Non-Cognitivism in Ethics

A non-cognitivist theory of ethics implies that ethical sentences are neither true nor false, that is, they lack truth-values. What this means will be investigated by giving a brief logical-linguistic analysis explaining the different illocutionary senses of normative sentences. The analysis will make sense of how normative sentences play their proper role even though they lack truth values, a fact which is hidden by the ambiguous use of those sentences in our language. The main body of the article explores various non-cognitivist logics of norms from the early attempts by Hare and Stevenson to the more recent ones by A. Gibbard and S. Blackburn. Jorgensen’s Dilemma and the Frege-Geach Problem are two important aspects of this logic of norms. Jorgensen’s Dilemma is the problem in the philosophy of law of inferring normative sentences from normative sentences, which is an apparent problem because inferences are typically understood as involving sentences with truth values. The Frege-Geach Problem is a problem in moral philosophy involving inferences in embedded contexts or in illocutionary mixed sentences. The article ends with a taxonomy of non-cognitivist theories. See also Ethical Expressivism.

Table of Contents

  1. Metaethical assumptions
    1. Different illocutionary acts
    2. Difference between language and metalanguage
    3. Ambiguity of normative sentences
    4. Definitions of ethical non-cognitivism
  2. The problem of a logic of norms
    1. Jorgensen’s dilemma: its importance for non-cognitivism
  3. From earlier non-cognitivism to the “new norm-expressivism”
    1. C. L. Stevenson and the role of persuasion
    2. R. M. Hare and the dictive indifference of logic
    3. The new “norm-expressivism”
  4. The Frege-Geach Problem
    1. Blackburn solutions to the Frege-Geach Problem
    2. Gibbard solution to the Frege-Geach Problem
  5. The significance of the Geach-Frege Problem and Jorgensen’s Dilemma for non-cognitivism
  6. A Taxonomy of Ethics
  7. References and Further Reading

1. Metaethical assumptions

In this section, we will introduce some preliminary linguistic notions that will allow us to give a better account of the cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism divide.

Canonically, forms of language are mainly divided in two species: cognitive sentences (cognitive use of language) and non-cognitive sentences (instrumental use of language). Cognitive sentences are fact-dependent or bear truth-values, while non-cognitive sentences are, on the contrary, fact independent and do not bear truth-values.

Cognitive sentences typically describe states of affairs, such as “The earth is square” or “Schwarzenegger won the last California election;” such sentences are verifiable and can be either true or false. On the other hand, sentences such as “You shall not steal,, “You ought to pay your taxes,” and “Don’t shut the door, please,” do not describe states of affairs nor can be understood as carrying falsehood or truth, but they rather have a different kind of illocutionary force.

a. Different illocutionary acts

Before introducing the notion of illocutionary force, we need to say more about language and its usage. The basic part of a language carrying meaning is called a sentence, such as “The actual king of France is bald” or “Close that door, please!” Thereby, a speaker’s actual empirical performance (here and now) of an actual linguistic expression is not mentioned. We are rather referring to a class including all the possible empirical performances made by a possible speaker in any language and in any occurrence of that determined expression. On the other hand, propositions are the meaning of sentences: they are true or false, they can be known, believed or doubted and, finally, they are kept constant in respect of their translation from a language to another (Lyons, 1995, p. 141).

The same proposition may be used in different occurrences for doing different things. In other words, the same proposition can be used for asserting, questioning, asking, demanding and so on. A sentence, therefore, can be understood as an illocutionary act. The general form of illocutionary acts, according to Searle, is:


where “F” stands for any indicator of illocutionary force, and “p” takes expressions for propositions. In this way, we can symbolize different kinds of illocutionary acts such as assertions:

├ p      such as in “You are going to shut the door”


!p        such as in “Shut the door!”

or questions:

?p        such as in “Are you going to shut the door?”

According to Reichenbach (1947, p. 337), illocutionary acts are not true or false. They are indeed instruments constructed with the help of propositions, and therefore they belong to language; this is what distinguishes them from other instruments devised to reach a certain aim. We can distinguish two – not necessarily separated – elements within an illocutionary act, namely the propositional indicator (p) and the indicator of illocutionary force (F). What is called propositional content (or proposition, or radical-proposition) is symbolized with “p” and it is the invariant ingredient in an illocutionary act (in our example above is: “your going to shut the door” or the possible state of affair “you are going to shut the door”). Indeed, it describes the “descriptive content” of a sentence; or, in other words, it stands for a possible state of affair containing meaning and, consequently, having truth-values.

On the contrary, illocutionary acts show the way a proposition is used or what illocutionary force the sentence belongs to. Therefore, illocutionary force has no semantic meaning whatsoever and so it does not form part, for example, of the conceptual amount of a norm sentence. Importantly, illocutionary forces are not alethic modalities-like (such as “is necessary that”); they are not like intensional operators and therefore they cannot be used for creating propositions starting from propositions. For this reason Frege’s Rule states signs of illocutionary force cannot (a) being iterated and (b) fall under the range of propositional connectives.

Finally, the illocutionary dimension has a perlocutionary element attached. According to Levinson (1983, p. 237), a perlocutionary act is specific to the circumstances of issuance and is therefore not conventionally achieved just by uttering that particular utterance, and includes all those effects, intended or unintended, often indeterminate, that some particular utterance in a particular situation may cause. The main difference between a perlocutionary act and an illocutionary act stands on the fact that the former has a conventional nature, as it can be represented in explicit form using the performative formula; this conventional nature does not apply to perlocutionary act. In the following, we will see the importance of perlocutionary acts within the emotive theories of ethics, which represent a kind of non-cognitivist theory.

b. Difference between language and metalanguage

Another fundamental notion to understand is considering the difference between cognitivism and non-cognitivism concerns a linguistic difference between language and meta-language. This distinction makes clear another problematic feature intrinsic to the ordinary use of natural languages such as the ambiguity of normative sentences and prescriptions. Often non-cognitivist positions are confused with relativistic positions because of the shift from the object language into the meta-language. When we say, “Hitler was a bad leader,” we are uttering a normative sentence. When we say, “Winston said Hitler was a bad leader” we are not uttering a normative although relativistic sentence. Rather we are moving from the object-language (that is the sentence “Hitler was a bad leader”) to a meta-linguistic one (that is “Winston said Hitler was a bad leader”) which is typically a descriptive sentence (taken as a whole) talking about a normative sentence (that is: “Hitler was a bad leader”). There is no room for relativism here: the latter is not a moral sentence but simply a descriptive sentence (or, following Max Weber, a sociological sentence), which, according to B. Russell (1935, p. 214-215), belongs to psychology or biography. An important feature of descriptive sentences holds that “The descriptive sentences of obligation and permission are relative in a sense in which the prescriptive sentences are not”; they always refer to the utterer/authority of that sentence (that in our case is Winston): “conceptually, the reference to the authority is necessary to identify the normative proposition [that is “Hitler was a bad leader”] expressed by a normative sentence used in a descriptive way” (Alchourrón, 1993)

c. Ambiguity of normative sentences

Notice that normative sentences are ambiguous; they can be uttered both in descriptive and in normative ways at the level of common language. In other words, the same normative sentence can be used either to perform prescriptions as well as to describe that a particular norm exists. Jeremy Bentham (1970, p. 104; Bentham, 1789, chap. XVII, § XXIX n.1; see Alchourron and Bulygin, 1989 and Bulygin, 1982) was intuitively aware of ambiguity in normative sentences. In fact, this semantical shift is due to a peculiar capacity of natural languages to mix up the language level with meta-language level to the extent in which we cannot appreciate any difference between them when using ordinary language. According to Bentham, on the contrary, such a linguistic difference should be clear; in fact he pointed out that “The property and very essence of law, it may be said, is to command; the language of the law then should be the language of command. For expressing commands there is in all languages a particular mood, which is styled the imperative” (Bentham, 1970, p. 105). Bentham also argues that “There is still enough that serves, and that as effectually as in the other case, to distinguish the imperative from the ordinary didactic, narrative, informative or assertive style: the language of the will from the language of the understanding” (ibid.). This distinction is very important in the practice of law and in the field of ethics because “What is been termed a declaratory law, so far as it stands distinguished from either a coercive or a discoercive law, is not properly speaking a law. It is not the expression of an act of will exercised at the time: it is a mere notification of the existence of a law, either of the coercive or the discoercive kind, as already subsisting; of the existence of some document expressive of some act of will, exercised, not at the time, but at some former period” (Bentham, 1789, p.).

More recently, von Wright made that intuition more precise, explaining, “Tokens of the same sentences are used, sometimes to enunciate a prescription (that is, to enjoin, permit, or prohibit a certain action), sometimes again to express a proposition to the effect that there is a prescription enjoining, or permitting or prohibiting a certain action. Such propositions are called norm-propositions [or descriptive sentences of norms]” (von Wright, 1963, p. viii). Norms “should be carefully distinguished from ‘normative propositions’, i.e. descriptive propositions stating that ‘p’ is obligatory (forbidden or permitted) according to some unspecified norm or set of norms. Normative propositions – which can be regarded as propositions about sets (systems) of norms – also contain normative terms like ‘obligatory’, ‘prohibited’, etc. but these have a purely descriptive meaning” (Alchourrón e Bulygin, 1981).

The most influential analysis on the nature of normative sentences (especially in the field of philosophy of law) was carried out by Hans Kelsen (especially in Kelsen, 1941).

d. Definitions of ethical non-cognitivism

Ethical non-cognitivism claims that prescriptions have a different nature than descriptive sentences; they have no truth-values, they are not describing anything, and they have a different illocutionary role. That is to say, they do not express factual claims or beliefs and therefore are neither true nor false (they are not truth-apt); they belong to a different illocutionary force, the prescriptive mood.

These theories, as opposed to cognitivist theories, are not holding that ethical sentences are objectively and consistently true or false, neither even presupposing new entities platonic-like (in the way naturalistic theories do), and therefore they do not need to explain the way in which we can epistemically access these theories (see Blackburn, 1984, p. 169 and Hale, 1993). In other words, non-cognitivism claims that the principal feature of normative sentences (their lacking of truth values) is a consequence of the illocutionary role of such sentences. In fact, these sentences are not bearing any cognitive meaning (such as assertions or descriptions), but they are just used to utter prescriptions.

Therefore, cognitivist theories reject three traditional theses: (1) Hume’s Law (that is the claims that a moral conclusion cannot be validly inferred from non-moral premises), as some cognitivist theories suppress the distinction between cognitive and normative sentences; (2) Ockham’s Razor, because some of cognitivist theories do multiply entities without necessity, as they presuppose a (platonic) realm of norms; and (3) Jorgensen’s Dilemma (see below).

Non-cognitivist theories do not infringe Ockham’s Razor as they are not implying any platonic entity (we saw the difference between normative sentences and descriptive sentences is just at the illocutionary level) and they accept the challenge of Hume’s Law.

We can find two main theories within noncognitivism: emotivism and prescriptivism. These two theories, often confused, need to be carefully distinguished. Indeed emotivism and prescriptivism are different for two main reasons; for emotivists a normative sentence is basically a sentence which expresses a speaker’s feeling (such as “Gasp!”). For prescriptivists a normative sentence is used for uttering overriding universalizable prescriptions (such us: “You shalt not steal!”). Another difference between those two theories is about the possibility of a genuine logic of norms. Emotivists, at least in classical formulations (from Ayer to Stevenson) claim a logic of norms is very problematic or even impossible to build: while for prescriptivists (in particular in Hare’s theory or in von Wright’s works) the possibility for a logic of norms is open, although problematic.

2. The problem of a logic of norms

The main challenge non-cognitivist theories face is about the possibility of a logic of norms. Cognitivist theories are not facing this dilemma as they claim there is no difference between normative and descriptive sentences; therefore the classic logic based on truth-values is sufficient for normative reasoning. What about norms lacking truth-values?

The problem of a logic of norms is a vexata quaestio that dates back, in modern times, to Language, Truth and Logic by A.J. Ayer (1936). Ayer claimed that ethical sentences are pseudo concepts aimed at expressing emotions or commands having no real meaning. The only purpose of ethical sentences is to persuade the listener to act in a certain way. In other words, ethical sentences have only a perlocutory function. Therefore it is no possible to talk about disagreement and unsoundness in ethics; neither is it possible to speak about ethical reasoning because ethical sentences such as “parsimony is a virtue” and “parsimony is a vice” are not expressing propositions (that is are not true or false). Thus they can’t be incompatible. On the other hand, Ayer acknowledged that people do discuss about questions regarding values, but they are not actually ethical dilemmas involving values but factual questions. In fact, people, according to Ayer, reason about empirical facts on which state of affairs to perform and not about agreeing on an ethical belief.

According to M. Warnock (1978) Ayer’s is a negative theory of ethics because it lacks of meaning and scientific basis. The last word in ethics is rather ideological, that is to state the superiority of a moral system over another. Ayer’s skeptical conclusion is a consequence of the linguistic model he adopted (that is basically Wittgenstein’s Tractatus picture-theory, 1922). In fact, Ayer is not able (at least in Language Truth and Logic) to distinguish in normative sentences between an emotive (perlocutionary) part and a descriptive (meaning) part. The distinction is necessary to give ethics its full significance back.

Two years after Ayer’s Language, Truth and Logic, another author dealt with the problem of the foundation of a logic of norms. Jorgen Jorgensen (in “Imperativer og Logik”, 1937-38) claimed that “any imperative sentences may be considered as containing two factors which I may call the imperative factor and the indicative factor, the first indicating that some thing is commanded or wished and the latter describing what it is that is commanded or wished.” In an actual sentence it is not possible to distinguish between those two factors because a command void of content is impossible; but the indicative factor can be kept apart from the imperative mood and it can be used to express indicative sentences describing the action, changes or state of affairs which can be ordered or wished. For example, in the imperative “Close the door!” somebody is ordering that a door be closed. The order is that the proposition “the door once open is now closed” be true. Methodologically, Jorgensen was in line with the modern distinction in sentences between illocutionary force and propositional content (see i.e. Searle, 1969).

Jorgensen concluded, “it seems to be a syntactical rule that from an imperative sentence of the form “Do so and so,” an indicative sentence of the form “This is so and so” may be derived.” In other words, Jorgensen claimed imperative sentences can be transformed in indicative sentences in two ways: (1) the imperative factor is put outside the brackets much as the assertion sign in the ordinary logic and the logical operations are only performed within the brackets; or (2) for each imperative sentences there is an equivalent indicative sentence which is derived from the former. This derived indicative sentence applies to the rules of classical logic and thereby indirectly applies the rules of logic to the imperative sentences so that entailments of the latter may be made explicit.

Jorgensen’s first solution acknowledges the application of logic only within the propositional content (or indicative factor) without using the normative (or imperative) constituent. This solution is very similar to R.M. Hare’s dictive indifference of logic (Hare, 1949 and 1952) in which, we will see, logic is valid only at the phrastics level. Jorgensen’s second solution, on the other hand, seems to propose that normative sentences and descriptive sentences are linked through an isomorphic relation; that is prescriptions hold as the same logical rules as their descriptive counterparts. G.H. von Wright (1963) will successively explore this solution. Therefore Jorgensen, differently from Ayer, moved to an idea of ethics, which is called moderate emotivism close to Stevenson’s (1944) and Hare’s (1949). In fact, Jorgensen acknowledges a descriptive component within prescriptive sentences and also he thinks that it is possible to apply logic to norms.

a. Jorgensen’s dilemma: its importance for non-cognitivism

More importantly, Jorgensen proposed the so-called Jorgensen’s Dilemma, which is the first attempt to analyze the problem of the inference of norms (prescriptive sentences) from norms (prescriptive sentences) moving from the point that norms (prescriptive sentences) are lacking of truth-values. In fact, Jorgensen analyzes this problem moving from the so-called Poincare’s argument (a variant of Hume’s Law) in which is studied the role of logical inference into prescriptive contexts (that are lacking of truth-values). Jorgensen still thinks logical inference is a concept linked to a classical idea of logic, where an inference is when we get true conclusions starting from true premises. However Jorgensen noticed that in ordinary normative reasoning we perform inferences can be accepted as true; such as:

1.Keep your promises
2.This is a promise of yours
├ Therefore, keep this promise

Where at least one of the premises (in our case the premise 1.) is prescriptive. Hence, Jorgensen finds himself in front of the following “puzzle”:

“According to a generally accepted definition of logical inferences only sentences which are capable of being true or false can function as premises or conclusion in a inference; nevertheless it seems evident that a conclusion in the imperative mood may be drawn from two premises one of which or both of which are in the imperative mood” (Jorgensen, 1937-38).

There are two ways to explain this phenomenon: widening the notion of logic inference beyond the “mere” sphere of truth, or bypassing this distinction by using descriptive sentences equivalent to prescriptive sentences and applying them to the classical notion of logic inference. Otherwise it is not possible to apply the notion of logical inference to norms: any normative discourse turns to be illogical (as Ayer claimed).

The essence of the challenge of non-cognitivism is therefore expressed: how is possible to apply the notion of logical inference whatsoever to the realm of sentences lacking of truth-values?

3. From earlier non-cognitivism to the “new norm-expressivism”

If we believe norms are lacking of truth-values but a logic of norms is possible, we are thinking about an objectivist and non-cognitivist theory of norms, such as Hare’s; while if we believe that logical inference cannot be applied to sentences lacking of truth-values, therefore we have a non-cognitivist and subjectivist theory of norms, such as Ayer’s.

a. C. L. Stevenson and the role of persuasion

C. L. Stevenson (1944) developed another non-cognitivist and subjectivist theory of norms. Stevenson acknowledges that in moral sentences there is a descriptive component, which has no cognitive function but rather a quasi-imperative force which, operating through suggestion and intensified by your tone of voice, readily permits you to begin to influence or to modify another person’s behavior. Therefore, according to Stevenson, ethical terms are instruments used in a cooperative enterprise that leads to a mutual readjustment of human interest. So, when using ethical sentences, we are not using logical inference, but, actually, we are using methods of persuasion. According to Hare (1987), Stevenson treated what were perlocutionary features of moral language as if they were constitutive of its meaning, and as a result became an irrationalist, because perlocutionary acts are not subject to logical rules.

b. R. M. Hare and the dictive indifference of logic

According to Hare, normative sentences are characterized by three ingredients: prescriptivity, universalizability and overridingness/supervenience; these three ingredients are logical characteristics of normative sentences by virtue of their meaning (Hare, 1989).

According to Hare, moral sentences are prescriptions that are sentences used for guiding an action or to reply at the question: “What shall I do?” (Hare, 1952). In other words, an indicative (or descriptive) sentence is used for telling someone that something is the case; an imperative is not about that – it is used for telling someone to make something the case (ibid.). Differently from emotive theories (such as Stevenson’s), Hare claims that telling someone to make something the case implies a persuasive process from the speaker to the listener. Emotive theories, according to Hare, judge the success of imperative solely by their effects, that is, by whether the person believes or does what we are trying to get him or her to believe or do. It does not matter whether the means used to persuade him are fair or foul, so long as they persuade him/her. Persuasions imply a lack of rationality by moral theories; therefore using persuasion does not mean rationally replying to the question “What shall I do?”, but rather it is an attempt to answer the question in a particular way.

Universalizability is a feature moral sentences share with descriptions, but, according to Hare still is a logic component of neustics (Hare’s term for descriptive component of a sentence). Roughly speaking it means that terms like “ought” and “must” are similar to words like “all” rather than “red” or “blue”. In other words, normative concepts have to be compared to logical operators (such as “all” or “some” or “It is necessary that”) and not to predicates (see Hare, 1963 and 1967). Moreover, the rules that define their logical behavior make them universalizable. Another interpretation of the thesis of Universalizability claims that Universalizability is not about the way moral terms function, but it is a principle (axiom) which is part of any possible normative system as such (see Hare, 1982). In other words, Universalizability is similar to the “Golden Rule” (“Treat others only in a way that you’re willing to be treated in the same situation”) or to impartiality, rather than an actual formal axiom in a ethical system. This thesis has been attacked by several authors such as A. MacIntyre (1957), B. Williams (1985) and M. Singer (1985). All those scholars agree that actually there are several levels of universalizability which Hare’s monolithical formulation would melt. Particularly, MacIntyre argues that Hare does not make clear between “generality” (that is general principles) and “universality” (universal principles).

Supervenience is a feature moral sentences share with descriptions too. This issue is discussed also in the philosophy of mind. In moral philosophy, the issue of supervenience concerns the relationship which is said to hold between moral properties and natural or non-moral properties. Alternatively, it is put forward as a claim about a certain feature of moral terms or moral predicates. When it is said of “trust” that it is, say, good, “trust” is good because or in virtue of some subjacent or underlying property of it. Generally, it is held that these subjacent properties are natural properties of “trust”.

For Hare overridingness is a feature, not just of evaluative words, properties, or judgments, but of the wider class of judgments which have to have, at least in some minimal sense, reasons or grounds of explanations (Hare, 1989). Basically, Hare believes that overridingness and universalizability are similar concepts in that both involve a universal premise such as in the Golden Rule.

From a logical-linguistic point of view, Hare distinguishes in a sentence between a phrastic and a neustic:

“I shall call the part of the sentence that is common to [assertive and imperative] moods (…) the phrastic; and the part different in the case of commands and sentences (…) the neustic” (Hare, 1952).

Roughly speaking, a phrastic is that component in the sentence we called the descriptive component above, and a neustic is the illocutionary part in a sentence. According to Hare, logical connectives are part of phrastics; combinations of those connectives are able to create, are valid in the case we deal with normative sentences as well as we deal with descriptive sentences. It is, indeed, the proper function of these connectives to establish relations between sentences; in other words, the validity of a reasoning depends upon the logical links subsisting among phrastics. Hare’s thesis is called “dictive indifference of logic”: “we shall see (…) that these connectives are all descriptive and not dictive. In fact, it is the descriptive part of sentences with which formal logicians are almost exclusively concerned; and this means that what they say applied as much to imperatives as to indicatives; for to any descriptor (or phrastic) we can add either kind of dictor (or neustic), and get a sentence” (Hare, 1949). Therefore no difference will subsist between a logic of imperatives and a logic of assertions: “The method of reasoning used in (…) [imperative] inferences is, of course, exactly which is used in indicative logic: these considerations in no way support that there can be a separate ‘Logic of Imperatives’, but only that imperatives are logical in the same way as indicatives” (Ibid.). Phrastics, indeed, are the same in imperatives and assertions, and we can assert “that any formula of formal logic which is capable of an indicative interpretation is capable also of an imperative one,” that is, we can substitute an indicative neustic with an imperative one, leaving the phrastic unchanged (Ibid.).

c. The new “norm-expressivism”

Starting from the 80s there was a renewal of analysis of morals in an emotivist key. These analyses were made by Simon Blackburn and by Allan Gibbard. In their work the emotive theory of morals is revised and enriched even accepting room for a logic of norms (in opposition to what happened in the earlier emotive theories, such as Stevenson’s).

Blackburn’s quasi-realism (1984) moves from the actual practice in the ordinary language to express itself in a realistic way even when uttering moral sentences. Blackburn claims that practice is to be, so to speak, the way we made projections of our attitudes onto the world; in Blackburn’s own words, “we say we project an attitude or habit, or other commitment which is not descriptive onto the world, when we speak and think as though there were a property of things which our saying describe, which we can reason about, know about, be wrong about and so on” (Blackburn, ibid.).

Blackburn, on one hand, rehabilitates emotive theories of morals and, on the other hand, says – contrary to Mackie’s error theory – our use of realist terminology is respectable and not in contract with its projective origin. We will see in the next section how Blackburn can make room for a logic of norms.

Gibbard’s (1990) central concept is the idea that calling something rational is to express one’s acceptance of norms that permits it. It applies to the rationality of actions, and it applied to the rationality of beliefs and feelings (ibid.). For Gibbard, cognitive analyses fail to recognize that judging a behavior as rational means to endorse it; even classical non-cognitivist analyses fails this point as they admit that moral judgment are not feelings, but judgments of what moral feelings it is rational to have. Feelings we think, can be apt or not, moral judgments are judgments of when guilt and resentment are apt.

The primary function of norms (which Gibbard justifies on evolutionary basis) is to facilitate the social cooperation, and while true factual sentences are coupled with world representations, normative ones have the function of making social cooperation stable, and not linked to environmental and social changes. Gibbard’s theory is a non-cognitivist but naturalistic one, which is necessary to give an account of rationality in terms of accepting a norm which is, in its turn, a standard for rationality of actions; on the contrary it would turn in a vicious circle.

Norms rule everybody’s feelings and actions and they are the main component of a moral judgment; to judging an action as wrong, in Gibbard’s terms, it means that an actor’s feelings of guilt and judging people’s anger are apt feelings. Of course, these will be changing from culture to culture. Finally, Gibbard suggests that normative judgments – because their social function – commit us to adopt higher level norms to encourage social cooperation.

Gibbard’s key concept is “accepting a norm” which is to justify on a psychological theory of meaning in a similar way to Stevenson’s theory. For Gibbard, a norm is a significant kind of a psychological state of the mind, which is not fully understandable for us. Therefore, Gibbard’s theory rests on an ambiguity; on one hand, value judgments are lacking of truth-values, but on the other hand, they express the existence of someone’s mental states.

4. The Frege-Geach Problem

The Frege-Geach problem (also known as the “embedding problem”) is used as the main “test” to understand rationality in non-cognitivist theories. The problem was posed in P. Geach’s article “Assertion” (Geach, 1964), but the discussion starts back from Geach’s article “Imperatives and Deontic Logic” (Geach, 1958). In particular, Geach used his own test to attack non-cognitivist claims; in fact, if we find a positive solution to the Geach-Frege Problem we are de facto giving significance to non-cognitivist moral reasoning. On the contrary, if no solution to the problem is provided, the only option left open to moral reasoning is cognitivism or excluding ethics into the realm of rationality (likewise radical forms of emotivism such as Ayer).

Briefly, the Frege-Geach problem is that sentences that express moral judgments can form part of semantically complex sentences in a way that an expressivist cannot easily explain. According to Geach, the sentence “Telling the lies is wrong” has the same meaning regardless of whether it occurs on its own or as the antecedent of “If telling the lies is wrong, then getting your little brother to tell lies is also wrong”. This must be so, since we may derive “Telling your little brother to tell lies is wrong” from them and both by modus ponens without any fallacy of equivocation. Yet nothing is expressed (in the relevant sense) by “Telling lies is wrong” when it forms the antecedent of the conditional, since the antecedent is not itself the same illocutionary force as the premise, and so its meaning (regardless of where it occurs) apparently cannot be explained by an expressivist analysis. Analogous problems within other kinds of embedded contexts (Unwin, 1999).

However, Geach recommends attention to Frege’s distinction between assertion and predication, or in other words, between illocutionary force and propositional content, respectively. In fact, if we assume the role of the illocutionary force, there would be a slight change in the meaning of the word “wrong” in the antecedent of the conditional “If telling the lies is wrong, then getting your little brother to tell lies is also wrong” and in its occurrence as consequence in the same conditional sentence. This problem is even clearer using modus ponens:

1. If tormenting the cat is wrong, then getting your little brother to torment the cat is also wrong
2. Tormenting the cat is wrong
Therefore, getting your little brother to torment the cat is wrong.

In the case above it is difficult to say that the occurrence of “wrong” as antecedent of the 1st conditional (which appears to be descriptive) has exactly the same meaning as “wrong” in the 2nd sentence (which appears to be normative).

We saw non-cognitivism is characterized by the assumption that norms lack truth-values. Yet, the contexts introduced by ordinary logic operators such as “and”, “not”, “or”, “if… then”, and the quantifiers, together with predication itself, are normally explicated in terms of the more basic semantic concepts of truth. Therefore, it seems that this option is not available to non-cognitivists, in general, and in particular to expressivists.

a. Blackburn solutions to the Frege-Geach Problem

S. Blackburn (1984) redefines the Frege-Geach Problem in terms of whether expressive theories can cope with unasserted contexts in such a way as to allow sentences the same meaning within them, as they have when they are asserted. According to Blackburn, we use evaluative sentences as if they were not different from assertions (because of our projective attitude), and, therefore, we intuitively treat them as if they were bearing truth-values and linked to descriptive sentences.

The problem will be about the interpretation of connectives to be used to build up more complex commitments having in their own several illocutionary characteristics (such as in a conditional). Blackburn suggests commitments are used to create more complex sentences which is accepted only if all its parts are accepted, according to the following solution: “the notion of commitment is then capacious enough to include both ordinary beliefs, and these other attitudes, habits and prescriptions” (Blackburn, ibid., p. 192). Therefore a conditional will express someone’s endorsement to an attitude (which is an expression of a moral standpoint, too) preceded by a belief. In other words, it expresses a higher-order attitude, that is, an expression of disapproval or approval toward a combination of attitudes (such as of lying). Conditionals, as they are used in ordinary language, show the way we express an endorsement over involvement of commitments – which is expression of a moral standpoint. In other words, we can see that using conditional forms (in normative contexts) is a higher level form (compared to simple sentences like “it’s wrong telling lies”) which serves to express one’s attitudes on attitudes, or meta-attitudes.

Blackburn introduces these kinds of sentences formally in the following way:

(a) H! (B!p → B!q)

Where H! stands for the “Hooray” operator (expressive counterpart of the deontic operator “O” – for obligation), B! is the “Booh” operator (expressive equivalent to the deontic “F” – for forbidden). What appears between slashes shows that our argument is an attitude or a belief, which express a first order attitude (such as “The playing for West Ham is wrong”).

The main limit of Blackburn’s solution of the Frege-Geach problem concerns the nature of the H! and B! operators, while iterated in a higher order sentence. Blackburn’s formulation does not make clear the illocutionary role of the operator. If we interpret all the operators in the formula (a) in an expressive (or prescriptive) way, (that is lacking of truth-values), the whole expression will not make sense. According to Barcan Marcus (1966), iteration of normative operators looks like stammering. Otherwise. if we interpret (according to Blackburn) the external operator H! in an expressive (or prescriptive) way and those into the slashes as descriptive ones, we will have a correct way of interpreting operators but no solution to the Frege-Geach problem. The formula (a) above, indeed, is formally correct but does not solve the problem about the identity of meaning for example between the antecedent of the 1st conditional in the Modus Ponens shown above (which is descriptive) and its 2nd sentence (which is normative).

b. Gibbard solution to the Frege-Geach Problem

Gibbard tries to solve the Frege-Geach problem using a slightly modified version of possible worlds semantics that he labeled as “factual-normative worlds”. Factual-normative worlds are an ordered pair where “w” is a possible world (or a set of facts) and “n” is a complete system of general norms. The pair constitutes a creedal-normative state completely opinionated (Gibbard, 1990, p. 95).

According to Gibbard, any particular normative judgment holds or not, as a matter of logic, in the factual-normative world . That is, the pair is a set of sound and complete norms where, for each possible human behavior, we can state the normative status (Forbidden, Obligatory or Indifferent) associated with it. In this way each individual can understand the normative qualification of his or her action.

Consider a human observer who is uncertain both factually and normatively. When the observer will think about the rightness of a normative judgment, she or he will rule out any possible action which is not included into a set constituted by all the factual elements and all the normative elements in which that normative judgment is valid. Let’s take for instance, the modus ponens above:

1. If tormenting the cat is wrong, then getting your little brother to torment the cat is also wrong
2. Tormenting the cat is wrong
Therefore, getting your little brother to torment the cat is wrong.

The first premise rules out all the combinations in which it is not wrong to get your little brother to tell lies. The second premise rules out the set of combination between norms and facts in which is wrong to torment the cat. Therefore both premises together rules out the whole set of norms and facts in which it is not wrong to get your little brother to torment the cat; including any combination that the conclusion rules out.

What does it mean for a sentence to be valid in a particular factual-normative world? According to Gibbard it means that for each sentence containing a normative predicate there is a n-corresponding descriptive version which makes a normative predicate (such as “rational”) refer to a particular set of norms (that is “rational” according to the system n). Hence, Gibbard concludes, for any logically complex sentence S containing normative predicates in embedded contexts, we may construct the descriptive sentence Sn that arises from replacing all normative predicates in S by their n-corresponding version. Therefore we can operate with embedded contexts saying the sentence S holds in if and only if Sn holds in a possible world .

Actually Gibbard’s solution to the Geach-Frege problem is rather a bypass method to avoid the problem because he explains the functioning of normative language by means of descriptive language and semantical models. According to Sinnot-Armstrong’s criticism (1993), Gibbard’s analysis appears to be compatible with a realist view on norms because of his ambiguous use of normative judgment (which is a state of mind) and his use of possible world semantics.

5. The significance of the Geach-Frege Problem and Jorgensen’s Dilemma for non-cognitivism

The Geach-Frege problems and Jorgensen’s Dilemma are faces of the same coin. The first deals with the problem of mixed, or embedded, contexts (normative and descriptive) and how it is possible to deal with mixed sentences. The main problem here is the interpretation of connectives and logical operators in contexts that are partially lacking truth-values.

Jorgensen’s Dilemma, on the other hand, deals with making inferences between norms, that is, sentences that are lacking of truth-values, and to create a logical foundation that makes sense of inferences between norms we actually find sound in the everyday discourse. The Jorgensen’s Dilemma also tries to explain the very nature lying behind moral disagreements and the way we can rationally deliberate on them.

Both are questions involving the different illocutionary role of normative/expressive sentences and their solution represents a challenge to non-cognitivism. A positive solution to both challenges would open a room to the rationality of non-cognitive discourse in ethics. On the contrary, a negative one would show that the only option for rationalism in ethics is cognitivism or — in the worst case scenario — to irrationality and ethical nihilism.

Finally it is worth notice that while both cover a similar perspective, the Frege-Geach problem is more popular in moral philosophy, whereas Jorgensen’s Dilemma is more popular in the philosophy of law. It is difficult to understand the reasons for that different interest. We can only guess that it was because the analysis of sentences in terms of the Frege-Reichenbach model was popular among moral philosophers while it was virtually unknown (until the works by Alchourron and Bulygin, 1971) among philosophers of law.

6. A Taxonomy of Ethics

The following scheme is a development from R. M. Hare’s A Taxonomy of Ethical Theories (Hare, 1997, p. 42)

Descriptivism: Meanings of moral sentences are wholly determined by syntax and truth conditions.

Naturalism: Truth conditions of moral sentences are non-moral properties.

Objectivistic naturalism: These properties are objective.

Subjective naturalism: These properties are subjective.

Intuitionism: Truth conditions of moral sentences are sui generis moral properties.

Non-descriptivism: Meanings of moral sentences are not wholly determined by syntax and truth conditions.

Emotivism: Moral sentences are not governed by logic.

Rationalistic non-descriptivism: Moral sentences are governed by logic.

Universal prescriptivism: The logic, which governs moral sentences, is the logic of universal prescriptions.

Expressivism: The moral sentences are about beliefs and/or commitments; their logic is different from the logic of descriptive sentences.

7. References and Further Reading

  • Alchourrón, 1993: “Philosophical Foundations of Deontic Logic and the Logic of Defeasible Conditionals”, in Meyer e Wieringa (1993), Deontic Logic in Computer Science, Chichester, Wiley, pp.43-84.
  • Alchourrón, C. E. and Bulygin, E. (1981): “The Expressive Conception of Norms”, in Hilpinen, H. (ed.) (1981), New Essays in Deontic Logic, Dordrecht, D. Reidel, pp. 95-124
  • Alchourrón, C. E. and Bulygin, E. (1989): “Limits of Logic and Legal Reasoning”, in Martino, A.A. (ed.) (1989), Deontic Logic, Computational Linguistics and Legal Information Systems, Amsterdam, North-Holland, pp. 1-20.
  • Ayer, A. J. (1936): Language, Truth and Logic, London, Gollancz
  • Bentham, J. (1789): An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation, eds. Burns, J.H. and Hart, H.L.A., London, Athlone Press, 1970
  • Bentham, J. (1970): Of Laws in General, ed. Hart, H.L.A., London, Athlone Press, 1970.
  • Blackburn, S. (1984): Spreading the Word, Oxford, Clarendon.
  • Bulygin, E. (1982): “Norms, normative propositions and legal statements”, in Floistad, G. (ed.), Contemporary Philosophy A New Survey, The Hague, M. Nijhoff, pp. 157-163; rist. in Alchourron e Bulygin (1991), pp. 215-238.
  • Geach, P. T., (1958): “Imperative and Deontic Logic”, Analysis, 18, 3, pp. 49-56.
  • Geach, P. (1964): “Assertion”, Philosophical Review, 74, pp. 449-465
  • Gibbard, A. (1990): Wise Choices, Apt Feelings. A Theory of Normative Judgement, Oxford, Clarendon Press
  • Hale, B., (1993): “Can There Be a Logic of Attitudes?”, in Haldane, J., e Wright, C, (eds.) (1995), pp. 337-363
  • Hare, R. M. (1949): Imperatives Sentences, in Mind, LVIII;  in Hare (1971), pp.1-21.
  • Hare, R. M. (1952): The Language of Morals, Clarendon, Oxford.. Hare, R.M. (1963): Freedom and Reason, Oxford, Oxford U.P.
  • Hare, R. M. (1967): “Some Alleged Differences between Imperatives and Indicatives”, in Mind, LXXVI
  • Hare R. M. (1982): Moral Thinkings: Its Levels, Methods and Point, Oxford, Oxford U.P
  • Hare R. M. (1989): Essays in Ethical Theory, Oxford, Oxford U.P.
  • Hare R. M. (1997):Sorting Out Ethics, Oxford, O.U.P.
  • Jørgensen, J. (1937-38): “Imperatives and Logic”, in Erkenntnis, 7, pp. 288-296
  • Kelsen, H. (1941): “The Pure Theory of Law and Analytical Jurisprudence”, in Harvard Law Review, 60, pp. 44-70
  • Levinson, S. C. (1983): Pragmatics. Cambridge, Cambridge U.P.
  • Lyons, J. (1995): Linguistic Semantics. An Introduction, Cambridge, Cambridge U.P.
  • MacIntyre, A. (1957): “What Morality is Not”, Philosophia, XXXII (123), pp. 325-335.
  • Marcus, B. (1966): “Iterated Deontic Modalities”, Mind, 75, pp. 580-582.
  • Reichenbach, H (1947): Elements of Symbolic Logic, New York, McMillan
  • Russell, B. (1935): Religion and Science, Oxford U.P.
  • Searle, J.R. (1969): Speech Acts. An Essay in the Philosophy of Language, London, O.U.P.
  • Singer, M. (1985): “The Generalization Principle”, in Potter, N.T. e Simmons M. (eds.) Morality and Universality, Boston, Dordrecht, pp. 47-73.
  • Sinnott-Armstrong, W. (1993): “Some problems for Gibbard’s norm-expressivism”, Philosophical Studies, pp. 297-313.
  • Stevenson, C.L. (1944): Ethics and Language, New Haven, Yale U.P
  • Unwin, N. (1999): “Norms and Negation: A Problem for Gibbard’s Logic”, The Philosophical Quarterly, 51(202), pp.60-75
  • von Wright, G. H. (1963): Norm and Action. A Logical Inquiry, London, Routledge & Kegan Paul
  • Warnock, M. (1978): Ethics since 1900, Oxford, Oxford U.P.,
  • Williams, B. A. O. (1985): Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy, Cambridge (Mass.), Cambridge U.P.

Author Information

Antonio Marturano
University of Exeter
United Kingdom