Paradox of Hedonism
Varieties of hedonism have been criticized from ancient to modern times. Along the way, philosophers have also considered the paradox of hedonism. The paradox is a common objection to hedonism, even if they often do not give that specific name to the objection. According to the paradox of hedonism, the pursuit of pleasure is self-defeating. This article examines this objection. There are several ambiguities that surround the use of this paradox, so first, a condensed conceptual history of the paradox of hedonism is presented. Second, it is explained that prudential hedonism is the best target of the paradox, and this is made clear by considering different hedonistic theories and meanings of the word hedonism. Third, it is claimed that the overly conscious pursuit of pleasure, instead of other definitions that emerge from the literature, best captures the kind of pursuit that might generate paradoxical effects. Fourth, there is a discussion on the implications of prudential hedonism. Fifth, different explanations of the paradox that can be traced in the literature are analysed, and the incompetence account is identified as the most plausible. Sixth, the implications of prudential hedonism are discussed. Finally, it is concluded that no version of the paradox provides a convincing objection against prudential hedonism.
Table of Contents
- Condensed Conceptual History
- Paradoxes of Hedonism
- Isolating the Paradox of Hedonism
- Defining the Paradox
- Explanations of the Paradox
- Concluding Remarks
- References and Further Reading
“I can’t get no satisfaction. ‘Cause I try, and I try, and I try, and I try.” (The Rolling Stones)
These lyrics evoke the so-called paradox of hedonism that it leads to reduced pleasure. The worry the paradox generates for hedonistic theories is that they appear to be self-defeating. That is, if we pursue the goal of this theory, we are less likely to achieve it. For example, Crisp states, “one will gain more enjoyment by trying to do something other than to enjoy oneself.” Veenhoven attests that this paradox strikes at the heart of hedonism. He argues that if hedonism does not bring pleasure in the end, the true hedonist should repudiate the theory. Eggleston adds that the paradox of hedonism seems to be an issue for hedonistic ethical theories, such as utilitarianism (for objections, see experience machine).
“The paradox of hedonism,” “the paradox of happiness,” “the pleasure paradox,” the “the hedonistic paradox,” and so forth are a family of names given to the same paradox and are usually used interchangeably. Hereon, I refer to the paradox of hedonism only, and I understand happiness as hedonists do—interchangeable with pleasure.
Non-hedonistic accounts of happiness do not consider it a state of mind. Aristotle, for example, considers eudaimonia, sometimes translated as happiness, as an activity in accordance with virtue exercised over a lifetime and in the presence of sufficient external goods.
The word “hedonism” descends from the Ancient Greek for “pleasure.” Psychological hedonism holds pleasure or pain to be the only good that motivates us. In other words, we are motivated only by conscious or unconscious desires to experience pleasure or avoid pain. Ethical hedonism holds that only pleasure has value and only pain has disvalue.
The relation between the philosophical and non-philosophical uses of the word hedonism needs to be explained. The word hedonism is used differently in ordinary language from its use among philosophers. For a non-philosopher, a stereotypical hedonist is epitomized by the slogan “sex, drugs, and rock ‘n’ roll.” To “the folk,” a hedonist is a person that pursues pleasure shortsightedly, selfishly, or indecently—without regard for her long-term pleasure, the pleasure of others, and the socially-appropriate conduct. Also, psychologists sometimes use the word hedonism in the sense of folk hedonism.
That said, even within philosophy, the word hedonism can cause confusion. For instance, some consider hedonistic utilitarianism egoistic; some identify pleasure as necessarily non-social and purely physical. However, hedonism corresponds to a set of theories attributing pleasure the primary role. Ethical hedonism is the theory that identifies pleasure as the only ultimate value, not as an instrumental value or an ultimate value among several. The attainment of good through the so-called “base or disgusting pleasures” such as sex, drugs, and sadism; the indifference to long-term consequences such as rejecting delayed gratification; and the disregard for others’ pleasure, such as taking pleasure at another’s expense are features attached to folk hedonism but are not necessarily part of philosophical hedonism.
Prudential hedonism—the theory identified as the target of the paradox—is a kind of ethical hedonism concerning well-being. It is the claim that pleasure is the only ultimate good for an individual’s life and pain is the opposite. That is, the best life is the one with the most net pleasure, and the worst is the one with the most net pain. Net-pleasure (or “pleasure minus pain”) hedonism means the result of a calculation where dolors (units of pain) are subtracted from hedons (units of pleasure). Like ethical hedonism, prudential hedonism does not claim how pleasure should be pursued. In prudential hedonism, pleasure can be pursued in disparate ways, such as sensory gratification and ascetic spiritual practice; all strategies are good as long as they are successful. Prudential hedonism is also silent about the time span (immediate vs. future pleasure). Nor does prudential hedonism advise that pleasure should be pursued anti-socially. In short, prudential hedonism is not committed to any claims concerning pleasures’ source, temporal location, or whether pleasure can be generated by social behaviors.
According to Herman, the paradox of hedonism can be found in Aristotle. Aristotle claimed that pleasure represents the outcome of an activity by asking and answering the following question: why is it the case that no one is never-endingly pleased? Aristotle replied that human beings are unable to perpetually perform an activity. Therefore, pleasure cannot be perpetual because it derives from activity. So, on closer inspection, Aristotle’s argument does not seem to be the forerunner of the paradox. This argument does not tackle the issue of whether the pursuit of pleasure is self-defeating. Rather, Aristotle’s reflection concerns what causes pleasure/activity and the impossibility of perpetual pleasure.
Later, Butler elaborates an argument against psychological egoism, especially its hedonistic version, which can be considered the harbinger to the paradox, if not its first complete instantiation. Butler’s argument, called “Butler’s stone,” has been interpreted widely as refuting psychological hedonism. The claim is that the experience of pleasure upon the satisfaction of a desire presupposes a desire for something that is not pleasure itself. That is, it presupposes that people sometimes experience pleasure that can generate only from the satisfaction of a non-hedonistic desire. Therefore, psychological hedonism is false—the view that all desires are hedonistic.
Austin attributes the first formulation of the paradox to J. S. Mill. After experiencing major depression in his early twenties, Mill states that happiness is not attainable directly and that happy people have their attention directed at something different than happiness. Later, Sidgwick coined the phrase “paradox of hedonism” while discussing egoistic hedonism. This form of ethical hedonism equates the moral good with the pleasure of the individual, so for Sidgwick, the overly conscious pursuit of pleasure is self-defeating because it promotes pleasure-seeking in a way that results in diminished pleasure.
However, it is questionable to consider the paradox of folk hedonism a paradox, even in the sense of empirical irony. To be empirically ironic, the paradox should involve the psychological truth of a seemingly absurd claim. Common sense holds that certain ways to pursue pleasure, such as committing crimes to finance heroin addiction, are ineffective. Since common sense holds that folk hedonism does not lead to happiness, this “paradox” lacks the counter-intuitiveness required to be labeled as such. Furthermore, if we consider that the focus of folk hedonism is short-term gains, it is not paradoxical. For example, suppose Suzy consumes cocaine during a party; this means she reached her aim. Suzy may encounter future displeasure, perhaps from addiction, but as a folk hedonist, Suzy does not have to care about her future self. So, neither common folk nor folk hedonists should be surprised that folk hedonism is a bad strategy for maximizing pleasure over a lifetime.
Psychological hedonism is the view that conscious or unconscious intrinsic desires are exclusively oriented towards pleasure. Individuals hold a particular desire because they believe that satisfying it will bring them pleasure. For example, Jane desires to do gardening because she believes that gardening will increase her pleasure. The paradox of psychological hedonism consists in the claim that the way our motivational system functions, we get less pleasure than we would have if our motivational system worked differently, specifically if it allowed the non-pleasures to motivate us. On the one hand, if psychological hedonism is a true description of our motivational system, it would have no prescriptive value because it advises us to do something impossible, at least until it becomes possible to alter our motivational system. The paradox of psychological hedonism can be seen as a device to stop being human. On the other hand, if psychological hedonism is not a true description of our motivational system, then we do not need to worry about the paradox at all. Considering this, it appears that this version of the paradox of hedonism is not particularly useful.
It seems that the above-explained ways of understanding the paradox do not capture the core idea. The paradox of folk hedonism is not counter-intuitive enough to be a paradox. For short-term gains, folk hedonism does not seem to backfire. However, any wisdom that resides in the paradox of folk hedonism collapses into the incompetence account analyzed below. Furthermore, the paradox of psychological hedonism is a descriptive claim that does not generate any useful advice.
The paradox of prudential hedonism best captures the heart of the expression: the paradox of hedonism. (1) It is prescriptive. That is, if you do x, the result will be y—which is bad. (2) It is counter-intuitive. That is, if you try to maximize your life’s net pleasure, you end up with less. The apparent absurdity in this claim is a necessary condition for a paradox. For instance, imagine telling a musician that if you aim to produce beautiful music, you will end up producing unpleasant noises. Or consider advising a student not to study hard because aiming for good grades will be counter-productive. These ways of talking are nonsensical. Common sense tells us that if you aim at something, you will be more likely to get it.
(1) and (2) also apply to the paradox of egoistic hedonism. Consider the similarities and differences between these theories. Both egoistic hedonism and prudential hedonism are normative theories that one should pursue pleasure. Yet, prudential hedonism is a theory of well-being or self-interest rationality, while egoistic hedonism is a theory of morality. According to prudential hedonism, it is rational in terms of self-interest to pursue pleasure. In contrast, according to egoistic hedonism, it is a moral obligation to pursue pleasure. Given that, it becomes apparent why prudential hedonism is the best candidate for the most refined version of the paradox of hedonism. The paradox, in fact, questions whether hedonism is rational, not whether it is moral. In other words, the claim of the paradox concerns the idiocy of pursuing pleasure, not its moral blameworthiness. For these reasons, this article focuses on the paradox of prudential hedonism.
This article is restricted to the common understanding of the paradox which refers to the pursuit of pleasure and does not cast light on avoiding displeasure. The points being made may not apply to both. Further research is required to understand that to what extent, if any, these processes overlap. For example, it might be claimed that happiness is a mirage. Such a claim would not imply that minimizing suffering is unrealizable too. For example, a pessimist such as Schopenhauer advised avoiding suffering instead of pursuing happiness. According to him, if you keep your expectations low, you will have the most bearable life. Therefore, further research is needed to understand that to what extent the reflection on the paradox of hedonism applies to the paradox of negative hedonism—the claim that the avoidance of displeasure is self-defeating. This distinction might have an important implication for prudential hedonism. If the pursuit of pleasure is paradoxical but the avoidance of displeasure is not, prudential hedonism is safe from the objection of self-defeatingness. Prudential hedonists would have to pursue the good life by minimizing displeasure rather than by maximizing pleasure.
Since affects can alter decision-making, we should exclude this from the most refined version of the paradox of hedonism. The opposite is the relevant mechanism: decision altering affects. The paradox is usually thought to be concerned with the relationship between pursuing pleasure and getting it, not with the relation between being pleased and its continuation. A related popular belief consists in the claim that happiness necessarily collapses into boredom. However, this cultural belief seems questionable. Certainly, some pleasures can lead to temporary satiation and loss of interest, but to not practice these pleasures in the rotation is a case of incompetence in the pursuit of pleasure. This phenomenon does not imply that pleasant states necessarily impair themselves. Relatedly, Timmermann’s “new paradox of hedonism” is based on the claim that “there can be cases in which we reject pleasure because there is too much of it.” Timmermann denies that his paradox descends from temporary satiation. However, Feldman shows that Timmermann’s new paradox of hedonism is nothing new and is based on a conflation of ethical hedonism with psychological hedonism. The psychological mechanism according to which we reject pleasure may threaten the claim that our motivation is only directed at pleasure but does not affect the claim that pleasure is good. Timmermann’s new paradox of hedonism is not a problem for prudential hedonism.
Another clarification describes the paradox of hedonism as the only mechanism that concerns decision-making and expected pleasure. In other words, the possible cases where prudential hedonism defeats itself momentarily are not included in the most refined understanding of the paradox. According to the paradox of hedonism, the agent’s decision to maximize pleasure does not optimize it in the long-term. A different mechanism involves decision-making and immediately experienced pleasure or pain. Since empirical evidence supports the view that decision-making involves immediate pleasure and pain, we should consider the paradox to refer only to the paradoxical effects concerning expected utility.
Following Moore, the paradox of hedonism is distinct from the weakness of will—hen a subject acts freely and intentionally but contrary to their better judgment. Consider the following example: Imagine that after years of studying philosophy, Bill concludes that prudential hedonism is true. Meanwhile, he cannot implement any change directed at his neurotic personality. Bill is an unhappy prudential hedonist, exhibiting the weakness of will. Indeed, empirical evidence suggests that when we imagine what will make us happier, we fail to be consistent with the plans that rationally follow from it. For example, people knowing that flow activities facilitate happiness end up over-practicing passive leisure and underutilizing active-leisure activities that could elicit periods of flow. Nevertheless, considering that the paradox of hedonism is the pursuit of pleasure resulting in less pleasure, cases of the weakness of will are not included in the refined version of the paradox because the pursuit of pleasure is missing. Cases of the weakness of will do not represent prudential hedonism’s paradoxical effects unless the belief about the truth of prudential hedonism somehow disposes of people the weakness of will more than other beliefs. Thus, the refined version of the paradox of hedonism excludes: the paradox of negative hedonism, pleasure impairing its continuation, momentary self-defeatingness, and the weakness of will.
The direct pursuit of pleasure is frequently used to express the paradox of hedonism, but how is it different from the indirect pursuit of pleasure. Imagine taking an opioid. The opiates travel through the bloodstream into the brain and attach to particular proteins, the mu-opioid receptors located on the surfaces of opiate-sensitive neurons. The union of these chemicals and the mu-opioid receptors starts the biochemical brain processes that make subjects experience feelings of pleasure. Taking an opioid seems to be the most direct way to pursue pleasure, but notice that several steps are still required, for instance, owning enough money and acquiring and taking the drug. Consequently, our pursuit of pleasure is always indirect in the sense that various actions mediate it. Thus, it seems that we cannot substantially regulate our hedonic experience at will.
However, even if the direct pursuit of pleasure is impossible, it is still possible for the pursuit of pleasure to be more or less direct. Imagine the directness of the pursuit as a spectrum where the action of consuming a psychoactive substance stands on the far right and the less controversial activities such as going to a party on the left. These activities on the left also include a wide range of more or less direct paths to the goal of pleasure. For example, diving into a pool on a hot day seems to be a shortcut to pleasure compared to the challenges of studying hard and eventually securing a fulfilling job. The issues seem to lie in how long one has to wait for pleasure. Incorporating this more plausible spectrum of directness into the paradox, we get that the direct pursuit of pleasure results in less pleasure. However, this formulation seems empirically questionable. Unless endorsing some forms of asceticism, it does not seem that pleasure simply depends on always choosing the long and hard route. Sometimes, like for pool-owners on a very hot day, the highly direct pursuit seems to produce more net pleasure in addition to immediate pleasure. So, it seems that not all forms of the direct pursuit of pleasure uniformly generate paradoxical effects.
The formulation of the paradox as a consequence of holding pleasure as the only intrinsically valuable end seems poorly descriptive. This expression corresponds to broader definitions of prudential hedonism. By definition, every prudential hedonist considers pleasure as the ultimate goal, the intrinsic good, the sole ultimately valuable end, etc. According to this interpretation, the belief in the truth of prudential hedonism is itself the mental state that generates paradoxical effects. However, it seems more useful to identify the mental state that descends from the belief in the truth of prudential hedonism (for example, the conscious pursuit of pleasure) determines the paradox. In other words, the expressions at stake do not seem descriptive because it seems that the paradoxical mental state is not a philosophical belief but another mental state or behavior that the philosophical belief might be determining.
As recognized by Dietz, the definition of the paradox that emerges from holding pleasure as the only intrinsic desire configures the paradox of hedonism as a symptom of a paradox of desire-satisfaction. If we only desire desire-satisfaction, we are stuck. In Dietz’s view, this paradox threatens all theories of well-being that value satisfaction of a subject’s desires, primarily desire-satisfactionism, which is one of the main rivals of hedonism as a theory of prudence. That said, this article is silent about the plausibility of the paradox of desire-satisfaction. Nevertheless, the paradox of desire-satisfaction needs a further step to affect prudential hedonism, which is rational desire—the view that there is a rational connection between our evaluative beliefs and desires. Contrary to rational desire, Blake writes that being a hedonist does not commit one to consider pleasure as the only desire. Even if the rational desire is true, this mechanism concerns ideal agents. We seem to consider things good without desiring them or desire things without considering them good.
What of the intentional pursuit of pleasure? Kant’s use of the adverb “purposely” seems to be a synonym of “intentionally.” Notice that philosophers distinguish between prior intention and intention in action, corresponding to action-initiation and action-control. Given that, the conscious pursuit of pleasure, analyzed below, appears more precise by pointing only to the paradoxical mechanism of action control.
All things considered, the conscious pursuit of pleasure seems to be the most appropriate definition. The conscious pursuit of pleasure can be understood as the pursuit that holds pleasure in the mind’s eye. Pleasure is kept in mind by the agent as her regulative objective. This is a case t“indirect self-defeatingness” when the counter-productive effects of a theory are caused by conscious efforts to comply with it. Among different passages, Sidgwick advances this interpretation when he writes: “Happiness is likely to be better attained if the extent to which we set ourselves consciously to aim at it be carefully restricted.” Which share of our conscious awareness should the pursuit of pleasure occupy? Or how often should we perform a conscious recollection of the goal of pleasure? Perhaps, the wisdom underlying the paradox of hedonism can be found in answers to these questions: the paradox should be regarded as advice against focusing too much on hedonic maximization.
The strategy of never being conscious of the goal of pleasure also seems irrational, especially when considering normative theories of instrumental rationality. The calculation of the best means to any given end is assumed to be more effective than a chance to secure the end. It does not seem wise to never think of the outcome we aim for. Sometimes, we need to remember why we are acting, even in the broad sense of directing or sustaining our attention. To never aim at happiness and yet still achieve it is a case of serendipity. In fact, it is possible to find x when looking for y, such as finding pleasure while pursuing a life of moral or intellectual perfection. Still, if you enter a supermarket to buy peanuts, looking for toothpaste does not seem to be the most rational strategy; however, if you are taking a walk, you might find peanuts.
Mill goes further by trying to identify why pursuing pleasure too consciously may be ineffective. He claims that allowing pleasure to occupy our internal discourse brings about an excessive critical scrutiny of pleasures. Similarly, Sidgwick seems to have identified one paradoxical mechanism of a too conscious pursuit of pleasure when warning about the risks of pleasure’s meta-awareness. In the first two decades of the 21st century, the empirical literature on the paradoxical effects of pursuing pleasure claim that much research supports the idea that monitoring one’s hedonic experience can negatively interfere with one’s hedonic state (Zerwas and Ford).
Concerning empirical evidence on the conscious pursuit of pleasure, Schooler and colleagues instructed participants to up-regulate pleasure while listening to a hedonically ambiguous melody, while the control group was only required to listen to the melody. Subsequent experimental studies by Mauss and colleagues employed a similar methodology by making participants watch a happy film clip. This research has investigated the effects of attempting to up-regulate pleasure during a neutral or pleasant experience consciously. Importantly, these studies support the paradoxical over-conscious pursuit of pleasure. In fact, the inductions of the experiments—subjects were asked to up-regulate their hedonic experience—caused the participants to pursue pleasure and fail consciously. Given the points above, it seems that the most sensible definition of the paradox of hedonism consists of the claim that the overly conscious pursuit of pleasure is self-defeating. According to Wild, it seems that hedonism’s paradox constitutes advice to maximize pleasure by temporarily forgetting about it. It is self-defeating to fix attention on pleasure too often.
Concerning the paradoxical conscious pursuit of pleasure, it does not seem that the strategy reported by Arnold, aiming at devising it as a logical argument, is successful. The argument is supposed to work this way: the pleasure kept in view (so that it can be sought) must be an idea. An idea is no longer a feeling, and the intellectual nature of ideas prevents them from being pleasurable. However, as claimed by Arnold, one of the fallacies of this argument lies in a false conception of the function of logical constructions: a hedonist aims at pleasant states, not at the idea of such states. The idea of pleasure is just a signpost, a concept that is supposed to lead to pleasure-producing choices. If keeping in mind pleasure the signpost impairs one’s ability to experience pleasure, this seems to be an empirical claim rather than a logical necessity. Therefore, the excessively conscious pursuit seems best understood as an empirical rather than a logical paradox because the attempt to make it a logical paradox fails. Following Singer, the paradox of hedonism does not seem like a paradox in the sense of a logical contradiction; instead, it seems to represent a psychological incongruity or empirical irony about the process of pleasure-seeking.
The version of the paradox identified gives no reason to think that prudential hedonism is theoretically weakened by it. As Eggleston claims, the paradox of hedonism might result in being an interesting psychological mechanism with no philosophical implications. Mill seems to support this conclusion when he starts his exposition of the paradox by saying that he is not questioning the prudential primacy of pleasure.
In fact, a theory that (1) considers pleasure to be the only intrinsic prudential good is not necessarily doomed to be internally inconsistent just because it (2) acknowledges that we should forget about pleasure at some points. (1) is a claim of theoretical reason, the kind of reason concerned with the truth of propositions; (2) is a claim of practical reason, it concerns the value of actions. The former addresses beliefs, and the latter addresses intentions. Since prudential hedonism advises the maximization of pleasure, it also advises that the agent instrumentally shapes the pursuit in whatever way it is most effective. As Sidgwick claims, the paradox of hedonism does not seem to cause any practical problem once the possibility of it has been acknowledged. As advanced by Sheldon, pleasure can be a by-product of states that require us not to pursue pleasure overly consciously. So, pleasure may be the reason to sometime forget about pleasure. These recommendations on how to avoid the paradox determine this version of the paradox of hedonism as a contingent practical problem for prudential hedonism but can be avoided. To sum up, considering the best definition of the paradox, the argument based on the paradox does not constitute a valid objection to prudential hedonism.
Based on Butler’s reflections, Dietz discusses an older explanation of the paradox of hedonism that considers the paradox to generate from pleasure itself and its relation to the satisfaction of desire. This explanation, with Dietz’s spin on it, explains that the evidentialist account is supposed to represent logical paradoxes. The evidentialist account relies on a desire-belief condition for pleasure and evidentialism. The desire-belief condition claims that pleasure requires the subject to believe she is getting what she wants. This account is based on Heathwood’s view that pleasure consists in having an intrinsic desire for some state of affairs and believing that this state of affairs is the case. Evidentialism is an epistemological theory in which a rational agent will hold beliefs only if justified by the evidence. This theory is supposed to dictate the rules for the formation of the belief about whether the desire is satisfied.
According to this account, prudential hedonism is self-defeating if the subject is epistemically rational and not deceived. Opposite to the incompetence account that arises from our irrationality and lack of self-knowledge, the evidentialist account arises for ideal agents. According to Dietz, if we suppose that I will experience pleasure only if I believe in my own pleasure and that I am going to be rational and well-informed, there will be no option for me to find independent support for this belief; thus, I will not be able to form such a belief, and I will never experience pleasure. In other words, as an evidentialist, I will only believe what I have good evidence to believe. To be pleased, I have to believe I am pleased. But, to believe I am pleased, I need good evidence that I am pleased. Unfortunately, the only evidence of my pleasure is the belief that I am pleased. So, no pleasure beliefs ever get off the ground because the evidence is tightly circular, therefore, not compelling. The underlying reasoning of the evidentialist account has the same structure as Cave’s placebo paradox. Cave imagines a sick person that receives a placebo. This person will regain his health only if he believes that he will regain his health. Similarly, a hedonist, following this account, will be pleased only if he believes that he is or will be pleased. But if the sick person is rational, he will only have the belief that he will regain his health if he has solid evidence that this is the case. Likewise, if a hedonist holds that his pleasure itself is a unique thing in which he will take pleasure, the belief that he will experience pleasure is not independently true, and if he is rational, he cannot form this belief.
Butler’s account is based on the view that pleasure consists in the satisfaction of non-hedonistic desires—desires for anything but pleasure—is implausible. For instance, we can take delight in pleasure itself and not only by gratifying non-hedonistic desires. The concepts of meta-emotions (emotions about emotions) and meta-moods (moods about moods) have been adopted and explored by researchers within both philosophy and psychology. It is possible to feel, for example, content about being relaxed, hopeful about being relieved, and grateful about being euphoric (positive-positive secondary emotions). These are counter-examples to Butler’s account because they involve feeling good about feeling good, precisely what is supposed to be impossible in Butler’s view. Thus, Butler’s theory of pleasure seems implausible.
Concerning Dietz’s evidentialist account, it is weakened by concerning ideal agents: given that human beings are not, as this account presupposes, it has scant practical utility. The evidentialist account assumes a questionable theory of pleasure (see Katz for problems in desire-based theories of pleasure). For example, pleasant surprises constitute prima facie counter-examples to hold desire-satisfaction necessary for pleasure. Also, solid neuroscientific evidence confutes the reduction of pleasure to desire.
To summarize, Butler’s and the evidentialist’s accounts do not seem reliable explanations of the paradox of hedonism because they are built on implausible theories of pleasure.
A closer inspection reveals that the special goods account collapses into the incompetence account, the belief that by atomistically pursuing our pleasure, we will maximize it. The special goods account collapses into the incompetence account because pursuing pleasure atomistically seems a fallacious strategy in terms of self-interest. Accordingly, if only individuals were well-informed about what leads to pleasure, they would cultivate special goods as means to pleasure.
Having rejected Butler’s and the evidentialist’s accounts and reduced the special goods account to the incompetence account, we are left with the “overly conscious” definition versions of the paradox. The incompetence account claims that we are so prone to making mistakes in pursuing pleasure, that by not aiming at it we are more successful in securing it. Following Haybron, much empirical evidence has been amassed on the ways in which humans are likely to make errors in pursuing their interests, including happiness. We possess compelling empirical evidence confirming that individuals are systematically unskillful at forecasting what will bring them pleasure. Individuals seem to suffer from several cognitive biases that undermine their capacity to elaborate accurate predictions about what will please them. This inability to make accurate predictions about the affective impact of future events might be problematic for prudential hedonism, especially what Sidgwick calls the “empirical-reflective method.” The empirical-reflective method consists of: (1) forecasting the affects resulting from different lines of conduct; (2) evaluating, considering probabilities, which affects are preferable; (3) undertaking the matching line of conduct. As Sidgwick already recognized, to imagine future pleasures and pains, sub (1), is an unreliable operation, so our confidence in the empirical-reflective method should be restricted.
Kant seems to have explained the paradox of hedonism similarly. Incidentally, for him, morality must always be given normative priority over happiness. The moral person acts to obey the moral law irrespectively of what might be prudentially good. He claims we do not have an accurate idea of what will make us happy. According to him, pursuing wealth can generate troubles and anxiety, pursuing knowledge can determine a sense of tragedy, pursuing health can highlight the pains of ill health in advanced age, and so forth.
Kant’s understanding of the paradox seems to rely on the incompetence account and especially on the failures of affective forecasting. Many life-defining choices are based on affective forecasts. Should you get married? Have children? Pursue a career as an academic or as a financer? These important decisions are heavily influenced by forecasts about how the different scenarios will make you feel.
Consequently, the aforementioned line of empirical research shows that, in pursuing pleasure, we are not rational agents: we make mistakes, and we can fail miserably. Perhaps this is not surprising. Who has not at some time chosen a job, holiday, partner, etc., only to find out that the choice did not bring nearly as much pleasure as we had expected?
To summarize, in this section, we explored affective forecasting failures as examples of our ineptitude in pursuing pleasure. Given this evidence of human incompetence in the pursuit of pleasure, it seems we lack the skills and knowledge required to effectively grasp and sustain this elusive feeling. This weakness in our psychology seems a plausible cause of the paradox¾a case Parfit labels as “direct self-defeatingness” when the counter-productive effects of a theory are caused by compliance to it. Pity that we are so inept in our pursuit of pleasure that pursuing it destines us to fail, and perhaps fail so catastrophically that we might find ourselves less pleased than when we started.
Having identified a plausible causal relation underpinning the paradox above, whether the incompetence account represents a theoretical issue for prudential hedonism is explored here. Recall that according to the argument based on the paradox of hedonism, prudential hedonism is a self-defeating theory.
Parfit elaborates on self-interest theory (the name under which he includes several theories of well-being) and the problem of self-defeatingness. For Parfit, a self-defeating theory “fails even in its own terms. And thus condemns itself.” Furthermore, the incompetence account corresponds to a peculiar category of self-defeatingness, a category that Parfit considers very unproblematic. In fact, in setting the boundaries of his study, he excludes cases where the paradoxical effects are mistakenly caused by what the agent does. For Parfit, incompetence is not a legitimate objection to a theory because the fault is not in the theory but in the agent.
Once again, as in the “overly conscious” definition of the paradox, the incompetence account can be seen as a practical problem that does not affect prudential hedonism as a theory. The possible practical self-defeatingness of prudential hedonism does not disprove any of prudential hedonism’s claims. Our incompetence in pursuing pleasure does not affect the validity of a theory that holds pleasure as the ultimate prudential good. If the paradox of hedonism emerges merely because of some contingent mechanisms in our psychology, prudential hedonists have no reason to reject the theory.
This article analyzed the paradox of hedonism, which is the objection that prudential hedonism is self-defeating. First, the most plausible definition of the paradox was pointed out. The overly conscious pursuit of pleasure was identified as the behavior that might determine paradoxical effects in a hedonistic prudential agent. This constitutes a plausible case of prudential hedonism’s indirect self-defeatingness when the conscious effort to comply with the theory defeats its aims. Secondly, the explanations of different versions of the paradox identifiable in the literature were assessed. The incompetence account emerged as a plausible causal mechanism behind the paradox of hedonism. This is a case of prudential hedonism’s direct self-defeatingness when acting in accordance with the theory defeats its aims. However, both versions of the paradox end up being contingent on psychological mechanisms. The possible practical problems that were identified, overly conscious and incompetent pursuits of pleasure, do not theoretically affect the plausibility of prudential hedonism that concerns prudential value and not practical rationality. Nevertheless, both seem avoidable. In practice, prudential hedonism does not seem to imply a necessarily self-defeating pursuit.
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