point is that human nature is always going to be driven by these more malicious feelings, so that a morality that fails to recognize this fact must be grounded in fantasy.

In general, the approach taken in Nietzsche’s psychological analysis of moral behaviour seems to take the form of an internal critique. Nietzsche expects his reader to be moved, on the basis of their current evaluative commitments, by his unmasking project: the hypocrisy of a cruel and self-serving tendency that masquerades as kindness and compassion is likely to strike us as distasteful, unappealing, perhaps disgusting. And thus shaken from our initially uncritical approval of what had presented itself as kindness and compassion, we may find ourselves psychologically more disposed to embark on the deeper ‘revaluation’ project that Nietzsche wants us to undertake. When we do so, Nietzsche hopes to persuade us of the disvalue not only of cruel egoism that presents itself as compassion, but indeed of compassion itself as an ideal. For this ideal, he argues, is fundamentally life-denying, and as a result will lead to nihilism (see the following section). (For more on the precise form of Nietzsche’s objections to Mitleid—pity or compassion—see Von Tevenar (2007).)

g. The Threat of Nihilism

Perhaps Nietzsche’s main objection to our current moral outlook is the likelihood that it will lead to nihilism. Nietzsche says:

Precisely here I saw the great danger to mankind, its most sublime temptation and seduction—temptation to what? to nothingness?—precisely here I saw the beginning of the end, standstill, mankind looking back wearily, turning its will against life, and the onset of the final sickness becoming gently, sadly manifest: I understood the morality of compassion, casting around ever wider to catch even philosophers and make them ill, as the most uncanny symptom of our European culture which has itself become uncanny, as its detour to a new Buddhism? To a new Euro-Buddhism? to—nihilism? (On the Genealogy of Morality, Preface, 5)

The Europe of Nietzsche’s day is entering a post-religious age. What his contemporaries do not realize, Nietzsche thinks, is that following the “death of God,” humanity faces an imminent catastrophic loss of any sense of meaning. Nietzsche’s contemporaries have supposed that one can go on endorsing the basic evaluative worldview of the Judeo-Christian moral code in a secular age, by simply excising the supernatural metaphysical underpinnings and then continuing as before. But this, thinks Nietzsche, is not so. Without these underpinnings, the system as a whole will collapse.

The problem does not seem to be exactly the metaethical worry that the absence of a properly robust metaphysical grounding for one’s values might undermine the project of evaluation as such. After all, Nietzsche himself seems happy to endorse various evaluative judgments, and he does not take these to be grounded in any divine or otherworldly metaphysics. (However, see Reginster (2006) for discussion of nihilism as arising from an assumption that value must be so grounded.) Instead, the problem seems to arise from the specific content of our current moral worldview. In particular, as we have seen, this worldview embodies ascetic and life-denying values—human beings’ earthly, bodily existence is given a negative evaluative valence. In the religious version of these ascetic ideals, however, the supernatural component provided a higher purpose: earthly suffering was given meaning through the promise that it would be repaid in the afterlife. Shorn of this higher purpose, morality is left with no positive sense of meaning, and all that remains is the negative evaluation of suffering and earthly existence. The old Judeo-Christian morality thus evolves into a secular “morality of pity,” aiming only at alleviating suffering and discomfort for “the herd.”

In pursuing this negative goal, the morality of pity seeks at the same time to make people more equal—and thus, thinks Nietzsche, more homogenous and mediocre. In Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Nietzsche gives a striking portrayal of the endpoint of this process:

Behold! I show you the last human being.

‘What is love? What is creation? What is longing? What is a star?’—thus asks the last human being, blinking.

Then the earth has become small, and on it hops the last human being, who makes everything small. His kind is ineradicable, like the flea beetle; the last human being lives longest.

‘We invented happiness’—say the last human beings, blinking.

They abandoned the regions where it was hard to live: for one needs warmth. One still loves one’s neighbor and rubs up against him: for one needs warmth.


One has one’s little pleasure for the day and one’s little pleasure for the night: but one honors health.

‘We invented happiness’ say the last human beings, and they blink. (Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Zarathustra’s Prologue, 5)

The “last human being” (often translated as “last man”) is taken by scholars to be Nietzsche’s clearest representation of the nihilism that threatens to follow from the death of God. Without any sense of higher meaning, and valuing only the eradication of suffering, humanity will eventually become like this, concerned only with comfort, small pleasures, and an easy life. Nietzsche’s dark portrait of the vacuously blinking “last human being” is supposed to fill the reader with horror—if this is where our current moral system is leading us, it seems that we have good reason to join Nietzsche in his project of an attempted “revaluation of all values”.

2. The Positive Project

As we have seen, Nietzsche’s critical project aims to undermine or unsettle our commitment to our current moral values. These values are fundamentally life-denying, and as such they threaten to bring nihilism in the wake of the death of God. In place of this system of values, then, Nietzsche develops an alternative evaluative worldview.

Drawing on a distinction suggested by Bernard Williams, we might usefully characterize Nietzsche’s positive project as broadly “ethical” rather than “moral,” in that it is concerned more generally with questions about how to live and what counts as a good, flourishing, or healthy form of life for an individual, rather than with more narrowly “moral” questions about right and wrong, how one ought to treat others, what one’s obligations are, or when an action deserves punishment or reward. As a result of this focus on health and flourishing, some scholars have characterized Nietzsche’s positive ethical project as a form of virtue ethics.

a. Higher Types

Nietzsche is not, however, interested in developing a general account of what counts as flourishing or health for the human being as such. Indeed, he rejects the idea that there could be such a general account. For human beings are not, according to Nietzsche, sufficiently similar to one another to warrant any sort of one-size-fits-all ethical code. The primary distinction is between two broad character “types”: the so-called “higher” and “lower” types. Nietzsche’s concern in the positive project is to spell out what counts as flourishing for the higher types, and under what conditions this might be achieved.

The distinction between higher and lower types appears to be a matter of one’s basic and unalterable psycho-physical make-up. While Nietzsche sometimes speaks as though all people can be straightforwardly sorted into one or the other category, at other points things seem more complicated: it may be, for example, that certain higher or lower character traits can end up mixed together in a particular individual. Nietzsche does not limit the concept of “higher types” to any particular ethnic or geographic group. He mentions instances of this type occurring in many different societies and in many different parts of the world. The distinction itself seems, in addition, to be largely ahistorical, such that there always have been and (perhaps) always will be higher types.

However, the detail of what the higher type looks like does vary based on the particular historical context. For example, the infamous “blond beasts” mentioned in the Genealogy are likely examples of higher types, but Nietzsche does not advocate a return (even if such were possible) to this cheerfully unreflective mode of existence. In the wake of the slave revolt in morality, human beings have become more complicated and more intellectual, and this development—though problematically shot through with ascetic ideals—has opened up new and more refined modes of existence to the higher types. As a result, the individuals that Nietzsche points to as his contemporary examples of higher types—Goethe, Emerson, and of course Nietzsche himself—tend to express their greatness through intellectual and artistic endeavors rather than through plundering and bloodlust. (Napoleon stands as an exception, although Nietzsche seems to think of him as a striking, and also somewhat startling, throw-back to an earlier mode of human existence.)

In general, the “higher type” designation seems to indicate a certain sort of potential that an individual possesses to achieve a certain state of being that Nietzsche takes to be valuable—a potential that may or may not end up being realized. The bulk of Nietzsche’s positive project, then, is concerned with spelling out what this state of being looks like, as well as what circumstances lead to its coming to fruition.

b. Autonomy

In recent years, commentators have focused on the notion of autonomy as a central component of Nietzsche’s ideal for the higher types. The autonomous individual, according to Nietzsche, is characterized primarily by self-mastery, which enables him (it appears, on Nietzsche’s account, to be invariably a “him”) to undertake great and difficult tasks—including, as we have seen, great intellectual and artistic endeavors.

This self-mastery, it seems, is primarily a matter of the arrangement of a person’s “drives”—the various and variously conflicting psychic forces that make up his being. What constitutes an ideal arrangement of drives for Nietzsche is not easy to pin down with precision, but some points seem clear. In the autonomous individual, the drives form a robust sort of a unity, with one or more of the most powerful drives co-opting others into their service, so that the individual is not being pulled in multiple different directions by different competing forces but instead forms a coherent whole. Not all forms of unity, however, will do the job. In Twilight of the Idols, Nietzsche offers a psychological portrait of Socrates, describing the “chaos and anarchy of [Socrates’] instincts” along with the “hypertrophy” of one particular drive—that of reason. In Socrates, according to Nietzsche, reason subjugates and tyrannizes over the other wild and unruly appetites, which are seen as dangerous alien forces that must be suppressed at all costs. The tyranny of reason does impose a unity of sorts, but Nietzsche does not seem impressed by the resulting figure of Socrates, whom he labels as “decadent”. The problem with Socrates’ drive formation may be formal—it may be that one drive merely tyrannizing over the others does not give us the right sort of unity; the controlling drive, we might suppose, ought instead to refine, sublimate, and transform the other drives to redirect them towards its purpose, rather than merely aiming to crush or extirpate them. Alternatively, the problem may be substantive: the issue might not be that one drive tyrannizes, but rather which drive is doing the tyrannizing in the case of Socrates. The tyranny of a less ascetic and life-denying drive might leave us with something that Nietzsche would be happy to think of as genuine self-mastery and hence autonomy. (For an interesting discussion of Nietzsche’s account of Socrates’ decadence, including the implicit references made to Plato’s city-soul analogy in the Republic, see Huddleston (2019). For Nietzsche’s drive-based psychology more generally, see Riccardi (2021), and for its relation to Nietzsche’s ideal, see Janaway (2012).)

A point of contention in the literature concerns whether or not the concept of “autonomy” (and related concepts of self-mastery and unity of drive formation) as Nietzsche uses it should be understood as connected to the concept of freedom. There are two related questions on the table here, which ought to be kept separate. The first is whether autonomy itself should be understood as a conception of freedom, so that to be autonomous is to be free in some sense. If so, then it seems that Nietzsche’s positive ethical vision includes freedom as an ideal that can be possessed by certain individuals who are capable of it. The second is whether or to what extent it is up to the individual to bring it about that he becomes autonomous—that is, whether or not the ideal of autonomy is an ideal that a higher type could pursue and achieve through their own agency. Let us consider the two questions in turn.

We have seen already that Nietzsche rejects a certain conception of freedom—the conception of “free will in the superlative metaphysical sense,” as he puts it (see section 1. c., “Attacks on the metaphysical basis of moral agency”). But several scholars have suggested that Nietzsche’s concept of autonomy is intended to offer an alternative picture of freedom, one that is not automatically granted to all as a metaphysical given, but which is rather the possession of the few. Ken Gemes (2009) thus marks a distinction between “deserts free will”—the sort of free will that could ground moral responsibility and thus a concept of desert, and which Nietzsche denies—and “agency free will” or autonomy, which Nietzsche grants certain individuals can come to possess. Several scholars have embraced Gemes’s distinction, and they and others have developed the idea that autonomy as freedom stands as a certain sort of ideal for Nietzsche (see Janaway (2006), May (2009), Richardson (2009), Kirwin (2017)). The thought is roughly that the autonomous individual is “free” because and insofar as he possesses certain sorts of agential abilities: having mastered himself, the autonomous agent is distinctively able to assert his will in the world, to make and honor certain sorts of commitment to himself or to others, to overcome resistance and obstacles to achieve his ends, and so on.

Against this school of thought, other scholars (most notably Brian Leiter) have argued that the picture of the autonomous individual that Nietzsche thinks so highly of does not give us in any meaningful sense a picture of freedom. On this reading, Nietzsche’s overall views on the question of freedom and free will are simple: none of us, not even those self-mastered higher types can be said to be free. Commentators from this camp do not deny that Nietzsche approves of the individual whose drives form a particular robust and powerful unity and who is thus “master of himself” and able to assert his will in the world. Their point is simply that these qualities do not amount to the individual’s being free in any meaningful sense.

One passage in particular has proven to be a point of controversy in the literature. In the Genealogy, Nietzsche introduces a character, the “Sovereign Individual,” who is described as the endpoint of a long historical process. The Sovereign Individual, Nietzsche says, is:

Like only to himself, having freed himself from the morality of custom, an autonomous, supra-moral individual (because ‘autonomous’ and ‘moral’ are mutually exclusive), in short, we find a man with his own, independent, enduring will, whose prerogative it is to promise—and him a proud consciousness quivering in every muscle of what he has finally achieved and incorporated, an actual awareness of power and freedom, a feeling that man in general has reached completion. (On the Genealogy of Morality, II:2)

How should we interpret this passage? There are, broadly speaking, three types of reading open to us. On the first, Nietzsche is sincere in his rather bombastic praise of this character, and his talk of freedom here should be taken seriously: that the Sovereign Individual is described as “autonomous” and as in various respects “free” gives us reason to think that Nietzsche really does hold freedom as a positive ideal for the higher types (see Ridley (2009) for one instance of this sort of reading). On the second type of reading, Nietzsche’s praise is sincere, but his talk of “freedom” is in a certain sense disingenuous: it is an instance of “persuasive definition” (the term comes from Charles Stevenson, writing in a different context), in which Nietzsche seeks to use the word ‘freedom’ in rather a different way to its ordinary usage, while at the same time capitalizing on the emotional attachment he can reasonably expect his readers will have to the term (see Leiter (2011)). On the third type of reading, Nietzsche’s praise of this character is given in a sarcastic tone: after all, the main achievement of this “Sovereign Individual” appears to be that he is able to keep his promises and pay his debts; perhaps what we have here is not a genuinely autonomous Nietzschean ideal (whatever that amounts to), but rather just a self-important member of the petty-bourgeoisie (see Rukgaber (2012), Acampora (2006)). Scholars remain divided on the interpretation of this passage in particular, as well as on the general question of whether the ideal that Nietzsche offers of the self-mastered individual, constituted by a robust unity of drives, should be thought of as an ideal of freedom.

We can in addition consider a second question. Granting that Nietzsche does think highly of such an individual, and that autonomy in this sense represents an ethical ideal for Nietzsche, we can ask whether or not it is an ideal that the higher types can consciously aspire to and work towards. Nietzsche sometimes talks of this ideal state as a sort of “achievement,” and some commentators have as a result presented autonomy as something that one can choose to pursue, and thus can through one’s own efforts bring about (can “achieve” in this sense). But this strongly agential reading of the process of coming to be autonomous faces a problem. For this account seems to suggest that one can freely, in some sense, bring it about that one becomes autonomous. But if Nietzsche has a positive picture of what it is to be free (and thus to act freely) at all, that picture seems to be the picture of autonomy, the state that one is here trying to achieve. It would be a mistake, then, to suppose that one can freely pursue and achieve autonomy, since this would be to import an additional illicit concept of freedom into the picture—the freedom one exercises in freely choosing to become autonomous.

A more plausible account, and one that accords more closely with Nietzsche’s texts, would have the process of coming-to-autonomy to be something that happens in some sense of its own accord, as a result of the interplay of external circumstance (including multi-generational historical processes) and facts about the individual’s inherent nature. Nietzsche often speaks of the growth of such an individual as occurring like the growth of a seed into a plant: the seed does not choose to grow into a mature plant or pursue it as a conscious goal; rather, if conditions are right, and the seed itself is healthy and well-formed, it will indeed grow and flourish. This, then, is how we should understand the process that results in a higher type’s “achieving” the ideal of autonomy. Whether or not that ideal, once achieved, should properly be thought of as a conception of freedom is a separate question. It does not follow from the fact that a condition is not freely pursued and reached that it cannot, once reached, count as a form of freedom.

c. Authenticity and Self-Creation

As the talk of seeds and plants suggests, a key component of Nietzsche’s positive ideal for the higher types involves a process of development into one’s “proper” or “true” or “natural” form. An acorn, given the right conditions, will grow into a particular type of thing—an oak tree—and as such it will have certain distinctive features: it will grow to a certain height, have leaves of a certain shape, and so on. Even when it was a small acorn, this is the form that is proper to it, to which it is in some sense “destined” to grow. “Destined” here does not mean “guaranteed,” for things may go wrong along the way, and the tree may end up stunted, withered, or barren. Nonetheless, if all goes well, the seed will develop into its proper form. Something like this seems to be what Nietzsche has in mind when he speaks of the importance of “becoming what one is.”

One very interesting feature of Nietzsche’s emphasis on this concept is the connection he draws to another concept that seems to be important to his positive ethical vision, namely the idea that one should “create oneself.” Contrasting himself and other higher types from “the many” who are concerned with “moral chatter,” Nietzsche says:

We, however, want to become who we are—human beings who are new, unique, incomparable, who give themselves laws, who create themselves! (The Gay Science, 335)

These two ideas—becoming who one is, and creating oneself, seem on the face of it to stand in some tension with one another. For the notion of becoming who one is implies that one has a particular determinate essential nature, a nature that one will ideally come to fulfil, just as the acorn in the right conditions can grow to reveal its proper and fullest form, that of the oak tree. But the concept of creating oneself, by contrast, seems to conflict with this sort of essence-based destiny. The notions of creation and creativity that Nietzsche invokes here seem to imply that the endpoint of the process is not fixed ahead of time; instead, there seems to be scope for free choice, for different possible outcomes, perhaps even for arbitrariness.

We can bring the two notions into closer alignment by attending to Nietzsche’s own account of artistic creation. Nietzsche rejects the idea that the artist’s approach is one of “laissez-aller”, letting go; instead, he says:

Every artist knows how far removed this feeling of letting go is from his ‘most natural’ state, the free ordering, placing, disposing and shaping in the moment of ‘inspiration’ – he knows how strictly and subtly he obeys thousands of laws at this very moment, laws that defy conceptual formulation precisely because of their hardness and determinateness. (Beyond Good and Evil, 188)

Artistic creation, then, is precisely not about arbitrary choice, but is rather a sort of activity in accordance with necessity. (We can imagine an artist, having been asked why he chose to compose a painting in particular way, replying: “I didn’t choose it—it had to be that way, otherwise the painting wouldn’t have worked!”) And indeed, immediately following the remark about human beings “creating themselves” in The Gay Science, Nietzsche continues:

To that end we must become the best students and discoverers of everything lawful and necessary in the world: we must become physicists in order to become creators in this sense – while hitherto all valuations and ideals have been built on ignorance of physics or in contradiction to it. (The Gay Science, 335)

Nietzsche wants us to understand the process of creation, then, as intimately connected to notions of necessity and law-governed activity. Just as the great artist is not making arbitrary choices but rather responding to their understanding of the unstated (and unstatable) aesthetic laws that govern how things must be done in this particular instance, so too the process of creation through which one creates oneself is not a matter of arbitrary choice but rather of necessity. What marks out an individual’s development as a process of self-creation will thus depend on whether or not the necessity derives from his own inner nature or from external sources. If the value system that an individual embraces (for instance) is merely a result of his being molded by his surrounding society, the worldview of which he accepts unquestioningly, then he will not count as having created himself, for his character has been shaped by forces outside of him and not by his own internal nature. If, on the other hand, an individual’s character emerges as a result of his own inner necessities, then he will count as having created himself. As we have already seen in the previous section, the idea will not be that a person makes a conscious choice to “create himself,” then going on to do so, for whether or not this process will take place is not a matter of conscious choice on the part of the individual. Nonetheless, the individual who creates himself has the principle of his own development, and his own character, within himself—within his inner nature. In this way, Nietzsche’s key concepts of authenticity (being who one is) and self-creation do indeed turn out to be intimately connected.

d. Affirmation

Perhaps the most fundamental part of Nietzsche’s positive ethical vision is his notion of “affirmation”. The flourishing individual, according to Nietzsche, will “say yes” to life—he will embrace and celebrate earthly existence, with all its suffering and hardships. Connected to this notion of affirmation are two other key Nietzschean concepts—amor fati, or love of (one’s) fate, and the notion of “eternal recurrence”:

My formula for human greatness is amor fati: that you do not want anything to be different, not forwards, not backwards, not for all eternity.

The notion of affirmation should be understood by way of contrast with the worldview of the morality that we have seen under attack in the critical part of Nietzsche’s project. Morality, as we have seen, involves a commitment to “life-denying” values: the earthly reality of human existence, and the suffering and pain it involves, is given a fundamentally negative evaluation, so that the only things that have a positive value are the promise of an afterlife in another world (in the religious iteration of the worldview), and the absence of suffering (in the secular version). The life-denying nature of these values is what threatens a descent into nihilism. Nietzsche’s positive ethical vision, by contrast, calls for an embracing of earthly life, including all of its suffering and pain.

The difficulty of Nietzsche’s ethical demand here should not be underestimated. To truly “say yes” to life, to “love one’s fate,” it is not enough simply to tolerate the difficulties and suffering for the sake of the greatness that comes along with them. Instead, one must actively love all aspects and moments of one’s life—to the extent of willing that one’s whole life, even the lowest lows, be repeated through all eternity. This is the notion of “eternal recurrence” or “eternal return”.

Some of Nietzsche’s unpublished remarks present the notion of eternal recurrence as a cosmological thesis to the effect that time is cyclical, so that everything that has happened will continue to repeat eternally. However, the emphasis within the published works is rather on eternal recurrence as a sort of test of affirmation: the point is to consider how one would react if one learnt that one’s life would repeat eternally—and this is the use of the concept that scholars have for the most part focused on. It is generally agreed that Nietzsche was not claiming that everything will in fact recur eternally.

This notion of eternal recurrence shows up in numerous places in the published works. In the Gay Science, Nietzsche says:

What if some day or night a demon were to steal into your loneliest loneliness and say to you: ‘This life as you now live it and have lived it you will have to live once again and innumerable times again; and there will be nothing new in it, but every pain and every joy and every thought and sigh and everything unspeakably small or great in your life must return to you, all in the same succession and sequence—even this spider and this moonlight between the trees, and even this moment and I myself. […]’ Would you not throw yourself down and gnash your teeth and curse the demon who spoke thus? Or have you once experienced a tremendous moment when you would have answered him: ‘You are a god, and never have I heard anything more divine.’ (The Gay Science, 341)

Eternal recurrence is also the central teaching of the prophet-like figure of Zarathustra in Thus Spoke Zarathustra (compare Nietzsche’s own discussion of Zarathustra in Ecce Homo). However, even Zarathustra himself finds it incredibly difficult to achieve the state of sincerely willing the eternal recurrence. Nietzsche seemed to think that this test of affirmation would be very difficult (perhaps impossible) for people, even truly great individuals, to pass. Nonetheless, this is the state of being that would be genuinely and fully opposed to the life-denying values of morality, and to the nihilism that follows in their wake.

3. References and Further Reading

This article draws primarily on Nietzsche’s published work from the 1880s. References to primary texts within the body of the article are to section numbers rather than page numbers.

a. Primary Texts

  • Daybreak.
  • The Gay Science.
  • Thus Spoke Zarathustra.
  • Beyond Good and Evil.
  • On the Genealogy of Morality.
  • Twilight of the Idols.
  • The Antichrist.
  • Ecce Homo.

b. Secondary Texts

  • Acampora, Christa Davis. “On Sovereignty and Overhumanity: Why It Matters How We Read Nietzsche’s Genealogy II:2.” In Christa Davis Acampora (ed.) Nietzsche’s On the Genealogy of Morals: Critical Essays. Lanham, MD: Rowan & Littlefield, pp. 147–162, 2006
  • Clark, Maudmarie and David Dudrick. The Soul of Nietzche’s Beyond Good and Evil. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2012.
  • Foot, Philippa. “Nietzsche’s Immoralism.” In Richard Schacht (ed.) Nietzsche, Genealogy, Morality: Essays on Nietzsche’s On the Genealogy of Morals. Berkeley: University of California Press, 1994.
  • Foot, Philippa. Natural Goodness, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001.
  • Gemes, Ken. “Nietzsche on Free Will, Autonomy and the Sovereign Individual”. In Ken Gemes and Simon May (eds.) Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy. Oxford, New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 33–50, 2009.
  • Huddleston, Andrew. Nietzsche on the Decadence and Flourishing of Culture. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2019.
  • Hurka, Thomas. “Nietzsche: Perfectionist.” In Brian Leiter and Neil Sinhababu (eds.), Nietzsche and Morality, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 9–31, 2007.
  • Janaway, Christopher. “Nietzsche on Free Will, Autonomy and the Sovereign Individual.” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume 80, pp. 339–357, 2006.
  • Janaway, Christopher. Beyond Selflessness: Reading Nietzsche’s Genealogy. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007
  • Janaway, Christopher. “Nietzsche on Morality, Drives, and Human Greatness.” In Christopher Janaway and Simon Robertson (eds.) Nietzsche, Naturalism, and Normativity. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 183–201, 2012.
  • Katsafanas, Paul. The Nietzschean Self:  Moral Psychology, Agency, and the Unconscious. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2016.
  • Kirwin, Claire. “Pulling Oneself Up by the Hair: Understanding Nietzsche on Freedom.” Inquiry, vol 61, pp. 82-99, 2017.
  • Leiter, Brian. Nietzsche on Morality, Second Edition, Oxford: Routledge, 2015 (First Edition published as Routledge Philosophy Guidebook to Nietzsche on Morality, Routledge, 2002).
  • Leiter, Brian. “Who Is the ‘Sovereign Individual”? Nietzsche on Freedom.” In Simon May (ed.), Nietzsche’s On the Genealogy of Morality: A Critical Guide. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 101–119, 2011.
  • Leiter, Brian. Moral Psychology with Nietzsche, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2019.
  • May, Simon. “Nihilism and the Free Self.” In Ken Gemes and Simon May (eds.) Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy. Oxford, New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 89–106, 2009.
  • May, Simon. (ed.) Nietzsche’s On the Genealogy of Morality: A Critical Guide. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2011.
  • Reginster, Bernard. The Affirmation of Life: Nietzsche on Overcoming Nihilism, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2006.
  • Riccardi, Mattia. Nietzsche’s Philosophical Psychology, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2021.
  • Richardson, John. “Nietzsche’s Freedoms.” In Ken Gemes and Simon May (eds.) Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy. Oxford, New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 127–150, 2009.
  • Ridley, Aaron. “What the Sovereign Individual Promises.” In Ken Gemes and Simon May (eds.) Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy. Oxford, New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 181–196, 2009.
  • Rukgaber, Matthew. “The ‘Sovereign Individual’ and the ‘Ascetic Ideal’: On a Perennial Misreading of the Second Essay of Nietzsche’s On the Genealogy of Morality.” Journal of Nietzsche Studies, Vol. 43 (2), pp. 213–239, 2012.
  • Von Tevenar, Gudrun. “Nietzsche’s Objections to Pity and Compassion.” In Gudrun von Tevenar (ed.) Nietzsche and Ethics. Bern: Peter Land, pp. 263–82, 2007.
  • Williams, Bernard. “Nietzsche on Tragedy, by M. S. Silk and J. P. Stern; Nietzsche: A Critical Life, by Ronald Hayman; Nietzsche, vol. 1, The Will to Power as Art, by Martin Heidegger, translated by David Farrell Krell, London Review of Books (1981).” Reprinted in his Essays and Reviews 1959–2002, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2014.


Author Information

Claire Kirwin
Clemson University
U. S. A.