Blaise Pascal (1623–1662)
Blaise Pascal was a French philosopher, mathematician, scientist, inventor, and theologian. In mathematics, he was an early pioneer in the fields of game theory and probability theory. In philosophy he was an early pioneer in existentialism. As a writer on theology and religion he was a defender of Christianity.
Despite chronic ill health, Pascal made historic contributions to mathematics and to physical science, including both experimental and theoretical work on hydraulics, atmospheric pressure, and the existence and nature of the vacuum. As a scientist and philosopher of science, Pascal championed strict empirical observation and the use of controlled experiments; he opposed the rationalism and logico-deductive method of the Cartesians; and he opposed the metaphysical speculations and reverence for authority of the theologians of the Middle Ages.
Although he never fully abandoned his scientific and mathematical interests, after his uncanny “Night of Fire” (the intense mystical illumination and midnight conversion that he experienced on the evening of November 23, 1654), Pascal turned his talents almost exclusively to religious writing. It was during the period from 1656 until his death in 1662 that he wrote the Lettres Provinciales and the Pensées. The Lettres Provinciales is a satirical attack on Jesuit casuistry and a polemical defense of Jansenism. The Pensées is a posthumously published collection of unfinished notes for what was intended to be a systematic apologia for the Christian religion. Along with his scientific writings, these two great literary works have attracted the admiration and critical interest of philosophers and serious readers of every generation.
Table of Contents
- Literary and Religious Works
- Provincial Letters
- Minor Works (Opuscules)
- Mathematical and Scientific Works
- Philosophy of Science and Theory of Knowledge
- Conclusion: Pascal’s Reputation and Cultural Legacy
- References and Further Reading
“Pascal’s life is inseparable from his work.”—A. J. Krailsheimer
Pascal’s life has stirred the same fascination and generated as much lively discussion and learned commentary as his writings. This is largely attributable to his intriguing, enigmatic personality. To read him is to come into direct contact with both his strangeness and his charm. It is also to encounter a tangle of incongruities and seeming contradictions. For Pascal himself – humble yet forceful; fanatical as well as skeptical; mild and empathetic, yet also capable of withering scorn – personified the very “chimera” he famously declared man to be (Pensées, 131/164). [Note: Throughout this article, fragments of the Pensées are identified first (that is, before the slash) by the numeration system of Lafuma and second (after the slash) by that of Sellier – L/S.]
Interest in his life is also due to our natural desire to learn more about this “scary genius” , or effrayant génie – Chateaubriand’s memorable phrase, whose unique combination of talents enabled him to make revolutionary contributions not only to mathematics and physical science but also to the theology and literature of his age. Merely to list his achievements is once again to encounter Pascal the “chimera,”— the human riddle who was both an avant-garde crusader for empirical science as well as an avid supporter of ancient prophecy, mysticism, miracles, and Biblical hermeneutics. Modern readers are usually shocked to discover that the father of gambling odds and the mechanical computer wore a spiked girdle to chastise himself and further mortify a body already tormented by recurrent illness and chronic pain.
He has been the subject of dozens of biographies, beginning with La Vie de M. Pascal, the brief hagiographic sketch composed by his sister Gilberte Périer shortly after his death in 1662 and first published in 1684. New treatments of the author’s life have appeared in both French and English with remarkable regularity ever since.
Périer’s memoir established a precedent by applying an underlying pattern and symmetry to her brother’s life. The implied form is that of a well-made play with classic five-act structure. In Périer’s treatment this life-drama is a divine comedy showing the spiritual rise and eventual salvation of a distressed soul who, after a series of trials and setbacks, reunites with God. Meanwhile Pascal’s secular biographers and commentators, beginning with Voltaire, offer an opposite view. They portray Pascal’s career as essentially a tragedy, a descending arc tracing the decline into timidity and superstition of a once bold and independent thinker. Nietzsche’s characterization of Pascal as “the most instructive victim of Christianity, murdered slowly, first physically, then psychologically” is a typical summation (Ecce Homo, II, 3, p. 243).
Both views are oversimplified. First of all, at no point during his lifetime was Pascal ever a libertine or libre-penseur. So portraying his life as though it consisted of two sudden and powerful “conversions,” with an intervening slide into worldliness and sins of the flesh, seems a bit too pat and melodramatic. Similarly, since Pascal was a lifelong supporter of the Catholic faith, and since he also maintained an interest in scientific and mathematical problems well after his commitment to Jansenism and Port-Royal, it seems unfair to portray his final years as a betrayal of his scientific principles rather than as an intensification or culmination of his religious views. Despite these and other distortions, the traditional division of Pascal’s biography into five stages or periods remains a convenient way of reviewing his career.
Blaise Pascal was born on June 19, 1623, in Clermont (now Clermont-Ferrand) in the Auvergne region of central France. His parents were Étienne Pascal (1588 – 1651), a magistrate, civil servant, and member of the aristocratic and professional class known as the noblesse de robe, and Antoinette Bégon Pascal (1596-1626), the daughter of a Clermont merchant. Pascal was named for his paternal uncle as well as for St. Blaise, the 3rd-century Armenian saint martyred by having his flesh flayed by iron carding combs as his namesake would later punish his own flesh by wearing a belt studded with sharp nails.
The Pascal family, including Pascal’s older sister Gilberte (b. 1620) and younger sister Jacqueline (b. 1625), enjoyed a comfortable, upper-bourgeois lifestyle. Étienne, in addition to being a lawyer, public official, and tax administrator, was proficient in Latin and Greek, a dabbler in natural philosophy, and an expert mathematician. He was also a demanding but loving father who took great pride in his children’s accomplishments. Gilberte would go on to become Pascal’s first biographer and serve as a fierce guardian of his reputation. Jacqueline displayed an early literary genius and earned acclaim as a poet and dramatist before becoming a nun at Port-Royal. Pascal’s mother, who was known for her piety and charitable work, died when Pascal was only three years old and Jacqueline was but an infant.
Pascal was a sickly child who suffered various pains and diseases throughout his life. According to a family anecdote related by his niece, at age one he supposedly fell victim to a strange illness. His abdomen became distended and swollen, and the slightest annoyance triggered fits of crying and screaming. This affliction supposedly continued for more than a year, and the child often seemed on the verge of death.
Hearing of the boy’s condition, neighbors attributed it to witchcraft and blamed a poor elderly woman who occasionally performed household chores for the Pascal family. Étienne, as an educated gentleman, at first scoffed at the accusation, but when his patience eventually wore thin he confronted the woman and threatened her with hanging if she didn’t come forward with the truth. The woman reportedly fell to the floor and promised to divulge everything if her life would be spared. She confessed that in a moment of anger and resentment she had cast a spell on the child – a fatal spell that could be undone only by having it transferred to some other living creature. Supposedly the family cat was given to her and made a scapegoat for the otherwise doomed child. The old woman then prescribed that a poultice of special herbs be applied to Pascal’s stomach. After an intense crisis, during which he appeared to be comatose and close to death, Pascal awoke from his “spell” and eventually recovered his health.
This strange and improbable “witch” tale is scarcely credible today. But that Pascal endured a serious and potentially fatal childhood illness during which his parents desperately tried all kinds of fanciful cures and treatments seems very likely. In fact, the anecdote is perfectly consistent with the wild and paradoxical world of 17th_ century culture and especially the medical practice of the time – a time when empirical science and natural magic, enlightened new techniques and antique superstitions, were routinely intermingled and practiced side by side.
The exact cause and basis of Pascal’s lifelong health problems have never been fully settled or accounted for. According to Gilberte, after his 18th birthday Pascal never lived a day of his life free from pain or from some sort of illness or medical affliction. The most common medical opinion is that he contracted gastrointestinal tuberculosis in early childhood and that manifestations of the disease, along with signs of possible concurrent nephritis or rheumatoid arthritis, recurred periodically throughout his lifetime. The accounts of his pathology are also consistent with migraine, irritable bowel syndrome, and fibromyalgia – a complex of illnesses often found together and which also frequently occur in combination with symptoms of anxiety, depression, and emotional distress.
Scholarly interest in this matter involves more than just idle curiosity and medical detective-work. The question of Pascal’s physical and mental health goes to the heart of desires to learn more about the conditions and circumstances that produce extraordinary genius. Affliction and disease, physical or emotional trauma, a natural disadvantage or disability have often served as an added motive or accelerator for high-level creative achievement. Examples abound – from the ancient legend of the blind and vagabond Homer to the documented histories of modern creative figures like Isaac Newton, Van Gogh, Stephen Hawking, and Christy Brown. We can only speculate whether and to what extent Pascal’s physical ailments and disabilities, instead of retarding his career, may have actually spurred and given rise to his intellectual triumphs.
In 1631, a few years after the death of his wife, Étienne sold his government post (a common practice of the day) along with most of his property and moved with his children to Paris. Over the next nine years he devoted himself to his amateur scientific and mathematical pursuits and took personal charge of his children’s education. Recognizing early on his son’s exceptional intellectual gifts, Étienne designed and supervised a special program and curriculum for the boy based on his own anti-scholastic and progressive educational principles.
Young Pascal was taught Latin and Greek as well as history, geography, and philosophy – all on an impromptu schedule, including during meals and at various hours throughout the day. Science, or natural philosophy as the discipline was then known, ignited Pascal’s imagination, and he demonstrated an early inquisitiveness about natural phenomena and a fondness for devising experiments. Civil and canon law were also part of a varied curriculum that included study of the Bible and the Church Fathers. The latter studies were in accordance with Étienne’s personal religious views, which were plain and respectful and as progressive as his views on education. He taught his son his own cardinal principle that whatever is a matter of faith should not also be treated as a matter of reason; and vice-versa. It is a tenet that Pascal took to heart and followed throughout his career.
In the belief that, once exposed to mathematics, his son would be so captivated by it that he would forsake or ignore his other studies, Étienne determined to withhold instruction in math and geometry until Pascal had completed the rest of his training. However, upon discovering that the boy had already achieved an intuitive understanding of the discipline including his own independently worked out demonstration of a proof in Euclid, Étienne acquiesced. The pages of Euclid were finally opened to the youth, and thus began Pascal’s belated introduction to mathematics – the subject with which he would conduct, at times guiltily, a lifelong love affair.
Pascal’s education was unique for his own time and would be unusual in any era. A passionate student who delved earnestly into each new subject, he absorbed new material, including, at a later period, the most arcane and technical components of theology quickly and effortlessly. However, his learning, while deep in a few areas, was never broad and was in some ways less remarkable for what it included than for what it left out.
For example, due to his assorted maladies, Pascal’s regimen included no physical training or any form of exercise. In addition, because of the sequestered, hermetic, entirely private form of his schooling, he never experienced any of the personal contacts or opportunities for social development that most young people, including even novice monks in monastic schools, commonly do. To what extent this may have deformed or limited his social and interpersonal skills it is hard to say. He was known to be temperamentally impatient with and demanding of others while sometimes seeming arrogant and self-absorbed. At a later point in his career, he fully acknowledged his deficiencies and indeed chastised himself for his social ambition and intellectual vanity.
Pascal was not widely read in the classics or in contemporary literature. Though he was well acquainted with Aristotelian and Scholastic thought, philosophy for him consisted mainly of Epictetus, Montaigne, and the traditional debate between Stoicism and Epicureanism. Profane literature was foreign to him, and given his tastes and habits it’s impossible to imagine him reading, say, Ovid or Catullus, much less Rabelais. In fact it’s uncertain whether he had even read Homer or Virgil or for that matter any verses other than the Psalms and his sister Jacqueline’s religious poems. As for drama, Corneille was a family friend who at one time personally championed Jacqueline’s poetry and dramaturgy, and the young Racine studied classical literature and rhetoric at the school at Port-Royal while Jacqueline and Pascal were also there. Yet Pascal never mentions the work of either great writer and indeed – other than to refer to the stage as a “dangerous diversion” (Pensées, 764/630) – seems to have taken little interest at all in contemporary French theatre, which was then at its artistic zenith.
But whatever he may have lacked in physical education, humanistic studies, and art appreciation, Pascal more than made up for in his favored pursuits. In fact, so rapidly did he advance in physics and mathematics that Étienne boldly introduced the boy at the age of only thirteen into his small Parisian academic circle known as the Académie libre. The central figure of this group was the polymathic philosopher, mathematician, theologian, and music theorist Père Marin Mersenne, one of the leading intellectuals of the age. Mersenne corresponded with Descartes, Huygens, Hobbes, and other luminaries of the period and actively promoted the work of controversial thinkers like Galileo and Gassendi. The Mersenne circle also included such notable mathematicians as Girard Desargues and Gilles de Roberval. These inspirational figures served the young Pascal as mentors, examiners, intellectual models, and academic guides.
It was during his involvement with the Mersenne circle that Pascal published, at age sixteen, his Essai pour les Coniques, an important contribution to the relatively new field of projective geometry. The essay includes an original proof concerning the special properties of hexagons inscribed within conic sections that is still known today as Pascal’s Theorem.
Around the same time that Pascal was working on his Theorem, Étienne, who had at one time served as an adviser to Cardinal Richelieu, incurred the wrath of the First Minister by leading a protest over a government bond default. Threatened with prison, he sought refuge in Auvergne. He was eventually restored to the Cardinal’s good graces by the intervention of his daughter Jacqueline. (The Cardinal, a patron of the theatre, was charmed not only by Jacqueline’s poetic and dramatic skills but also by her beauty and courtly manners.) It’s also likely that Richelieu had an additional motive for welcoming Étienne back. For no sooner was Étienne returned to royal favor than Richelieu appointed him the chief tax administrator for Rouen. At the Cardinal’s behest, the Pascal family moved from Paris to Rouen in early January of 1640.
Rouen was a city in crisis, beset by street violence, crop failures, a tax revolt, and an outbreak of plague. It was Étienne’s job to handle the taxpayer revolt, which he eventually managed to do by working with the local citizens and earning their confidence and respect. Pascal meanwhile seems to have been little affected by the change of scene and continued with his mathematical studies. He also undertook a new project. Impressed by the massive number of calculations required in his father’s work of accounting and tax assessment, he wondered if the drudgery of such labor might not be relieved by some type of mechanical device. Setting to work on the idea in 1642, he eventually conceived, designed, and oversaw the construction of what was presented to the public in 1645 as la machine arithmétique, later known as the Pascaline. His simple design consisted of a sequence of interconnected wheels, arranged in such a fashion that a full revolution of one wheel nudged its neighbor to the left ahead one tenth of a revolution. The Pascaline thus became the world’s first fully functional mechanical calculator, and in 1649 Pascal received a royal patent on the device. Over the next five years he continued tinkering with his design, experimenting with various materials and trying out different linkage arrangements and gear mechanisms. Nine working models survive today and serve as a reminder that Pascal was not just a mathematical Platonist absorbed in a higher world of pure number but also a practical minded, down-to-earth engineering type interested in applying the insights of science and mathematics to the solution of real-world problems.
On an icy day in January of 1646, Étienne Pascal, in his capacity as a public official, was summoned to prevent a duel that was to take place in a field outside Rouen. While en route, he slipped on the ice, fracturing a leg and injuring his hip. The family called in two local bonesetters, the brothers Deschamps, who moved into the Pascal household for a period of three months to care for Étienne and oversee his recovery. The brothers turned out to be members of the small, saintly community of Augustinian worshippers established at Port-Royal by the Jansenist priest Jean du Vergier de Hauranne, more simply known as the abbé Saint-Cyran.
The Jansenists (named for the Dutch theologian Cornelius Jansen) accepted the strict Augustinian creed that salvation is achieved not by human virtue or merit but solely by the grace of God. At Port-Royal they practiced an ascetic lifestyle emphasizing penance, austerity, devotional exercises, and good works. While treating Étienne, the Deschamps brothers shared their stringent, exacting, and somewhat cheerless religious views with the Pascal family. Pascal himself, along with his father and sisters, had never displayed much in the way of genuine religious fervor. They were good upper-middle-class Catholics, mild and respectful in their beliefs rather than zealous, neither God-fearing nor, to any extraordinary degree, God-seeking. Yet the ardor of the Deschamps brothers proved contagious. Pascal caught the fire and read with avidity the Jansenist texts that were given to him – sermons by Saint-Cyran along with doctrinal works by Augustine, Antoine Arnauld (Saint-Cyran’s successor), and Jansen himself. Gradually, with growing assurance, and eventually with complete sincerity and conviction, Pascal embraced the Jansenist creed. According to Gilberte’s account, he was the first in the family to convert to the new faith, and no sooner had he done so than he set about to convert the rest of family, first Jacqueline, then Étienne, and finally Gilberte and her husband Florin Périer. It should be added, however, that from Pascal’s own point of view he wasn’t so much “converting” to Jansenism, or any particular group or sect, as he was declaring or reaffirming his commitment to the true faith.
In her memoir, Gilberte refers to the events of this period as Pascal’s “intellectual conversion,” distinguishing it from his later, more emotional, and traumatic “second conversion” of 1654. She also asserts that at this time Pascal formally renounced all his scientific and mathematical researches and ever afterward devoted himself entirely and exclusively to the love and service of God. This claim is inaccurate and indeed hard to fathom given that only a year later Florin Périer, Gilberte’s own husband, assisted in what is probably Pascal’s most famous scientific investigation, the celebrated Puy-de-Dôme experiment measuring air pressure and proving the existence of the vacuum. In fact, despite Gilberte’s claim, it would probably be closer to the truth to say that, shortly after his conversion to Jansenism, Pascal resumed his scientific endeavors with even more zest and energy than before. In the spring of 1647, partly on the advice of his physicians, he returned to Paris where he linked up once again with former colleagues and began organizing several new essays and treatises for publication. His supposed renunciation of natural philosophy and the bright world of Parisian intellectual life had lasted all of six months.
Contrary to Gilberte’s account, most biographers have accepted the years 1649 -1654 as a periode mondaine in Pascal’s career – that is, as a time when he retreated from his pledge to serve only God and resumed to a significant degree the life of a gentleman-scientist.
It was not a period of debauchery and libertinism or anything of the kind. Although he showed an occasional weakness for silk and brocade and enjoyed the amenities of both a valet and a coach-and-six, Pascal did not become a salon habitué or even much of a bon vivant. He was simply a young man who sought the company of fellow experts, savored the spotlight of recognition for personal achievement, and delighted in the social world of learned conversation and sparkling intellectual debate. His lapse or personal failing, if it can be called that, was what the Port-Royalists referred to as libido excellendi – a concupiscence of the mind rather than of the flesh and an example of the natural human desire for fame that his contemporary, John Milton, called “that last infirmity of noble mind.”
Pascal’s companions during this period included such stars of the Paris social scene as Artus Gouffier, the Duc de Roannez, a former military officer, noted courtier, and amateur dabbler in science and mathematics; Antoine Gombaud, the Chevalier de Méré, a soldier, gambler, author, and paragon of honnêteté (more than mere “honesty,” this term connotes an entire code of conduct and the gallant, cheerful lifestyle of an independent-minded man of the world); and Damien Mitton, another champion of honnêteté whose name became a byword for debonair charm and colorful raconteurship. Several commentators on the Pensées argue that the work is directly aimed at the culture of honnêteté and that it specifically targets figures like Méré and Mitton, that is, persons who seek a life of virtue and happiness apart from God.
Shortly after his return to Paris in 1647 and during a turn for the worse in his health, Pascal reunited with his old circle of friends and fellow intellectuals and was also introduced into polite society. Descartes himself paid a visit (and according to reports wisely suggested that Pascal follow a regimen of bed-rest and bouillon rather than the steady diet of enemas, purgings, and blood-lettings favored by his doctors). The historic meeting between the two scientific and philosophical rivals reportedly did not go well.
Pascal’s new life in Paris was interrupted in 1648 by the outbreak of the Fronde, the violent civil clash that began as a power struggle between Chief Minister Mazurin and leaders of Parliament and which continued as a conflict between the crown and various aristocratic factions over the next five years. To escape the mob havoc and pervasive military presence in Paris, Pascal returned to Clermont along with his sisters, brother-in-law, and father. There he effectively inserted himself into the Auvergne equivalent of Parisian high society and resumed his temporary infatuation with la vie honnêteté. He returned to Paris in 1650, reconnected with his old friends, and began revising and polishing several scientific papers, including portions of a never completed or partially lost version of his Treatise on the Vacuum.
On September 24, 1651, Étienne died; he was 63. Pascal and Jacqueline were at his bedside. Gilberte was in Clermont awaiting the birth of a child who would be named Étienne Périer in honor of his grandfather. Pascal’s letter of consolation to Gilberte, preserved among his complete works, has disappointed some of his admirers due to its austere tone and cold Jansenist view of death (we should not grieve but rejoice at God’s will; the deceased is now in a better world; and so forth.). However, the letter includes a note of affection for the man who had taken personal charge of his education and who was the first to introduce him to the world of science and mathematics. Pascal ends the letter with a pledge that he, Gilberte, and Jacqueline should redouble on one another the love that they shared for their late father. A few months later, Jacqueline finally made good on her determination (long postponed in obedience to her father’s and brother’s wishes) to dedicate her life to holy service and enter Port-Royal as a nun.
In the summer of 1654 Pascal exchanged a series of letters with Fermat on the problem of calculating gambling odds and probabilities. It was also at this time (although many have doubted his authorship) that he completed his Discourse on Love. And according to at least two of his biographers (Faugère and Bishop) it was during this same period (1653-54) that Pascal himself fell victim to amorous passion and even contemplated marriage (supposedly to the comely Charlotte de Rouannez, his frequent correspondent and the sister of his good friend the Duke). On the other hand, Gilberte in her account of her brother’s life makes no mention whatsoever of a love affair, and the evidence that Pascal ever succumbed to romance or became a suitor remains sketchy at best.
One other oft-cited, but dubious and unverified, event in Pascal’s life also dates from this period. According to various sources, none wholly reliable, in October of 1654, Pascal was supposedly involved in a nearly fatal accident while crossing the Pont de Neuilly in his coach. His affrighted horses reportedly reared, bolted, and plunged over the side of the bridge into the Seine, nearly dragging the coach and Pascal after them. Fortunately, the main coupling broke and the coach, with Pascal inside, miraculously hung on to the edge and stabilized.
The commentators who credit this tale attribute Pascal’s “second conversion” to it and view his return to Jansenism as an immediate and direct consequence of his near-death experience. Sigmund Freud accepted the story and even used it as an example of how severe trauma can trigger an obsessive or phobic reaction. However, there is no conclusive evidence that the event ever happened.
The crucial event of Pascal’s life and career occurred on November 23, 1654, between the hours of 10:30 pm and 12:30 am. Pascal lay in bed at his home in the Marais district in Paris when he experienced the religious ecstasy or revelation that his biographers refer to as his “second conversion” or “night of fire.” He produced a written record of this momentous experience on a sheet of paper, which he then inserted into a piece of folded parchment inscribed with a duplicate account of the same vision. This dual record, known as the Memorial, he kept sewed into the lining of his jacket as a kind of secret token or private testament of his new life and total commitment to Jesus Christ. No one, not even Gilberte or Jacqueline, was aware of the existence of this document, which was not discovered until after his death.
The text of the Memorial is cryptic, ejaculatory, portentous. At the top of the sheet stands a cross followed by a few lines establishing the time and date, then the word FEU (fire) in all upper case and centered near the top of the page. Then:
Dieu d’Abraham, Dieu d’Isaac, Dieu de Jacob, non des philosophes et des savants.
Certitude. Certitude. Sentiment. Joie. Paix.
Dieu de Jésus-Christ.
Deum meum et Deum vestrum.
Ton Dieu sera mon Dieu.
(God of Abraham, God of Isaac, God of Jacob, not of the philosophers and scholars. Certitude, certitude, feeling, joy, peace. God of Jesus Christ. My God and your God. Thy God will be my God.)
And so on, in a similarly ecstatic vein for about eighteen more lines. The parchment copy ends with the solemn pledge: “Total submission to Jesus Christ and to my director. Eternally in joy for a day’s trial on earth. I shall not forget thy word.”
As the name Memorial implies, Pascal’s words were written down to preserve them indelibly in his memory and to bear tangible witness to what was for him a soul-piercing and truly life-altering event. His account, despite its brevity and gnomic style, accords closely with the reports of conversion and mysticism classically described and analyzed by William James.
In the weeks leading up to November 23, 1654, Pascal had on several occasions visited Jacqueline at Port-Royal and had complained, despite his active social life and ongoing scientific work, of feelings of dissatisfaction, guilt, lack of purpose, and ennui. As in the story of his carriage accident by the Seine, he seemed to be a man teetering on the edge – in this case between anxiety and hope. His “Night of Fire” dramatically changed his outlook and brought him back from the brink of despair.
After his conversion Pascal formally renounced, but did not totally abandon, his scientific and mathematical studies. He instead vowed to dedicate his time and talents to the glorification of God, the edification of his fellow believers, and the salvation of the larger human community. It wasn’t long before he got an early test of his new resolve.
In fact, hardly had Pascal committed himself to Port-Royal than the Jansenist enclave, never secure and always under the watchful suspicion of the greater Catholic community, found itself under theological siege. Antoine Arnauld, the spiritual leader of Port-Royal and the uncompromising voice and authority for its strict Augustinian beliefs and values, was embroiled in a bitter controversy pitting Jansenism against the Pope, the Jesuit order, and a majority of the bishops of France. In effect, opponents charged that the entire Jansenist system was based on a foundation of error. At issue were matters of Catholic doctrine involving grace, election, human righteousness, divine power, and free will. Arnauld denied the charges and published a series of vehement counter-attacks. Unfortunately, these only served to make the hostility towards himself and the Port-Royal community more intense. He ended up being censored by the Faculty of Theology at the Sorbonne and stood threatened with official accusations of heresy. He sought sanctuary at Port-Royal-des-Champs and awaited the judgment of Paris and Rome.
With the official voice of Port-Royal effectively muted, the cause of Jansenism needed a new champion. Pascal stood ready to fill the role. During the period 1656-57, under the pseudonym Louis de Montalte,
he produced a series of 18 public letters attacking the Jesuits and defending Arnauld and Jansenist doctrine. The Lettres provinciales, as they became known, introduced an entirely new tone and style into contemporary theological debate. From time to time, the genre had served as a forum for obfuscation, vituperation, abstruse technical language, and stodgy academic prose. Pascal’s Lettres injected a new note of wit and humor and ran the gamut from light irony and sarcasm to outright mockery and scorn. They also featured a popular idiom and conversational tone and made use of literary devices such as characterization, dialog, dramatization, and narrative voice. They became a sensation and attracted the amused attention of readers throughout France. Who, people wondered, is this clever fellow Montalte? The Jesuits, stunned and slow to respond, seemed to have met their intellectual match.
During the same week that Pascal’s fifth provinciale (a polemic against Jesuit casuistry) was published, and just when rumors of new antagonism and royal disfavor with Jansenism began to circulate, an extraordinary event occurred at Port-Royal. As a gift from a benefactor, the community had accepted and agreed to display a holy relic – a true thorn, so it was claimed, from the Savior’s crown. Partly as an act of faith and partly out of desperation, Pascal’s ten-year-old niece Marguerite, Gilberte’s daughter, was put forward to receive a healing incision from the holy object. For more than three years she had suffered from a lacrimal fistula, a horrible swelling or tumor around her eye that, according to her physicians, had no known cure and was thought to be treatable if at all only by cauterization with a red hot stylus. Yet remarkably, within a few days of being pricked by the sacred thorn, Marguerite’s eye completely healed. The seeming miracle excited the Pascal family and the entire Port-Royal community; news of the event soon spread outside the walls of Port-Royal and around the nation. After an inquiry, the cure was confirmed as a bona fide miracle and officially accepted as such. Port-Royal rejoiced, and for a while the antagonism against it from the larger Catholic community abated. Pascal regarded the miracle as a sign of divine favor for his Lettres project and for the cause of Jansenism in general. It also confirmed his belief in miracles, a belief that would form part of the foundation for his view of religious faith as set forth in the Pensées.
Despite the auspicious sign of heavenly favor, and even though the Lettres were brilliantly successful in the short term, they failed in their ultimate goal of vindicating Arnauld and Port-Royal. A papal “bull” condemning Jansenism was issued by Alexander VII in October of 1656 and approved in France in December of 1657. An official oath decreeing that Jansenist doctrine was contaminated by heresy was circulated and all French priests, monks, and nuns, including the Port-Royalists and Pascal’s sister Jacqueline, were compelled to sign. In 1660 the “little schools” of Port Royal, renowned for excellence and models of progressive education, were closed. In 1661 the monastery was no longer allowed to accept novices. Early in the next century the abbey would be abolished, the community of worshippers disbanded, and the buildings razed. Overwhelmed by a combined force of royal politics and papal power, Port-Royal would lie in ruins and Jansenism, though it would inspire a few random offshoots and latter-day imitations, would find itself largely reduced to an interesting but brief chapter in the history of French Catholicism.
Meanwhile, in the spring of 1658, as he was studying the Bible and doing preparatory work for what was to be his magnum opus – the great Apology for Christianity that would become the Pensées – Pascal turned his attention once again to mathematics and to the problem of the roulette or cycloid. Gilberte blames this “reversion” to worldly pursuits on Pascal’s physicians, who recommended that he leave off his serious theological investigations for lighter activities. She also claims that the solution to the problem, which had challenged the likes of Galileo, Torricelli, and Descartes, came to him almost despite himself and during a bout of sleeplessness caused by a toothache. She finally alleges that Pascal decided to make his discovery public only when he was at length persuaded by others that it was God’s will. Gilberte’s claims are questionable. What is known is that when Pascal, under the pseudonym Amos Dettonville, actually did publish his solution, which was done within the context of a contest or challenge that he had thrown out to some of the best mathematical minds of Europe, the result was a controversy that occupied his time and energy for several months and which distracted him from working on his new project.
The Pensées occupied Pascal’s final years and were undertaken at a time when his health, which was never robust, deteriorated and grew progressively worse. Originally conceived as a comprehensive defense of the Christian faith against non-believers, the work in its existing form is a rich assortment of notes, fragments, aphorisms, homilies, short essays, sermonettes, and aperçus that even in their disorganized and unfinished state constitute a powerful and fascinating contribution to philosophy, theology, and literary art.
Pascal worked determinedly on the Pensées to the extent that his health permitted him, which was unfortunately not very often or for very long. By early 1659 he was already seriously ill and could work for only short spurts before succumbing to mental and physical exhaustion. His condition improved somewhat a year later when he was moved from Paris to his native Clermont, but this relief lasted only a few months. When he returned to Paris he mustered enough energy to work out his plan for a public shuttle system of omnibuses for the city. When this novel idea was realized and put into actual operation in 1662, Paris had the first such transit system in the world.
The last two years of Pascal’s life were spent in Paris under the care and supervision of Gilberte and Florin, who had taken a home nearby. It was a grim period for all the Pascals; Jacqueline died in 1661, only a few months after being forced to subscribe to the formulary condemning Jansen’s Augustinus as heretical. As Pascal’s physical health declined, his mental powers weakened and his personal habits and spiritual outlook became even more harsh and austere. According to Gilberte, he regarded any sort of dining pleasure or gastronomic delight as a hateful form of sensuality and adopted the (very un-Gallic) view that one should eat strictly for nourishment and not for enjoyment. He championed the ideal of poverty and claimed that one should prefer and use goods crafted by the poorest and most honest artisans, not those manufactured by the best and most accomplished. He purged his home of luxuries and pretty furnishings and took in a homeless family. He even cautioned Gilberte not to be publicly affectionate with her children – on grounds that caresses can be a form of sensuality, dependency, and self-indulgence. In his opinion, a life devoted to God did not allow for close personal attachments – not even to family.
During his last days he burned with fever and colic. His doctors assaulted him with their customary cures. He wavered in and out of consciousness and suffered a series of recurrent violent convulsions. However, Gilberte attests that he recovered his clarity of mind in time to make a final confession, take the Blessed Sacrament, and receive extreme unction. His last coherent words were reportedly “May God never abandon me.” He died at 1:00 AM August 19, 1662, at the age of 39.
Even post-mortem Pascal was unable to escape the curiosity and intrusiveness of his physicians. Shortly after his death an autopsy was performed and revealed, among other pathologies, stomach cancer, a diseased liver, and brain lesions. Nor after death, was he granted peace from the still ongoing crossfire between Jesuits and Port-Royal. Was Pascal, it was asked, truly orthodox and a good Catholic? A sincere believer and supporter of the powers of the Pope and the priesthood and the efficacious intervention of the Saints? Did he reject the Jansenist heresy on his deathbed and accept a more moderate and forgiving theology? Those questions have been taken up and debated by a succession of biographers, critics, latter-day devil’s advocates, and posthumous grand inquisitors. His works have fared better, having received, during the three and a half centuries since his death, first-rate editorial attention, a number of superb translations, and an abundance of expert scholarly commentary. The Pensées and the Provincial Letters have earned him a place in the pantheon of French philosophical non-fiction alongside names like Montaigne, Descartes, Voltaire, Rousseau, and Sartre.
Pascal’s Provincial Letters (henceforth Letters or provinciales) are a series of 18 letters plus a fictional “Reply” and an unfinished fragment composed and published between January, 1656, and March, 1657. Their aim was to defend the Jansenist community of Port-Royal and its principal spokesman and spiritual leader Antoine Arnauld from defamation and accusations of heresy while at the same time leading a counter-offensive against the accusers (mainly the Jesuits). Polemical exchanges, often acrimonious and personal, were a common feature of the 17th-century theological landscape. Pascal ventured into this particular fray with a unique set of weapons – a mind honed by mathematical exercise and scientific debate, a pointed wit, and sharp-edged literary and dramatic skills.
In the background of the letters stand two notable events: (1) In May of 1653, Pope Innocent X in a bull entitled Cum Occasione declared five propositions supposedly contained in Cornelius Jansen’s Augustinus to be heretical. (2) In January of 1656, after a long and heated trial, Arnauld, who had repeatedly denied that the five propositions were in Jansen’s text, was officially censured and expelled from the Sorbonne.
The five propositions can be stated as follows:
1. Even the just, no matter how hard they may strive, lack the power and grace to keep all the commandments.
2. In our fallen condition it is impossible for us to resist interior grace.
3. In order to deserve merit or condemnation we must be free from external compulsion though not from internal necessity.
4. It is heresy to say that we can either accept grace or resist it.
5. Christ did not die for everyone, but only for the elect.
Two separate questions were at stake: (1) Are the propositions actually in Jansen, if not explicitly and verbatim, then implicitly in meaning or intention? This was the so-called question of fact (de fait). (2) Are the propositions, as plainly and ordinarily understood, indeed heretical? This was the question of right or law (de droit). The Port-Royal position was yes in the case of the second question, no in the case of the first. Arnauld claimed that the propositions do not occur, verbatim or otherwise, anywhere in Jansen’s text, but he acknowledged that if they did occur there (or for that matter anywhere), they were indeed heretical. Despite the fact that he disavowed any support for the five propositions, he and the Port-Royal community as a whole stood under suspicion of secretly approving, if not openly embracing them.
Such was the situation that Pascal found himself in when he sat down to compose the first provinciale. What he produced was something utterly new in the annals of religious controversy. In place of the usual fury and technical quibbling, he adopts a tone of easy-going candor and colloquial simplicity. He presents himself as a modest, ordinary, private citizen (originally anonymous, but later identified in the collected letters by the pseudonym Louis de Montalte) who is writing from Paris to a “provincial friend.” “Montalte’s” purpose is to pass along his personal observations, insights, and commentary on the learned and mighty disputes that recently took place at the Sorbonne. In essence, via his fictional persona, Pascal provides an account of l’affaire Arnauld and the case against Jansenism as viewed by a coolly observant, playful outsider.
In the course of the letter, Pascal/Montalte introduces a series of fictional interlocutors who explain or advocate for the Jansenist, Jesuit, and Thomistic views on a range of theological issues, most notably the doctrines of sufficient grace vis-à-vis efficacious grace and the notion of proximate power. These happen to be exactly the sort of deeply esoteric, highly technical, theological matters that “Montalte” and his “provincial friend” (and thus, by extension and more importantly, his target audience of plain-spoken, commonsense, fellow citizens) were likely to find strained, incomprehensible, and somewhat silly. Through devices of interview and dialogue Montalte manages to present these issues in relatively clear, understandable terms and persuade the reader that the Jansenist and Thomist views on each are virtually identical and perfectly orthodox. He goes on to show that any apparent discrepancy between the two positions – and in fact the whole attack on Jansenism and Arnauld – is based not on doctrine, but is entirely political and personal, a product of Jesuit calumny and conspiracy. In effect, a complicated theological conflict is presented in the form of a simple human drama. Irony and stinging satire are delivered with the suave aplomb of a Horatian epistle.
Not all of the provinciales deal with the same issues and concerns as the first. Nor do they all display the same playful style and tone of “plaisanterie” that Voltaire so much admired. In fact some of the later letters, far from being breezy and affable, are passionate and achieve sublime eloquence; others are downright vicious and blistering in their attack. Letters 1-3 offer a defense of Arnauld, challenging his trial and censure. Letter 4, pitting a Jesuit against a Jansenist, serves as a bridge between provinciales 1-3 and 5-10. Letters 5-10 attack Jesuit casuistry and doctrine; in them Montalte accuses the Society of hypocrisy and moral laxity and of placing ease of conscience and the glory of the Order above true Christian duty and love of God. Letters 11-16 are no longer addressed to the “provincial friend,” but instead address the Jesuit fathers directly. Letter 14 includes an extended discussion of both natural and divine law and makes an important ethical distinction between homicide, capital punishment, and suicide. Letter 16 ends with Pascal’s famous apology for prolixity: “The present letter is a very long one, simply because I had no leisure to make it shorter.”) Letters 17 and 18 are addressed to Father Annat, SJ, confessor to the King, and are direct and personal. Here Pascal virtually abandons the artifice of “Montalte” and seems almost to come forward in his own person. In Letter 17, a virtual reprise and summation of the case of the five propositions, he repeats once again that he writes purely as a private citizen and denies that he is a member of Port Royal. Since Pascal was neither a monk nor a solitaire within the community, the claim is technically accurate, though it arguably leaves him open to the same charges of truth-bending and casuistry that he levels against the Jesuits.
Although the Letters gained a wide readership and enjoyed a period of popular success, they failed to achieve their strategic goal of preserving Port-Royal and Jansenist doctrine from external attack. They also had a few unfortunate, unintended consequences. They were blamed, for instance, for stirring up cynicism, disrespect, and even contempt for the clergy in the minds of ordinary citizens. Quickly translated into English and Latin, they also became popular with Protestant readers happy to extend Pascal’s wounding attack on Jesuit morality into a satirical broadside against Catholicism as a whole. After the publication of the provinciales, the term Jesuitical would become synonymous with crafty and subtle and the words casuistry and casuistical would never again be entirely free from a connotation of sophistry and excuse-making. Banned by order of Louis XIV in 1660 and placed on the Index and burned by the Inquisition, the provinciales nevertheless lived on underground and abroad with their popularity undimmed.
Today, the provinciales retain documentary value both as relics of Jansenism and as surviving specimens of 17th-century religious polemic, but modern readers prize them mainly for their literary excellence. They represent the original model not only for the genre of satirical non-fiction, but for classic French prose style in all other genres as well. Rabelais and Montaigne were basically inimitable and far too quirky and idiosyncratic to serve as a style model for later writers. Pascal’s combination of brisk clarity and concise elegance set a pattern for French authors from La Rochefoucauld, Voltaire, and Diderot to Anatole France. Even Paul Valéry, arguably Pascal’s most severe critic, excoriated his predecessor in a prose style heavily indebted to him. Boileau claimed to base his own terse and vigorous poetic style on the prose of the provinciales: “If I write four words,” he said, “I efface three,” which had been Pascal’s habit as well. Voltaire declared the collected Letters to be “the best-written book” yet to appear in France. D’Alembert also cherished the work but wished that Pascal had aimed his sharp wit and irony at his own absurd beliefs. He argued that Jansenism is every bit as “shocking,” and as deserving of scorn and ridicule, as the doctrines of Molina and the Jesuits. Of Pascal’s modern readers only the arch conservative Joseph de Maistre, spearhead of the counter-Enlightenment, utterly scorned the work, calling Jansenism a “vile” and “unblushing” heresy and finding the style of the Letters rancorous and bitter.
In the end, it’s unfortunate that the principal debate in the provinciales was theological rather than philosophical, for it would have been useful and interesting to have Pascal’s candid discussion of free will vs. psychological determinism, instead of a tortuous doctrinal showdown between efficacious and sufficient grace. Jansen’s own formula – that “man irresistibly, although voluntarily, does either good or evil, according as he is dominated by grace or by concupiscence” – is paradoxical and tries to have it both ways. (Can an act be both voluntary and irresistible?) Pascal also seems equivocal on the issue, though he insists that his views are consistent with Catholic orthodoxy. He wrestled with the problem of grace and free will not only in the Letters, but also in portions of the Pensées and especially in his Écrits sur la grâce (1657-58), where he offers an extensive commentary on Augustine and compares the Calvinist, Jansenist, and Jesuit views. However, even there his account is abstruse and theological rather than blunt and philosophical and is thus of interest mainly to specialists rather than general readers.
The Pensées are a rarity among literary and philosophical works – a magnum opus by a major author that has achieved classic status despite being unfinished, fragmentary, and almost scrapbook-like in form. The Aeneid, The Canterbury Tales, De Rerum Natura, Kafka’s manuscripts all had work remaining or were incomplete when their authors died, but they seem like final drafts compared to the Pensées. Sainte-Beuve compared the work to a tower in which the stones have been piled up but not cemented. The text, as we have it today, represents the assembled notes, fragments, miscellaneous aphorisms, and short essays-in-progress of what was to be a detailed and comprehensive Apology for Christianity – a defense of the faith against atheism, deism, libertinism, pagan philosophy, and the cult of honnêteté.
Inspired by the force and certainty of his own conversion and by the late excitement of the Holy Thorn, Pascal was further encouraged by the recent success of the provinciales. Confident in his powers of argument and persuasion, both logical and literary, he felt called upon to undertake a bold new project. The new work was to be nothing less than a definitive affirmation and justification of Christianity against its detractors and critics. It would also be an exercise in spiritual outreach and proselytization – an earnest appeal, addressed to both the reason and the heart, inviting scoffers, doubters, the undecided, and the lost to join the Catholic communion. In the Pensées, Pascal would assume the role of both Apologist and Apostle.
In the spring of 1658, he presented a detailed outline of his project, explaining its scope and goals, to an audience of friends and members of Port-Royal. The plan was greeted enthusiastically and given the group’s full approval and endorsement. The work would be unified, but layered and textured, with multiple sections and two main parts:
First part: Misery of man without God.
Second part: Happiness of man with God.
First part: That nature is corrupt. Proved by nature itself.
Second part: That there is a Redeemer. Proved by Scripture. (6/40).
The project was designed as an example of what is today termed immanent apologetics. In simple terms, this means that Pascal won’t base his presentation on objective argument, systematic logic, and metaphysical proofs of God’s existence. Indeed, except for a few instances, such as 135/167, where he finds evidence in nature for a Being who is “necessary, infinite, and eternal,” Pascal eschews most of the traditional proofs of God, even Augustine’s. He will instead appeal to the unfolding history of the Christian faith from its roots in Old Testament prophecy through its early development to the modern Church. Further, he will appeal directly to the subjective human spirit and to each reader’s personal experience, emphasizing our existential human need for God and our feelings of incompleteness and wretchedness apart from Him.
In essence, Pascal will leave it to readers to decide whether his account of the human condition and his descriptions of their social and physical worlds (not as they might wish them to be, but as they actually experience them in our daily lives) are credible and persuasive. If the reader accepts his accounts, Pascal will be halfway to his goal. It will remain for him to further convince readers that the solution to our wretchedness, to the disorder and unfairness of life, is acceptance of Jesus Christ. He will argue that not only is belief in Christianity not contrary to reason, but that it’s the only religion that is fully compatible with it. To support this claim, he will offer historical evidence in its favor from the authority of Scripture and ancient witnesses, and also in the form of miracles, prophecies, and figural (typological) hermeneutics. However, he admits that this evidence will not be conclusive – for Christianity can never be proved by reason or authority alone. It must be accepted in the heart (coeur – a special term in Pascal’s vocabulary that includes connotations of “spirit,” “soul,” “natural human instinct,” and even “love,”): “It is the heart which experiences God, and not the reason. This, then, is faith: God felt by the heart, not by the reason” (424/680).
Such in essence was the plan. Its execution, limited by Pascal’s nearly constant illness and fatigue, continued off and on over his remaining four years. Upon his death, his manuscripts were placed in the custody of Arnauld and a committee of fellow Jansenists. While transcribing the manuscripts, the committee produced two variant copies. The original Port Royal edition of Pascal’s works came out in 1670, incomplete and carefully screened to avoid offending the government. Prosper Faugère brought out a revised and authoritative edition of the work in 1844. Several new editions, with different arrangements of the material, appeared over the next century. The numerical ordering used in Léon Brunschvicg’s 1897 edition became standard, but was superseded first by the 1951 edition of Louis Lafuma (which was based on the First Copy) and then again by the 1976 edition of Phillipe Sellier (which was based on the Second Copy). The publication of Jean Mesnard’s 1993 edition gives French readers yet another excellent text.
Death, God, infinity, the nature of the universe, the limits of reason, the meaning of life – these are just a few of the big ideas and philosophical topics that Pascal reflects on in the short space of the Pensées. Indeed, other than the gnomic fragments of Heraclitus or the terse aphoristic texts of Wittgenstein, it’s hard to think of a work that packs as many provocative philosophical musings into so few pages.
Yet even with its multiple subject headings and wide range of topics, the work can still be read as the deep exploration of a single great theme: the Human Condition, viewed under its two opposing yet interrelated aspects – our wretchedness without God, and our greatness with Him. Pascal argues that without God our spiritual condition is essentially a state of misery characterized by anxiety, alienation, loneliness, and ennui. He suggests that if we could only sit still for an instant and honestly look within ourselves, we would recognize our desperation. However, we spend most of our time blocking out or concealing our true condition from ourselves via forms of self-deception and amour-propre. (Like Augustine before him, Pascal accurately describes mechanisms of denial and ego-defense long before they were clinically and technically defined by Sigmund Freud).
Chief among these ego-protective devices is divertissement (distraction or diversion), Pascal’s term for our continual need and almost addictive tendency to seek out mindless or soul-numbing forms of entertainment and amusement. Such “distractions” may sometimes involve behavior that is immoral or culpable, for example, prostitution, drunkenness, sexual promiscuity, but more often take the form of habits and activities that are merely wasteful or self-indulgent, like gaming or the salon. They may even consist of pastimes that are basically innocent, but which are nevertheless vain, trivial, or unedifying, for example, sports like tennis and fencing. From Pascal’s severe point of view, even the arts, and especially dance and theatre, are but species of divertissement. So are all the luxuries, consumer goods, and worldly delights with which we proudly surround ourselves. According to Pascal, we use these goods and activities not, as we self-flatteringly suppose, to certify our achievements or add a touch of bonheur to our inner life. On the contrary, we use them mainly as a way of concealing our bleak inner reality from ourselves and from one another. They are a means of denying our own mortality and hollowness. (136/168; 139/171.)
In effect diversions prevent us from acknowledging our essential misery. They create a false sense of security that hides the abyss or vacuum within. On the other hand, wretchedness and insecurity are only part of our nature. Our condition, as Pascal points out repeatedly in the Pensées and also in his “conversation” with Sacy, is dual. We are one part misery and one part grandeur; and alongside our feelings of isolation and destitution we also have a profound sense of our intrinsic dignity and worth. Pascal calls us “thinking reeds,” though his stress is on thinking. For thought, he argues, is the whole basis of our dignity, the attribute of our nature that elevates and separates us from the rest of the material universe. It’s an accident of history that Pascal’s collection of notes came to be called Pensées. But the title is appropriate, since the work as a whole could well be described as an extended meditation on human consciousness, on what it means to think.
Criticism and interpretation of the Pensées have followed two main approaches. The first, which could be called the conventional or historical approach, is the one favored by most literary scholars and historians of religion, including most notably Philippe Sellier, David Wetsel, and Jean Mesnard. According to this view the Pensées are to be understood within the context and framework of traditional Christian apologetics. Moreover, the author’s original design and purpose (so far as modern scholarship can determine them) are to be carefully reconstructed and fully respected. Most of the biographers and critics who follow this approach agree that Pascal’s primary purpose was to articulate and defend Christianity – and especially the Augustinian-Jansenist form of Christianity practiced at Port-Royal – against its skeptical, atheistic, and deistic opponents. In particular, they argued, Pascal aims to convert the contemporary free-thinker and honnête homme – that is to say, a figure much like his friends Mitton and Méré and indeed not unlike a secular, rationalistic, and worldly version of himself. The work is thus understood to be not an inner drama enacting Pascal’s own personal struggles with religious belief but rather an artfully contrived dialog with and rhetorical proselytization of an imagined adversary. The “I” of the work, in this view, is not Pascal himself in propria persona but a polyphonic fiction – a range of literary voices and masks adopted by Pascal strictly as a rhetorical device and as a means of persuasion. Thus, any time we seem to hear the narrative voice of the Pensées expressing fear, doubt, conflict, or existential agony we are to understand that voice not as Pascal’s own, but as that of a literary creation or persona whose utterances are to be interpreted ironically or as presented for dramatic or rhetorical effect.
Although he was neither a literary scholar nor a historian of religion (but more like a cantankerous version of each), Voltaire seems to have read and understood the Pensées in this traditional way. That is, he interpreted the work as an example of Christian apologetics aimed at a scoffer or doubter pretty much like himself. Needless to say, he was not swayed by Pascal’s arguments. To the claim that the human condition is one of anxiety and wretchedness, he responds that we are neither as wicked nor as miserable as Pascal says. As for Pascal’s extensive discussion of miracles, prophecy, the figurative interpretation of Scripture, and the like, Voltaire regards the effort as so much wasted breath. He even suggests that Christianity would be better off without such strained and overwrought apologetics, which he compared to trying to prop up an oak tree by surrounding it with reeds.
The poet and critic T. S. Eliot, in his 1933 introductory essay to the Pensées, also interprets the work in this traditional way. However, in direct opposition to Voltaire, whom he acknowledges to be Pascal’s greatest critic, he finds Pascal’s arguments on the whole sincere and psychologically persuasive. He departs from the traditional reading only to the extent that he considers the Pensées not only as a work of Christian apologetics but also as an example of spiritual biography, an expression of Pascal’s forceful and idiosyncratic personality and unique combination of passion and intellect (360).
In opposition to this essentially historical and scholarly way of reading the Pensées, several critics and commentators, from Chateaubriand and Walter Pater to Paul Valéry, AJ Krailsheimer, and Lucien Goldmann, have offered versions of what might be called a “romantic,” “confessional,” or “phenomenological” approach. According to this line of interpretation, Pascal’s fragmentary narrative represents either a fictional portrait of a soul in crisis or a true personal confession in the manner of Augustine (and later Rousseau). That is, it presents a cri de coeur or cri de triomphe that provides a direct look into the heart and soul of a penitent former sinner who, after a long and agonizing struggle, finds Christ and renounces the world. Romantic readers themselves disagree on the extent to which this exercise in self-revelation is a conscious product – that is, a carefully arranged and skillfully made artifact – or, in a more psychoanalytic vein, the expression of the author’s actual inner conflicts and unconscious motives and intentions. They also offer different interpretations of the audience or addressee of the work. Are the Pensées a dramatic monologue? A private confession addressed to God? A dialog between Pascal and the reader? Between Pascal and himself? Are they truly intended to convert a Méré or a Mitton, and are they addressed only to skeptics and those lacking faith? Or are they meant also as a meditative exercise and inspiration for active Christians, a spiritual tool to help guide believers and strengthen their faith? Or perhaps Pascal, in the manner of St. Paul, is trying to be all things to all people and thus to a certain extent trying to do some or all of the above at the same time?
The great Victorian critic Walter Pater compares the Pensées to Shakespearian tragedy and notes that Pascal is not a converted skeptic or former infidel who has seen the light. Instead, he seems caught “at the very centre of a perpetually maintained tragic crisis holding the faith steadfastly, but amid the well-poised points of essential doubt all around him.” The Pensées, Pater goes on to claim, dramatize an intense inner dialectic: “no mere calm supersession of a state of doubt by a state of faith; the doubts never die, they are only just kept down in a perpetual agonia.”
This view of the Pensées as an interior dialogue or psychomachia dramatizing Pascal’s own personal struggle between faith and doubt is thoroughly rejected by Jean Mesnard and other scholars who insist that any hint of such a struggle is merely a rhetorical pose on Pascal’s part and employed for dramatic effect.
Pascal was proclaimed a heretic and a Calvinist during his lifetime and has been called everything from a skeptic to a nihilist by modern readers. So to a certain extent Paul Valéry in his controversial essay “Variations on a Pensée” was for the most part only repeating criticisms of the author that earlier critics, many of them Catholic clergymen, had made before (for example, that he was a poor theologian, that he was insensitive to natural beauty and to art, and so forth). Valéry seems to recognize a distinction between Pascal the author and the “I” of the Pensées, but he finds the “I” of the work so artificial and overwrought that he accuses the author of being hypocritical and insincere. Thinking of the passage in the Pensées about the terror induced by “the eternal silence” of infinite space (201/233), he says, here is a “strange Christian,” who gazes upon the starry heavens yet fails to discover his Heavenly Father. Echoing a criticism formerly made by Voltaire, Valéry likens Pascal to a tragic poet who portrays the human condition as much bleaker and harsher than it actually is; who describes the fears and torments of life vividly, but who depicts its delights and joys, its moments of excitement and intensity, hardly at all.
Lucien Goldmann has argued that the fragmentary form of the Pensées may be an accident due to Pascal’s death, but it also qualifies as a brilliantly achieved creative product, an aesthetically and psychologically appropriate form that not only reflects the true style and state of mind of Pascal himself and of his narrative persona but also captures the mood and temper of his time. Writing from a Lukácsian-Marxist and evolutionary perspective that he calls “genetic structuralism,” Goldmann views Pascal as both a cutting-edge, creative force and at the same time a product of his personal circumstances and historical era. In this interpretation, Pascal sets up dialectical polarities in the Pensées –man’s wretchedness vs. his greatness; concupiscence vs. godliness and sacrifice; Old Testament type vs. New Testament antitype; reason vs. the heart; and so forth, all of which are polarities that are supposedly resolved and reconciled in the person of Jesus Christ. Those polarities are homologous with and paralleled by the larger historical oppositions of the period: the new science vs. ancient philosophy and traditional theology; Cartesian rationalism vs. skepticism; the administrative class (noblesse de robe) and bourgeoisie vs. the nobility; Protestantism and Jansenism vs. Catholicism; and so forth. Viewed in this way, the Pensées can be seen to encapsulate and effectively dramatize the main intellectual and social dynamics of an entire era.
One of the more remarkable developments in Western philosophy is the fact that one sliver of the Pensées , a single fragment of a fragmentary text and but a small portion of the untidy, multi-part, unfinished work that contains it, has achieved a full literary life of its own, with its own lively history of commentary and criticism. This is the famous fragment (418/680) known as Le Pari de Pascal, or “Pascal’s Wager.” Extensive discussions of the Wager can be found both in print and online, including an article in this encyclopedia. These discussions address a range of issues relating to the Wager, such as its status in the development of decision theory and probability theory, the various objections that have been made against it, and the numerous revised or alternate versions and applications that have been derived from it. This section will take up only two matters related to the topic: (1) the question of whether or not Pascal himself sincerely approved the Wager and believed that it presents a legitimate and persuasive argument for faith in God; (2) the response to the Wager on the part of a few selected philosophers and critics along with a glance at some of its precedents in literary history.
Simply characterized, the Wager is a second-person dialog in which Pascal imagines an individual forced to choose between belief in God and disbelief in Him. He analyzes the situation as if the reader-protagonist (the “you” of the imaginary dialog) were involved in a great existential coin-toss game. The conditions and possible outcomes of the Wager are presented in the following table:
|You bet that He exists
|You bet that He does not exist
|+ ∞ (infinite gain)
|– ∞ (infinite loss)
|God does not exist
|– x (finite loss)
|+ x (finite gain)
Pascal argues that given the terms of the Wager it is not simply prudent, it is practically obligatory to bet on God’s existence and illogical and utterly foolish to bet against Him. For consider: if you bet on His existence, you stand to win an infinite reward (an eternity in paradise) at the risk of only a small loss (whatever earthly pleasures you would be required to forego during your mortal life). On the other hand, if you bet against His existence, you risk the possibility of an infinite loss (loss of paradise – along with the possibility of an eternity in Hell) for only a limited gain (the opportunity to enjoy a few years’ worth of worldly delights).
Pascal was a lifelong Catholic whose personal conversion from lukewarm to whole-hearted faith was accomplished not by rational argument but by a life-changing mystical experience. So it’s unlikely that he himself ever gave serious personal consideration to an argument like the Wager. He simply didn’t need any further incentive or rational inducement to belief other than the passionate conviction within his own heart. On the other hand, it’s not unlikely that he thought the Wager might appeal to and perhaps even sway a libertine, a skeptic, or a Deist who might be teetering on the brink of belief. And that goes even more for a figure like a Méré or Mitton or any of the other young gallants and connoisseurs of honnêteté whom Pascal came to know in the salons and gaming rooms of Paris. After all, what better than a wager to entice a gambler? “Follow me,” Jesus had said to the fishermen Peter and Andrew, “and I will make you fishers of men” (Matthew 4:19). Similarly, Pascal, in the role a latter-day apostle, uses a game of chance as a net to bring sinners to salvation.
The concept of the Wager was by no means original with Pascal. Versions of it can be found as far back as Euripides’ The Bacchae. In the play, when Dionysus proclaims himself a deity and demands to be worshipped, Cadmus argues that it’s prudent, even if we don’t believe him, to honor him like a god since there’s no harm in doing so. (On the other hand, we risk a great deal of personal hardship by failing to show him proper reverence if he truly is a god.)
Sir Thomas More’s anecdote of the Gallant and the Friar presents in an inverted form a similar conflict and moral: When a gallant sees a friar walking barefoot in the snow, he asks him why he endures such pain. The friar responds that the pain is trivial, if we remember Hell. “But what if there is no hell?” inquires the amused gallant, adding “then art thou a great fool.” “Yes, master,” the friar replies, “but what if there is a hell? Then art thou a greater fool.”
A comical modern parody of the Wager occurs in the 1951 Broadway musical Guys and Dolls. Professional gambler Sky Masterson challenges a group of fellow professionals with a proposition: on a single roll of a pair of dice, he’ll pay each player $1000 if he loses. But if he wins, the gamblers will have to attend a midnight revival meeting at the Save-a-Soul mission. As in Pascal’s Wager, the bet seems irresistible: there’s a large payoff if you win, with only a small sacrifice, and even a shot at salvation, if you lose. Sky wins his wager. The gamblers are “saved.”
Voltaire called the Wager “indecent and childish” and thought it strange that Pascal reduced questions of the highest gravity to the mathematics of games of chance. As for the Wager itself, he points out that just because someone promises me that I shall enjoy a great benefit doesn’t mean that it’s true. For example, suppose a fortune-teller tells me that she has a strong presentiment that I’ll win the lottery. Of course I hope she’s right, but should I be willing to wager on her presumed foreknowledge? If so, how much? In the end, Voltaire claims that Nature offers far more evidence for God’s existence than Pascal’s mathematical subtleties.
Following up on Voltaire’s objections, Diderot pointed out that Pascal’s same basic argument (better to believe than not to believe) would apply equally well to any other religion: “An imam could argue just as well this way.” Indeed, by this logic, it could be argued that the more fanatical the religion, and the more extreme its promised rewards for belief and punishments for non-belief, the more powerful the argument in its favor.
Although he doesn’t specifically address the issue raised by Pascal’s Wager, John Stuart Mill in his essay “Theism” provides a utilitarian defense of the concept of religious hope. In effect, he argues that in a case where the truth is uncertain and the alternatives, immortality of the soul vs. extinction; existence of God vs. His non-existence, appear equally probable, it is legitimate to prefer the more hopeful option as being the choice more likely conducive to overall happiness.
In his essay “The Will to Believe” William James offers a sharp critical assessment of the Wager and finds Pascal’s basic argument to be weak, sophistic, and insincere:
. . . When religious faith expresses itself thus, in the language of the gaming-table, it is put to its last trumps. Surely Pascal’s own personal belief in masses and holy water had far other springs; and this celebrated page of his is but an argument for others, a last desperate snatch at a weapon against the hardness of the unbelieving heart. We feel that a faith in masses and holy water adopted willfully after such a mechanical calculation would lack the inner soul of faith’s reality; and if we were ourselves in the place of the Deity, we should probably take particular pleasure in cutting off believers of this pattern from their infinite reward (224).
However, having said this, James goes on to makes a pragmatic case for voluntary belief similar to Mill’s utilitarian defense of “hope” and to some extent comparable to Kierkegaard’s “leap of faith”. He argues that there are matters where the truth is in doubt and science is incapable of passing judgment as in the question of whether God exists. Where that choice is, in his terms, live (meaning that it seems of vital interest and value to us and engages us emotionally), momentous (meaning that it is non-trivial and has serious consequences), and forced (meaning that we must choose one way or the other and cannot simply sit the fence or stand aside), then it is lawful, indeed even necessary for us to weigh the risks and evidence and choose. In the end, James basically recasts Pascal’s Wager in a new form, re-focusing on its existential and psychological dimensions and dispensing with what he regards as its stagy and cheapening gambling metaphors.
Besides his two major works (the Pensées and the Provinciales), Pascal also wrote several shorter works touching on a wide range of topics – from political legitimacy and social order to Stoicism and romantic love. A brief overview and précis of some of the better known and more important of these minor works follows.
Essentially an extensive commentary on human nature and the doctrine of divine grace, the Écrits represent Pascal’s most ambitious venture into the arena of Catholic theological debate. First published in 1779, the work was written at the same time as the provinciales and covers much of the same ground (proximate power, concupiscence, free will, and so forth), though in a more serious and less cavalier manner and in a more direct and methodical form. Along with other deep matters, Pascal here explicates Augustine’s distinction between human nature in its unfallen state as pure, innocent, and naturally just, though capable of choice and error, and our postlapsarian condition, which is in thrall to concupiscence and naturally prone, indeed practically bound to do evil if it were not for God’s prevenient grace. Adam was upright but free to fall; we children of Adam are weighed down by sin, and incapable of rising by our own effort. But, we are free to accept grace and can therefore be lifted up.
Pascal dissects the problem of free will in a similarly Augustinian fashion. Adam had free will in the sense that he could freely choose either good or evil, though he naturally inclined to the former. We, in our concupiscent state, are also free to choose. However, we are naturally inclined to prefer evil, which in our ignorant, fallen condition we commonly mistake for good. Pascal also points out that through the grace of Jesus Christ, a grace instilled by the Holy Spirit, we can achieve a redeemed will – a will sufficient to overcome concupiscence and capable of recognizing and choosing good.
Commentators on the Écrits have questioned whether its depiction of grace (which is presented as something largely mysterious yet vital for salvation) is consistent with the rational apologetic approach and systematic style of argument that Pascal sought to use in the Pensées.
Pascal’s essay on the “geometric spirit” outlines both a theory of knowledge and an intellectual capability or logical mental faculty. He asserts that geometry and mathematics are the only areas of human inquiry that provide knowledge that is both certain and infallible. He then supports this claim with arguments and demonstrations. He goes on to describe a certain quality or faculty of mind that he calls l’esprit géométrique, which he defines as the ability to take known or perceived truths and to present them in such a way – with such precise steps, perfect elegance, and logical rigor – that their truth cannot help but be recognized and approved by others. Such an irrefutable and triumphant persuasiveness – the ability to vanquish all doubt and counter-argument – seems to have been Pascal’s goal in all his writings, whether on scientific subjects or in matters of theological dispute. In any case, the “geometric spirit” is both a prominent characteristic of Pascal’s own genius as well as an important epistemological idea (illustrating both the powers and limitations of the human mind) that he returns to repeatedly throughout his writings.
Pascal’s authorship of the “Discourse on the Passions of Love” has been disputed for the obvious reason that its subject (romantic love) and sentiments (that love exalts the soul, that those with the greatest souls make the truest lovers, that secret or undeclared love entails both exquisite joy and agonizing pain, and so forth) are highly uncharacteristic of the writer and would seem to be far outside his range of interest and expertise. Yet the style of the Discourse is distinctively Pascalian and some of the ideas contained in it (such as the distinction between the “geometric” mind and the spirit of “finesse”) are certifiably his own. Thus his authorship, while dubious, is at least possible, and so the question for his critics and biographers becomes: how to account for a work that seems so utterly contrary to Pascal’s own modest habits and reputation, so much more in the spirit of the salons of Paris rather than the cells of Port-Royal?
The most popular way of dealing with the Discourse has been simply to dismiss it as uncanonical and regard it as, at bottom, some kind of anonymously composed pastiche that incorporates bits and echoes of Pascal along with selections from other sources. Alternatively, it could be argued that the Discourse is written in the style and spirit of the Paris salons because Pascal himself intentionally wrote it in that vein, possibly as a kind of literary exercise or demonstration on his part for the amusement of his friends Méré and Mitton and their circle. (One can indeed easily imagine the pair challenging their shy friend to attempt such an exercise and then delighting in his successful performance.) So even though the Discourse may indeed be Pascal’s, its content and sentiments are for the most part artificial and insincere, many of the expressed opinions being mere restatements or variations of age-old commonplaces and platitudes about romantic love taken either from the précieuse poetry of his own era or from earlier literature. (See, for example, the medieval Rules of Courtly Love of Andreas Capellanus, a compendium of witty, lofty, acerbic, or tongue-in-cheek observations about love very similar to Pascal’s.)
Despite its minor status, the “Discourses on the Great” is nevertheless of interest since it is the only work of Pascal’s that attempts to formulate something like a social or political philosophy. The work (which is addressed to a young man of high degree) begins with a parable about a castaway on an island whom the inhabitants (owing to his close physical resemblance) mistake for their long-lost king. Such, Pascal argues, is the condition of those born to nobility or wealth within society: it is only by coincidence or lucky accident and by the power of custom and convention, not by nature, that they have their status. From this it follows that persons of rank are obligated to conduct themselves with due humility and must never allow themselves to treat those on society’s lower rungs with insolence or disrespect. Pascal concludes the Discourses by reminding his young learner of his true condition and enjoins him to rule and lead with beneficence.
Simply stated, the political philosophy expressed in the Discourses is noblesse oblige. Pascal acknowledges that the origins of human inequality are of two kinds, natural and institutional. The former arise from relative abilities or deficiencies of mind or body. For instance, A has better eyesight than B; X is taller and stronger than Y).Institutional inequalities, unless they are sanctioned by divine law, are entirely conventional and sometimes even arbitrary and can be rescinded or overturned. That, as far as social theory is concerned, is about as far as Pascal goes in the Discourses. Since his primary purpose is to offer moral instruction to a young nobleman, he doesn’t address topics like property, the social contract, divine right theory, which was a view recently and avidly affirmed by Louis XIV, or the ethics of revolt. From scattered comments in the Pensées, we know that he was politically conservative and despised violence. Apparently his experience during the Fronde led him to believe that even oppressive order is better than anarchy and that there is no worse social evil than civil war (see Pensées 94/128, 81/116, 85/119).
Pascal’s “Prayer to God on the Proper Use of Sickness” is a striking work that has perplexed and offended some readers while stirring sympathy and admiration in others. Readers of the first sort, knowing of Pascal’s persistent illnesses and chronic pain, are disturbed to find him here not only begging forgiveness for the few pleasures he enjoyed during his brief intervals of health, but even thanking God for his lifetime of afflictions and earnestly beseeching Him for more of the same. These readers view the “Prayer” as an expression of almost pathological morbidity and the testament of a fanatic. Interpreted in this way, Pascal’s portrayal of the pleasures of life as cruel and deadly and of disease and affliction as salutary and healing seem not so much holy paradoxes as evidence of the extent to which the gloom of Jansenism had darkened his entire outlook.
This reading is defective in at least two ways. First, it ignores the fact that the paradoxes invoked in the “Prayer”—life is death; death is life; health is illness, illness is health; pain is pleasure, pleasure is pain; and so forth — are Christian commonplaces and that the rhetorical use of such figures had long been a standard feature of Christian discourse. (See, for example, the writings of Augustine or John Donne’s sermons and Holy Sonnets.) Second, any accusation of exaggerated melodrama or overstatement in the “Prayer” also overlooks the degree to which serious illness and devastating rates of mortality – plagues, deaths, executions, amputations – were an everyday part of life in Europe during the 17th century. Viewed in this context, the “Prayer” may still strike modern readers as unnaturally bleak, but it expresses sentiments and feelings that many of Pascal’s contemporaries would have been familiar with and shared.
The “Prayer” can be more accurately characterized as a simple statement of faith and humility and a plea for patience and courage. It expresses the blend of neo-stoicism and contemptus mundi that was common in prayers and sermons of the day. Christian stoicism had been recently introduced into French literature via the writings of Guillaume du Vair, and Pascal had likely read Epictetus’s Enchiridion in du Vair’s translation. Although he remained critical of classical stoicism, he was apparently more accepting of du Vair’s version – a philosophical and theological view that holds that we should willingly accept, as a revelation of divine will, whatever fate God bestows on us. Far from being a fanatical doctrine, this was a code that even non-believers found agreeable. Indeed most of us find it admirable when individuals who are sorely afflicted with a disease or who have suffered the loss of an organ or limb accept their condition with fortitude and equanimity.
The minor work Entretien avec M.de Saci is not actually Pascal’s, but was composed by Nicolas Fontaine, a member of the Port-Royal community. It is the record of a conversation that took place between Pascal and his spiritual director Lemaistre de Sacy shortly after Pascal took up residence at Port-Royal in 1654. The work wasn’t published until 1736, but it’s an important document nevertheless since it represents the fullest discussion that we have of Pascal’s views on Western philosophy. The portrait of Pascal that emerges from the Conversation is well drawn and seems authentic, and the words and style are recognizably his own. Many of the ideas presented in the work can be found scattered throughout the Pensées, where they are expressed in nearly similar language and where once again Epictetus and Montaigne stand as mighty opposites: the former championing but over-estimating the greatness and nobility of humankind, the latter recognizing but exaggerating our folly and ignorance.
Pascal praises Epictetus as a brilliant philosopher whose knowledge of our essential moral duties and especially of our need for patience, courage, faith, and humility is unsurpassed. Unfortunately, the philosopher’s “diabolic pride” leads him astray. For example, Epictetus wrongly supposes that human reason is a perfectly reliable guide to truth. He also errs in holding that the mind and the senses are sufficient for perceiving and understanding the true nature and overall justice of the cosmos.
Of Montaigne, Pascal remarks that although he was a professed Catholic he nevertheless chose to forego Christian doctrine as a source of moral law and turned instead to his, admittedly fallible, personal judgment and natural instinct as ethical guides. Pascal then goes on to criticize Montaigne for his utter and thoroughgoing Pyrrhonism symbolized by the device of a scales that Montaigne had emblazoned on the ceiling of his study with his famous motto Que sais-je?(What do I know?) inscribed beneath. Pascal argues that, in contrast to Epictetus, Montaigne’s error consists not in glorifying or over-estimating human reason and knowledge but rather in denying them any credit or status whatsoever. Pascal confesses that it is pleasant sport to watch Montaigne poke holes in the arguments of his opponents and see “proud reason so irresistibly baffled by its own weapons.” Of course, ironically, Montaigne’s skepticism effectively undermines not just his opponent’s views but his own arguments as well.
Near the end of the conversation, Pascal launches into an oratorical peroration describing how the errors, imperfections, and opposing polarities represented by the two philosophers are ultimately mediated and reconciled in the person of Jesus Christ. @
It is therefore from this imperfect enlightenment that it happens that the one [that is, Epictetus] knowing the duties of man and being ignorant of his impotence, is lost in presumption, and that the other [that is, Montaigne], knowing the impotence and being ignorant of the duty, falls into laxity; whence it seems that since the one leads to truth, the other to error, there would be formed from their alliance a perfect system of morals. But instead of this peace, nothing but war and a general ruin would result from their union; for the one establishing certainty, the other doubt, the one the greatness of man, the other his weakness, they would destroy the truths as well as the falsehoods of each other. So that they cannot subsist alone because of their defects, nor unite because of their opposition, and thus they break and destroy each other to give place to the truth of the Gospel. This it is that harmonizes the contrarieties by a wholly divine act, and uniting all that is true and expelling all that is false, thus makes of them a truly celestial wisdom in which those opposites accord that were incompatible in human doctrines. . . . Such is the marvelous and novel union which God alone could teach, and which He alone could make, and which is only a type and an effect of the ineffable union of two natures in the single person of a Man-God.
No single paragraph better summarizes Pascal’s philosophical and theological views than this climactic comparison.
Pascal made his first important mathematical discovery and published his first article, the Essay on Conics (1640), at the age of sixteen. Barely an essay at all, the work is a one-page document consisting of three diagrams, three definitions, and two lemmas. Although it had little immediate impact beyond a small circle of mathematicians, it was nevertheless a breakthrough contribution to the emerging new field of projective geometry. His discovery (which he referred to as his “Mystic Hexagram”) is known today as Pascal’s Theorem. It states that if six points are situated on a conic section (an ellipse, parabola, or hyperbola), and if these points are then joined by line segments to form a hexagon, then if the sides of this hexagon are projected beyond the section, the pairs of opposite sides will meet in three points all of which lie on a straight line.
Figure 1: Pascal’s “Mystic Hexagram.” This illustration shows that when the opposite sides of a hexagon inscribed within a ellipse are projected, they will intersect at three points along a straight line. (In this case all the points lie entirely outside the ellipse.)
After his death, Pascal’s unpublished mathematical papers (including what seems to have been a full treatise on conics) were collected by his nephew Étienne Périer. Eventually these manuscripts were turned over to the great German philosopher and mathematician Gottfried Leibniz for his evaluation and use. Leibniz left behind an extensive set of notes on the collection and registered his admiration for Pascal’s genius. Unfortunately Pascal’s original papers have all been lost.
In 1644 the Italian physicist Evangelista Torricelli, testing a hypothesis suggested by Galileo, took a glass tube closed at one end and filled it with mercury. He then inverted the tube, open end down, into a bowl also containing mercury and watched as the mercury in the tube dropped slightly leaving a vacant space at the top. Contrary to the prevailing scientific view upheld by Aristotelians and Cartesians alike according to which a vacuum in nature is a physical impossibility, Torricelli surmised that the space at the top of the tube was indeed a vacuum and that it was created by the pressure of the external air, which exactly balanced the pressure exerted by the column of mercury inside the tube.
Pascal learned of the experiment from his former mentor Père Mersenne. Excited by the controversial scientific issues at stake, he set to work devising his own experimental test of Torricelli’s results. Just obtaining the required apparatus posed a huge challenge. Scientists of the era typically had to design, specify, oversee the production of, test, and of course pay for their own equipment. Pascal did all that and then went to work conducting his own experiments and demonstrations. Confident of his results, he went on tour to demonstrate his hypothesis, which he was able to do using tubes of different length and diameter and a variety of liquids. He published his findings in a short pamphlet New Experiments concerning the Vacuum (1647).
The decisive experiment, proving that the level of mercury in the tube was due to external air pressure, was conducted at the Puy-de-Dôme, the mountainous lava dome near Pascal’s native Clermont. Pascal designed and organized the experiment, but because of his health issues it was actually conducted by his brother-in-law Florin Périer along with a team of observers, clerics, and local officials. Using two identical tubes, the team measured the levels of mercury at a base point in the town. Then, with a portion of the party staying behind to monitor the mercury level in one tube, which remained at the home base, Florin and the rest of the party ascended the mountain with the other tube and measured the mercury level at various elevations. It was found that the level of mercury in the mobile (or test) tube varied inversely with the altitude. Meanwhile, the mercury level in the stationary (or control) tube never varied. Repeated experiments produced the same conclusive results: the level of mercury was due to air pressure, which also has the ability to create a vacuum.
Pascal published a record of the experiment in a short document entitled “The Account of the Great Experiment of the Equilibrium of Fluids.” to which he appended a closing note that deserves quotation since it marks a historic turning point in the advance of modern science vis-à-vis ancient authority. On the basis of his experiments, he asserts “that nature has no repugnance for the vacuum” and “makes no effort to avoid it”:
. . . all the effects that have been attributed to her horror have their origin in the weight and pressure of the air, that it is their sole and true cause. . . . It is not on this occasion only that, when the weakness of men has been unable to find the true causes, their subtlety has substituted imaginary causes to which they have given specious names filling the ears and not the mind. Thus it is said that the sympathy and antipathy of natural bodies are efficient causes, responsible for many effects, as if inanimate bodies were capable of sympathy and antipathy; it is the same with antiperistasis and with many other chimerical causes, which but give a vain solace to man’s hunger to know hidden truths, and which, far from revealing them, serve only to cover up the ignorance of such inventors and to feed that of their followers.
One other document relating to the vacuum that dates from this period (October 29, 1647) and which bears special mention is Pascal’s reply to (the felicitously if improbably named) Père Noël. A Jesuit priest who embraced the widely accepted doctrine (approved by both Aristotelian and Cartesian physicists) that nature is a material plenum and will not permit a vacuum, Noël had written a letter to Pascal defending the horror vacui viewpoint and arguing that the empty space that Pascal claims to have observed at the top of the tubes in his experiments was not empty space at all but a space necessarily filled with “rarified air” or some other subtle form of substance. Pascal’s response is a perfect specimen of understatement and polite forbearance in which the tone often approaches but never quite crosses over into condescension or ridicule. The provinciales are usually cited as the original instance of classic French prose style, but the letter to Noël and indeed a number of Pascal’s scientific papers – all notable for their force, clarity, concision, and elegance as well as for their utter absence of bombast, fustian, and needless adornment – could also lay claim to setting the model. An early paragraph in Pascal’s letter succinctly defines his criteria and standards of truth in matters of scientific investigation; two later paragraphs illustrate his tactful but forceful way of dealing with the kind of learned ignorance that Sir Francis Bacon had referred to as “vain imaginations” and the “idols of the theatre”:
The rule [of scientific method] is never to make a decisive judgment, affirming or denying a proposition, unless what one affirms or denies satisfies one of the two following conditions: either that of itself it appear so clearly and distinctly to sense or to reason, according as it is subject to one or the other, that the mind cannot doubt its certainty, and this is what we call a principle or axiom, as, for example, if equals are added to equals, the results are equal; or that it be deduced as an infallible and necessary consequence from such principles or axioms . . . . Everything satisfying one of these conditions is certain and true, and everything satisfying neither is considered doubtful and uncertain. We pass decisive judgment on things of the first kind and leave the rest undecided, calling them, according to their deserts, now a vision, now a caprice, occasionally a fancy, sometimes an idea, and at the most a happy thought; and since it is rash to affirm them, we incline rather to the negative, ready however to return to the affirmative if a convincing demonstration brings their truth to light….
For all things of this kind [that is, hypothetical entities] whose existence is not manifest to sense are as hard to believe as they are easy to invent. Many persons, even among the most learned men of the day, have opposed me with this same substance [that is, rarified air or some comparable ethereal matter] before you (but simply as an idea and not as a certain truth), and that is why I mentioned it among my propositions. Others, to fill empty space with some kind of matter, have imagined one with which they have filled the entire universe, because imagination has this peculiarity that it produces the greatest things with as little time and trouble as little things; some have considered this matter as of the same substance as the sky and the elements, and others of a different substance, as their fancy dictated, for they disposed of it as of their own work.
But if we ask of them, as of you, that you show us this matter, they answer that it cannot be seen; if we ask that it make a sound, they say it cannot be heard, and so with all the remaining senses; and they think they have done much when they have convicted others of powerlessness to show that it does not exist by depriving themselves of all power to show that it does.
Pascal later composed, but never published, two detailed monographs that were discovered among his manuscripts after his death: a Treatise on the Equilibrium of Liquids and a Treatise on the Weight of the Mass of Air. These two treatises represent seminal contributions to the sciences of hydraulics and hydrostatics and include the discovery that if no other forces are acting on a fluid, the pressure will be the same throughout the fluid and the same in all directions – an observation that is known today as Pascal’s Principle. It is in recognition of his important work in the study of fluid mechanics that a standard unit of pressure is today known as the pascal (Pa), defined as a force equal to 1 Newton per square meter.
In 1654, Pascal responded to a series of problems posed by his friend Antoine Gombaud, the self-styled Chevalier de Méré, an amateur mathematician and noted gambler. Suppose, Pascal was asked, that you are given 24 rolls of a pair of dice. What is the probability of your throwing double sixes at least one time? Méré also asked a related question known as the “problem of the points” (also known as the problem of the division of the stakes). This problem asks, if a wager game is terminated before it has been completed, how should the contestants divide the stakes? For example, suppose that A and B are playing a winner-take-all game in which a point is scored on every try and the winner is the first player to reach ten points. How should the stakes be divided if the game is terminated after A has 7 points and B has 5?
Pascal developed solutions to these and other problems relating to the calculation of gambling odds and in an exchange of letters shared his insights with the great Toulouse mathematician Pierre de Fermat. Together the two correspondents effectively founded the modern theory of probability.
Part of the foundation for the modern theory is provided in Pascal’s “Treatise on the Arithmetical Triangle,” which he composed in 1653. (He sent a copy of this document to Fermat during their correspondence, but it was never published until after his death.) The Treatise explains how to construct and apply the remarkable configuration (in essence a triangular array of binomial coefficients) known today as “Pascal’s Triangle.” The array had been generated and used previously by Chinese, Indian, Persian, and European mathematicians, and Pascal never claimed to have discovered or originated it. He was simply interested in demonstrating its fascinating properties and powers.
Pascal calls the square containing each number in the array a cell. The numeral 1’s at the top of his triangle head perpendicular rows; those on the left side of the triangle head parallel rows. He calls the third (diagonal) side of the triangle the base. Cells along any diagonal row are called cells of the same base. The first diagonal row (consisting of the number 1) is row 0. The second diagonal row (1, 1) is row 1; and so on. The number value of each cell is equal to the sum of its immediately preceding perpendicular and parallel cells. For example, 120 in the base diagonal (item 4 in row 7) = 36 + 84.
Furthermore, the number value of each cell is also equal to the sum of all the cells of the preceding row (from the first cell to the cell immediately above the target cell). For example, 126 (the number value of cell 6 in row 5) = 1 + 4 + 10 + 20 + 35 + 56 (the sum of cells 1-6 of row 4).
Pascal explains in detail how the Triangle can be used to calculate combinations (that is to compute C in cases where nCr = n things taken r at a time). As Pascal demonstrates, to find the answer we would move perpendicularly down to the nth row and then move diagonally r cells. For example, for 5C4, we would go perpendicularly down to row 5 and then move diagonally 4 cells and find that the number of combinations is 5. Similarly, if we calculate for 6C3,we would move down 6 rows and then diagonally 3 cells and find that the answer is 20. And so on. In another section of the Treatise, Pascal explains how to use the Triangle to solve the Problem of Points.
Solutions to Méré’s problems:
1. Probability of at least one double-six in 24 rolls of two dice: 1 – (35/36)24 = 0.4914.
2. Problem of points: A needs 3 more points, B needs 5 more points. (Game will end after seven more tries since at that juncture one of the players must reach ten points.) Count 3 + 5 rows on the Triangle; then sum the first 5 items. That sum divided by the sum of all items in the row is A’s portion of the stakes. Then sum the remaining 3 items in the row and divide that total by the sum of all the items in the row. That will be B’s portion.
From the Triangle:
(1+7+21+35+35) ÷ (1+7+21+35+35+21+7+1) = 99/128 = A’s portion.
(1+7+21) ÷ (1+7+21+35+35+21+7+1) = 29/128 = B’s portion.
Expressed as a percentage, A receives 77.34375 percent of the stake; B receives 22.65625 percent of the stake.
The idea of mathematical infinity – of a number that can be vaguely conceived but whose properties and nature can never be fully understood – has strong affinities with Pascal’s idea of God and also relates to his Wager and to his personal anxiety as he contemplates the “eternal silence of these infinite spaces” (201/233).
Imagine Pascal’s Triangle. Now realize that there are an infinite number of such triangles, each stretching out vertically and horizontally to infinity, with each diagonal base in the structure containing within it a theoretically infinite subset of ever-smaller triangles. Such is the paradoxical notion of infinity, a concept that astounded and haunted Pascal, and which has teased, baffled, and intrigued a long list of theorists and commentators from Nicholas of Cusa and Giordano Bruno to Bertrand Russell and David Foster Wallace. Although the idea of infinity can fill the imagination with dread, it can also, as Pascal points out at the conclusion of his treatise Of the Geometrical Spirit, provide us with a true understanding of nature and of our place in it:
But those who clearly perceive these truths will be able to admire the grandeur and power of nature in this double infinity that surrounds us on all sides, and to learn by this marvelous consideration to know themselves, in regarding themselves thus placed between an infinitude and a negation of extension, between an infinitude and a negation of number, between an infinitude and a negation of movement, between an infinitude and a negation of time. From which we may learn to estimate ourselves at our true value, and to form reflections which will be worth more than all the rest of geometry itself.
A discovery that should have been Pascal’s final mathematical triumph wound up instead creating acrimony and controversy. In the spring of 1658, supposedly as a diversion while contending with a toothache, he took up the problem of the roulette or cycloid, a problem that had puzzled some of Europe’s best mathematicians, including Galileo and Descartes, for nearly a century.
Figure 3: Cycloid
Imagine a point P on the circumference of a revolving circle. A cycloid is the curve described by P as it rolls along a straight line. The challenge is to discover and prove the area of this curve geometrically. Pascal worked out his own solution and then, as was common practice at the time, issued a public challenge to fellow mathematicians. Under the name Amos Dettonville, an anagram of the pseudonym Louis de Montalte, which he had used to write the provinciales (an anagram of the motto Talentum Deo Soli – “My talent for God alone”—according to Morris Bishop), Pascal drew up a list of six problems relating to the cycloid and offered a prize of 600 livres to the first person to solve them (Bishop 222). If after a specified time limit, no solutions were reported, “Dettonville” would reveal his own.
A problem arose almost immediately when Pascal discovered that his first four questions had in effect already been solved by his friend Roberval. The contest was therefore reduced to the final two questions, a change that, unfortunately, was not made clear to all the contestants. In addition, some contestants protested that the time limit was unreasonably short. Christian Huygens and Christopher Wren published solutions, but did not compete for the prize. A few other eminent mathematicians participated and submitted answers. However, Pascal, finding none of the submissions fully satisfactory, eventually revealed his own solutions and declared himself the winner. Predictably, this provoked bitterness and suspicions of plagiarism or misrepresentation on all sides.
Though the controversy left a blemish on Pascal’s reputation, his work on the cycloid has been admired by later mathematicians for its ingenuity and elegance, and he is credited, alongside his great contemporaries Galileo, Torricelli, Descartes, Mersenne, Roberval, Fermat, Wren, and Huygens, as having helped to solve the curve once known for its power to attract and captivate all who studied it as the “Helen of geometers.” In 1672, after having obtained and reviewed copies of Pascal’s papers on conics and the cycloid, Leibniz attested to their brilliance and concluded that were it not for an “evil fate” (by which phrase it’s unclear whether he meant their author’s short lifespan or his absorption in Jansenist theology) Pascal would have almost certainly gone on to make further and deeper mathematical discoveries.
Summarizing Pascal’s scientific and mathematical achievements, it can be said that in an age of amateurism, when everyone from priests and attorneys to soldiers and salonnières dabbled in “natural philosophy,” he was a marvel who often found himself in a position analogous to that later experienced by Newton and Leibniz: that is, he had to communicate dramatically new, highly complex and abstract concepts to readers who lacked his extraordinary mathematical imagination and facility. Having made his discoveries more or less instinctively, using his own private mathematical inventions and methods, he then found he had to “translate” his ideas into the conventionally accepted language and procedures of his peers and fellow numerophiles. Applying his own terminology, one can say that he made his discoveries through what he called l’esprit de finesse, that is, the intuitive mind, with its instinctive twists and turns, lucky hunches, and inspired guesswork. He found, however, that in order to communicate his findings to others he had to turn to what he styled l’esprit géométrique that is, the geometric mind, which he defined as the skill or capacity for “demonstrating truths already found, and of elucidating them in such a manner that the proof of them shall be irresistible”. Excellence in science and mathematics, he argued, requires both capabilities. It was Pascal’s good fortune to possess both l’esprit de finesse and l’esprit géométrique in rare and powerful abundance.
Of the many great natural philosophers of the 17th century – a group that includes both theoreticians and experimentalists and such illustrious names as Galileo, Descartes, Bacon, Boyle, Huygens, and Gassendi – Pascal arguably was the one who came closest to articulating a coherent, comprehensive, durable philosophy of science consistent with and comparable to the standard view that prevails today, except that he came up short. As Desmond M. Clarke has argued, Pascal was torn between his love of geometric proof and pure logical demonstration on the one hand and his skeptical, pragmatic instincts in favor of down-to-earth experimentalism and empiricism on the other. As a result he seemed trapped in a kind of philosophical limbo. (See “Pascal’s Philosophy of Science,” in Hammond, 118.) Similarly, although he seemed to recognize that our knowledge of the natural world is only probable and can never be certain, a part of him nevertheless remained enthralled by the “will-o-the-wisp” or “Holy Grail” of absolute certainty.
In most other respects, Pascal’s outlook is ahead of its time and admirable in its self-restraint and in its awareness of its own limitations. Unlike Bacon, he makes room for hypothesis and even imaginative insight and conjecture (l’esprit de finesse) and also allows a deductive component a la Descartes (l’esprit géométrique). He acknowledges that all hypotheses must be tested and confirmed by rigorous experiments, and even if he didn’t actually carry out his experiments exactly as described, he nevertheless accepts the necessity of such testing. Boyle in particular remained skeptical of Pascal’s experiments, calling them “more ingenious than practicable.” He especially marveled at the availability of 40-ft. Torricelli tubes and of brass fittings engineered to nearly microscopic precision. Attempting to reproduce one of Pascal’s hydrostatic tests involving a fly in a chamber of water, Boyle attests that “upon tryal with a strong flie” the creature “presently drowned” (243.)
Pascal fully understood that once a hypothesis is tested and confirmed, the problem of determining the true cause of the phenomenon still remains and becomes itself a matter for further conjecture. For example, take his prediction, experimentally confirmed, that the level of mercury in a Torricelli tube will decline as altitude increases. Pascal claimed that this phenomenon was due to the weight of air, though he knew that other factors might also explain the same effect. Indeed, for all he knew, an invisible emanation from the god Mercury may have influenced his results. (Ironically, the famous Puy-de-Dôme experiment had been performed near an ancient temple to that deity). As Pascal observed to Father Noël, fanciful explanations for phenomena are as easy to imagine as they are impossible to disprove.
In his correspondence with Noël, Pascal at one point suggests that it is fatal for one’s hypothesis if an experimental test fails to confirm a predicted outcome. However, as he himself and his fellow experimentalists certainly knew, there can be nearly as many reasons why an expected result does not occur, such as defective apparatus, lack of proper controls, measurement errors, extraordinary test circumstances, etc, as there are explanations for a result that occurs as expected. Apparently in his haste to champion the new science of experimentalism against its critics, both Cartesian and Scholastic, Pascal wanted to at least be able to say that if experiments cannot conclusively prove a given hypothesis, then they may at least be able to disprove it. If this was his intention, he was anticipating by nearly three centuries Karl Popper’s theory of empirical falsification and opposed to (and seemingly fearful at the prospect of) any view similar to WVO Quine’s theory of confirmation holism, according to which all scientific claims are at best only probable and there is no such thing as a decisive experiment.
Que-sais-je? (“What do I know?”) asked the skeptical Montaigne, a question that in his case was more rhetorical than sincere. Que puis-je savoir? (“What can I know?”) was Pascal’s more earnest if also slightly skeptical variation. Anticipating Kant, he wondered with what limitations and with what level of assurance we can confidently say we know what we believe we know.
Pascal has been plausibly labeled an empiricist, a foundationalist, even a positivist and a skeptic. The confusion is understandable and is due largely to the fact that his epistemological views are complex and seem in certain respects equivocal or inconsistent. For example, he accepts the rule of authority in some areas of knowledge, such as ancient history, while opposing and even forbidding it in others, especially physical science. He also recognizes three different types or sources of knowledge related to his so-called “three orders”: body/sense; mind/reason; heart/will or instinct, each with its own domain or area of applicability, level of certainty, and tests of confirmation and reliability.
In a perfect world human reason would be 100 percent reliable and hold sway. Presumably, Adam, prior to the Fall, had such a pristine and certain view of things, such that there was a perfect congruency or correspondence between his inner perceptions and the outer world. Pascal believes that the axioms and first principles of math, geometry, and logic constitute knowledge of this kind. They are perceived directly by reason and (along with any consequences that we can directly deduce from them) represent the only knowledge that we can know infallibly and with certainty. It is with respect to such axioms and principles alone that Pascal accepts Descartes’ criteria of clearness and distinctness as reliable evidence of truth. Everything else is subject to error and doubt.
A critic of Cartesian rationalism and the deductive method, which he referred to as “useless and uncertain” – 887/445, Pascal was for the most part an empiricist and experimentalist who held that our knowledge of the natural world is acquired through the senses and must be tested and empirically verified by experiment. Reason also has a role in this process. It guides our observations and assists us in the forming of hypotheses and predictions. It is reason that also judges and approves (or disapproves) the final results, though it does so on the basis of empirical evidence, not deductive logic or some preconceived system.
In the Preface to his Treatise on the Vacuum, Pascal declares that reason and sense alone must rule and authority has no place in the establishment of scientific truth. Authority is to be respected, he says, in history, jurisprudence, languages, and above all in matters of theology, where the authority of Scripture and the Fathers is omnipotent. But, he argues that in the case of physical science reverence for the ancients can actually cloud the truth and impede the advancement of knowledge, especially when such reverence is, blind, misplaced, or overly devout. He concludes the Preface with a witty reversal of roles in the heated, ongoing debate between “ancients and moderns”:
Those whom we call ancient were really new in all things, and properly constituted the infancy of mankind; and as we have joined to their knowledge the experience of the centuries which have followed them, it is in ourselves that we should find this antiquity that we revere in others.
If there is an element of mystery in Pascal’s theory of knowledge, it is in the source of knowledge and inner being that he terms le Coeur. In scattered places throughout the Pensées he makes reference to a logique du coeur or an ordre du coeur. But what exactly he means by such phrases he never clearly explains. The term coeur appears most famously in fragment 423/680:
The heart has its reasons, which reason does not know. We feel it in a thousand things. I say that the heart naturally loves the Universal Being, and also itself naturally, according as it gives itself to them; and it hardens itself against one or the other at its will. You have rejected the one, and kept the other. Is it by reason that you love yourself?
“The heart has its reasons, which reason doesn’t know.” Not only has Pascal’s famous aphorism become an oft-quoted cliché, it has also managed to enter and even permeate popular culture in the form of song lyrics, as the title of a love memoir, and as a message of endearment or benediction on bumper stickers and greeting cards. Even people who have never read a page of the Pensées are familiar with the quote, and while it seems safe to say that Pascal had no such sentimental meaning in mind, amour, in its various senses from romantic love and self-love to charity and maternal instinct, seems an inescapable association when we hear the phrase “reasons of the heart.” In fact, the Catholic scholar Romano Guardini has plausibly offered “love” and “charity” as appropriate translations or synonyms for coeur (133).
It has also been suggested that by “heart” Pascal means something transcending reason and prior to it (Peters 168-171; Kearns 101-02), almost as if it were some kind of Kantian intuition, or as if it were a form of natural or divinely endowed intelligence on the very cutting edge of perception; some instinctive faculty that, without contradicting reason, can either surpass it or supplement it. (110/142). Such a faculty, if it is indeed instinctive, would presumably be inborn and thus either a part of our basic nature and something that all humans share or a special gift or grace bestowed by God to the elect. And if it is intuitive, then it possibly bears some relation to what Pascal elsewhere terms l’esprit de finesse, the subtle or intuitive component of intellect that somehow “sees” or penetrates directly into truths that l’esprit géométrique, the logical or sequential intelligence, can arrive at only via incremental, deductive steps. Heart-knowledge would then be like some faint glimmer or trace of the instantaneous, clairvoyant understanding that the unfallen Adam was believed to enjoy in Paradise. In any case, the notion of a raison du Coeur remains a critical crux in Pascal studies and posed a mystery and challenge to his readers.
Fideism can be defined as the view that religious truth is ascertainable by faith alone and that faith is separate from, superior to, and generally antagonistic towards reason. Whenever the term shows up in a religious or philosophical discussion, it is typically in conjunction with a list that includes names like Tertullian, Luther, Montaigne, Kierkegaard, Wittgenstein, and William James. Pascal’s name is often inserted into this group.
Based on the foregoing definition of fideism, Pascal does not fit into such a list, though the tendency to include him is understandable. Perhaps the most compelling evidence in favor of labeling him a fideist is the striking fact of his midnight conversion and “Night of Fire,” the powerful, visionary experience, clearly more mystical than rational, on the basis of which he wound up explicitly rejecting “the god of the philosophers.” However, just because the medium or process through which a belief is achieved may not be rational, doesn’t mean that the belief itself is unreasonable. For Pascal, that belief was his acceptance of Jesus Christ as his Lord and Savior. Kekule discovered the shape and structure of the benzene molecule in a dream. Though his means of discovery was non-rational, what he discovered was quite reasonable and proved true.
Another reason why Pascal’s religious views are sometimes confused with fideism is his notion of an infinite and hidden God, who is essentially beyond our comprehension and understanding and whose existence and nature transcends the limited perspectives of reason and sense perception. However, once again, just because God surpasses or eludes empirical sense and reason doesn’t mean that He is contrary to or incompatible with them. “Faith,” Pascal writes, “indeed tells what the senses do not tell, but not the contrary of what they see. It is above them, and not contrary to them” (185/265). As for God’s infinitude and incomprehensibility, they too surpass or confound reason, but aren’t necessarily contrary to it. The notion of mathematical infinity baffles us in the same way. As Pascal points out, just because something is incomprehensible, for example, God, infinity, “a sphere whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is nowhere,” doesn’t mean that it can’t exist (149,230/182,262).
Some critics have even used the Wager itself (418/680) as a basis for linking Pascal to fideism since that fragment sets forth and vividly illustrates the view that God’s existence is uncertain and can’t be proved. Of particular significance in this respect is the paragraph in which Pascal, in an observation that seems to echo Tertullian almost as much as St. Paul, candidly acknowledges the “foolishness” of the Christian creed:
Who then will blame Christians for not being able to give reasons for their beliefs, since they profess belief in a religion which they cannot explain? They declare, when they expound it to the world, that it is foolishness, stultitiam; and then you complain because they do not prove it! If they proved it, they would not keep their word; it is through their lack of proofs that they show they are not lacking in sense.
But, again, not being able to prove or give a convincing explanation for a belief is not quite the same thing as saying that the belief is incompatible with or contrary to reason. Conspiracy theories are typically lamely supported and impossible to prove, but they are seldom implausible or illogical. Moreover, it is not just a fideistic claim, but a perfectly orthodox Catholic view (and indeed a widely observable fact) that reason has limits; that it is indeed, as Pascal claims, unreasonable to trust reason too much. “Reason’s last step is the recognition that there are an infinite number of things which are beyond it.” (188/220.)
Pascal eschewed metaphysical proofs of God’s existence not on fideistic grounds because he thought that, as rational constructions, they were contrary to faith, but because he felt they were emotionally sterile and too abstruse and technical to persuade a non-believer:
The metaphysical proofs for the existence of God are so remote from human reasoning and so involved that they make little impact, and, even if they did help some people, it would only be for the moment during which they watched the demonstration, because an hour later they would be afraid they had made a mistake. (190/222)
And this is why I shall not undertake here to prove by reasons from nature either the existence of God, or the Trinity or the immortality of the soul, or anything of that kind: not just because I should not feel competent to find in nature arguments which would convince hardened atheists, but also because such knowledge, without Christ, is useless and sterile. Even if someone were convinced that the proportions between numbers are immaterial, eternal truths, depending on a first truth in which they subsist, called God, I should not consider that he made much progress towards his salvation. The Christian’s God does not consist merely of a God who is the author of mathematical truths and the order of the elements. That is the portion of the heathen and Epicureans. (449/690)
In the end, the strongest reason for denying Pascal a place within fideism is that he believed that even the most “irrational” proofs of Christianity – the prophesies, miracles, typological confirmations, and so forth – were not only not contrary to reason but were in fact perfectly compatible with it. (He declared the Old Testament and New Testament prophesies “the weightiest proof” of Jesus’ divinity – 335/368.) That Christianity is reasonable though not provable by reason effectively summarizes one of the central arguments of the entire Pensées.
Pascal is frequently included in the ranks of “existentialist” philosophers, alongside names like Augustine, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Sartre.
Again it can be asked (as it was in the case of his alleged affiliation with fideism) whether he belongs in such a list . Once again, the strict, technical response would seem to be that he isn’t an existentialist–although in this case the label is arguably more appropriate and may even be justified.
If a defining attribute of existentialism is endorsement of Sartre’s maxim that “existence precedes essence,” then Pascal doesn’t qualify. For in his view human beings enter the world with a largely defined and determined nature and a destiny that is partly charted, partly free. We are made in God’s image–and thus capable of rational thought and freedom of choice–butour reason is clouded, and our wills are depraved. We are broken creatures and would be hopelessly lost if it were not for divine grace. If such a view of the human condition is incompatible with existentialism, then Pascal is no existentialist.
On the other hand, if Augustine and Kierkegaard (or for that matter any Christian thinker) can be considered existentialists in some broad sense, then it is hard to see why Pascal might not also qualify. Like Augustine and Kierkegaard, he emphasizes the priority of the individual and the deeply personal character of our choice to believe. Like them, he values and personally exemplifies an extreme inwardness, indeed at times displays an almost fanatical absorption in his mental and spiritual life. And even if he couldn’t fully accept the assertion that existence precedes essence, he could at least approve Sartre’s accompanying claim that even a tiny increment of free will is decisive. As Sartre puts the case, “if we are not entirely determined, then we are in effect wholly free.” Pascal would agree, though he would attribute this freedom to divine grace rather than accepting it as a mere donnée or product of happenstance.
The Confessions, with its focus on the self and personal identity, and especially on the self as a cumulative record, inscribed in memory, of our life-altering decisions and events, is conceivably the first existentialist text. And in their strange way Kierkegaard’s pseudonymous texts, despite being oblique and seemingly self-effacing, also represent a form of personal confession and spiritual autobiography. The Pensées stands as an intermediate text in this series, an experiment in autobiographical apologetics linking the direct, confessional style of Augustine with the multiple personae, lyrical vignettes, and pensive fragments typical of Kierkegaard.
That human life without God is wretched and that the human condition is marked by restlessness, ennui, and anxiety is an observation common to all three writers. Another common feature of their work is the recurrent image of a vast gulf or abyss. Augustine compares the human soul to a deep abyss and likens it to the Nothingness preceding the Creation (Genesis 1:2). Without the light of God, he suggests, we are but a dark emptiness. Kierkegaard argues that human freedom necessarily entails a constant sense of anxiety, and his image of our condition is that of a person standing on the edge of a dark precipice. Pascal’s dread of the silence of infinite space (201/233) and similar images in the Pensées of void and darkness echo these sentiments. And in the background of this imagery also stands the legend of his personal idée fixe – that is, his feeling that he was constantly shadowed by a personal abyss. (This legend relates to the aforementioned story of his accident on the Pont de Neuilly when his coach supposedly almost plunged into the Seine – an unconfirmed but oft-retold event that has been perpetuated and basically permanently enshrined in Baudelaire’s poem “Le Gouffre” and in Freud’s writings on obsession.)
In the Confessions Augustine describes the long ordeal that eventually leads to his conversion. But his narrative doesn’t end at that point. Instead, he must begin a new spiritual test and journey – that of actually living a Christian life. Similarly, Kierkegaard never wrote of being a Christian, but always of becoming one. He regarded an authentic Christian life as a constant trial and task. Like Augustine, Pascal places even harsher spiritual demands on himself after his conversion. And like Kierkegaard, he believes that true Christianity is an ever-striving imitatio Christi, a continual remaking of oneself in the image and spirit of Jesus.
With these resemblances in mind, it’s hardly a stretch to say that entire portions of the Pensées, translated into Latin or Danish, could easily pass for an excerpt from Augustine or from Kierkegaard’s Training in Christianity or another of the author’s “edifying” texts. Similarly, if we place Pascal in a sequence of “Christian existentialist” writers, a line that arguably proceeds from Augustine to Kierkegaard and then on to, say, Unamuno and Berdyaev, we find the same emphasis on personal experience and individual freedom and responsibility; the same rhetorical skill and verbal flourishes; the same flair for metaphor and self-dramatization. In short, if we accept existentialism as not so much a system or body of doctrine, but as more of a perspective or attitude towards life – an exacting and indeed tragic sense of life (depicted graphically and with Dostoyevsky-like force in fragment 434/686) – then Pascal can be considered an existentialist philosopher.
“Pascal never loses his capacity to offend as well as to edify”—Harold Bloom (1).
“How few,” wrote Walter Pater in what was to be his last work, a sparkling critical essay on Pascal, “how select, are the literary figures who have earned the honor of receiving regular ongoing criticism, both appreciative and deprecatory, from their successors.” Pascal has earned that honor and is of that rare and select company, having acquired during the nearly four centuries since his birth a long line of admirers and detractors, including many of the leading names in world literature. Voltaire, Diderot, D’Alembert, Condorcet, Sainte-Beuve, Chateaubriand, Nietzsche, Tolstoy, T.S. Eliot, Borges, Bertrand Russell, Paul Valéry, Harold Bloom – the list of important writers and thinkers who have studied Pascal and gone on to voice their appreciation or discontent could be extended literally for pages.
In his introductory essay to the Pensées published in 1933, Eliot referred to Pascal as “one of those writers who will be and who must be studied afresh by men in every generation. It is not he who changes, but we who change. It is not our knowledge of him that increases, but our world that alters and our attitudes towards it.” (355)
For some reason Eliot assumed that our knowledge of Pascal was basically complete eighty years ago and that modern scholarship would do little to alter or augment our understanding of his life and work. On this point he was quite mistaken. In fact, on the contrary, owing to the biographical and textual labors of scholars like Lafuma, Sellier, and Mesnard, students of Pascal today have a much fuller understanding of the author’s personal life, family, medical history, intellectual and religious development, and social milieu, as well as a far better sense of the likely order, design, and method of the Pensées, than any previous generation of readers.
Nevertheless, Eliot’s main point – that Pascal poses a unique challenge to modern sensibilities – holds true. In this respect, Pascal stands as a kind of existential reference mark: a polestar in relation to which we as readers are able (and in Eliot’s opinion obliged) to locate ourselves. He remains a fixed point against which we are challenged to measure the sincerity and durability of our own values and beliefs.
Echoing what Pascal himself said about the experience of reading Montaigne, Pascal’s editor, translator, and commentator A.J. Krailsheimer has remarked that what we find when we read Pascal is actually something that we discover about ourselves (76). In effect, what both Krailsheimer and Eliot are suggesting is that ultimately there is not one Pascal, but many – possibly as many as there are readers of his texts. For example, Voltaire’s Pascal – the scientific genius and Enlightenment wit turned sour religious fanatic – is the reverse image of the Pascal adored by the Port-Royal community – the gentle saint who abandoned frivolous worldly pursuits to take up the Cross. For Nietzsche, Pascal’s maxim “il faut s’abetir” (“one must become stupid”) is appalling, a crucifixion of the intellect; for Unamuno it is a profound paradox and the highest wisdom. Valéry’s Pascal is a sententious and badgering preacher, oblivious to the beauty of nature; the Pascal of Sainte-Beuve is an “athlete, martyr, and hero of the invisible moral world.” What Gilberte Perier refers to as her brother’s “second conversion,” Bertrand Russell regards as an act of “philosophical suicide.” And so on. In short, Pascal’s writings, and especially the Pensées, have served less as a window into the author’s soul than as a kind of mirror or prism reflecting the different outlooks and opinions of his readers.
Of course any proper summation of Pascal’s cultural legacy must include his contributions to probability theory and game theory and his invention of the mechanical computer (in honor of which the Swiss computer scientist Niklaus Wirth aptly named his new programming language Pascal). And, one must include all the other eponymous scientific, mathematical, and theological concepts (Pascal’s Theorem, Pascal’s Principle, Pascal’s Triangle, Pascal’s Wager, and so forth) that bear his name. In addition, every modern system of intra-urban or inter-urban shuttle transportation also owes a debt to the philosopher, who first conceived such a system and oversaw its original implementation in the city of Paris.
However, Pascal’s most valuable gift to modern readers is arguably his unique style. His combination of wit, irony, and aphorism, his ease and clarity, his air of someone skilled both in urbane conversation and erudite technical debate was to a large extent already present and on dazzling display in Montaigne. The same features reappear in the writings of Voltaire and the philosophes. And today, thanks largely to Pascal, these attributes have become a part of French literary tradition. However, what sets Pascal’s style apart, especially in the Pensées, is that supplemental to his characteristic élan and luster he adds a tone of existential angst: a visionary quality, together with an element of strangeness that is utterly foreign to the works of Montaigne and Voltaire but which appears powerfully in writers like Dante, Kafka, and Borges. Pascal’s imagination, like theirs, seems haunted by the notion of infinity and by images of mystery and turmoil; by circles, mazes, precipices, and abysses:
“At the far end of an infinite distance a coin is being spun . . .” 418/680.
“Nature is an infinite sphere whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is nowhere” 199/230.
Relatively few writers, and certainly few philosophers, have his uncanny quality, using that term in Freud’s sense as the ability to make familiar ideas seem strange and strange ideas seem familiar. Pater rightly called him the intellectual equivalent of lightning.
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- Mesnard, Jean, ed. Œuvres complètes de Pascal. 4 vols. (to date). Paris: Desclée de Brouwer, 1964-1992.
- Pascal, Blaise, Gilberte Pascal Périer, and Louis Lafuma (ed). Oeuvres Complètes. Paris: Seuill, 1980.
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